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Cosmology: Methodological Debates in the 1930s and 1940s

First published Sat May 18, 2002; substantive revision Wed Jun 20, 2007

Sometimes, philosophy drives science. Cosmology between 1932-48 provides an excellent example how explicitly philosophical considerations directed the evolution of a modern science during a crucial period of its development. The following article exhibits these philosophical aspects of cosmological thinking in detail, beginning with a brief sketch of the historical development of general relativity cosmology until 1932. Following this, the historical participants in the philosophical debate are introduced, along with the basic ideas of their competing positions. Then the critical stages of the debate -- 1935-37 -- are closely explored by focussing directly upon the arguments of the participating scientists and philosophers. Finally, the concluding stage of the philosophical debate, namely, the emergence of the steady-state theory of the Universe, is presented in the context of its development from Popper's philosophy of science.

1. Introduction

One of the most vigorous philosophical debates of the century broke out among cosmologists during the 1930s and 1940s. At the peak of the debate, 1936-37, many of the most prominent scientists in Britain, as well as several leading philosophers of science, had gotten themselves publically involved. Their arguments, attacks and rebuttals were chronicled in many of the leading scientific journals, including a special edition of the foremost general scientific journal, Nature, devoted entirely to philosophical arguments and counter-arguments.

Methodology was the central issue of the debate, although metaphysical questions also arose, particularly those concerning the actual reality of certain structures and forces imputed to the Universe by the new cosmological theories and observations. But in the end, methodology was the real goad spurring on most of the participants.

At bottom, there were just two opposing positions in the debate, each of which comprised a two-point stance. On one side were those scientists who had their roots mostly in the experimental side of natural science. To them, there was one and only one legitimate method for science. Theory construction, they believed, involved two closely-linked steps. First, one began from the empirical observations, that is, from measurements, manipulations, experiments, whose results were evident to the human senses; this is classic empiricist epistemology. Observational results would then suggest possible hypotheses to examine via further empirical testing. When enough data concerning the hypothesis had been gathered, logical generalization could be carried out, thereby producing a theory; this is classic inductivist logic.

Opposing these inductive-empiricist scientists were those whose roots were mostly in the theoretical side of natural science, most especially mathematical physics. To them, there was another, more logically sound, method to construct theories. First, hypotheses could be generated in any fashion, although most believed that imagining hypotheses which were based upon very general, very reasonable concepts—that the Universe's physical processes had simple mathematical descriptions, for example—was the best place to begin; this is classic rationalist epistemology. Once the hypothesis had been generated, strict analytical reasoning could be used to make predictions about observations; this is classic deductivist logic. Scientists who held this view came to be called hypothetico-deductivists; their views about both hypothesis generation and deductive predictions were each strongly opposed by the inductive-empiricists.

Part of the controversy may be laid to the fact that cosmology was a new science, and disputes about methodology in new sciences are not rare in the history of the sciences. What is rare about this case, however, is the vigor, sometimes even bitterness, with which the philosophical controversy was waged. Another reason for the controversy lies in the fact that cosmology is a data-poor science: observations are hard-won and rare, and they frequently must be run through elaborate theoretical manipulations and corrections in order to make sense at all. With a paucity of data results, scientists must rely upon philosophical argument to undergird their views about how the scientific work should be done.

One final feature of the debate must be noted. The participants are almost universally scientists, and not philosophers. Yet this does not much affect the level of philosophical thinking going on; these scientists knew their philosophy well, and they wielded philosophy's weapons and defenses with great skill. In the end, their debate shaped cosmology into the science we know today.

It will be useful to look briefly at the history of cosmology leading up to the debate.

2. The Lead-up to the Debate

Since about 1700 theories about the nature and structure of the Universe were derived from Newtonian theory, most especially his theory of gravitation, which was used to account for the behavior of heavenly bodies and their systems. Newton's theory hypothesized a force—gravitation—acting upon material bodies, free to move over time within the passive, inert ‘container’ of three-dimensional space. Bodies, paths, and space itself exemplified the classical geometry of Euclid. All these features changed with the publication of Einstein's General Theory of Relativity, 1915-17.

2.1 Einstein's General Theory of Relativity

Einstein's intended his theory to replace Newton's theory of gravitation completely. In Einstein's view, gravity was not a force existing independently of the spatial ‘container’; rather, gravitation arises as a curvature of the space (and time, which is necessarily connected to space in the new theory), which means that geometry and gravity and astronomical behavior are all intimately connected. For example, near the sun the geometrical structure, the curvature, of spacetime changes radically, which expresses itself as an increasing velocity of incoming orbiting bodies such as comets or satellites. One immediate, and to some, puzzling, consequence of Einstein's theory is that the geometry of the Universe is no longer taken to be Euclidean. Although there are several different candidates for the actual geometry of space, it was not known which is correct.

It was not recognized at first that the General Theory of Relativity could be applied to the Universe as a single, whole, individual object, thereby producing a new cosmological theory, one completely different from its predecessors. Although the mathematics involved are extremely difficult, two solutions, one by Einstein himself, the other by the Dutch astronomer Willem de Sitter, were produced in just a short time in 1917. Unfortunately, the universes predicted by the two solutions were extreme: Einstein's universe would be densely packed with matter, whereas de Sitter's would be essentially empty.

Obviously, the universe as observed by astronomers did not conform at all to the description provided by either solution, a fact many found troubling. Moreover, no additional solutions were forthcoming (even though both Friedmann and LeMaître had developed alternatives, they remained unknown and unnoticed). For nearly twelve years, the new cosmology appeared to be going nowhere. Then Hubble at California's Mt. Palomar made public his astonishing observations of a cosmic Doppler shift, a shift toward the red in the color of light coming from the most distant star systems.

