Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri Oct 13, 2006

A citizen is a member of a political community who enjoys the rights and assumes the duties of membership. This broad definition is discernible, with minor variations, in the works of contemporary authors as well as in the entry “citoyen” in Diderot's and d'Alembert's Encyclopédie [1753].[1] Notwithstanding this common starting-point and certain shared references,[2] the differences between 18th century discussions and contemporary debates are significant. The encyclopédiste's main preoccupation, understandable for one living in a monarchy, was the relationship between the concepts ‘citizen’ and ‘subject’. Were they the same (as Hobbes asserted) or contradictory (as a reading of Aristotle suggested)?[3] This issue is less central today as we tend to take for granted that a liberal democratic regime is the appropriate starting-point for our reflections. This does not mean, however, that the concept has become uncontroversial. After a rather long period of relative calm, there has been a dramatic upsurge in philosophical interest in citizenship since the early 1990s.[4]

Two broad challenges have led theorists to re-examine the concept: first, the need to acknowledge the internal diversity of contemporary liberal democracies; second, the pressures wrought by globalization on the territorial, sovereign state. We will focus on each of these two challenges, examining how they have led to new discussions and disagreements.

The entry has three principal sections. The first examines the main dimensions of citizenship (legal, political, identity) and sees how they are instantiated in very different ways within the two dominant models: the republican and the liberal. The feminist critique of the private/public distinction, central to both models, serves as a bridge to the entry's second part. It focuses upon two important debates about the implications of social and cultural pluralism to conceptions of citizenship: first, should they recognize, rather than transcend, difference and, if so, does this recognition affect citizenship's purported role in strengthening social cohesion? Second, how are we to understand the relation between citizenship and nationality under conditions of pluralism? The entry's final section discusses the challenges which globalisation poses to theories of citizenship. These theories have long taken for granted the idea that citizenship's necessary context is the sovereign, territorial state. This premise is being increasingly contested by those who question the state's right to determine who is accepted as a member and/or claim that citizenship can be meaningful beyond the boundaries of the nation-state.

1. Dimensions of citizenship

1.1 Definitions

The concept of citizenship is composed of three main elements or dimensions (Cohen 1999; Kymlicka and Norman 2000; Carens 2000). The first is citizenship as legal status, defined by civil, political and social rights. Here, the citizen is the legal person free to act according to the law and having the right to claim the law's protection. It need not mean that the citizen takes part in the law's formulation, nor does it require that rights be uniform between citizens. The second considers citizens specifically as political agents, actively participating in a society's political institutions. The third refers to citizenship as membership in a political community that furnishes a distinct source of identity.

In many ways, the identity dimension is the least straightforward of the three. Authors tend to include under this heading many different things related to identity, both individual and collective, and social integration.[5] Arguably, this is inescapable since citizens' subjective sense of belonging, sometimes called the “psychological” dimension of citizenship (Carens 2000, 166),[6] necessarily affects the strength of the political community's collective identity. If enough citizens display a robust sense of belonging to the same political community, social cohesion is obviously strengthened. However, since many other factors can impede or encourage it, social integration should be seen as an important goal (or problem[7]) that citizenship aims to achieve (or resolve), rather than as one of its elements. As we will see, one crucial test for any conception of citizenship is whether or not it can be said to contribute to social integration.

Relations between the three dimensions are complex: the rights a citizen enjoys will partly define the range of available political activities while explaining how citizenship can be a source of identity by strengthening her sense of self-respect (Rawls 1972, 544). A strong civic identity can itself motivate citizens to participate actively in their society's political life. That distinct groups within a state do not share the same sense of identity towards ‘their’ political community (or communities) can be a reason to argue in favour of a differentiated allocation of rights (Carens 2000, 168–173).

As we will see, differences between conceptions of citizenship centre around four disagreements: over the precise definition of each element (legal, political and identity); over their relative importance; over the causal and/or conceptual relations between them; over appropriate normative standards.

1.2 Two models of citizenship: republican and liberal

Discussions about citizenship usually have, as their point of reference, one of two models: the republican or the liberal. The republican model's sources can be found in the writings of authors like Aristotle, Tacitus, Cicero, Machiavelli, Harrington and Rousseau, and in distinct historical experiences: from Athenian democracy and Republican Rome to the Italian city-states and workers' councils.

The key principle of the republican model is civic self-rule, embodied in classical institutions and practices like the rotation of offices, underpinning Aristotle's characterization of the citizen as one capable of ruling and being ruled in turn. Citizens are, first and foremost, “those who share in the holding of office” (Aristotle 1958, 1275a8). Civic self-rule is also at the heart of Rousseau's project in the Contrat Social: it is their co-authoring of the laws via the general will that makes citizens free and laws legitimate.[8] Active participation in processes of deliberation and decision-making ensures that individuals are citizens, not subjects.[9] In essence, the republican model emphasizes the second dimension of citizenship, that of political agency.

The liberal model's origins are traceable to the Roman Empire and early-modern reflections on Roman law (Walzer 1989, 211). The Empire's expansion resulted in citizenship rights being extended to conquered peoples, profoundly transforming the concept's meaning. Citizenship meant being protected by the law rather than participating in its formulation or execution. It became an “important but occasional identity, a legal status rather than a fact of everyday life” (Walzer 1989, 215). The focus here is obviously the first dimension: citizenship is primarily understood as a legal status rather than as a political office. It now “denotes membership in a community of shared or common law, which may or may not be identical with a territorial community” (Pocock 1995, 37). The Roman experience shows that the legal dimension of citizenship is potentially inclusive and indefinitely extensible.

The liberal tradition, which developed from the 17th century onwards, understands citizenship primarily as a legal status: political liberty is important as a means to protecting individual freedoms from interference by other individuals or the authorities themselves. But citizens exercise these freedoms primarily in the world of private associations and attachments, rather than in the political domain.

At first glance, the two models present us with a clear set of alternatives: citizenship as a political office or a legal status; central to an individual's sense of self or as an “occasional identity”. The citizen appears either as the primary political agent or as an individual whose private activities leave little time or inclination to engage actively in politics, entrusting the business of law-making to representatives. If the liberal model of citizenship dominates contemporary constitutional democracies, the republican critique of the private citizen's passivity and insignificance is still alive and well.

Republicans have problems of their own. First and foremost is a concern, often repeated since Benjamin Constant, that their ideal has become largely obsolete in the changed circumstances of the “grands États modernes” (Constant 1988).  Aiming to realize the original republican ideal in the present context would be a disaster, as was the Jacobins' attempt during the French revolution (Walzer 1989, 211). Today's citizens will not be Romans: first, the scale and complexity of modern states seem to preclude the kind of civic engagement required by the republican model. If an individual's chances of having an impact as an active citizen are close to nil, then it makes more sense for him to commit himself to non-political activities, be they economic, social or familial. His identity as citizen is not central to his sense of self and politics is only one of his many interests (Constant 1988, 316). Second, the heterogeneity of modern states does not allow the kind of “moral unity” and mutual trust that has been projected onto the ancient polis, qualities deemed necessary to the functioning of republican institutions (Walzer 1989, 214). But if ancient virtue is irrecoverable, the republican model may still act today as “a benchmark that we appeal to when assessing how well our institutions and practices are functioning”(Miller 2000, 84). In essence, this involves a reformulation of the model, questioning some of its original premises while holding onto the ideal of the citizen as an active political agent.

