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World Government

First published Mon Dec 4, 2006

‘World government’ refers to the idea of all humankind united under one common political authority. Arguably, it has not existed so far in human history, yet proposals for a unified global political authority have existed since ancient times — in the ambition of kings, popes and emperors, and the dreams of poets and philosophers.

Proponents of world government offer distinct reasons for why it is an ideal of political organization. Some are motivated negatively and see world government as the definitive solution to old and new human problems such as war and the development of weapons of mass destruction, global poverty and inequality, and environmental degradation. More positively, some have advocated world government as a proper reflection of the unity of the cosmos, under reason or God. Proponents have also differed historically in their views of the form that a world government should take. While medieval thinkers advocated world government under a single monarch or emperor who would possess supreme authority over all other lesser rulers, modern proponents generally do not advocate a wholesale dismantling of the sovereign states system but incremental innovations in global institutional design to move humanity toward world federalism or cosmopolitan democracy.

Critics of world government have offered three main kinds of objections — to do with the feasibility, desirability and necessity of establishing a common global political authority.

First, a realist argument, forwarded by international ‘realist’ theorists, holds that world government is infeasible; ideas of world government constitute exercises in utopian thinking, and are utterly impractical as a goal for human political organization. Assuming that world government would lead to desirable outcomes such as perpetual peace, realists are skeptical that world government will ever materialize as an institutional reality, given the problems of egoistic or corrupted human nature, or the logic of international anarchy that characterizes a world of states, all jealously guarding their own sovereignty or claims to supreme authority. World government is thus infeasible as a solution to global problems because of the unsurpassable difficulties of establishing “authoritative hierarchies” at the global or international level (Krasner 1999, 42). A related consequentialist argument speculates that even if world government were desirable, the process of creating a world government may produce more harm than good; the necessary evils committed on the road to establishing a world government would outweigh whatever benefits might result from its achievement (Rousseau 1756).

Second, even if world government were shown to be a feasible political project, it may be an undesirable one. One set of reasons for its undesirability emphasizes the potential power and oppressiveness of a global political authority. In one version of this objection — the tyranny argument — world government would descend into a global tyranny, hindering rather than enhancing the ideal of human autonomy (Kant 1784). Instead of delivering impartial global justice and peace, a world government may form an inescapable tyranny that would have the power to make humanity serve its own interests, and opposition against which might engender incessant and intractable civil wars (Waltz 1979). In another version of this objection — the homogeneity argument — world government may be so strong and pervasive as to create a homogenizing effect, obliterating distinct cultures and communities that are intrinsically valuable. The institution of a world government would thus destroy the rich social pluralism that animates human life (Walzer 2004). While the preceding two arguments stem from fear of the potential power of a world government, another set of concerns that make world government undesirable focuses on its potential weakness as a form of political organization. The objections on this account are that the inevitable remoteness of a global political authority would dilute the laws, making them ineffectual and meaningless. The posited weakness of world government thus leads to objections based on its potential inefficiency and soullessness (Kant 1784).

Third, contemporary liberal theorists argue mainly that world government, in the form of a global leviathan with supreme legislative, executive, adjudicative and enforcement powers, is largely unnecessary to solve problems such as war, global poverty, and environmental catastrophe. World government so conceived is neither necessary nor sufficient to achieve the aims of a liberal agenda. Even cosmopolitan liberals do not argue that moral cosmopolitanism necessarily entails political cosmopolitanism in the form of a world government. The liberal rejection of world government, however, does not amount to an endorsement of the conventional system of sovereign states or the contemporary international order, “with its extreme injustices, crippling poverty, and inequalities” (Rawls 1999, 117). Instead, most liberal theorists envision the need for authoritative international and global institutions that modify significantly the powers and prerogatives traditionally attributed to the sovereign state.

This entry will, first, discuss the positive and negative motivations underlying proposals for world government. In a selective discussion of the idea's history, the entry will focus on Dante's medieval treatise on the necessity of a world monarch or emperor, and then consider mainly arguments by Hobbes, Rousseau and Kant that reveal more skepticism about world government as a solution to the problem of war and peace among sovereign states. Most of the objections against the idea of world government outlined above are articulated in their writings. The historical background section will continue with the revival of ideas of world government in the twentieth century, prompted by technological progress, economic globalization, and the experience of two devastating world wars. Debates about world government during the Cold War, however, were pervaded by the ideological division of the world, and the section concludes with an exploration of socialist views on world government.

Second, the entry will explore debates in contemporary theory. One set of debates is located within international relations theory, between neorealist, ‘international society’, liberal internationalist, and constructivist schools. Another set of discussions about world government is located within contemporary liberal theory, involving the foremost liberal political philosopher of the twentieth century, John Rawls, and his cosmopolitan liberal critics. Both sets of discussions show that practically no one in these debates endorses the political project of establishing a world government on the model of a coercive, centralized domestic authority. Somewhat of an outlier is the constructivist theorist, Alexander Wendt, who has argued that a world state with a global monopoly on the legitimate use of force is “inevitable,” given the nature of the struggle for recognition that underlies the logic of anarchy (2003). The idea of world government has gradually given way, in contemporary scholarship, to the concept of “global governance,” which highlights the increasing agency of global civil society and nonstate actors, and deliberately eschews the coercive and centralized components of domestic models of government for looser, decentralized modes of achieving similar functions of government. The conclusion to the entry questions whether global governance in contemporary world conditions can really deliver the goods of global security, universal human rights, social justice, and environmental protection that have made the ideal of world government a persistent if elusive human aspiration.