2.2 Hubble's Expanding Universe

Most cosmologists—with the interesting exception of Hubble himself—came to the immediate conclusion that the red shift could only mean that the universe was expanding. Immediately the relativity theorists were able to interpret the expansion as a continuous change in the geometry of spacetime, which was thoroughly accounted for by the General Theory of Relativity. After over a decade of stagnation in face of the meager choice between just two models of the cosmos, Hubble's observations spurred theorists on to the construction of a melange of new models, each vying in competition with the other.

In the end, it was the Belgian astronomer Georges LeMaître's theory of an expanding universe that came to be accepted. LeMaître's model was publically proclaimed as appropriate and generally correct during a special session of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, 31 Oct 1931. Modern scientific cosmology had been officially born; because of its birth within the context of Einstein's theory of relativity, the new cosmology became quickly and broadly known as Relativistic Cosmology. The model of this cosmology is most famously that of the blowing up of a balloon painted with dots to represent galaxies. Over time, the radius of the model's spherical space (the balloon) increases, thereby decreasing the curvature of the space (the balloon's skin), and increasing the distance between the dots.

Although cosmologists came from Europe and America as well as Britain, most of the work in theoretical cosmology took place in London, Cambridge and Oxford. Americans Hubble, Tolman and Robertson did their work at CalTech in Pasadena, but were frequently in England; and most of the European and British workers cycled through Pasadena at one time or another. De Sitter, from Holland, and LeMaître, from Belgium, spent important periods in England, as did various of the German workers. Thus, even though cosmology was done throughout the Western world, its major concentrating point was England; our focus in what follows will be the same.

3. Cosmology and its philosophy

Because it represented such a radical departure from previous scientific thinking about the Universe, relativistic cosmology needed to work out its philosophical underpinnings, most especially in regard to its methodology. ‘How is this new science to be conducted?’ was thus a compelling question. But method, of course, is always linked to metaphysics and epistemology. A full-blown philosophical discussion was evidently required. It came soon enough: within a span of less than a year, a vigorous debate between two philosophically opposed camps developed. The debate required nearly two decades to reach its full resolution. But, with the resolution, cosmology had philosophically certified its methodology within the context of a concensus metaphysics and epistemology. Before going into the details of the debate, however, several general points should be noted. Let us turn to the details of the origin of the debate.

3.1 Relativistic Cosmology: the majority philosophy

To begin with, the cosmological thinking of the majority of scientists—including Eddington, de Sitter, Robertson, Tolman, and their colleagues—had betrayed a relatively unexamined, and apparently uncontroversial cluster of philosophical perspectives: on the metaphysical side they held a modest sort of explanatory realism—if an accepted theory referred to entity x, then x was acceptable as a genuinely, physically real object; to this metaphysical stance was coupled a methodology exhibiting a classic sort of inductive empiricism—scientific knowledge consisted of generalizations built up from individual empirical observations. But this cluster of views did not go long unchallenged. In early July 1932, just nine months after relativistic cosmology became the concensus during the British Association meeting, Oxford astrophysicist E. A. Milne published a short article in Nature which directly attacked the current philosophical tenets, proposing their replacement by a new cluster of views, one as radical as the new science it purported to undergird.

3.2 Milne's Philosophical Challenge

Milne's metaphysical views were based in positivism, most especially in operationalism: only those objects whose properties could be directly revealed by some observational procedure, or operation, were to be counted among the real. Thus, for Milne, reality did not contain the usual relativistic cosmology referents “curved space”, “expanding space” or even “four-dimensional spacetime”, simply because none of these entities were operationalizable. Milne held that ‘what you saw was what you got’; since “curved space” of various geometries couldn't be observed, space was just as it looked—Euclidean. In the same way, the expanding of the Universe was a genuine expanding—each galaxy was retreating from each other—not just a change in the geometry of the curvature, as it was for the relativists. Moreover, in place of relativistic cosmology's inductive empiricism, Milne opted for a hypothetico-deductive rationalism. Cosmologists, Milne believed, were bound to dream up any and all possible models of a universe, and then deduce what, if any, observable consequences followed from their hypotheses. Hypothesizing could be based upon just about anything, although Milne believed that certain very general rational principles derived from aesthetic beliefs about universal order and regularity would be the most fruitful. His ‘cosmological principle’, namely, that every cosmologist in the universe should look out upon the same cosmos, was the prime example of such thinking. Later, Bondi would found Steady-state Cosmology on an even more general version of Milne's principle, which he called the ‘perfect cosmological principle.’

3.3 Kinematic Relativity—an alternative cosmology

Milne's philosophy of cosmology came with a closely associated cosmological model, kinematic relativity, so-called because of its tight links to the kinematics of Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity. Kinematics, in Einstein's Special Theory, is especially concerned with observers trying to make measurements of the behavior of objects moving in systems relative to themselves. According to Milne's understanding, these measurements could only be made by the observers signalling among themselves using light or other electromagnetic radiation, using clocks to time the signals. In the end, all measurement—even space and velocity—reduced to timing the signals as they went from one observer to another. This idea of measurement represented a revolutionary simplification of previous ideas, and held philosophical interest for that reason alone. There were practical consequences as well. As Bondi later remarked, “Milne's idea led straightaway to the radar speed gun!”

Milne's kinematic relativity and its underlying philosophy both immediately brought careful scrutiny, not to mention controversy.