Instead of opposing the two models, we could reasonably see them as complementary. Political liberty, as Constant pointed out, is the necessary guarantee of individual liberty. Echoing Constant, Michael Walzer considers that the two conceptions “go hand in hand” since “the security provided by the authorities cannot just be enjoyed; it must itself be secured, and sometimes against the authorities themselves. The passive enjoyment of citizenship requires, at least intermittently, the activist politics of citizens” (Walzer 1989, 217). There are times when individuals need only be “private citizens” and others when they must become “private citizens” (Ackermann 1988). But can we expect passive spectators of political life to become active citizens should the need arise? This is no easy question and may explain why Constant ended his famous essay by insisting that the regular exercise of political liberty is the surest means of moral improvement, opening citizens' minds and spirits to the public interest, and to the importance of defending their freedoms. Such habituation underpins their capacity and willingness to protect their liberties and the institutions that support them (Constant 1988, 327–328).[10]

1.3 The feminist critique

Since the 1970s, feminist theorists have sharply criticized the republican and liberal models' shared assumption of a rigid separation between the private and the public spheres. Their critique has provided the impetus to the development of alternative conceptions of politics and citizenship.

In its classical formulation, the republican conception sees the public/political sphere as the realm of liberty and equality: it is there that free, male citizens engage with their peers and deliberate over the common good, deciding what is just or unjust, advantageous or harmful (Aristotle 1958, 1253a11). The political space must be protected from the private sphere, defined as the domain of necessity and inequality, where the material reproduction of the polis is secured. Women, associated with the ‘natural world’ of reproduction, are denied citizenship and relegated to the household.

Feminists have criticized this rigid division as mythical since both the separation itself and the radically unequal conception of the household that it presupposed “were clearly the outcome of political decisions made in the public sphere” (Okin 1992, 60). If the division ostensibly made it possible for citizens to engage with each other as equals, feminists doubt whether it ever was the ideal way of achieving this goal. Hence Susan Okin's question to republicans: “Which is likely to produce better citizens, capable of acting as each other's equals? Having to deal with things part of the time — even the ‘mundane’ things of daily life? Or treating most people as things?” (Okin 1992, 64–65). An egalitarian family is a much more fertile ground for equal citizens than one organized like a school for despotism (J.S. Mill); if this means that the political space cannot remain insulated from the world of things, there's no great loss.

The liberal model, for its part, gives primacy to the private sphere. Political liberty is seen in instrumental terms: the formal rights of individuals secure the private sphere from outside interference, allowing the free pursuit of their particular interests (Dietz 1998, 380–81). But the neutral language of Lockean egalitarian individualism hides the reality of women's subjection: “woman's sphere” can be read as “male property” since wives are described as naturally subordinated to their husbands. Here as well, the division between private and public has prevented women from gaining access to the public (Pateman 1989, 120; Dietz 1998, 380–81; Okin 1991, 118).

Since the public and private “are, and always have been, inextricably connected” (Okin 1992,69), the upshot of the feminist critique is not simply to make models of citizenship inclusive by recognizing that women are individuals or to acknowledge that they too can be citizens. Rather, we must see how laws and policies structure personal circumstances (e.g. laws about rape and abortion, child-care policies, allocation of welfare benefits, etc.) and how some ‘personal problems' have wider significance and can only be solved collectively through political action (Pateman 1989, 131). This does not make the distinction irrelevant and the categories collapsible. But it does mean that the boundaries between public and private should be seen as a social construction subject to change and contestation and that their hierarchical characterization should be resisted.

If we discard the abstractions that characterize both the classical and the liberal conceptions, the citizen sheds his “political lion skin” (Pateman 1989, 92 quoting Marx 1967) and appears as “situated” in a social world characterized by differences of gender, class, language, race, ethnicity, culture, etc. To accept that politics cannot and should not be insulated from private/social/economic life is not to dissolve the political, but, rather, to revive it since anything is as political as citizens choose to make it. As we will see now, this contextualized conception of the political has informed much of the criticism aimed at the universalist model of citizenship and has inspired the formulation of a differentialist alternative.

2. The challenge of internal diversity

2.1 Universalist vs differentialist conceptions of citizenship

The universalist or unitary model defines citizenship primarily as a legal status through which an identical set of civil, political and social rights are accorded to all members of the polity. T.H. Marshall's seminal essay “Citizenship and Social Class” is the main reference for this model, which became progressively dominant in post-World War II liberal democracies. Marshall's central thesis was that the 20th century's expansion of social rights was crucial to the working class's progressive integration in British society (Marshall 1950).[11] Similar stories were told in other Western democracies: the development of welfare policies aimed at softening the impact of unemployment, sickness and distress was fundamental to political and social stability. The apparent success of the post-war welfare state in securing social cohesion was a strong argument in favour of a conception of citizenship focused on the securing of equal civil, political and social rights.[12]

The universalist model was aggressively targeted at the end of the 1980s as the moral and cultural pluralism of contemporary liberal societies elicited increasing theoretical attention. Scepticism towards the universalist model was spurred by concerns that the extension of citizenship rights to groups previously excluded had not translated into equality and full integration, notably in the case of Afro-Americans and women (Young 1989; Williams 1998). A questioning of the causal relation assumed between citizenship as a uniform legal status and civic integration followed.

Critics argued that the model proves exclusionary if one interprets universal citizenship as requiring (a) the transcendence of particular, situated perspectives to achieve a common, general point of view and (b) the formulation of laws and policies that are difference-blind (Young 1989). The first requirement seems particularly odious once generality is exposed as a myth covering the majority's culture and conventions. The call to transcend particularity too often translates into the imposition of the majority perspective on minorities.  The second requirement may produce more inequality rather than less since the purported neutrality of difference-blind institutions often belies an implicit bias towards the needs, interests and identities of the majority group. This bias often creates specific burdens for members of minorities, i.e. more inequality.

Critics of this (failed) universalism have proposed an alternative conception of citizenship based on the acknowledgment of the political relevance of difference (cultural, gender, class, race, etc.). This means, first, the recognition of the pluralist character of the democratic public, composed of many perspectives, none of which should be considered a priori more legitimate. Second, it entails that, in certain cases at least, equal respect may justify differential treatment and the recognition of special minority rights.

Once these two points are conceded, the question becomes when, and for what reason, the recognition of particular rights is either justified or illegitimate. This discussion is necessarily context specific, focusing on concrete demands made by groups in particular circumstances, and shies away from easy generalizations. It has led to an array of publications covering issues ranging from the fate of ‘minorities within minorities' to how tolerant liberal societies should be of illiberal groups, etc.[13]

But the model of differentiated citizenship has generated its own share of criticisms and queries, particularly with regards to the overall effects of its implementation. Critics focus on its impact on the possibility of a common political practice. Consider Iris Young's vision of a heterogeneous public where participants start from their “situated positions” and attempt to construct a dialogue across differences. This dialogue requires participants to be ‘public-spirited’ — open to the claims of others and not single-mindedly self-interested. Unlike interest group pluralism, which does not require justifying one's interest as right or as compatible with social justice, participants are supposed to use deliberation to come to a decision that they determine to be best or more just (Young 1989, 267). While welcoming Young's conception of the democratic public, one may doubt that the policies and institutions associated with a differentiated model of citizenship would either motivate or enable citizens to engage in such dialogue.