1. Historical Background

For I dipt into the future, far as human eye could see,
 Saw the Vision of the world, and all the wonders that would be;

Till the war-drum throbb’d no longer, and the battle-flags were furl'd
In the Parliament of man, the Federation of the world.

There the common sense of most shall hold a fretful realm in awe,
And the kindly earth shall slumber, lapt in universal law.

Alfred, Lord Tennyson, “Locksley Hall” (1837)

United States President Harry Truman, who oversaw the founding of the United Nations after the Second World War, kept these lines from Tennyson's poem in his wallet (Kennedy 2006, xi). After this brutal global war that claimed over fifty million lives, just like after the previous world war in which almost ten million perished, ordinary people and statespersons alike sought to establish a post-war international order that would be able to prevent another war of global devastation from occurring. In fact, since the problem of war, or large-scale socially organized violence, has been with us throughout human history, the ideal of a universal community of humankind living in perpetual peace was not at all new.

Derek Heater's history of ideas of world government and citizenship begins by noting their presence in ancient Chinese and Indian as well as Graeco-Roman thought (1996, ix-x). According to Heater, the concept of human unity produced an ideal that such unity ought to be expressed in political form. The exact nature of that form, however, has changed radically over time. While Stoic ideas about the oneness of the universe were politically inchoate, they inspired medieval Christian proposals for a global political authority; at the same time, the historical model of imperial Rome (or its myths) inspired medieval quests for world empire.

The Italian poet, philosopher, and statesperson, Dante (1265–1321), perhaps best articulated the Christian ideal of human unity and its expression through a world governed by a universal monarch. In The Banquet [Convivio], Dante argued that wars and all their causes would be eliminated if “the whole earth and all that humans can possess be a monarchy, that is, one government under one ruler. Because he possesses everything, the ruler would not desire to possess anything further, and thus, he would hold kings contentedly within the borders of their kingdoms, and keep peace among them” (Convivio, 169). In Monarchia, a full political treatise affirming universal monarchy, Dante draws on Aristotle to argue that human unity stems from a shared end, purpose or function, to develop and realize fully and constantly humanity's distinct intellectual potential (13). In Book I, Dante argues that peace is a vital condition for realizing this end, and peace cannot be maintained if humanity is divided. Just as “[e]very kingdom divided against itself shall be laid waste” (15), since humankind shares one goal, “there must therefore be one person who directs and rules mankind, and he is properly called ‘Monarch’ or ‘Emperor’. And thus it is apparent that the well-being of the world requires that there be a monarchy or empire” (15). Most importantly, when conflicts inevitably arise between two rulers who are equals, “there must be a third party of wider jurisdiction who rules over both of them by right”; a universal monarch is necessary as “a first and supreme judge, whose judgment resolves all disputes either directly or indirectly” (21–2). In the absence of a universal monarch, humanity is “transformed into a many-headed beast,” striving after “conflicting things” (43–4); humankind ordered under a universal monarch, however, “will most closely resemble God, by mirroring the principle of oneness or unity of which he is the supreme example” (xvii and 19). Dante completes his treatise by extolling the Roman Empire as “a part of God's providential plan for humanity” (xxxiii). And while Dante argued for a universal emperor whose temporal power was distinct from the pope's religious power, and not derivative from the latter, he envisioned that God's will must require pope and emperor to forge a cooperative and conciliatory, rather than competitive and antagonistic, relationship.

The idea of uniting humanity under one empire or monarch, however, became an ambivalent appeal by the seventeenth century with the entrenchment of the system of sovereign states after the Peace of Westphalia (1648).

In Leviathan [1651], Hobbes (1588–1679) gave the quintessential formulation of sovereignty as supreme legal coercive authority over a particular population and territory. Hobbes argued that although mutual vulnerabilities and interests lead individuals to give up their liberties in the state of nature, in exchange for protection — thereby instituting sovereign states — the miseries that accompany a plurality of sovereign states are not as onerous to individuals, hence there is less rational basis for political organization to move towards a global leviathan: “because states uphold the Industry of their Subjects; there does not follow from the international state of nature, that misery, which accompanies the Liberty of particular men” (1651, 188). Contrary to realist interpretations of Hobbes in international relations thought, Hobbes did not consider international law or cooperation between sovereign states to be impossible or impractical. Anticipating the development of international law, collective security organizations, the League of Nations and the United Nations, he affirmed the possibility and efficacy of leagues of commonwealths founded on the interests of states in peace and justice: “Leagues between Common-wealths, over whom there is no humane Power established, to keep them all in awe, are not onely lawfull [because they are allowed by the commonwealth], but also profitable for the time they last” (286). In Hobbes, we find the first articulation of the argument that a world government or state is unnecessary, although he envisaged that the development of a lawful interstate order is possible, and potentially desirable.