4. The Great Cosmological Debate Begins: 1933-1934

Eddington was the first to attack Milne's views. In a series of lectures given at Harvard during late ‘32 and published early in the new year as The Expanding Universe, Eddington denied the efficacy of both operationalism and hypothetico-deductivism, and not only defended explanatory realism, but strengthened his ontological position heroically: the theoretical entities of relativistic cosmology were not just plausible, they were so necessary to understanding the universe, that cosmological knowledge was essentially impossible without them. (Eddington 1932, p. 19)

4.1 Dingle's First Attacks

Few others would ever go so far as Eddington's ontological heroism; yet epistemological and methodological heroism in the fight against Milne was not rare. Chief hero in this aspect of the attack on Milne was Herbert Dingle, a highly respected astrophysicist, and then-secretary of the Royal Astronomical Society. Dingle's initial foray appeared as a response to Milne's first detailed presentation of kinematic relativity. (Milne 1933) After claiming that while kinematic relativity did not differ appreciably from relativistic cosmology in its mathematical formalism or observable consequences, Dingle asserted that, on the other hand, it invited special criticism because it renounced “the fundamental principles of scientific method,” namely, “Newton's principle of induction from phenomena.”(Dingle 1933 p178) Dingle was never to relent in his attacks upon Milne's hypothetico-deductivism, at all times rejecting the methodology as even a possible candidate for acceptance by genuine science.

Dingle's article appeared back-to-back with an appraisal of kinematic relativity by the important American cosmologist H. P. Robertson. (Robertson 1933a) Robertson focussed upon Milne's hypothetico-deducivism as well, noting that the cosmological principle in kinematic relativity functions as an a priori rule, rather than as an empirical generalization, its status in relativistic cosmology. Robertson otherwise is not especially taken with Milne's theory, limiting himself to remarks suggesting that, where they can be compared, kinematic relativity and relativistic cosmology apparently are similar in physical content. As we shall shortly see, Robertson's later work strongly belied this earlier apparent indifference to Milne's theory.

4.2 Two Ways to Disagree with Milne

Right from the start, cosmologists differed in their opinions about both the physical content of Milne's theory, and its underlying philosophy. Dingle disliked Milne's methods, but found the theory itself of not much interest. Robertson initially agreed with Dingle, but within a short time had significant changes of heart. Eddington disliked both the theory and its philosophy, finding them far too deviant from what was typical, i.e., relativistic cosmology and its mainstream philosophy. Younger cosmologists such as McVittie and McCrea, students, respectively, of Eddington and Whittaker, soon joined the fray. McVittie initially found the physics of kinematic relativity quite interesting, and quite different from the physics of relativistic cosmology. (McVittie 1933b) But Milne's philosophy was something else; the strict empiricism McVittie had earlier revealed (McVittie 1933a) made him equally unhappy with both Milne's rationalism and his hypothetico-deductivism.

McCrea's remarks were among the most perceptive and favorable. (Kermack and McCrea 1933) While he thought that Milne's operationalist criticisms of curved and expanding space were of little import, McCrea was the first to notice the parsimony and elegance of Milne's strictly kinematic solution to the problem of the origin of the universe's expansion. Since a search for such a solution had vexed relativistic cosmology for several years (McVittie 1931), McCrea suggested that Milne's mechanism should be immdiately shown to be part of relativistic cosmology. (Kermack and McCrea 1933 p. 529)

Clearly, the so-recently won consensus about relativistic cosmology and its philosophy had dissolved into confusion and controversy over Milne and his methods.

4.3 Milne Makes Philosophical Improvements

Over the next year or so, Milne made strenuous efforts to elucidate both kinematic relativity's physics and its philosophy, beginning, as would be his wont, with the philosophy. In October, Milne addressed the Philosophical Association, giving an explicit and detailed analysis not only of his philosophical views, but also of their history, which, he claimed, extended back to Locke and Hume (Milne 1934a) His description of the two opposed methods—inductive empiricism vs. hypothetico-deductivism—is quite clear and useful:

Strictly speaking, physics has no philosophy. It has method…Now the methods of theoretical physics seem to be reducible to two species, the method of starting with concepts and the method of starting with things observed. …When a subject is developed from concepts the concepts play the part of the terms occurring in the axioms of geometry…. The concepts are undefined save as being governed by propositions of which they are subjects.

Milne's commitment to axiomatization is notable here. It was based in his earlier admiration for the work of Whitehead and Russell (Crowther 1970); commitment to axiomatization in cosmology, once having been initiated by Milne, would be an enduring hallmark of the work of many, including both Robertson and Walker.

Three weeks after this address, Milne spoke on related topics at the monthly meeting of the Royal Astronomical Society. His main point was that theories differed only insofar as their concepts could be cashed out in observations deduced from them. Eddington took strong exception to Milne's arguments, claiming in response that kinematic relativity and relativistic cosmology differed more importantly in their ontology than in their consequences. Eddington was especially concerned with differences in the spacetime-geometry each theory ascribed to the world. For Eddington and his colleagues, the equivalence of gravitation and spacetime geometry was a genuine reality, a feature of the physical world, just as real as suns and moons and stars.

4.4 A Major Philosophical Issue: What makes a scientific theory ‘good’?

Milne was having none of it. In the next month's Observatory—the informal monthly publication of the Royal Astronomical Society—he took Eddington and his theoretical-realist colleagues to task, concluding that “theories differ simply and solely when their predictions as to phenomena differ”; most importantly, “this method of comparison avoids all reference to distance-assignments, world-geometry, schemes of projection or the like.” (Milne 1934b) In other words, metaphysics was to be avoided in cosmology; space, spacetime, geometry and the like were to be rejected as scientific realities, replaced by reference simply and solely to observations. The only realities, according to Milne, were what could be reported among observers about light signals and clocks.

