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Theories of Criminal Law

First published Mon Oct 14, 2002; substantive revision Mon Apr 14, 2008

Philosophical ‘theories of criminal law’ may be analytical or normative (§ 1). Once we have identified the salient features that distinguish criminal law from other kinds of law (§2), we ask whether and why we should maintain such an institution (§3). Instrumentalist answers to this question portray criminal law as an efficient technique that helps us achieve worthwhile ends; non-instrumentalist answers portray it as an intrinsically appropriate response to certain kinds of wrongful conduct (§4). By considering the question of how the criminal law should address citizens (§5), we can discern the truth in the non-instrumentalist perspective. The next question concerns the proper scope of the criminal law: what kinds of conduct should be criminalised? Several candidate principles of criminalisation are critically discussed (§6), including the Harm Principle, and the claim that the criminal law should be concerned with ‘public’, rather than merely ‘private’, wrongs.Further questions are raised, however (§7), by the increasingly important phenomenon of international criminal law.

1. Different Kinds of Theory

‘Theories of criminal law’ could just be general theories of law applied to the particular case of criminal law: proponents of legal positivism, of natural law, of economic analysis of law, of Critical Legal Studies and other schools of legal theory will expect to be able to say about the criminal law what they say about law in general (for examples of the last two approaches, see Posner 1985; Kelman 1981). Questions raised by theories of this kind will figure in what follows—for instance whether it is part of the essence of criminal law that it must satisfy, or make, certain kinds of moral demand; whether criminal law can be adequately understood in purely instrumental terms; whether we should take the criminal law's apparent pretensions to rationality and principle seriously, or should rather see it as an oppressive exercise of political or economic power, or as the site of conflicts which produce an irredeemably contradictory, unprincipled set of doctrines and norms (see Norrie 2001). Such questions are important, but we will not begin with them. We should, instead, begin by asking what is distinctive about criminal law. What marks it out from other kinds or aspects of law? What are its distinctive institutional structures, purposes, or content?

Philosophical theories of criminal law can be analytical, or normative (see Husak 1987: 20-26). Analytical theorists seek to explain the concept of criminal law, and related concepts such as—most obviously—that of crime (metaphysically more ambitious theorists might seek an account not merely of the concept of criminal law, but of its real, metaphysical nature; see Moore 1997: 18-30). They need not look for a strict, ahistorical definition—an account of the necessary and sufficient conditions given, and only given, which a human practice counts as a system of criminal law; we have no reason to think that any such definition will be available. But they can hope to identify and explain the central or salient features of systems of criminal law—features at least some of which will be exhibited by anything we can count as a system of criminal law; and to develop an account of a paradigm of criminal law, on the basis of which we can recognise as systems of criminal law other practices that resemble that paradigm sufficiently closely, even though they do not quite fit it.

Normative theorists seek an account not just of what criminal law is, but of what it ought to be (and whether it ought to be at all). Should we maintain a system of criminal law? If so, what goals should it serve, what values should inform it, what should its scope and structure be? Any such normative theory must presuppose some analytical account of that whose goals, values, scope and structure are being discussed. Whether analytical and normative theorising are related more closely than this will depend on what kind of analytical theory we develop: a legal positivist will insist that, here as elsewhere, the question of what law ought to be is quite separate from, and left open by answers to, the question of what law is; a Natural law theorist will argue that an adequate analysis of the concept or the metaphysical nature of criminal law will reveal the moral purposes or values that a practice must serve (or at least claim to serve) if it is to count as a system of criminal law at all (see Moore 1997: 23-35).