In the eighteenth century, Charles Castel, Abbé de Saint-Pierre (1658–1743), in his Project for Making Peace Perpetual in Europe [1713], extended Hobbes's argument — that a rational interest in self-preservation necessitated the creation a domestic leviathan — to the international realm, asserting that reason should lead the princes of Europe to form a federation of states by social contract. The contracting sovereigns would form a perpetual and irrevocable alliance, establishing a permanent Diet or Congress that would adjudicate all conflicts between the contracting parties. The federation would also proscribe as “a public enemy” (Rousseau 1756, 63) any member who breaks the Treaty or disregards the decisions of the congress; in such a situation, all members would “arm and take the offensive, conjointly and at the common expense, against any State put to the ban of Europe” in order to enforce the decisions of the federation (61-4). In other words, perpetual peace can be achieved if the princes of Europe would agree to relinquish their sovereign rights to make war or peace to a superior, federal body that guaranteed protection of their basic interests.

In his comments on this proposal, Rousseau (1712–78) acknowledged its perfect  rationality: “Realize this Commonwealth of Europe for a single day, and you may be sure it will last forever; so fully would experience convince men that their own gain is to be found in the good of all” (93). To Rousseau, however, existing societies had so thoroughly corrupted humans’ natural innocence that they were largely incapable of discovering their true or real interests. Thus, the Abbé's proposals were not utopian, but they were not likely to be realized “because men are crazy, and to be sane in a world of madmen is itself a kind of madness” (91). At the same time, Rousseau noted that the sovereigns of Europe were not likely to agree voluntarily to form such a federation, generating a consequentialist objection to the proposal: “No Federation could ever be established except by a revolution. That being so, which of us would dare say whether the League of Europe is a thing more to be desired or feared? It would perhaps do more harm in the moment than it would guard against for ages” (112).

Rousseau viewed war as a product of defectively ordered social institutions; it is states as public entities that make war, and individuals participate in wars only as members or citizens of states. Far from viewing the achievement of a domestic leviathan as moral progress, Rousseau noted that the condition of a world of entangled sovereign states puts human beings in more peril than if no such institutions existed at all. Isn't it the case, he argued, that “each one of us being in the civil state as regards our fellow citizens, but in the state of nature as regards the rest of the world, we have taken all kinds of precautions against private wars only to kindle national wars a thousand times more terrible? And that, in joining a particular group of men, we have really declared ourselves the enemies of the whole race” (56)? In Rousseau's view, the solution to war is to establish well-governed societies, along the lines he established in The Social Contract [1762]; only in such contexts will human beings realize their full rational and moral potential. To establish perpetual peace, then, we should not pursue world government, but the moral perfection of states. A world of ideal societies would have no cause for war, and no need for world government.

Kant tried, in his Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose  [1784], to refute the claim that the development of the domestic state constituted a moral step backwards for humankind, by placing it and its trials “in the history of the entire species, as a steadily advancing but slow development of man's original [rational] capacities” (41). Nature employs the “unsociableness of men” to motivate moral progress; thus war is a means by which nature moves states “to take the step which reason could have suggested to them even without so many sad experiences — that of abandoning a lawless state of savagery and entering a federation of peoples in which every state, even the smallest, could expect to derive its security and rights not from its own power or its own legal judgment, but solely from this great federation (Foedus Amphictyonum), from a united power and the law-governed decisions of a united will” (47). This is the “inevitable outcome” (48) of human history, a point Kant reiterated in Perpetual Peace [1795], when he argued that rationality dictated the formation of “an international state (civitas gentium), which would necessarily continue to grow until it embraced all the peoples of the earth” (105).

In present conditions, however, Kant noted that “the positive idea of a world republic cannot be realized,” thus his treatise on perpetual peace begins with the social fact of a world of distinct but interacting states. What would be required, given such a world, to achieve perpetual peace? Kant makes three arguments. First, every state must have a republican constitution that guarantees the freedom and equality of citizens through the rule of law and representative political institutions. The internally well-ordered republican state is less likely to engage in wars without good reason; “under a constitution where the subject is not a citizen, and which is therefore not republican, it is the simplest thing in the world to go to war” (100). Second, such internally well-ordered states would need to enter into a “federation of peoples,” which is distinct from an “international state” (102). A “pacific federation (foedus pacificum) … does not aim to acquire any power like that of a state, but merely to preserve and secure the freedom of each state in itself, along with that of the other confederated states” (104). In this context, a federal union of free and independent states, he argued, “is still to be preferred to an amalgamation of the separate nations under a single power which has overruled the rest and created a universal monarchy.” His reasons against a universal monarchy combine fears of an all-powerful and powerless world government: “For the laws progressively lose their impact as the government increases its range, and a soulless despotism, after crushing the germs of goodness, will finally lapse into anarchy” (113). Most forcefully articulating the tyranny objection, Kant argued that a “universal despotism” would end “in the graveyard of freedom” (114). The third condition for perpetual peace in a world of distinct but interacting states is the observance of cosmopolitan right, which Kant limits to universal hospitality. Although the human race shares in common a right to the earth's surface, Kant argued that strangers do not have entitlements to settle on foreign territory without the inhabitants’ agreement. Thus, cosmopolitan right justifies visiting a foreign land, but not conquering it, which Kant criticized the commercial states of his day to have done in “America, the negro countries, the Spice Islands, the Cape” and East India (106).

Kant's views on the desirability of world government are clearly complex. His endorsement of the ideal of human unity prompts him to see a world republic of free and equal individuals as an ideal end of the progress of human history. At the same time, he condemns any move towards a universal monarchy, because a monarchy, in contrast to a republic, does not guarantee, and is more likely to undermine, the freedom and equality of individuals. Although a world republic is Kant's ultimate political ideal, his “realistic utopia” (Rawls 1999: 11–6) consists of a federation of free (republican) states short of a world state. One might say that such a federation of republican states would constitute the closest approximation to the ideal of a world republic.