During 1934 Milne worked together with his new student A.G. Walker. Walker never evinced much interest in the philosophical aspects of kinematic relativity, choosing instead to focus tightly upon working out the physical details of the theory itself. He had immediate success. (Walker 1934) One of his important conclusions was that other authors, specifically McVittie and Robertson, were wrong to conclude that the physics of Milne's theory ultimately corresponded to relativistic cosmology: “Milne's system is fundamentally different from that of general relativity.” (Walker 1934 p. 489; emphasis in original)

4.5 How to Choose Among Theories and Philosophies?

In an important review of the entire confused situation between kinematic relativity and relativistic cosmology, McVittie confessed that “experimentally it seems hopeless to discriminate between them…at present the choice is almost entirely a matter of personal taste.” (McVittie 1934 p. 29) At almost the same time, de Sitter took on Milne in serious fashion. (deSitter 1934) Responding to Milne's methodological challenge, he showed that, indeed, it is possible to formulate relativistic cosmology in axiomatic fashion, just as Milne had formulated kinematic relativity “from concepts.” But de Sitter explicitly rejected Milne's philosophical use of the cosmological principle, “which asserts that statistically the world pictures of two different observers must be the same.” His objection is founded on the matter-of-fact that “we have, however, no means of communicating with other observers, situated on faraway stars, or moving with excessive velocities.” (deSitter 1934 p. 598) So much for rational principles as hypotheses!

The year in cosmology ended almost as confused as it had begun, with one exception: Milne had gotten much clearer about his philosophical views, and was applying them to an exhaustive presentation of his cosmology, theory and philosophy. His book Relativity, Gravitation and World Structure (Milne 1935) would be published in just a few months.

5. The Triumph of Milne's Methods 1935-36.

The new year marked a sudden change. In short order, McCrea, Walker and Robertson succumbed to Milne's methodological recommendations: first, to carry out an operationalist paring of non-observational concepts, then, secondly, to embed the resulting minimalist concept set in an axiomatic hypothetical-deductive structure. Thus was the famous Robertson-Walker spacetime metric born.

5.1 McCrea, Walker and Robertson Adopt Milne's Methods

McCrea's effort operationalized the concept of “distance”, principally and originally by comparison of certain elements of Newtonian cosmology and de Sitter's axiomatized version of relativistic cosmology. (McCrea 1935) Walker's paper specifically eschewed use of “any indefinable concepts”, in particular, he did not assume that the “associated metric [of relativistic cosmology] has any a priori physical significance.” (Walker 1935) Robertson's article, the first of three, is the most important, both in its content, and in the signal it sends, namely, that one of the original mainstream relativistic cosmology proponents has adopted a major element of Milne's new philosophy for cosmology. (Robertson 1935) Robertson's conclusion exhibits this point clearly and explicitly:

We have examined, from the operational standpoint, the problem of determining the most general kinematical background suitable for an idealized universe in which the cosmological principle holds. Allowing the fundamental observers the use only of clocks and theodolites, and granting them the possibility of sending and receiving we have shown that for each given mode of motion x(t) there necessarily exists a quadratic line element which is invariant, in form as well as in fact, under transformation fqrom one fundamental observer to another. (Robertson 1935 p. 300)

Unlike de Sitter, Robertson accepts the cosmological principle, replete with its observers on far-separated particles. Moreover, as this statement shows, Robertson is intimately familiar with Milne's latest operationalist reduction: space is to be reduced to time measurements given by clock readings on signals exchanged between observers. Robertson gets this idea from Milne's book, which he had earlier reviewed (but which was only subsequently published) for Astrophysical Journal. (Robertson 1936)

5.2 But Eddington Scoffd…

Eddington disparages these same methods. In his scathing Nature review of Milne's book, he rejects Milne's hypothetico-deductivism, his cosmological principle, and, above all, his operationalism: “When I visit the Cavendish Laboratory, I do not find its occupants engaged in flashing light-signals at each other, but I find practically everyone employing rigid scales or their equivalent.” (Eddington 1935, p. 636) Whittaker's review was not so negative as Eddington's. (Whittaker 1935) While the senior physicist rejects Milne's operationalism and attacks upon the geometrical commitments of relativistic proponents, he is considerably more forgiving about Milne's hypothetico-deductivism, and even goes so far as to remark Milne's “brilliant record in astrophysical discovery.” Nonetheless, Milne's break with a tradition including at least “Einstein, de Sitter, Friedmann, LeMaître, Weyl, Eddington, H.P. Robertson and others” is to be regretted. (Whittaker 1935 p. 179) Perhaps, along with Eddington, Whittaker hopes that soon “Professor Milne will return to orthodoxy.” (Eddington 1935, p. 636)

But Whittaker's view on Milne must be put into the perspective he held on the whole ongoing debate. As he saw it

…a lively debate is in progress at the present moment between Sir Arthur Eddington and Dr Harold Jeffreys of Cambridge, Professor Milne of Oxford, Sir James Jeans, and Professor Dingle of the Imperial College, the subject being the respective shares of reason and observation in the discovery of the laws of nature. (Whittaker 1941, p. 160)

But lively debate is far too gentlemanly a description for what now occurred. After holding his ire somewhat in check for—as he saw it—already far too long, Dingle finally erupted.

6. Dingle's Denoument

Controversy over Milne and his philosophy reached a crescendo in mid-1937. Dingle, his stew having finally boiled over, wrote privately to the editor of Nature, first castigating the rampant cosmological ‘mysticism’ passing itself off for science, and then offering to produce an article taking the sword to the mystics themselves. His offer was immediately accepted. The result was Dingle's notorious “Modern Aristotelianism”, a polemical diatribe chiefly against Milne, but aimed as well at Eddington and Dirac on account of their “betrayal” of the scientific method of Newton and his fellow members of the Royal Society. (Dingle 1937)

6.1 Modern Aristotles?

The article is remarkable both for its style and for its content. Dingle's style in the article is vituperative. Thus, emotionally-loaded terms such as “paralysis of reason,” “intoxication of the fancy,” “‘Universe’ mania”, and the like frequently appear, these to be topped only by references to “delusions,” “traitors,” and, of course, “treachery,” each associated with one or more of the guilty parties. (Dingle 1937, p. 786)