This analysis is tied to a wider literature on the virtues required of citizens in pluralist liberal democracies and on ways to favour their development. Stephen Macedo (1990), William Galston (1991), and Eamonn Callan (1997), among others, have all emphasized the importance of public reasonableness. This virtue is defined as the ability to listen to others and formulate one's own position in a way that is sensitive to, and respectful of, the different experiences and identities of fellow citizens, acknowledging that these differences may affect political views. But how and where does one develop this and related virtue(s)? If a differentiated model of citizenship simply allows individuals and groups to retreat into their particular enclaves, how are they to develop either the motivation or the capacity to participate in a common forum?

One immediately understands political philosophers' renewed interest in education over the last twenty years. If we want citizens of diverse societies to develop the ‘right’ attitudes and dispositions, should we not encourage a common education, school them in a curriculum that teaches respect for difference, while providing the necessary skills for democratic discussion across these differences? If so, should we not resist demands for separate schools or dispensations for minorities? How flexible should public schools be towards minorities if the goal is to make them feel welcome and ensure that they do not retreat into parochial institutions? (Callan 1997; Gutmann 1999; Brighouse 2000, 2006)

Critics of differentiated citizenship have also argued that policies that break with difference-blind universalism can only weaken the integrative function of citizenship. If embracing multicultural and minority rights means that citizens lose their sense of collective belonging, it may also affect their willingness to compromise and make sacrifices for each other. Citizens may then develop a purely strategic attitude towards those of different backgrounds. As Joseph Carens puts it: “From this perspective, the danger of […] differentiated citizenship is that the emphasis [it] place[s] on the recognition and institutionalization of difference could undermine the conditions that make a sense of common identification and thus mutuality possible” (Carens 2000, 193). Critics of Aboriginal demands for self-government rights have pressed this concern with force (Cairns, 2000).

In addressing these and similar queries, Will Kymlicka and Wayne Norman have broadly distinguished between three types of demands: special representation rights (for disadvantaged groups), multicultural rights (for immigrant and religious groups) and self-government rights (for national minorities) (Kymlicka and Norman 1994; Kymlicka, 1995, 176–187). The first two are really demands for inclusion into mainstream society: special representation rights are best understood as (temporary) measures to alleviate the obstacles that minorities and/or historically disadvantaged groups face in having their voices heard in majoritarian democratic institutions. Reforming the electoral system to ensure the better representation of minorities may raise all sorts of difficult issues, but the aim is clearly integration into the larger political society, not isolation.

Similarly, the demands for multicultural rights made by immigrant groups are usually aimed either at exemption from laws and policies that disadvantage them because of their religious practices or at ensuring public support for particular education and/or cultural initiatives to maintain and transmit elements of their cultural and religious heritage. These should be seen as measures designed to facilitate their inclusion in the larger society rather than as a way to avoid integration.

According to Kymlicka and Norman, it is only claims to self-government rights, grounded in a principle of self-determination, that potentially endanger civic integration since their aim is not to achieve a greater presence in the institutions of the central government, but to gain a greater share of power and legislative jurisdiction for institutions controlled by national minorities: “While both representation and multicultural rights take the larger political community for granted and seek greater inclusion in it, demands for self-government reflect a desire to weaken the bonds with the larger community and, indeed, question its very nature, authority and permanence” (Kymlicka and Norman 1994, 375).

Addressing such demands through a simple reaffirmation of the ideal of common citizenship is not a serious option. It may only aggravate the alienation felt by members of these groups and feed into more radical political projects, including secession. Further, to say that recognition of self-government rights may weaken the bonds of the larger community is to suppose that these bonds exist in the first place and that a significant proportion of national minorities identify with the larger society. Yet such assumptions are often overly optimistic. If these bonds do not exist, or remain quite weak, what is needed is the construction of a genuine dialogue between the majority society and minorities over just relations, through which difference can be recognized. The hope is that such dialogue would strengthen, rather than weaken, their relationship by putting it on firmer moral and political grounds (Carens 2000, 197).

This broadly positive assessment of the effects of differentiated citizenship on civic integration has recently been questioned. On the one hand, left-leaning authors have complained that multicultural politics make egalitarian policies more difficult to achieve by diverting “political effort away from universalistic goals” and by undermining efforts to build a broadly based coalition supporting ambitious policies of redistribution (Barry 2001, 325). On the other hand, events like September 11, the killing of Dutch film director Theo Van Gogh and, most recently, the Mohammed cartoons affair have chilled the enthusiasm and led to something of a backlash against the recognition of multicultural rights. In particular, the belief that such demands are really demands for inclusion in the larger society has been thrown into doubt, notably in the case of Muslim immigrants. Increasingly wary, some European countries have introduced legislation aimed at better securing the integration of immigrants: by requiring minimal linguistic proficiency in the majority language as a condition of citizenship or by banning religious symbols from public schools. Such initiatives can only rekindle debate about what constitutes legitimate conditions of integration as opposed to the illegitimate imposition of the majority culture.

To allay fears about the supposed trade-off between cultural recognition and redistribution, supporters of multiculturalism cite the lack of empirical studies establishing a negative correlation between the adoption of multicultural policies and a robust welfare state (Kymlicka 2006, 7; Banting 2005). Further, claims that the push for multicultural policies diverts energies, time and resources from the struggle for redistributive policies assume that the pursuit of justice is zero-sum, seemingly a false generalization. On the contrary, it can be argued that: “the pursuit of justice in one dimension helps build a broader political culture that supports struggles for justice in other dimensions” (Kymlicka 2006, 18). In the same vein, to claim that paying attention to issues of cultural recognition tends to warp our sensitivity to economic injustice is to assume that we can only be sensitive to one dimension of injustice at a time. But it is equally plausible that sensitivity to a particular type of injustice may favour, rather than hinder, sensitivity to other injustices. Still, it is difficult not to agree with Anne Phillips' assessment that, in debates on democracy, there has been a tendency in the 1990s to focus either on political and cultural issues or on matters of social and economic concern. As she points out, there is a real need to reconnect reflections on socio-economic and political/cultural equality (Phillips 1999).

Supporters of multicultural rights are also responding to the changed climate surrounding multicultural demands of immigrant groups. Since worries centre over the ability and willingness of Muslim immigrants to integrate into Western liberal democracies, there has been a steady upsurge of interest in these groups. On an empirical level, there is a growing interest for research focusing on the particular challenges Europe faces in integrating Muslim minorities (e.g. history of colonization; importance of Muslim immigration as a proportion of total immigration; European unification, etc.) (Modood, Triandafyllidou, Zapata-Barrero, 2006; Klausen 2005). At a more theoretical level, there is a call to re-examine the complex relations between the secular liberal political cultures dominant in the West and religion, more particularly with regards to the difficult question of religion's place in the public sphere (Parekh 2006). It is critically important to give another look at the supposed ‘thinness' of contemporary liberalism and focus on what should be the basic elements of a common public culture to which all citizens could reasonably be expected to subscribe.