Philosophical theories of criminal law, whether analytical or normative, cannot subsist in isolation. They must have some regard to the empirical actualities of that which they theorise: to the histories of the different systems of criminal law, and to sociological inquiries into their actual operations. Some critical theorists believe that such historical or sociological inquiries will undercut the pretensions of philosophical theorising: that what needs analysing is not the superstructure or superficial self-presentation of the criminal law, on which philosophers tend to concentrate, but the social, political and economic realities lying beneath that surface; and that given the oppressive or conflictual nature of those realities, philosophical theories cannot amount to anything more than doomed attempts to rationalise what is inherently irrational or a-rational (see Kelman 1981; Norrie 2001; also Law and Ideology). The only adequate reply to these critiques of philosophical theorising is to show how such theorising can assist both an understanding of what criminal law is, and the discussion of what it ought to be, by taking seriously the concepts in terms of which it presents itself: that is the task on which we embark in what follows.

(Another way in which philosophical theories of criminal law cannot subsist in isolation is that they cannot be wholly separate from other branches of philosophy. They must draw, most obviously, on political philosophy, since they must depend on some conception of the proper aims of the state and of the proper relationship between a state and its citizens (see e.g. Pettit 1997, 2002; Duff 2001: chs 2-3; Dubber 2005; Dagger 2008). They must draw on moral philosophy, insofar as the criminal law properly aims to define types of moral wrong and to punish those who culpably commit them (see e.g. Moore 1997; Tadros 2005). They must draw on philosophy of action and on philosophy of mind, if they are to explicate ideas of wrongdoing and of fault that are appropriate to law's wrong-defining role (see e.g. Moore 1993; Green 2005; Gardner 2007).)

2. Aspects of Criminal Law

We can usefully begin by identifying some of the salient features of the systems of criminal law with which we are familiar (contemporary systems of municipal criminal law): features by which we can distinguish the criminal law both from non-legal phenomena and from other types of law. It would be unproductive to ask whether all these are strictly necessary features of criminal law, or whether we might still count a practice that lacked one or more of them as a system of criminal law; the most we can sensibly claim is that these are defining features of the paradigm of criminal law as we understand and experience it.

The criminal law deals with crimes: but what is a crime—and how does the criminal law deal with it?

Crimes, we might initially say, are kinds of conduct that are defined by the law as wrong. However, even this crude initial approximation must be qualified. First, we can say that crime always involves ‘conduct’ only if we stretch the meaning of that term so far as to empty it of substantial content (see Husak 1987: ch. 4): we can (whether justly or not) be held criminally liable not merely for what we do, or fail to do, but for what we are, perhaps even for what we think—for what we intend, for instance. But for the moment we can talk of ‘conduct’, since it captures the most familiar kinds of crime. Second, we must not, or must not yet, read ‘wrong’ here as ‘morally wrong’: it will be a further question whether the criminal law either must of its very nature, or should as a matter of normative theory, portray the conduct it criminalises as morally wrong; all we should say so far is that it portrays it as being in some way wrong or defective, something that those bound by the law should not do (this point is often expressed by saying that the criminal law ‘prohibits’ the conduct that it defines as criminal, but we will see in section 5 that this is misleading). That is, for instance, the defining difference between a law that defines a certain kind of conduct as a crime which is punishable by a fine, and one that subjects that conduct to a tax: both laws might be intended to reduce the incidence of the conduct, but the former, unlike the latter, does by defining and punishing it as wrong.

Crimes differ from extra-legal wrongs in that they are defined as wrongs by the law: they are not, or not just, wrongs in terms of some extra-legal social standard of morality, prudence, or etiquette, but wrongs that are defined and recognised as such by the law. (This leaves open the question of whether the criminal law can create wrongs, or whether it rather gives formal recognition to wrongs whose wrongfulness is initially determined by extra-legal standards.) But not all legally defined wrongs are criminal wrongs.