Above and beyond his extreme language, Dingle makes certain substantive claims bearing directly upon central philosophical questions. The issue, as he sees it, is nothing more than the question “Whether the foundation of science shall be observation or invention” (Dingle 1937, p. 786). As always, talk about ‘foundations’ is philosophical talk. The two opposing positions Dingle here calls “foundational” involve views on both method and epistemology, suitably tangled together. Dingle delineates the opposed alternatives as follows. The way of true science, he claims, shows that “the first step in the study of Nature should be sense observation, no general principles being admitted which are not derived by induction therefrom.” (Dingle 1937, p. 784) Stated more explicitly, Dingle here argues that authentic science is empiricist in epistemology (scientific knowledge is founded in sensory observation), and inductivist in method (general principles are reached via inductive logic). Opposed to this view, he argues, is “the doctrine that Nature is the visible working-out of general principles known to the human mind apart from sense perception.” (Dingle 1937, p.787) As representative of this latter view Dingle cites Milne, and refers in particular to Milne's claim that “it is, in fact, possible to derive the laws of dynamics rationally…without recourse to experience.” (Milne 1937, p. 329) Obviously, Dingle is here arguing against the view, Milne's view, that authentic science may be rationalist in epistemology (scientific knowledge is founded in pure theoretical reasoning apart from sense perception), and hypothetico-deductive in method (general principles are justified by their deductively implying correct observations).

Along with Milne, Dingle indicts Eddington, and, by implication, Dirac, all three of whom, Dingle believes, are guilty of inventing scientific hypotheses by free mental imaginings rather than by strict immersion in observations and observational data.

6.2 Dingle as ‘True Believer’

What is going on here? Put bluntly, Dingle is an old-fashioned empiricist and inductivist. He believes that the only way to do true science is to first collect data, then, and only then, to hypothesize on the basis of that data. Observation, then hypothesis. As he sees it, Eddington, Milne and Dirac have got it exactly backwards. They first (as he terms it) assume an hypothesis, then, and only then, go about collecting data. Except, according to his lights, the data isn't ever collected: “to [the Aristotelians'] modern representatives it seems as though a fancy is no sooner in the head than it is on paper and sent for publication.” (Dingle 1937, p. 785) Obviously Dingle is simply wrong; it never occurred to his opponents that hypotheses would not be followed immediately by attempts at deductive prediction of observational consequences. But it was enough, in Dingle's mind, that they didn't use induction, for them to come under blame.

6.3 Wrong from the Very Start

But there is something else at work here as well. Dingle doesn't object solely to his opponents' lack of inductive logic. Of equal importance is the fact that they find the source of their hypotheses in fairly general principles, wide-ranging rational proposals about the structure of the universe at large. These principles Dingle takes to be a priori, in the most pejorative sense of that term. They are phantasms, “chimeras” he calls them, which seduce the imaginations of his opponents, and lead them and their dumb-struck admirers away from the genuine, authentic method of science. This is what really sticks in Dingle's craw. In turn, Eddington, Milne and Dirac are chastised, each for something slightly different, but at bottom the same, namely, they one and all “appear as a victim of the great ‘Universe’ mania.” (Dingle 1937, p. 786) In the end, Dingle believes, the danger of this new ‘methodology’ is real, and serious. As he notes in conclusion:

Nor are we dealing with a mere skin disease which time itself will heal. Such ailments are familiar enough; every age has its delusions and every cause its traitors. But the danger here is radical. Our leaders themselves are bemused, so that treachery can pass unnoticed and even think itself fidelity. It is the noblest minds that are o'erthrown…the very council of the elect can violate its charter and think it is doing science service. (Dingle 1937, p. 786)

Here Dingle obviously goes over the top. Yet overblown as it is, there is no doubting his sincerity: Milne and the other cosmologists have betrayed the true science bequeathed them by their ancestors in the Royal Society.

How could Dingle be answered?

6.4 The Debate Goes Very Public

The response arrived three months later, on 12 June. On this particular Saturday in June, Nature published a fifteen-page special supplement as No. 3528. Contained within were contributions from sixteen “representative investigators”, as the editor referred to them, each responding to “Modern Aristotelianism” Nature's Editor, R.A. Gregory, introduces the occasion by noting that “in Nature of May 8, we published an article by Dr. Herbert Dingle entitled ‘Modern Aristotelianism’”. Because the article, as Gregory goes on to say, “created considerable interest”, Nature “decided to invite further contributions on the subject from a number of representative investigators.”

“Created considerable interest” is, to understate the issue, an understatement. Some of the contributors were quite obviously livid with rage and other volatile emotions. Others, such as Milne himself, who had come in for particularly scathing criticism in Dingle's article, were patient and careful in rebuttal. Each of the sixteen contributors to the special article chose a side in the controversy, either pro Dingle's inductive empiricism, and con Milne et al.'s rationalist hypothetico-deductivism, or vice versa. Remarks made by the participants exhibit the full diversity of philosophy of science in their contemporary community. Dingle's views, in particular, were not without favor.

Harold Jeffreys, F.R.S., noted geologist and astronomer, and author of a well-regarded philosophy of science book Scientific Inference (1957), led off with a nice ad hominem: “Without using induction, Milne and Eddington could not order their lives for a day, and what they are really asserting is that they are entitled to use special axioms in physics, for which no need has been shown.” Jeffreys' criticism here of course ignores the role of deductive observations in justifying the “special” axioms. The problem, as Jeffreys sees it, originates in the perpetrators' “belief that there is some special virtue in mathematics.” L.N.G. Filon, F.R.S., vice-chancellor of the University of London agrees on this point, noting that “some men of science appear to think that they can solve the whole problem of Nature by some all-inclusive mathematical intuition.” R.A. Sampson, the Astronomer Royal, focusses upon the rationalistic aspects of the ‘modern Aristotelians’, to wit, for their “framing a theory independent of experience, such as is denounced in Dr. Dingle's article”, which produces work not unlike that “of a poet or other humanist, who gives us at most a number of illustrative cases.”