2.2 Liberal nationalists vs postnationalists

The debate between supporters and critics of differentiated citizenship centres on the model's supposed effect on civic integration. It is assumed that democratic citizenship, properly construed, can indeed function as a significant lever of integration. The idea is that citizenship as a set of civil, political and social rights and as a political practice can help generate desirable feelings of identity and belonging. This statement hides significant disagreement over how to characterize the relation between citizenship and nationality. Some consider that citizenship's capacity to fulfil its integrative function depends on, and feeds upon, the prior existence of a common nationality while others counter that, under conditions of pluralism, nationality cannot function as a suitable focus of allegiance and identity. The collective identity of modern democratic states should rather be based upon more abstract and universalistic political and legal principles that transcend cultural difference. This debate brings to the fore different assessments of the role that citizenship can play in contemporary societies characterized by a high degree of complexity and internal diversity.

Liberal nationalists like David Miller have argued that only specific forms of political practice can produce high levels of trust and loyalty between citizens (Miller 2000, 87). The political activities of the citizens of Athens or of Rousseau's ideal Republic presumed face-to-face relations of cooperation that favour the growth of such sentiments. The scale and complexity of modern states have made the kind of political practice envisaged by Rousseau and described by Aristotle at best marginal. Citizens do not meet under an oak tree to formulate the laws; they are basically strangers and citizens' involvement in the politics of representative democracies is episodic and diluted. Politics in this context cannot be expected to play a central role in most individuals' lives; something else must generate the trust and loyalty necessary to the functioning of a political community. Historically, it is the nation that has allowed large numbers of individuals to feel a sense of commonality, setting them apart from others and making solidarity among strangers possible.

Postnationalists do not dispute the key role played by the nation in making republican politics possible in large modern states. They agree that reference to a common nationality allowed the political mobilization of their inhabitants, calling on their shared descent, history or language. But democracy's association with the nation-state is contingent rather than necessary. And this, it is argued, means that democratic politics can, in principle, free itself from its historical moorings. Postnationalists claim that this dissociation is not only possible, but necessary for moral and pragmatic reasons (Habermas 1998, 132).

On the one hand, the balance sheet of the nation-state reveals a legacy of oppression of minority cultures within and cultural, political and economic imperialism outside its borders. On the other hand, the acknowledgment of the nation-state's (growing) internal diversity and sensitivity to the injustice of forced assimilation undermine its ability to continue playing the role it fulfilled in the 19th and early 20th centuries. Imposing the majority culture upon minorities may simply make it more difficult for them to identify with the nation-state and weaken its legitimacy.

In conditions of pluralism, therefore, the majority culture cannot serve as the grounding of a shared identity. It must be replaced by universalistic principles of human rights and the rule of law, which do not, it is argued, imply the imposition of a particular majority culture on minorities. Each political community develops distinctive interpretations of the meaning of these principles over time, which become embodied in its political and legal institutions and practices. These in turn form a political culture that crystallizes around the country's constitution and makes those principles into a ‘concrete universal’. This embedding of democratic and liberal principles in a distinctive political culture can, in turn, give rise to what Jürgen Habermas has called a “constitutional patriotism”, which should replace nationalism as the focus of a common identity. In countries that have achieved a strong national consciousness, the political culture has long been entangled with the majority culture. This “fusion”, argues Habermas, “must be dissolved if it is to be possible for different cultural, ethnic, and religious forms of life to coexist and interact on equal terms within the same political community” (Habermas 1998, 118).

The thrust of the argument is that democratic political practice can provide a sufficient stimulus to integration in complex democratic societies, and is indeed the only one properly available to them. There is no need for a background consensus based on cultural homogeneity to act as a ‘catalyzing condition’ for democracy to the extent that the democratic political process, involving public deliberation and decision-making, makes “a reasonable political understanding possible, even among strangers.” Democracy, as a set of procedures, can secure legitimacy in the absence of more substantive commonalities between citizens and achieve social integration. Since it is not wedded to particular cultural premises, it can be responsive to changes in the cultural composition of the citizenry and generate a common political culture (Habermas 2001a, 73–74). Habermas's position, then, gives pride of place to the democratic process and to the political participation of citizens, which play a key role in securing social integration: “In complex societies, it is the deliberative opinion- and will-formation of citizens, grounded in the principles of popular sovereignty, that forms the ultimate medium for a form of abstract, legally constructed solidarity that reproduces itself through political participation” (Habermas 2001a, 76).

But the democratic process can fulfil its role only if it achieves a certain level of output legitimacy: appropriate levels of solidarity are sustainable only if basic standards of social justice are satisfied (Habermas 2001a, 76). If it is to remain a source of solidarity, citizenship has to be seen as a valuable status, associated not only with civil and political rights, but also with the fulfilment of fundamental social and cultural rights (Habermas 1998, 118–119).

For most liberal nationalists, this seems like putting the cart before the horse since a successful welfare state, they argue, is possible only if citizens already enjoy high levels of mutual trust and loyalty. Welfare policies suppose that we make sacrifices for anonymous others who differ from us in terms of their ethnic origin, religion and way of life. But in democracies, redistributive policies can be sustained only if they enjoy strong levels of public support. This support is dependent on a sense of common identity that transcends difference and motivates citizens to share their revenues with people whom they do not know, but to whom they feel related by common bonds. This sentiment implies reciprocity: the expectation that, in times of need, one could also benefit from the solidarity of fellow citizens (Miller, 1995; Canovan, 1996).

Liberal nationalists and other critics of the postnationalist position go on to argue that freeing the liberal democratic state from its historical moorings is neither possible, nor necessary. They recognize that the link between liberal democracy and the nation is historically contingent rather than necessary or conceptual while adding that this does not mean that they can or should be dissociated (Miller 1995, 29–30; Kymlicka 2003). Calling for the separation of a country's political culture from the majority group's culture is easier said than done. While it may be comparably easy to discard the most egregious forms of fusion, if there is the political will to do so (for instance, by de-establishing the Anglican church in the case of England), any political culture will be ethically patterned in ways that are difficult for members of the majority to appreciate. Expressions such as “cutting the umbilical cord” or “dissolving” the fusion overstate the extent to which a political culture may be disengaged from the background culture. This is not necessarily cause for alarm, it is argued, since the nation need not be construed in ways that exclude minorities. Nationhood can be understood in sufficiently ‘thin’ terms to accommodate minorities while being ‘thick’ enough to generate appropriate sentiments of solidarity, loyalty, and trust.

There are different versions of this thin understanding of nationhood. What they all share is the downplaying of substantive commonalities of descent, culture and religion to the benefit of political and legal principles and institutions.[14] Still there are variations: David Miller defends a conception of public culture that goes beyond the political to cover social norms (such as honesty in filling tax returns) and may include certain cultural ideals (for instance, “religious beliefs or a commitment to preserve the purity of the national language” (Miller 1995, 26)) while Kymlicka argues that an appropriately thin conception of nationhood also discards assumptions that “members of the nation should share the same […] life-style” (Kymlicka 2003, 273).