First, some legal systems distinguish between ‘crimes’ properly speaking and other kinds of penalised conduct. So German law distinguishes ‘Strafrecht’ and ‘Straftaten’ (criminal law and crimes) from ‘Ordnungswidrigkeitenrecht’ and ‘Ordnungswidrigkeiten’ (regulations and violations; Weigend 1988); and the American Law Institute's Model Penal Code distinguishes ‘crimes’ from ‘violations’ (s. 1.04). Violations might include conduct that other legal systems count as criminal, although even in systems in which it counts formally as criminal, it is often seen as not ‘really’ criminal (thus German Ordnungswidrigkeitenrecht includes many traffic violations that English law defines as crimes, although many drivers would deny that they are ‘real’ crimes). They are distinguished from crimes by the procedures for dealing with them, the relative mildness of the sanctions they attract, and the absence of some of the other consequences that typically attach to conviction for a crime—such as a criminal record. I will not discuss this distinction further here, save to note that it can be justified (if it is justifiable) either on pragmatic grounds—mere violations are not dangerous enough to justify mobilising the expensive resources of the criminal justice system; or on principled grounds—they do not involve serious enough wrongs to merit the condemnation that a criminal conviction, as we will see, involves (for further, more critical discussion, see Weigend 1988; Steiker 1997; Duff et al 2007: ch 6.5.

Second, most legal systems distinguish criminal from civil wrongs: wrongs that ground a criminal prosecution, from those that ground a civil case for damages brought by the injured party. We can clarify the concept of crime by focusing on this distinction. The same conduct often constitutes both a criminal and a civil wrong, as is shown most dramatically when, after a failed prosecution or a decision not to prosecute, the victim or her family bring a civil case for damages against the alleged wrongdoer: but we can still usefully ask what the difference is between defining and treating conduct as a criminal wrong and defining and treating it as a civil wrong (see generally Murphy & Coleman 1990: ch. 3; Boston University Law Review 1996).

Civil wrongs are typically treated as ‘private’ matters in the sense that it is for the victim to investigate what happened, to identify the alleged wrongdoer, and to bring a case against him. The law provides the institutions (the courts, arbitration panels) through which that case can be brought; it lays down the norms by reference to which the case is decided; it specifies what remedies are available; it might also help successful plaintiffs to extract damages from unwilling defendants. But it is for the injured party to bring, or to decide not to bring, a case; to pursue, or to abandon, that case; to insist on extracting the damages the court awarded, or to forgo them. The case is described and understood as ‘P v D’: P sues D, and the case thus belongs to her. The criminal law, however, provides for the public investigation, prosecution and punishment of crimes: for a police force, tasked with investigating (as well as preventing) crime and detecting criminals; for a system of criminal courts, in which defendants are tried for the crimes that they are alleged to have committed (and whose workings are structured by a complex array of procedural rules and requirements); for a system of punishments that will be imposed by the courts, and administered by other institutions and officials. Now the police act in the name and with the authority not just of the victim, but of the whole polity; it is for the prosecuting authority, not for the victim, to decide whether, and on what charge, anyone will be prosecuted. If the victim does not want the case to go to court, the prosecutors will in fact often not proceed with it—because it would be hard to do so without the victim's willing co-operation, or out of concern for the victim's feelings; but cases can be prosecuted despite the victim's unwillingness (this can be an important issue for prosecutors dealing with domestic violence; see Dempsey 2007). When the case comes to court, it is described not as ‘P v D’, but as ‘State v D’, or ‘People v D’, or ‘Queen v D’: D is prosecuted not by an individual victim, but by the polity—or, in societies that have not yet shaken off the trappings of undemocratic monarchy, by its sovereign. (Some legal systems allow the possibility of private prosecutions; this is one of several ways in which the distinction between criminal and civil law is neither sharp nor watertight.)

The difference between the public character of criminal wrongs and the private character of civil wrongs is also evident in the outcomes of the two kinds of legal process. A civil case typically results in a finding either for the plaintiff, or for the defendant; if the plaintiff wins, the defendant may have to pay her damages, as compensation for the harm that she suffered, and for which she has sued. Criminal cases, by contrast, result in a conviction or an acquittal; if the defendant is convicted, he is liable to suffer a punishment. Criminal convictions express an explicit condemnation of the defendant: he has been proved guilty of doing wrong, and the verdict is focused on that wrong. A verdict for the plaintiff in a civil case will typically imply that the defendant acted wrongfully, but the focus of the case, and thus of the verdict, is more on who should pay for whatever harm was caused (see Ripstein 1999: chs. 2-4).