6.5 The Counterattack

But Milne, Eddington, and Dirac had their supporters as well. N.R. Campbell, whose theory of science was already well-known, makes an uncontroversial interpretation of the affair. “Science” he begins, “(or at least physics) has long consisted of two distinct but complementary activities”, one of which is experimental and empirical; “its procedure is induction.” The other activity attempts to provide explanations of scientific laws, which explanations have the “pecularity” that “they often (not always) predict new laws in addition to explaining old ones.” Campbell cannot resist ending on an ad hominem of his own: “If he [Dingle] does not deem it important to observe the distinction between what is and what is not demonstrable experiment, surely he should welcome a movement to amalgamate the Royal with the Aristotelian Society.” Indeed.

G.J. Whitrow, then a young lecturer at Christ Church, Oxford, returns to the mathematical theme. Dingle, he argues, “not only attacks the particular methods adopted by contemporary mathematical investigators in relativistic cosmology, but even refuses to admit that this subject is worthy of scientific investigation as it is based not only on experience but also on reason.” Hypotheses, by this light, may originate rationalistically as well as any other way, certainly there is no problem with this.

6.6 The Coolest Voice

The clearest, most temperate discription of the issues at hand is given by young cosmologist William McCrea, then professor of mathematics at Queen's, Belfast, and editor of the R.A.S.'s Observatory. Not to be outdone by Jeffreys, McCrea begins with an ad hominem of his own: “Dr. H. Dingle's objection to ‘modern Aristotelianism’ seems to be itself what he would call Aristotelian rather than Galilean.” In other words, Dingle raises a non-empirical objection about Milne et al.'s non-empiricism! But McCrea soon gets to the heart of the matter, the role of hypothetico-deductivism in mathematical physics:

What Dr. Dingle has done is to reopen the question of the relation of mathematical physics to experimental physics, since he claims to detect a new and perverted point of view in the former. Now a system of mathematical physics, apart from the alleged perversion, is the working out of the mathematical consequences of certain hypotheses. The worth of the theory is judged…by the closeness of the agreement of its predictions with the results of observation, and also the number of phenomena which it can so predict from the one set of hypotheses. The scientific attitude is, not to cavil at the attempt, but to see if it is successful.

This is an absolutely standard interpretation of how the H-D method works. Throughout his own writings, beginning right from his inaugural lecture in Oxford (Milne 1929), Milne had subscribed to precisely the same interpretation of the Hypothetico-Deductive (H-D) method. Whatever the controversy is about, the issue is not how to interpret hypothetico-deductivism. That much is evident.

Moreover, it is quite clear that Dingle et al. are not mounting opposition to something we, today, would consider philosophically radical; rather, they are objecting to what, today, would be considered completely unobjectionable. Given today's acceptance of the H-D method, yet its rejection by otherwise well-regarded scientists at that time, it seems to follow that it was, at least in part, this debate and its followup which settled the issue. In any case, Dingle and his supporters generally went silent, restricting their activities for the most part to books, or relatively positive statements of their own positions. (A.D.R. 1938, Dingle 1938) Things settled down, just in time for the War.

7. The Calm Between the Storms

During the next several years, it became evident that Milne's methods, and kinematic relativity as well, had reached respectability. One important sign of this progress was exhibited at an early 1939 joint meeting between the Royal Astronomical Society and the Physical Society of London, The meeting had as its goal a thorough review of the situation in cosmology. McVittie was chosen to present the observational situation; his report was soon published. (McVittie, 1939) Reviewing the theoretical situation was George Temple, one of the most highly respected mathematicians of the time. Temple's report saw print almost immediately. (Temple 1939) Within a short time, Temple's paper took on the role of successor to Robertson's definitive 1933 “Relativistic Cosmology.” (Robertson 1933b)

7.1 Two Equal Competitors

Both McVittie and Temple presented kinematic relativity and relativistic cosmology as equal competitors in accounting for the cosmological observations. Unfortunately, as McVittie noted, observations could not, at that time, discriminate between the two theories. Temple's analysis of Milne's work praises its simplicity and elegance, and refers in particular to its operationalism and axiomatization, which “start from a completely novel discussion of the correlation of measurements made by different observers in terms of light signals only.” (Temple 1939, p. 468) Throughout the rest of his discussion of the two theories, Temple utilizes Milne's light-signal correlation method, explicitly rejecting rigid-rod transport for distance measurement. Milne's methods have triumphed.

Later that year McCrea publishes an important paper in Philosophy of Science. (McCrea 1939) Put most simply, the paper starts out to defend Milne's methods, but ends up by presenting a full-blown and interesting, although quite unhistorical, account of the evolution and structure of physical theories.

7.2 The Origin and Evolution of Theories

McCrea's overall view is that theories are set up to be hypothetico-deductive in structure. His account is based on his view of the evolution of theories of space-time and mechanics, beginning with Newton, through the General Theory of Relativity and ending in kinematic relativity. His argument reduces to the claim that, insofar as Milne and e.g., Newton, can be shown to follow the same procedure, any attack upon Milne is also an attack upon Newton. First, he states his goals in the paper.