These differences notwithstanding, both conceptions are affirmed as inclusive since they describe national identity as flexible and open to change. Once immigrants are citizens, they can participate in the collective conversation by which citizens debate and constantly reinterpret the nation's identity. What immigrants are required to display is a “willingness to accept current political structures and to engage with the host community so that a new common identity can be forged” (Miller 1995, 129). They are expected “to speak a common national language”, “feel loyalty to national institutions” and “share a commitment to maintaining the nation as a single, self-governing community into the indefinite future” (Kymlicka 2003, 273).

Given the thin version of national identity they propose, one might conclude that liberal nationalists are not that far from the constitutional patriotism of Jürgen Habermas. After all, both positions seem to give the central role to a common political culture. The distance separating them becomes clear when we look at the political implications of their respective views, like when evaluating the prospects of the European Union. Liberal nationalists are often sceptical towards the European experiment while postnationalists are firm supporters.[15] This difference flows from their respective conceptions of what makes and sustains a political culture as a source of integration. For liberal nationalists, continuity is essential: a political culture derives much of its strength from an anchoring in the history and narrative of a distinct political community extending backwards and forwards in time. They are sceptical of political voluntarism and, more specifically, towards what can be achieved through formal political institutions. Democratic procedures alone, divorced from a richer background, can neither generate nor sustain a robust political culture or a sense of common identity.

In contrast, postnationalists like Habermas consider that the democratic process is crucial. The postnationalist conception gives greater weight to political practice and to the legal and political institutions that sustain it rather than their cultural and historical moorings. This explains Habermas's militant support of the European project and, more specifically, his belief that adopting a constitution could have a “catalytic effect” on the process of constructing a ‘more perfect Union’ (Habermas 2001b, 16).

3. The challenge of globalisation

For the better part of the last century, conceptions of citizenship, despite many differences, have had one thing in common: the idea that the necessary framework for citizenship is the sovereign, territorial state. The legal status of citizen appears as the formal expression of membership in a polity that has definite territorial boundaries within which citizens enjoy rights and exercise their political agency. In other words, citizenship, both as a legal status and as an activity, is thought to presuppose the existence of a territorially bounded political community, which extends over time and is the focus of a common identity. In the last fifteen years, this premise has come under close scrutiny. A host of phenomena, loosely associated under the heading ‘globalisation’, have encouraged this critical awakening: exploding transnational economic exchange, competition and communication as well as high levels of migration, of cultural and social interactions have shown how porous those borders have become and led people to contest the relevance of state sovereignty.

Two questions are particularly salient.[16] First, the intensification of migratory movements from poorer to richer countries in the context of growing inequalities between North and South has led some authors to contest the state's moral right to choose its members by selectively closing its borders. But if we question the right of the state as a political community to “preserve its integrity” by distributing membership as it sees fit, are we not weakening the very institutional framework that makes citizenship a meaningful practice? This question raises a second set of issues as it assumes that the democratic nation-state is the only institutional context in which citizenship can thrive. This is contested by those who claim that citizenship can be exercised in a multiplicity of ‘sites' both below and above the nation-state.

3.1 Citizenship and borders

Does the political community have the moral right to decide who can/cannot become a citizen or mustn't we recognize the right to free movement? Much of the philosophical debate has turned around two issues: first, on the nature of our obligations towards people from impoverished countries who seek better lives for themselves and their families; second, on the moral status of political communities and their supposed right to protect their integrity by excluding non members.[17]

One way of characterizing our obligation to strangers insists that, absent any relations of cooperation, common humanity is our only bond. It is argued that only a rather weak, imperfect or conditional duty of assistance can be inferred from such a premise. This duty limits the basic right of the political community to distribute membership as it wishes without, in any way, displacing it. Individuals have a duty to assist strangers in urgent need if they can provide assistance without exposing themselves to significant risk or cost. At a collective level, the implications are more considerable as political communities have greater resources and can consider a broader range of benevolent actions at comparably negligible cost. The principle of mutual aid may justify redistribution of membership, territory, wealth and resources to the extent that certain states have more than they can reasonably be said to need (Walzer 1983, 47). In this framework, redistributive policies remain, however, entirely dependent on wealthier countries' understanding of their needs and of the urgency of a stranger's situation. There is no obligation to give equal weight to the interests of non-members.

Institutionally, this position supports what the Geneva Convention on the Status of Refugees (United Nations 1951) calls the principle of “non refoulement”: signatory states are not to deport refugees and asylum seekers to their countries of origin if this threatens their lives and freedom. It can also support claims in favour of increasing the number of immigrants admitted into richer countries, depending on how the latter evaluate the potential effects on their own interests.

Critics contend that our obligations towards migrants and asylum-seekers go well beyond this and call for a policy of open borders. Two strategies are proposed: the first consists in arguing that freedom of movement is a fundamental human right. One way of doing this is to show that any theory recognizing the equal moral value of individuals and giving them moral primacy over communities cannot justify rejecting aliens' claims to admission and citizenship. As Joseph Carens demonstrated in an early article, this argument applies to the three main strands of contemporary liberal theory: libertarianism (a la Nozick), Rawlsianism and utilitarianism (Carens 1987). If we give the principle of moral equality its full extension, the distinction between citizen and alien is morally arbitrary, justified neither by nature nor achievement. When evaluating border and immigration policies, the equal consideration of the interests of all affected (be they aliens or citizens) is required. Political communities cannot decide whether they can afford to accept refugee claimants or prospective immigrants simply according to their understanding of their own situation, needs and interests. Consideration of consequences (e.g. in terms of public order, the sustainability of welfare policies, the potential effects of a brain drain in developing countries, etc.) is not prohibited; what changes radically is how we are to evaluate them. Institutionally, this would doubtless lead to substantial changes in the immigration and refugee policies of most Western democracies.

The second strategy is indirect. To the extent that states do not satisfy their moral obligations to guarantee the universal human right to security and subsistence through international redistributive policies, they have a moral obligation to admit those wishing to enter. Here the idea of open borders is an instrumental, rather than intrinsic, moral principle: it is a means towards achieving global distributive justice (Bader 1997). The advantage of this line of argument is that it faithfully reflects the main motivation for open borders: the outrage provoked by the huge inequalities between North and South and rich countries' role in perpetuating this situation. This strategy, if successful, would establish specific rights for people from poorer countries towards the North, and not simply a broadly framed right to free movement, to be ‘equally’ enjoyed by individuals of rich and poor countries alike.

To be convincing the argument must show, first, that severe global poverty requires immediate action; second, that it is a matter of justice, not charity. To that effect, it is crucial to show that the extreme poverty of some countries is not simply the result of endogenous factors (e.g. bad governance; corrupt political culture, etc.), but is linked to a global political and economic order that systematically produces an unjust distribution of resources and political power, which rich northern countries, as its main beneficiaries, are in no hurry to reform.[18] The third step in the argument purports to show that justifications of restrictive immigration policies premised on ethico-political claims lose much of their force in the context of profound international inequalities and injustice. The claim is that regulating immigration in order to preserve the integrity of the political community is a legitimate goal only if duties of international distributive justice are satisfied (Tan 2004, 126, referring to Tamir 1992, 161). The argument's upshot is that “[r]ich Northern states have a double moral obligation to seriously fight global poverty and to let more people in” (Bader 1997, 31).