Finally, the punishments imposed for crimes differ from the damages that are awarded as a result of a civil suit—and not just in the fact that whereas the successful plaintiff can forego the damages she is awarded, it is not for the victim of a crime to decide whether the sentence imposed by the court should be carried out. Often punishments take a different material form from civil damages, as when an offender is imprisoned or put on probation. Even when their material form does not differ, however (as when a convicted offender is fined £1,000, and the defendant who loses a civil case is ordered to pay £1,000 in damages), their meanings differ. First, even if the severity of criminal punishments is to some degree determined by the extent of the harm caused (itself a controversial matter), it typically also depends on the nature and degree of the offender's culpability for that harm: someone who kills or injures recklessly can expect to be punished more severely than someone who causes death or injury by a negligent act or omission. Civil damages, however, are proportioned to the harm actually caused; some kind of culpability, such as negligence, might be a threshold requirement, in that the plaintiff must prove that the defendant was at least negligent in relation to the harm he caused; but the damages are not proportioned to the degree of the defendant's culpability, since their purpose is simply to provide compensation for the harm caused. Second, punishments are intended to be painful or burdensome, whereas civil damages are not (indeed, this is standardly cited as a defining feature of punishment). If I am ordered to pay £1,000 compensation for damage that I negligently caused to your property, making that payment might be burdensome for me, if I am not well off, or no burden at all, if I am rich (or have suitable insurance): but the damages serve their purpose in either case. If, however, I am fined as punishment for a crime, that fine is intended to be burdensome: that is why many sentencing authorities aim to proportion fines to the offender's means, to ensure that both rich and poor offenders are burdened fairly and proportionately; and that is what is wrong with the idea that one might take out insurance to cover the cost of fines.

These distinctions between criminal and civil outcomes are often blurred in practice. For instance, English criminal courts can include a ‘compensation order’ in the sentence that they impose, thus bringing a dimension of civil law into the criminal process (see Powers of Criminal Courts (Sentencing) Act 2000 s.130); some civil systems allow for the award of ‘punitive damages’, which are intended to burden the defendant. More generally, civil plaintiffs might be seeking an apology rather than damages that could compensate for the material harm they have suffered—this is often true in libel cases, for instance, or in cases in which bereaved parents sue the hospital or corporation that negligently caused their child's death: in such cases, any damages that are awarded might best be rationalised as a way of giving material form and force to the apology; but if they are to serve that role, they must be burdensome (see Duff 2001: 94-96). Nonetheless, we can still draw a useful analytical distinction between two paradigms: a civil paradigm, which focuses on harm that has been caused and on the question of where the costs of that harm should fall; and a criminal paradigm, which focuses on a wrong that has been done and on the question of who—if anyone—should be condemned and punished for that wrong. The civil paradigm is a matter of private law in the sense that it aims to provide compensation and satisfaction for the aggrieved plaintiff, if she chooses to pursue the case; the criminal paradigm is, by contrast, a matter of public law in the sense that the case is brought and the punishment is imposed in the name and on behalf of the whole polity rather than any individual victim.

We now have a sketch of the criminal law as a distinctive kind of human institution. This then raises three further questions. First, should we have such an institution at all? Second, if we should, what goals or purposes should it serve? Third, what should its content be, or how should that content be determined: what kinds of conduct should be criminal, and how should we go about deciding that issue?

3. Should We Abolish the Criminal Law?

Although the criminal law is a pervasive, and might seem to be an inescapable, feature of the developed societies in which we live, there are those who argue that, precisely in virtue of the paradigmatic features identified in the previous section, it is an institution that we should seek to abolish: this is a central strand of the ‘abolitionist’ movement which, whilst often focusing most directly on the abolition of criminal punishment, also incorporates a critique of criminal law (see Legal Punishment ss. 2, 7). Abolitionist critics focus on three aspects of criminal law which, they argue, make it an utterly unsuitable institution for the kinds of social life and the kinds of relationship that we should seek (see Christie 1977; Hulsman 1986; Bianchi 1994).