The first goal is to emphasise how each theory leaves us in a position in which the succeeding one appears as a perfectly natural next step in the development of ideas. (McCrea 1939, p. 137) McCrea embeds this argument in an account of how analogue models (à la Campbell) are used to set up new theories—this is essentially an account of how discovery might proceed in linking an older theory with its successor.The second goal is to show how, in spite of superficial differences in character, the theories in question all necessarily possess the same general structure constituted by the presence of hypotheses, from which certain general mathematical relations are deduced, which in their turn are used to predict relations between observable quantities. As McCrea notes, “this study may claim an interest of its own, but it is presented also for a further reason” namely, that

it has been contended [by Dingle, most especially] that theories like Milne's represent a fundamentally new outlook on the part of some theorists, in that such theories are purely mental constructs divorced from experince of the physical world. We shall see that on the contrary Milne's theory is easily brought into line with the others in such a way that this criticism is neither more nor less true of it than of the rest. (McCrea 1939, p. 138)

In McCrea's discussion of the theories he asserts that “the consituents [of the theories themselves] which are of physical significance are sets of mathematical relations, coupled with sets of rules of interpretation” which yield, “after observational test, descriptions rather than explanations of physical phenomena.” According to McCrea, one real advantage of his view is that it “leads to simple criteria for comparing the merits of different theories.” Finally, on the metaphysics of the original hypotheses, McCrea claims that “the initial hypotheses from which the mathematical relations are deduced do not ultimately have any direct physical significance.”

McCrea's paper, published in the leading philosophy of science journal of the time, is the final imprimateur on Milne's views.

7.3 Milne's Ultimate Success

Three years later, Milne was awarded the James Scott prize, the most prestigious award for ‘natural philosophy’ in the Anglophone world. Milne's lecture title is telling: “Fundamental Concepts of Natural Philosophy.” (Milne 1943) Although Milne does concede to Dingle that he no longer believes that it is possible to deduce physics completely in the absence of reference to phenomena, for the most part his award lecture is a long reiteration of his previous twelve years' work in cosmology.

One year later, Milne received his ultimate accolade, election as president of the Royal Astronomical Society. In his inaugural lecture, Milne again reviews his work, but adds two remarks of interest. First, he modifies his earlier view that theories are acceptable solely on the basis of their successful predictive power; to this, he now adds that a theory cannot be accepted as satisfactory unless it is philosophically satisfying. (Milne 1943, p. 120) Secondly, on a personal note, he admits that he is still amazed at the outcry that his theory and its philosophy caused. Milne here is being a bit disingenuous. In many places in his letters he not only recognizes the outcry, he delights in it, and seeks to provoke it even more. (Milne 1932-37, 12 May 35; 28 Jul 36)

From this point onward, cosmology's philosophy is no longer directly influenced by Milne himself. Moreover, kinematic relativity began to stagnate as a research programme; except for Whitrow, Milne had no new students, and failed to attract any new converts to the theory. His work was done. But his philosophical influence didn't end, in fact it wasn't to crest until the end of the 40s in the work of another man, Hermann Bondi. Again, however, a storm was generated by Milne's methods, even though they were now in the hands of another.

8. Steady-state Cosmology

In 1948, a young mathematician, Herman Bondi, in concert with two close friends Thomas Gold and Fred Hoyle, proposed a radical new cosmological theory, the Steady State theory. This theory differs from the basic picture shared by both kinematic relativity and relativistic cosmology, namely, that of a universe with a definite origin in a small, dense knot, followed by evolution into the universe we have today. According to Bondi's theory, the universe as far back into the past as we might look would always look the same; there was no evolution, there could be no “fossils”, as Bondi called putative evidence of a universe different in the past from our present one. What we observe today is the same state of a universe that has been and always will be steady. Bondi came to his notion of the steady state primarily from his commitment to the philosophical components of Milne's work, most especially the methodology of rationalism plus hypothetico-deductivism; additionally, Bondi coupled to these Milnean notions some ideas taken directly from the philosophy of Karl Popper.

8.1 Bondi's Philosophical Origins

Bondi reveals his philosophical commitments in several ways. First, he argues against induction and extrapolation from small-scale experiment, that is, against the inductive empiricism of Dingle et al. Secondly, he argues in favor of hypothesis and deduction, that is, in favor of Milne et al. Finally, he specifically remarks the excellence of Milne's Methods, and the theory—kinematic relativity—created therefrom, and remarks the significance of these elements in the creation of his version of the new steady-state cosmology.

From the very beginning Bondi admits the validity of both positions in the methodological debate:

In particular, there are two important approaches to the subject [cosmology] so different from each other that it is hardly surprising that they lead to different answers...The contrast between the ‘extrapolating’ and the ‘deductive’ attitudes to cosmology is very great indeed. (Bondi 1960), p. 3-5)

The extrapolating approach, which Bondi sometimes calls the empirical school, is represented by Dingle, McVittie, and their colleagues. Opposed to the extrapolative approach is the deductive approach, which “is reached from investigations in the borderland between physics and philosophy.” Milne is obviously the major proponent of this view. Although Bondi finds good points in both approaches, he also finds problems in both approaches. In the end, cosmology is the worse for excesses from either end of the spectrum:

Just as some adherents of the ‘empirical’ school tend to regard cosmology as a testing ground for their extrapolations and as a legitimate playground for the geometers, so some adherents of the deductive approach appear to regard cosmology as a purely logical subject. (Bondi 1960, p. 7)

In this latter case, the deductive extremists, in their mathematical zeal, seem to forget that cosmology, after all, should have some relation to observation: “To them all that is of interest in a theory is its logical character, not its relevance to the interpretation of observational data.” Obviously, this danger must be avoided: according to Bondi, deductivism can be a scientific approach in cosmology only if its postulates (or axioms) are candidates for disproof.

8.2 Enter Popper

Clearly, with this reference to the connection between science and disproof, Bondi has added a distinctly Poppererian element to the deductivist methodology, one which had not previously appeared in the works of any of the earlier members of the hypothetico-deductive school. According to Popper's philosophy of science, a theory can legitimately be called “scientific” only if that theory makes a prediction that, in principle, can be shown to be false, or falsified, to use Popper's own term. Thus astrology, for example, fails to be a scientific theory because it cannot be falsified: although astrology seems to make predictions, these statements about the future are so vague, so general and abstract, that they cannot be tied down to definite claims about observations to be made at a definite time and place. Hence there is no explicit observation to be made in falsification. Astronomy, in comparison, makes explicit, specific predictions about what will occur in the sky on such-and-such a date, in such-and-such a place. If the prediction fails, then we know that the element of astronomical theory which made the prediction is deficient, maybe even false.