Both supporters and critics of (more) open borders agree that liberal democratic political communities have a moral status and are worth preserving. They disagree over what exactly is worthy of protection and how much weight should be given to securing their integrity (however it is defined) relative to our duties of international justice.

The division of the world into states is arguably justifiable on functional grounds, to the extent that states appear as “first approximations of optimal units for allocating and producing the world's resources” (Coleman and Harding 1995, 38). If we think that states matter simply as local units of efficient production and distribution, then this would be the main consideration when evaluating immigration policies. Public order arguments would still matter, likewise claims pertaining to a society's economic capacity to secure its material reproduction, but not arguments relating to its cultural integrity or way of life. Unless, of course, the capacity of states to act as efficient units of production and distribution is linked to their being distinctive political communities with a particular culture of shared meanings worth preserving.

Over twenty years ago, Michael Walzer defended such a view, based on the idea that “distributive justice presupposes a bounded world within which distribution takes place” (Walzer 1983, 31). Since the goods to be divided, exchanged and shared among individuals have social meanings that are specific to particular communities, it is only within their boundaries that conflict can be resolved and distributive schemes judged either just or unjust. The crucial assumption here is that the “political community is probably the closest we can come to a world of common meanings. Language, history, and culture come together […] to produce a collective consciousness”(Walzer 1983, 28). Politics itself, moreover, as a set of practices and institutions that shape the form and outcome that distributive conflicts take, “establishes its own bonds of commonality”(Walzer 1983, 29). To reject political communities' right to distribute the good of membership is to undermine their capacity to preserve their integrity. It is to condemn them to become nothing more then neighbourhoods, random associations lacking any legally enforceable admissions policies. The probable result of the free movement of individuals would be “casual aggregates” devoid of any internal cohesion and incapable of being a source of patriotic sentiments and solidarity. In a world of neighbourhoods, membership would become meaningless. The upshot of this is that we should recognize the political community's right to regulate admission with a view to securing its cultural, economic and political integrity.

Walzer's position, notably his choice of analogies, has been extensively discussed.[19] His assumption that sovereign states constitute communities of shared meanings appears particularly shaky. Most often, existing states incorporate various political communities that are themselves internally pluralistic: linguistically, culturally and ideologically. In such cases, one would be hard pressed to identify the community whose integrity is at stake. Indeed, few states correspond to the picture Walzer envisages as the appropriate context for distributive justice.

This is not to say that political communities are merely functional units. As Habermas argues, if the communitarian position appears irrelevant in the face of the complexity and internal diversity of modern societies, it reminds us that modern states are a “political form of life” that cannot be “translated without remainder into the abstract form of institutions designed according to general legal principles”. As forms of life, they include “the politicocultural context in which universalistic principles must be implemented, for only a population accustomed to freedom can keep the institutions of freedom alive” (Habermas 1996, 513). Here, Habermas refers yet again to his distinction between the political culture, which develops around universalistic constitutional principles, and the wider, background culture. It is the integrity of the former, not the latter that must be preserved: immigrants should be expected to integrate into the political culture of their new country, which means more than simply embracing abstract liberal-democratic principles. They must “willingly engage” with the particular form that these principles take in a given society, with a specific history. Given that they come from different cultures, newcomers will bring distinct perspectives to the interpretation of the political constitution and may well affect its future development. But to the extent that their contribution can be understood as part of the democratic conversation, rather than as a conversation stopper, one cannot justify stricter limits to immigration on such grounds.[20] What presumably can be argued is that the capacity of the polity to integrate newcomers in the political culture should be considered when setting admissions policies.

Liberal nationalists like Will Kymlicka make a similar argument: they claim that liberal egalitarian aims such as equality of opportunity and solidarity stand a much better chance of being realized in the context of a strong national culture, defined as a “societal culture” involving a “common language and social institutions” (Kymlicka 2001, 259).[21] Everything being equal, maintaining and strengthening such cultures serves a vital interest of individuals and liberal egalitarians should not strive for fully open borders. But does this mean that our interest in a strong national culture outweigh our duty to pursue international justice? From a liberal egalitarian perspective, the answer is clearly no. The right of political communities to protect their integrity stands only under conditions of rough international equality. Under such conditions, limits to immigration would not cause substantial harm, but “would only reserve for the nationals of a country what aliens already have in their own country — namely, the chance to be free and equal citizens within their own national community” (Kymlicka 2001, 271). Under the present situation of radical inequality, however, restrictive policies of immigration allow richer countries to “hoard an unfair share of resources” and cannot be squared with the principle of the moral equality of persons, which requires that “we care equally about the well-being of all individuals, wherever they are born, and however little we interact with them” (Kymlicka 2001, 271).

Kymlicka doesn't say how we should interpret his conclusion as pertains to present policies of immigration: must we demand that the borders of Western democracies be opened until they honour their duties of international justice?[22] Should we rather underscore their dual moral obligations to fight global poverty and allow in more immigrants? (Bader 1997) Or, since global poverty and injustice are the problems, wouldn't it be better to address them directly and see them as our first moral priority (Pogge 1997)? As Kok-Chor Tan remarks, the argument should be understood as supporting “the primacy of international justice, rather than as a claim about how to prioritize public policies and goals”. This primacy implies “that national projects of well-off nations lose their legitimacy if these nations are not also doing their fair share as determined by their duties of justice” (Tan 2004, 129). Whether or not liberals should concentrate on reforming the international system as Thomas Pogge has urged or fight for both greater international distributive justice and more open borders as Veit Bader advises is a matter of strategy. The two prescriptions are by no means incompatible; insisting on the illegitimacy of restrictive immigration policies under current conditions may be a way to put rich countries on the spot and prod them to accept their moral responsibilities towards the world's poor (Goodin 1992, 8).

3.2 The promise of transnational citizenship: sceptics vs. voluntarists

As we have just seen, the nation-state's sovereignty often appears as an impediment to global justice. Its capacity to deal with economic, social and environmental problems that increasingly cut across borders is also in doubt. Under such circumstances, should the sovereign, territorial state still be seen as the necessary institutional context for justice and democracy? Should we not explore possibilities beyond its boundaries?

Such questioning has sparked two responses from theorists of citizenship. ‘Voluntarists’ insist on the need to rethink democracy and citizenship beyond the nation-state, proposing schemes to extend democratic politics to the regional and global levels.[23] ‘Sceptics’, on the other hand, argue that democratic citizenship requires a bounded territorial space, in which citizens see themselves as part of a common demos. At the heart of this debate is the contested meaning of democratic political agency and its conditions, which must be clarified if the debate is to get anywhere.

Citizenship as legal status is what makes global citizenship conceivable, since there is no limit to the potential extension of rights, while the political dimension of citizenship presupposes a concept of political community that is richer but more limited (Cohen 1999, 249). The sceptics consider that citizenship at the global level entails a weakening of its political dimension, a waning of its democratic character. The voluntarists respond that transnational political citizenship is not an oxymoron if we rid ourselves of the blinkers inherited from the past. Both sceptics and voluntarists acknowledge that meaningful citizenship cannot simply be legal in nature. It's their assumptions about the political dimension of democratic citizenship and its background conditions that set them apart.