Kant's work shows that even in the eighteenth century, debates about world government were alive and well, including arguments by radical political cosmopolitans such as Anarcharsis Cloots (Jean-Baptiste du Val-de-Grace, baron de Cloots, 1755–1794), who used social contract theory to advocate the abolition of the sovereign states system in favor of a universal republic encompassing all humanity (Kleingeld and Brown 2002).

The nineteenth and twentieth centuries witnessed revivals of proposals for world government that were fueled by positive developments — such as technological progress in travel and communications that enabled rapid economic globalization — as well as negative developments — such as the devastating impact of wars fought with modern technology.

After the atomic bombings of Hiroshima and Nagasaki, atomic scientists lobbied for the international control of atomic energy as a main function of world federalist government. Albert Einstein wrote in 1946 that technological developments had shrunk the planet, through increased economic interdependence and mutual vulnerability through weapons of mass destruction. To secure peace, Einstein asserted, “A world government must be created which is able to solve conflicts between nations by judicial decision. This government must be based on a clear-cut constitution which is approved by the governments and nations and which gives it the sole disposition of offensive weapons” (1956, 138). Organizations such as the United World Federalists (UWF), established in 1947, called for the transformation of the United Nations into a universal federation of states with powers to control armaments. World peace required that states should give up their traditional unrestricted sovereign rights to amass weapons and wage war, and that they should submit their disputes to authoritative international institutions of adjudication and enforcement; world peace would only be achieved through the establishment of world law (Clark and Sohn 1962).

Calls for world government in the post-World War Two era implied a deep suspicion about the sovereign state's potential as a vehicle for moral progress in world politics. Emery Reves’ influential The Anatomy of Peace, is a condemnation of the nation-state as a political institution: “The modern Bastille is the nation-state, no matter whether the jailers are conservative, liberal or socialist” (1945, 270). Echoing Rousseau, Reves argued that nation-states threaten human peace, justice and freedom, by diverting funds from important needs, prolonging a global climate of mistrust and fear, and creating a war machine that ultimately precipitates actual war. The experience of the world wars thus made it especially difficult to view states as agents of moral progress. David Mitrany, perhaps motivated by such suspicions, bracketed the idea of a world federation or world state, and focused on the role that “a spreading web of international activities and agencies” could play in the pursuit of world integration and peace (2003, 101).

Some did not reject the nation-state per se, but only authoritarian nondemocratic states as unfit partners for building a peaceful world order. The Atlantic Union Committee (AUC), formed in 1949 by Clarence Streit, for example, called for a federal union of democratic states that would be the genesis of a “free world government, as nations are encouraged by example to practice the principles which would make them eligible for membership, namely the principles of representative government and protection of individual liberty by law” (quoted in Baratta 2004, 470).

In the context of the Cold War (1945–89), however, the division of the world into two ideologically opposed camps — led by the United States (US) and the Union of Soviet Socialist Republics (USSR) — produced mutual distrust that pervaded the reception of all proposals for world government. Soviet opposition to all Western proposals as attempts to impose “American monopolistic capitalism” on the world (Goodman 1953, 234) made the world federalist movement's goal of establishing a universal federation infeasible. The Soviet leadership also condemned the AUC's proposal for an exclusive union of democracies as part of the Cold War rivalry — an attempt to strengthen the anti-communist (anti-Soviet) bloc.

In a distorted fashion, the Soviet Union became the historical manifestation of socialist or communist thought. Socialist ideas can be traced back to the French Revolution, but developed more fully as a response to negative aspects of the rapid growth of industry in the nineteenth century. At the same time that technological advancements promised great material progress, the changes they wrought in social and economic relations were not all positive. While the many workers, or “proletarians,” in new industrial factories worked under terrible conditions for meager wages, the few factory owners, “the bourgeoisie” or “capitalists,” amassed great wealth and power. According to Karl Marx, human history is a history of struggles not between nations or states, but between classes, created and destroyed by changing modes of production. The state as a centralized, coercive authority emerges under social modes of production at a certain stage of development, and is only necessary in a class society as the coercive instrument of the ruling class. The capitalist economic system, however, contains within it the seeds of its own destruction: capitalism necessitates the creation of an ever-growing proletarian class, and a global revolution by the proletariat will sweep away “the conditions for the existence of class antagonisms and of classes generally” (Marx 1848, 75). The state will fall along with the fall of classes: “The society that will organize production on the basis of a free and equal association of the producers will put the whole machinery of state where it will then belong: into the Museum of Antiquities, by the side of the spinning wheel and the bronze axe” (Engels 1884, 755). In a communist vision, capitalism is a necessary but transitional and ephemeral order of things; the revolutionary overthrow of capitalism by forces it unleashed itself is necessary to attain a new world order, “in which the free development of each is the condition for the free development of all” (Marx 1848, 75). World peace and freedom for all, especially freedom from the “alienated” or “estranged” labor (Marx 1844, 71–81) produced under capitalism, will be achieved through the transformation of a capitalist to a communist social order: “In proportion as the antagonism between classes within the nation vanishes, the hostility of one nation to another will come to an end” (73).