First, the criminal law purports to declare and enforce authoritative standards of value, in particular of moral value: it claims the authority to tell us how we should live, and to enforce its demands on us if we disagree or disobey. But this, critics argue, amounts to an illegitimate attempt to impose a moral consensus—inevitably the consensus of those with political power—on societies which are rather characterised by radical moral disagreement; it denies to those who do not share that consensus the freedom to think and live as they see fit.

Second, the criminal law ‘steals conflicts’ from those to whom they properly belong. Of course citizens often find themselves in conflict with one another; their relationships are often impaired by various ‘troubles’. Such conflicts and troubles must be resolved; any harms that have been done must be repaired. But that is a task for those most directly involved—for the ‘victim’ and the ‘offender’ (though we should be cautious about such notions), with the help of their local community. The criminal law, however, in defining such conflicts or troubles as criminal wrongs to be dealt with by a public criminal process, steals them: it transfers them to the professionalized context of a criminal justice system in which neither victims nor offenders are allowed really to participate; it thus denies those to whom the conflict belongs the chance to work it out for themselves.

Third, the criminal law deals in punishment—in ‘pain delivery’—when what is needed is instead a process that will repair whatever harm was caused, reconcile the people involved in the conflict, and thus restore the relationships that the conflict damaged. Criminal punishment cannot contribute to those appropriate ends: it reflects a primitive, backward-looking concern with retributive justice, whereas we should rather be seeking a forward-looking restorative or reparative justice.

I will not discuss the third objection here, since it belongs with the discussion of criminal punishment (see Legal Punishment ss. 2, 7): but we will see that the familiar consequentialist and retributivist models for the justification of punishment have analogues in accounts of the proper aims of criminal law more generally. The following sections will constitute an answer to the first two objections. Abolitionists are right to highlight these two features of a system of criminal law: it claims the authority to declare certain public norms of conduct (norms that must, as we will see, claim a moral foundation), and to insist on respect for those norms even from those who do not share them; and it makes breaches of those norms its business, and so the business of the whole polity in whose name and on whose behalf the law claims to speak and to act, rather than leaving them as the business purely of those who are most immediately involved. The question is whether and how we can justify maintaining institutional practices of this kind.

The first objection is, as it stands, unimpressive, and sometimes expresses an incoherent moral relativism which makes the moral demand that we should not make moral demands of others (see B. Williams 1976: 34-9). It does reflect two general issues that face any attempt to justify systems of political authority and law: the question of how far a polity depends for its legitimacy on a normative consensus, at least a Rawlsian overlapping consensus, amongst its members, and how far law and polity are possible in contexts of radical disagreement; and the question of whether and how a polity can claim legitimate authority over those who reject its central values and its normative claims. We cannot pursue these questions here, although we may note that they are as urgent for abolitionists as they are for advocates of the criminal law, since their favoured practices and institutions depend, just as a system of criminal law does, on the legitimacy and authority of the polity that sustains them. However, this first objection does also raise a question that is more specific to the criminal law, and that must be answered by those who would defend the criminal law: what kinds of norm, with what kind of claimed authority, does or should the criminal law declare—and should we maintain an institution that seeks to declare and support such norms?

The second objection focuses our attention on the distinction between civil and criminal law sketched in the previous section. We might agree with the abolitionists that our existing criminal procedures do not allow either victims or offenders the actively participatory roles that they should be able and encouraged to play, but the basic question is still this: should we maintain a system of law that defines and responds to a category of ‘public’ wrongs—wrongs that concern not only the particular victim and offender, but the whole polity; wrongs which are ‘our’ business collectively as a polity, and which must therefore be investigated and dealt with by a public process—which inevitably involves taking them out of the hands of those most immediately affected by them?

4. Instrumental and Moralistic Conceptions of Criminal Law

We can begin to tackle these two questions by distinguishing two radically different ways of conceptualising criminal law. We might decide, in the end, that a plausible account will have to draw on both kinds of conception; but we can usefully begin by contrasting simple, pure versions of each.