We will examine two versions of this disagreement. In the first, disagreement centres upon the basic conditions of democratic political agency rather than on its meaning. This is a crucial issue since how we define these conditions can limit the potential extension of the political community. In the second, the disagreement is over the meaning of democratic agency itself. To what extent should political agency be understood as a form of collective agency? Should we characterize political action as a common practice, which requires that citizens be in a relation of interaction and mutual awareness, or can we define it as primarily individual?

Supporters of global democracy reject the conventional identification between demos, territory and citizenship. In their view, citizenship is not a set of practices and rights that need to be anchored in a particular demos defined by specific territorial boundaries. On the contrary, citizenship is ideally exercised in a multiplicity of ‘sites', situated at different levels of governance: local, national, regional and global. Global democrats sketch a multilayered, global democratic order in which no single layer or site is dominant (Pogge 1992, 58, Young 2000, 266). This scheme implies a ‘vertical’ dispersal of power above and below existing sovereign states, which are stripped of their centrality. This would give less of an incentive for conflicts over power and wealth within and between states, “‘thereby reducing the incidence of war, poverty, and oppression’ and environmental degradation” (Kuper 2004, 30, quoting Pogge 1992, 102–105).

Voluntarists would balance this dilution of state power by strengthening certain global regulatory regimes in areas like peace and security, human rights, the environment, trade and finances, etc. These regimes would set down general rules “regarding that small but vital set of issues around which peace and justice call for global co-operation” (Young 2000, 267).[24] A set of global institutions would be needed to ensure the application of these rules; though voluntarists are quick to point out the importance of democratic principles — consent, self-determination and autonomy — and their institutional implications (Pogge 1992, 64).

The formal political institutions and procedures envisaged are largely familiar: representative assemblies based on elections and referenda. Such institutions would exist at each level of the multilayered scheme: local, national, regional and global. Following the European Union model, continent-wide parliaments are envisaged, as well as a reformed general assembly of the United Nations. At the informal level, voluntarists insist on the need for globally active organizations of civil society, welcome the emergence of a transnational public opinion and call on global agencies such as the World Trade Organization and the International Monetary Fund to commit themselves to basic principles of publicity.

Global democrats assume that the extension of democracy beyond the limits of the nation-state is neither conceptually nor practically impossible. Their response to claims that scale constitutes a major obstacle is twofold: first, they put the principle of subsidiarity at the front and centre of their institutional scheme (Held 2005, 14; Pogge 1992, 65–66); second, they insist that robust democratic politics is truly possible only at the local level. In existing, large nation-states, representative institutions are already far removed from ordinary citizens, who feel largely disempowered and disaffected (Young 2000, 270–271). Since the multilayered scheme they propose involves significant decentralization from the national to the sub-national level, the argument runs that global democracy would, in fact, translate into more, rather than less, ‘real’ democracy. It would serve to increase the ability of citizens to participate effectively in shaping the policies that concern them directly (Pogge 1992, 64; Young 2000, 269). But no matter how forcefully the principle of subsidiarity is applied, the global democratic project would still entail the implementation of global principles and standards (e.g. (re)distributive principles, human rights standards) that would rely on coercive enforcement agencies (Benhabib 2004, 113). Given this reality, the democratic legitimacy of political institutions above the level of the state is an issue that cannot be avoided.

Sceptics of global democracy have worked to identify basic background conditions to democratic institutions and procedures while showing that they cannot be satisfied beyond a certain threshold. Their argument is empirical, rather than conceptual. A common language is one plausible candidate put forward by Will Kymlicka. He insists that linguistic/territorial political associations are the primary forum for democratic participation, rather than higher-level political associations that cut across linguistic lines, because democratic politics is essentially “politics in the vernacular” (Kymlicka 1999, 121).[25] Even in cases where average citizens are conversant in one or more foreign language, they rarely have the level of fluency necessary to participate in political debate in a language other than their own: only a select few have the ability and opportunity to acquire and sustain the necessary language skills. Political debate in multilingual settings is essentially an elitist pursuit.

In fact, political discussions require a higher degree of fluency than what is needed for business transactions or tourism: “political communication has a large ritualistic component, and these ritualized forms of communication are typically language-specific. Even if one understands a foreign language in the technical sense, without knowledge of these ritualistic elements one may be unable to understand political debates” (Kymlicka 1999, 121). If he is right, the hope that English's emergence as a new lingua franca in Europe and globally could overcome the linguistic obstacles that impede the development of transnational democratic politics are overstated (Van Parijs 2005). English's growing use may be enough to increase mutual understanding between individuals, but it is unlikely that it could become a transnational vernacular allowing democratic politics to transcend national boundaries.[26]

Most voluntarists and sceptics rely on the same implicit view of democratic political agency: citizens are political agents through their participation in institutions and procedures that require significant interaction and mutual awareness. In this sense, democratic political agency appears collective rather than individual. Yet this leaves the door open to the sceptics' objections. If we believe that formal and informal democratic institutions like Parliaments and the public sphere require relatively high levels of horizontal communication between citizens, the existence of a common language appears a necessary condition to democratic agency. This, in turn, sets limits to the potential extension of the political community. Schemes that call for the “institutionalization of national and transnational forms of public debate, democratic participation, and accountability” (Held 2005, 18) for democracy's global extension appear misguided.

It might be argued, however, that the development of transnational advocacy networks shows that the sceptics' criticisms are overstated. These networks are proof that it is possible for individuals to exercise political agency in forums other than those provided by democratic states and that the absence of a common vernacular does not impede participation. Global democracy becomes thinkable once we focus on the development of transnational civil society rather than on the transposing of representative institutions at the global level. In response, it should be noted that such networks coalesce around a common ideology or conception of the good (e.g. the environment; rights of indigenous peoples, critique of neo-liberal forms of globalisation, etc.), which serves as a functional equivalent to a common vernacular. More important, these networks are composed of voluntary associations organized around shared interests and cannot stand as a surrogate for the political community per se, which acts as the addressee of claims made by the organisations and groups of civil society.

Which political community or communities can act as the addressee of claims made by organisations of transnational civil society? If one answers national political communities and their formal institutions, one agrees with Kymlicka that: “the weak transnationalism of advocacy networks is predicated on, even parasitic on, the ongoing existence of bounded political communities” (Kymlicka 2003, 291). Surely, we cannot point to a constituted cosmopolitan political community, which as yet does not exist and, if the sceptics are to be believed, has very little chances of ever coming into existence. If this is right, then the organisations of an emerging transnational civil society can offer possibilities of political agency for certain committed individuals and groups, but they do not offer a solution to the problem posed by the extension of democratic citizenship to the global level.[27]

There is another version of the global democratic project, however, that involves an individualist conception of democratic political agency. Here citizens can engage in significant political activities that do not require high levels of interaction and cooperation between them. This is a position developed recently by Andrew Kuper (2004). It involves, first, that we abandon the conception of democratic legitimacy implicit in deliberative, participatory and republican conceptions of democracy, which all attempt to maintain a broadly Rousseauian understanding of legitimacy: laws are legitimate only if citizens can see themselves, somehow, as their co-authors. In this tradition, democratic government entails the idea of civic self-government, predicated upon significant involvement of citizens in the deliberative and decision-making processes. Kuper suggests that we discard this vision of democratic legitimacy in favour of one focusing on the responsiveness of the political system as a whole.[28] The central issue becomes whether this system is made to act “in the best interests of the public, in a manner responsive to them” (Kuper 2004, 75 quoting Pitkin 1967). Legitimacy does not require citizens playing a decisive role and actively participating in processes of opinion and will formation. It requires, simply, that they exercise “a degree of active control over rulers and politics” (Kuper 2004, 79).