The Russian revolutionary, V.I. Lenin, drew on Marx to argue that the proletarian class needed to seize the coercive apparatus of the state to oppress the resisters and exploiters, the bourgeoisie, however, Lenin was committed to world revolution, and to the view that the state is “the organ of class rule,” and that even the “proletarian state will begin to wither away immediately after its victory because the state is unnecessary and cannot exist in a society in which there are no class antagonisms” (Lenin 1978, 135). Later Soviet leaders and elites who rejected Western proposals for world federation somewhat inconsistently envisaged the transcendence of nation-states and world capitalism, and the establishment of a world socialist economy governed by a “Bolshevik World State” (Goodman 1953, 231). In communist ideology, ultimately, balance-of-power politics between states enjoying unrestricted sovereignty did not cause war; the real cause of war was capitalism. In practice, the Soviet Union's internally and externally repressive policies made a mockery of socialist ideals of a classless society, or a world of peaceful socialist republics, and the disintegration of the Soviet Union itself spelled the practical end of one alternative to a capitalist economic world order.

Today, proposals for a world government with coercive powers and centralized authority structures have given way to proposals for noncoercive, decentralized structures of “global governance.” This evolution from “world government” to “global governance” reveals the promise and problems of building a world order based on liberal principles and values.

2. Debates in Contemporary Political Theory

2.1 International Relations Theory

Contemporary international relations theory developed out of the urgent need to explain and predict the causes of war and peace between sovereign states existing in a condition of anarchy, or the lack of a central overarching authority.

Contemporary international “realists” or “neorealists” claim not to evaluate the contemporary states system in normative terms. They liken the international order to a Hobbesian state of nature, where notions of justice and injustice have no place, and in which each unit is rationally motivated to pursue every means within its power to assure its own survival, even at the expense of others’ basic interests. Kenneth Waltz, in his seminal account of neorealism, Theory of International Politics, however, clearly favors a system of sovereign states over a world government (1979, 111–2). World government, according to Waltz, would not deliver universal, disinterested, impartial justice, order or security, but like domestic governments, it would be driven by its own particular or exclusive organizational interests, which it would pursue at the expense of the interests and freedom of states. Thus, while Waltz laments international anarchy as a necessary feature of interstate relations, he also celebrates its virtues, one of which he claims is the space it affords national freedom. With this argument, Waltz seems to be making a normative claim that an atomistic order of sovereign states is preferable from a moral point of view to a more integrated one that might impose burdens on states and inhibit their autonomy (Lu 2006a). These conclusions are ironic since the neorealist explanation of the cause of interstate war is the very condition of international anarchy, understood as the absence of a world government with supreme authority. The contemporary realist view is that this feature of the states system is an unalterable social fact; wars between states are thus tragedies of the unavoidable kind (Mearsheimer 2001).

“International society” theorists, or the “English school,” argue that although there is no central overriding authority above sovereign states, their relations are not wholly lawless or devoid of authoritative and enforceable norms and rules for conduct. The anarchy between states does not preclude the concept of a norm-governed society of states (Bull 1977). Since ‘international society’ theorists do not see the absence of a central global authority as necessitating a state-eat-state world, they regard the idea of world government as unnecessary, and potentially dangerous, since it may serve as a cloak in the struggle for imperial domination between states. Martin Wight has noted that the moral ideals of cosmopolitanism typically translate in practice into political tyranny and imperialism (1991). As an alternative to world government, and echoing both Rousseau and Kant, Chris Brown forwards “the ideal of a plurality of morally autonomous, just communities related to one another in a framework of peace and law” (1995, 106). Establishing an international society, ideally conceived, would make a supreme world government unnecessary.

Liberal internationalist accounts of world order are motivated by more than just the traditional preoccupation with problems of war and peace. This school of international relations thought, more than the preceding two, is explicitly critical of traditional accounts of state sovereignty. Richard Falk has depicted the contemporary world order as one of “inhumane governance,” identifying the following ills: global severe poverty affecting more than one billion human beings, denial of human rights to socially and culturally vulnerable groups, the persistent use and threat of war as an instrument of politics, environmental degradation, and the lack of transnational democratic accountability (1995, 1–2). A liberal internationalist agenda is advanced when progress is made on alleviating or correcting these ills. However, Falk is explicit that “humane governance can be achieved without world government, and that this is both the more likely and more desirable course of action” (8). By world government, Falk means a form of global political organization that has, at minimum, the following features: “compulsory peaceful settlement of all disputes by third-party decision in accordance with law; general and complete disarmament at the state and regional levels; a global legislative capacity backed up by enforcement capabilities; and some form of centralized leadership” (7). Instead of world government, Falk calls for “transnational democratic initiatives” from global civil society as well as United Nations reform, both of which would challenge and complement the statist and market forces that currently produce our contemporary global ills (207).