Cosmology is a borderline case: since observations of cosmological significance are so rare and hard-won—Hubble's observation of the red shift was one of the first solid ones—it is very difficult, not to mention brave, to tie one's cosmological theory to Popper's falsificationist principle as a guarantee of scientific acceptability. But this is exactly what Bondi did.

Much later Bondi was to make explicit his debt to Popper:

I think the person from whom we had most help on the philosophical side was Popper. His analysis of science encouraged one to be imaginative, and encouraged one to go for something that was very rigid and therefore empirically disprovable. (Bondi 1990, p. 194)

8.3 But It's Milne In the End

Yet Bondi's major philosophical debt was to Milne. According to Bondi, Milne's theory was through and through deductive, which was reason enough for some of his colleagues to condemn it:

The aim of this discipline [= kinematic relativity] is to deduce as much as possible merely from the cosmological principle and the basic properties of space, time and the propagation of light. The beauty of this, as indeed of any deductive theory, rests on the rigour of the arguments and the small number of the axioms required...When the theory was first developed it met with great hostility and was criticized very severely, often unjustly, and sometimes frivolously. (Bondi 1960), p. 123)

In addition to his admiration of Milne's H-D methodology, Bondi has high praise as well for Milne's operationalism, particularly its use in defining distance:

Imperfect as Milne's definition of distance may be, it is very much better than the ‘rigid ruler’ one used in most other theories…Milne's definition of distance, by no means perfect as it is, is probably the best yet devised. (Bondi 1960, p. 126-9)

In the end, Bondi sums up Milne's contributions with no uncertain praise:

The foregoing brief description will have indicated the remarkable success of kinematic relativity in attempting to use the cosmological principle not only for the construction of the substratum but as chief guide in formulating ordinary physics. In this respect it differs greatly from all other cosmologies which either rely on a conventionally obtained body of physics or have not yet succeeded in drawing conclusions of local interest from the cosmological principle. (Bondi 1960, p. 136)

8.4 Return of the Cosmological Principle

Here Bondi speaks of Milne's cosmological principle. According to Milne's principle, every observer in the universe should get the same world picture, that is, should make precisely the same observations of the universe at the same moment as any other observer. (Milne 1934b) Uniformity over spatial slices is guaranted by Milne's invoking of the principle. Yet Milne's universe evolves, it changes its form over time. Hence it has no temporal uniformity. Bondi felt that this raised the possibility that physics itself might change over time. Because of this risk, Bondi generalized Milne's cosmological principle into what he called the perfect cosmological principle [=PCP]. According to this principle, all observers at all places and at all times will look out upon the same unchanging, unevolving, universe. Such a universe is a universe in a steady-state—hence the name.

Clearly, PCP is a daring, indeed heroic, interpretation of a methodological necessity. Forty years after the fact, Bondi described the “philosophical attitude” which underlay his “implausible” PCP:

But the essential point of the philosophy was and is that if the universe was evolving and changing, then there is no reason to trust what we call the laws of physics, established by experiments performed here and now, to have permanent validity. (Bondi 1990, p. 192)

Hence, or so Bondi's argument goes, since there is reason not to trust the laws of physics if the universe is evolving, let us presume that the universe is not evolving and changing; that is, let us presume PCP. Although the principle (and the theory which results from it—steady state cosmology) is, as McVittie remarked, “much more restrictive than general relativity”; (McVittie 1990, p. 45) it is this very restrictiveness which satisfies Bondi's Popperian wishes:

For the correct argument has always been that the steady state model was the one that could be disproved most easily by observation, Therefore, it should take precedence over other less disprovable ones until it has been disproved. (Bondi and Kilmister 1959, p. 55-6)

In another place, Bondi makes a similar point: “Comparison with observation becomes then possible and renders the PCP liable to observational disproof. This possibility of a clear-cut disproof establishes the scientific status of PCP.” (Bondi 1957, p. 198) Comments such as this make clear Bondi's committment to a Popperian addition to the basic deductive methodology he inherited from Milne.

8.5 A Popperian Conclusion

In the end, the philosophical purity of Bondi's steady state theory served him, and cosmology, well. Of course, the usual suspect, Dingle, and others of his ilk, such as McVittie in particular, were outraged, and loudly, at Bondi's extension of Milne's methods. A passage from Dingle's R.A.S. Presidential Address suffices to show the tenor of the debate's declining days:

Even idle speculation may not be quite valueless if it is recognized for what it is. If the new cosmologists would observe this proviso, calling a spade a spade and not a perfect agricultural principle, one's only cause for regret would be that such great talents were spent for so little profit. (Dingle 1953, p. 404)

But PCP and the theory which it engendered were exactly as described: eminently falsifiable. No matter the extent of Dingle et al's disdain, Steady State theory stayed right out in front, ready for whatever empirical observations might be slung at it. As Bondi said “Show me some fossils from an evolving universe, and I'll give it up.” In 1965, the fossils arrived, courtesy of the observations of the 3° K remnant microwave radiation.

And Bondi, true to his philosophy, gave it up.


Other Internet Resources

At this time there are few if any internet sites devoted to the history and philosophy of modern cosmology. What is typically available is information relating to cosmology within the history of astronomy, or presentations about contemporary cosmology. The URLs given below are the best sources for history of cosmology; there are no known sites relating to the philosophy of modern cosmology.

Related Entries

epistemology | general relativity: early philosophical interpretations of | induction: new problem of | induction: problem of | metaphysics | Popper, Karl | rationalism vs. empiricism | science, philosophy of | scientific method | space and time: inertial frames