Citizens' control over authorities does not necessarily demand high levels of interaction and mutual awareness, partly because significant control can be exercised ‘horizontally’, through an extensive system of checks and balances that does not involve citizens directly. More importantly, Kuper proposes the development of (cross-border) formal advocacy and accountability agencies, akin to public ombudsmen, access of information agencies or the public curator's office. These agencies would provide citizens “crucial, limited ranges of more independent and accessible information about political actors” while also acting on their behalf as “professional contesters”. They would constitute “a locus of mobilization that agglomerates and pursues [citizens'] concerns and yet does not require that citizens act together with high levels of mutual awareness” (Kuper 2004, 127, my italics). In other words, citizens would exercise significant control over authorities without the need for extensive communication or cooperation. The vertical, rather then horizontal, dimension of communication is of overarching importance: individual citizens must have access to relevant information about what various authorities are doing, there must exist institutional channels by which they can pressure authorities and let them know their views on proposed policies. Doing so does not require that they “act together with high levels of mutual awareness”; they can exercise these capacities individually, via specific agencies.

This scheme avoids some of the criticisms levelled against other versions of the global democratic project. If citizens can exercise political agency in the absence of significant interaction, acting individually through specialized agencies, then the argument that a common language is a necessary background condition to democratic political agency loses much of its force.

But should we uncritically accept this understanding of democratic political agency? Should we set aside the conviction that it is best understood as a form of collective agency, entailing significant interaction and mutual awareness between citizens? One could credibly argue that representative democracy does not require a collective understanding of political agency. Voting is arguably an individual political action that does not demand a level of interaction comparable to that required of the Athenian assembly or workers' Councils. Of course, voting is an action that has to be performed by a large number of individuals to be significant and a formal agency needs to coordinate those individual actions. They also need to be aggregated in order to produce meaningful results. But at the level of the individual citizen, voting can be interpreted as a purely individual, private act. Elections can be understood as a way of organizing political activity that does not require the conscious horizontal cooperation of individual citizens.

Yet this account of the representative system is also contestable. As Bernard Manin points out, the substantial degree of discretion required by representatives has its counterweight in the free expression of political opinion. The latter guarantees that without being obliged to follow the people's will, representatives also cannot ignore it. The crucial point here is that the publication and/or manifestation of opinion is decisive not merely because it keeps citizens and governments informed, but also because it ensures horizontal communication amongst the governed. Indeed, Manin claims that meaningful political agency in a representative democracy requires that citizens be capable of learning what their co-citizens think about important policy issues or events independent of the authorities. Horizontal communication between citizens appears as a necessary condition to their being capable of political action (Manin 1997, 170–171).[29]

One might answer that since the point of horizontal communication in representative government is to increase the citizens' capacity to act, allowing them to control and influence governments, then the criticism is off the mark if innovative institutions can offer citizens alternative but equally effective means of doing exactly this. In other words, if we insist on horizontal communication as a means to achieve certain ends and we discover that these ends can be reached through other institutional means, the problem ends there. Unless, of course, we hold the view, as Aristotle or Hannah Arendt (and even Benjamin Constant) did, that a high level of interaction between citizens is an intrinsic, not simply an instrumental, good.

But this position need not be defended here. Rather, one can question whether the accountability and advocacy agencies defended by Kuper are an acceptable functional equivalent to higher levels of communication between citizens. As Manin insists, the ability of citizens to gain information about each other's views independently from government is crucial. In the end, the thing that makes citizens political agents is their capacity to act independently of authorities and this ability, in turn, depends on whether they regularly act and communicate together, even if this interaction is often mediated through institutions like the electronic media. As Tocqueville famously argued, to prevent the kind of passivity that made the Terror possible, interaction between citizens must be habitual and not just potential or occasional. Institutions here play a central role: the administrative institutions of the Monarchy were guilty of having robbed the French of the possibility and desire to act together (Tocqueville 1998, 243).[30] Free institutions simultaneously rely on and must strengthen citizens' autonomous interactions. If this poses enormous challenges in pluralistic and complex mass societies, we should also be wary of weakening this ideal.

4. Conclusion

Our survey of contemporary discussions has highlighted important differences over each of the three dimensions of citizenship. As a legal status, citizenship remains the keystone of contemporary conceptions: its normative core is the principle that citizens shall enjoy equal rights, although most would now agree that, in certain circumstances, equal consideration of individuals' interests may justifiably result in differential treatment from the state. This broad agreement on principle leaves ample room for disagreement over the particulars, as witnessed by the recurring debates over affirmative action and minority rights. But such discussions have become a hallmark of contemporary liberal societies, and our legal and political discourses are well equipped to handle them. The deeper worry, which new forms of political violence have made more acute, centres upon achieving a proper balance between the recognition of difference and the affirmation of common principles to which all citizens are required to adhere.

How robust an identity can citizenship provide in complex and internally diverse societies? There is a tension here that is difficult to resolve: our awareness of the pluralist nature of contemporary societies leads us to underscore the importance of general legal and political principles (democracy, human rights, rule of law) rather than the traditional emblems of nationality: common history and culture. Postnationalists, in particular, emphasize the role of democratic political practice in securing social integration. Yet, the complexity and scale of contemporary liberal societies tend to make this practice less significant in the lives of most citizens, a fact reflected in declining levels of participation in formal political institutions. Are we not expecting too much from democratic political practice under current circumstances?

This question brings us face to face with the difficult issue of citizens' political agency, which has long been central to debates between liberals and republicans. Whether we understand democracy in terms of civic self-government (republican version) or as the ability to exercise control over government (liberal version), it is not easy to determine how, and through what institutional mechanisms, ordinary citizens can exercise meaningful political agency in complex societies. This difficulty is epitomized in the debate over transnational citizenship. Although global citizenship is conceivable first and foremost as a legal status securing a number of fundamental human rights, most authors agree that it should not be strictly legal in nature and must have a significant political dimension. One senses, however, a distinct malaise when it comes to identifying appropriate normative standards and locating the institutions through which these could be approximated.

In the end, our dismissal of the encyclopédiste's interest in distinguishing subject and citizen may have been too hasty. If being a citizen in a liberal-democratic political community is to mean something more than the status of legal subject, we must be ready to state what this “more” entails. This stubborn blind-spot of theories of citizenship leads us to some of the most difficult issues pertaining to the very possibility of democracy in the contemporary world.


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