While international relations theorists of all persuasions seem to reject the possibility or desirability of world government, constructivist theorist Alexander Wendt has argued that the “logic of anarchy” contains within it the seeds of transformation towards a “global monopoly on the legitimate use of organized violence — a world state” (2003, 491). Using Aristotelian and Hegelian insights, Wendt offers a teleological account of the development of world order from an anarchic states system to a world state, arguing that “the struggle for recognition between states will have the same outcome as that between individuals, collective identity formation and eventually a state” (493). Technological changes, especially those that increase the “costs of war” as well as “the scale on which it is possible to organize a state,” affect the struggle for recognition among states, undermining their self-sufficiency and making a world state “inevitable” (493–4). Wendt draws on the work of Daniel Deudney (1995 and 1999), who has argued that the evolution of destructive technology makes states as vulnerable as individuals in a Hobbesian state of nature: “Hence nuclear one-worldism — just as the risks of the state of nature made it functional for individuals to submit to a common power, changes in the forces of destruction increasingly make it functional for states to do so as well” (Wendt 2003, 508). World state formation, according to Wendt, would be characterized by the emergence of “a universal security community,” in which members expect to resolve conflicts peacefully rather than through force; a “universal collective security” system that ensures the protection of each member should “crimes” occur; and a “universal supranational authority” that can make binding authoritative decisions about the collective use of force (505). Driving this transformation is the struggle for recognition, and the “political development of the system will not end until the subjectivity of all individuals and groups is recognized and protected by a global Weberian state” (506).

Wendt recognizes that powerful states enjoying the benefits of asymmetrical recognition may be most resistant to world state formation. He argues, however, that with the diffusion of greater violence potential to smaller powers (such as al-Qaeda and North Korea), “the ability of Great Powers to insulate themselves from global demands for recognition will erode, making it more and more difficult to sustain a system in which their power and privileges are not tied to an enforceable rule of law” (524). Based on the assumption that systems tend to develop toward stable end-states, a world state in which individuals and “states alike will have lost the negative freedom to engage in unilateral violence, but gained the positive freedom of fully recognized subjectivity” (525) is the inevitable end-state of the human struggle for recognition. At the same time that Wendt sees world state formation as an inevitable trajectory of the struggle for recognition between individuals and groups, he argues that a world state could take various forms: while collectivizing organized violence, it need not collectivize on a global scale culture, economy or local politics; while requiring a structure that “can command and enforce a collective response to threats,” it need not abolish national armies, or require a single UN army; and while it requires a procedure for making binding choices, “it would not even require a world ‘government’, if by this we mean a unitary body with one leader whose decisions are final” (506).

2.2 The Liberal Rejection of World Government

We now turn to debates about world government among contemporary liberal theorists. Since the publication of John Rawls's landmark A Theory of Justice in 1971, liberal theorists such as Charles Beitz and Thomas Pogge have sought to formulate a cosmopolitan version of liberalism by extending Rawlsian principles of domestic justice to the international realm. According to Beitz, a cosmopolitan liberal conception of international morality is “concerned with the moral relations of members of a universal community in which state boundaries have a merely derivative significance” (1999a, 181–2). Cosmopolitan liberalism evaluates the morality of domestic and international institutions based on “an impartial consideration of the claims of each person who would be affected” (1999b, 287). A cosmopolitan liberal theory of global justice thus begins with a conception of humanity as a common moral community of free and equal persons. This moral cosmopolitanism that Beitz and other liberal theorists endorse, however, is distinct from political or institutional cosmopolitanism in the form of a world state or government (Beitz 1994).

Although Rawls himself rejects cosmopolitan liberalism, disagreeing with his liberal critics on several critical issues related to global distributive justice, they are united in their agreement that a world state is not part of a liberal ideal for world order. In his treatise on global order, The Law of Peoples, Rawls forwards the concept of a society of peoples, governed by principles that will accommodate “cooperative associations and federations among peoples, but will not affirm a world-state” (1999, 36). He explicitly states his reason for rejecting the idea of a world state or government: “Here I follow Kant's lead in Perpetual Peace (1795) in thinking that a world government — by which I mean a unified political regime with the legal powers normally exercised by central governments — would either be a global despotism or else would rule over a fragile empire torn by frequent civil strife as various regions and peoples tried to gain their political freedom and autonomy” (36). Other liberal thinkers have similarly rejected the desirability of world government in the form of a domestic state writ large to cover the entire globe (Beitz 1999, 182; Jones 1999, 229; Tan 1994, 100; Tan 2000; Pogge 1988, 285; Satz 1999, 77-8).

In a related objection, “communitarian” liberals, such as Michael Walzer, argue against a centralized world government as a threat to social pluralism. Walzer thus endorses “sovereign statehood” as “a way of protecting distinct historical cultures, sometimes national, sometimes ethnic/religious in character,” and rejects a centralized global order because he does not “see how it could accommodate anything like the range of cultural and religious difference that we see around us today. … For some cultures and most orthodox religions can only survive if they are permitted degrees of separation that are incompatible with globalism. And so the survival of these groups would be at risk; under the rules of the global state, they would not be able to sustain and pass on their way of life” (2004, 172 and 176). At the same time that distinct communities may constitute intrinsic human goods, Walzer also endorses social and political pluralism as an instrumental good: given the diversity of human values, he argues that they “are best pursued politically in circumstances where there are many avenues of pursuit, many agents in pursuit. The dream of a single agent — the enlightened despot, the civilizing imperium, the communist vanguard, the global state — is a delusion” (188). A world of distinct, autonomous communities may be important to curbing the appetite of a hegemonic or global state to re-make the world in its own image.

The liberal rejection of world government does not mean, however, that most liberal political theorists are proponents of the status quo or traditional state sovereignty. Rawls's rejection of a world government does not negate the legitimacy and desirability of establishing international or transnational institutions to regulate cooperation between peoples and even to discharge certain common inter-societal duties. Thus, after his rejection of a world state, Rawls goes on to say that in a well-ordered society of peoples, organizations “(such as the United Nations ideally conceived) may have the authority to express for the society of well-ordered peoples their condemnation of unjust domestic institutions in other countries and clear cases of the violation of human rights. In grave cases they may try to correct them by economic sanctions, or even by military intervention. The scope of these powers covers all peoples and reaches their domestic affairs” (36). Rawls's vision of global order clearly rejects a world of atomistic sovereign states with the traditional powers of absolute sovereignty. Instead, his global vision includes “new institutions and practices” to “constrain outlaw states when they appear” (48), to promote human rights, and to discharge the duty of assistance owed to burdened societies.

Thomas Pogge argues that realizing “a peaceful and ecologically sound future will … require supranational institutions and organizations that limit the sovereignty rights of states more severely than is the current practice” (2000, 213). He sees this development to be possible only when a majority of states are stable democracies (213–4). Pogge thus appears to agree with Rawls (and Kant) that the path to perpetual peace (and environmental safety) lies in promoting the development of well-ordered states, characterized by democratically representative, responsive and responsible domestic governments.

As these lines of argument by Rawls and Pogge suggest, liberals have been quick to reject framing the choice of world orders as one between either a world of traditional sovereign states or a world with a global central government. Pogge has asserted that liberals should “dispense with the traditional concept of sovereignty and leave behind all-or-nothing debates about world government.” Instead, he argues for an “intermediate solution that provides for some central organs of world government without, however, investing them with ‘ultimate sovereign power and authority’” (1988, 285). Debra Satz has also argued that framing the choice as one between the current states system and “an all-powerful world-state” poses a false dilemma: “the contrast between a system of sovereign states and a centralized world-state is too crude. There are many other possibilities, including a state system restrained by international and intergovernmental institutions, a non-state-based economic system, a global separation-of-powers scheme, international federalism, and regional political-economic structures, such as those currently being developed in western Europe and the Americas (via NAFTA)” (1999, 77–8).

As the many liberal proposals for moral improvement of the world order indicate, liberal objections to world government — whether they take the form of tyranny/homogeneity arguments and/or the inefficiency/soullessness objections — are not motivated by a complacent attitude towards the contemporary world order and its resulting conditions (Pogge 2000). As Charles Jones has put it, these valid and plausible objections to world government do not show that “the status quo is preferable to some alternative arrangement” (1999, 229). While liberal theorists acknowledge the tyrannical potential of a world government, they also acknowledge that “sovereign states are themselves often the cause of the rights-violations of their citizens” (229). Kok-Chor Tan characterizes liberal proposals for world order to involve, therefore, neither world government nor absolute state sovereignty. Instead, liberals have argued consistently for restrictions on the traditional powers of sovereignty, as well as for the vertical dispersion of sovereignty, “upwards towards supranational bodies, and also downwards toward particular communities within states” (2000, 101). In such a world order, states become “another level of appeal, and not the sole and final one” (101).

David Held argues that this dispersion of sovereignty is inevitable given that the nation-state does not exist in an insular world, but a highly interdependent and complex system: the contemporary reality consists of a globalized economy, international organizations, regional and global institutions, international law, and military alliances, all of which operate to shape and constrain individual states. Although national sovereignty still has a place in the contemporary world order, “interconnected authority structures … displace notions of sovereignty as an illimitable, indivisible and exclusive form of public power” (1995, 137). In Held's account of cosmopolitan democracy, the universal realization of the liberal ideal of autonomy, derived from Kant, ultimately requires long-term institutional developments such as the creation of a global parliament, an international criminal court, the demilitarization of states, and global distributive justice in the form of a guaranteed annual income for each individual (279–80).

Critical theorist Iris Marion Young similarly calls for a global politics of non-domination, that would support “a vision of local and cultural autonomy in the context of global regulatory regimes” (2002, 237). Her model of global governance — “a post-sovereign alternative to the existing states system” (2000, 238) — entails a “decentred diverse democratic federalism” (253). While everyday governance would be primarily local, it would take place in the context of global regulatory regimes, built upon existing international institutions, that would be functionally defined to deal with “(1) peace and security, (2) environment, (3) trade and finance, (4) direct investment and capital utilization, (5) communications and transportation, (6) human rights, including labor standards and welfare rights, (7) citizenship and migration” (2002, 267). Young envisages these global regulatory regimes to apply not only to states, but also to non-state organizations, such as corporations, and individuals. In terms of feasibility, Young points to the development of a robust “global public sphere” (Habermas 1998) as crucial to bringing about “stronger global regulatory institutions tied to principles of global and local democracy” (Young 2002, 272).

While Young argues that “global governance should be organized democratically” (265), Anne-Marie Slaughter has rejected the idea of cosmopolitan democracy and a global parliament as infeasible and unwieldy (2004, 8 and 238). Slaughter is an advocate of “global governance,” in the sense of “a much looser and less threatening concept of collective organization and regulation without coercion,” to solve common global problems such as transnational crime, terrorism, and environmental destruction (9). According to Slaughter, states are not unitary, but “disaggregated” and increasingly “networked” through information, enforcement, and harmonization networks (167) — producing “a world of governments, with all the different institutions that perform the basic functions of governments — legislation, adjudication, implementation — interacting both with each other domestically and also with their foreign and supranational counterparts” (5). A networked world order, she argues, “would be a more effective and potentially more just world order than either what we have today or a world government in which a set of global institutions perched above nation-states enforced global rules” (6–7). Although Slaughter is keen to highlight the promise of “global governance through government networks” as “good public policy for the world and good national foreign policy” (261), she acknowledges that in contemporary world conditions of radical social, economic and political inequality between states and peoples, effective and fair global governance will require the networks comprising global governance to abide by the norms of “global deliberative equality,” toleration of reasonable and legitimate difference, and “positive comity” in the form of consultation and active assistance between organizations; in addition, global governance networks would need to be made more accountable through a system of checks and balances, and more responsive through the principle of subsidiarity (244–60). Without movement towards a more equitable world of mutual respect, however, it is difficult to see actually existing global governance networks operating in an impartial and generous spirit to help “all nations and their peoples to achieve greater peace, prosperity, stewardship of the earth, and minimum standards of human dignity” (166).

3. Conclusion: Power, Responsiveness and Responsibility

Some think that the idea of world government involves a paradox: however it is conceived institutionally, when the winning conditions exist for establishing a desirable form of world government or global governance — one that will guarantee human security with individual liberty, protect the environment, and advance global social justice — it will no longer be necessary (Nielsen 1988, 276). Once all governments, especially the most powerful ones, are willing to build and use government networks to promote global peace, justice and environmental protection, and to cede some traditional rights of sovereignty to supranational institutions in areas such as the use of military force, the management and protection of the environment and natural resources, and the distribution of wealth, the establishment of a global political authority might seem superfluous. As Alexander Wendt has pointed out, however, a stable end-state of world order development requires such ideal conditions, should they ever develop, to become institutionalized into a world state that enacts “a global monopoly on the legitimate use of organized violence” (491); enforcement mechanisms are not superfluous, since there is always the possibility of violations by outlaw states and groups.

One might wonder, however, if linking the realization of cosmopolitan ethical aims to a world government agenda may misidentify the barriers to their realization (Lu 2006a, 106–7). Thus Pogge has argued for a Global Resources Dividend (GRD) to eradicate global severe poverty (2000, 196–215) that could work effectively with a decentralized method of enforcement, but notes, “Without the support of the US and the EU, massive global poverty and starvation will certainly not be eradicated in our lifetimes” (211). Similarly, the former UN Secretary-General's special envoy for HIV/AIDS in Africa, Stephen Lewis, has not lamented the absence of a world government as the cause of the lack of treatment for the large majority of Africa's infected population; instead, after being disappointed time after time by the chasm between promised and actually delivered funds to help the seven million (projected to rise eventually to thirty million) poor suffering from AIDS/HIV in Africa, he has condemned “the wealthy governments of the western world” because they “simply cannot be trusted to deliver the goods” (2006, 198). A world government, or global governance structure, that similarly lacks a political commitment to such issues, would most likely also fail to deliver on the goods.

According to the Independent Working Group on the Future of the United Nations, by the middle of this century, “it is likely that the nature of statehood and assumptions about national sovereignty will have evolved in response to global needs and to an enlarged sense of world community” (quoted in Baratta 2004, 527). Given contemporary world conditions, marked by radical economic inequalities and vast power disparities, the question of whose “sense of world community” and whose “global needs” will define the global political agenda and order, might very well be obscured by the discourse of “global governance.”

Proponents of world government may be heartened by the realization of one institutional development in the contemporary world order — the establishment of an International Criminal Court (ICC) to try individuals, including heads of state, for the offences of genocide, war crimes and crimes against humanity. The ICC is a treaty-based international institution, and its jurisdiction is limited by the concept of “complementarity,” which allows the Court to exercise its jurisdiction only when domestic national courts fail to prosecute due to lack of will or incompetence. In principle, then, the ICC does not threaten to undermine the authority of well-functioning domestic legal orders, and may simultaneously limit and enhance state rights and responsibilities. Global authority thus need not undermine national authority structures. It may be disturbing to some, however, that the first institution of cosmopolitan justice to be entrenched at the international level is not concerned with global distributive justice, but with global criminal justice. A world order that is quick to punish through the ICC, but slow to help empower the destitute and marginalized, would constitute a perversion rather than a fulfillment cosmopolitan ideals (Lu 2006b, 206).

World government as an ideal expresses an aspiration for law-governed, just and peaceful relations between the diverse groups that comprise a common moral community of humankind. World government as an idea or proposal about how to organize the world politically, however, may or may not meet that ideal. That is, even if there were a world state with authoritative legislative, adjudicative and enforcement powers, the elimination of organized violence, poverty and environmental degradation would not automatically follow. The proponents of global governance face a similar challenge. It remains to be seen whether the developing agents, networks and structures of global governance can effectively promote environmental protection; will be able to develop authoritative mechanisms for disciplining the use of force, by nonstate actors as well as by the world's most powerful states; and will serve the interests of the bottom half of humanity barely eking out a living, even if it means demanding a small sacrifice from the fortunate fifteen percent of humankind living in the world's high-income economies. For those who lament present day conditions, Wendt's teleological theory of world order development might provide some comfort and inspiration in reminding us that history is not over.


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citizenship | cosmopolitanism | Dante Alighieri | globalization | Hobbes, Thomas | justice: international | Kant, Immanuel | Rousseau, Jean Jacques | sovereignty | war