One conception is instrumental. The criminal law is a technique or instrument that can be used to serve various possible ends. We are justified in maintaining a system of criminal law if it is an efficient technique for achieving worthwhile ends; its structure and content should then be determined by asking how it can serve those ends most efficiently.

What worthwhile ends could a system of criminal law serve? We cannot simply say that it should prevent or reduce crime, since without the criminal law there would be no crimes—no conduct would count as criminal. However, a number of plausible goals could be posited, reflecting a range of views both about human goods and about the proper roles and functions of the state. The American Model Penal Code, for instance, declares that:

The general purposes of the provisions governing the definition of offenses are:

a) to forbid and prevent conduct that unjustifiably and inexcusably inflicts or threatens substantial harm to individual or public interests [s. 1.01(1)].

We begin with a set of individual and public interests that merit protection, given their role in human welfare: they can be protected by various methods, including various state activities; a system of criminal law makes its distinctive contribution to their protection by forbidding and thus preventing conduct that threatens substantial harm to them. German criminal law theory posits a similar starting point: a set of individual and collective Rechtsgüter (a Rechtsgut is a good which the law properly recognises as being necessary for social peace or for individual well-being, and as therefore meriting legal protection) which the criminal law protects against conduct that seriously threatens them (see Roxin 2006: 8-47; for critical discussion of the utility of the idea of Rechtsgüter see Wohlers et al 2003). As we will see in § 6, it is not yet clear whether or how individual as distinct from public or collective interests should figure in an account of the protective aims of the criminal law, and some accounts certainly emphasise the collective dimension. Thus on Walker's ‘pragmatic’ account, the criminal law should aim to further the “smooth functioning of society and the preservation of order” (Walker 1980: 18, quoting Devlin 1965: 5)—collective or shared goods which provide essential preconditions for individual flourishing.

Two aspects of such instrumentalist accounts are worth noting here. First, they typically limit the criminal law's concern to serious harms to the specified kinds of interest, that cannot be otherwise prevented: thus the Model Penal Code refers to “substantial harm”, and German theorists argue that criminal law should be used only as a last resort against seriously harmful conduct (see Roxin 2006: 45-7; also, more generally, Husak 2004; Jareborg 2005). This kind of limitation can itself be rationalised in instrumental terms. The criminal law is a blunt and oppressive technique, which impinges seriously on the interests of those who are subjected to its coercive attention: not just those who are convicted and punished, but also those who are caught up in police investigations, or who are tried and acquitted, A consequentialist calculus of costs and benefits is therefore unlikely to favour its use unless it is the only feasible method of preventing quite serious harm.

But, second, the Model Penal Code also limits the criminal law's concern to conduct that “unjustifiably and inexcusably inflicts or threatens substantial harm” (see lso Feinberg 1984: 31-6); and most criminal codes include similar limitations. The ‘unjustifiably’ limit might still be justified instrumentally; we should not want to prevent conduct that justifiably causes harm. Some theorists argue that we can also justify the ‘inexcusably’ limit in instrumental terms (e.g. Braithwaite & Pettit 1990): that the criminal law's goals are not efficiently served by criminalising faultless or excusable conduct. Others, however, ground this limit in a non-instrumental side-constraint on the aim of harm-prevention: a purely instrumentalist theory cannot justify criminalising only culpable conduct; we must instead appeal to a non-instrumentalist demand of justice, that those who lack fault should not be liable to criminal punishment (see Hart 1968: 17-24, 28-53).

What emerges here is a familiar difference between two types of instrumentalist theory (see Braithwaite & Pettit 1990: 26-36). A pure instrumentalist seeks to explain every aspect of a justified system of criminal law in consequentialist terms; in designing a system, we need only ask which doctrines, practices and rules will efficiently serve the goals we have posited. A side-constrained instrumentalist, by contrast, argues that our pursuit of those goals is also constrained by non-consequentialist values—for instance by requirements of justice—which might preclude some practices—for instance the criminalisation of faultless conduct—even if those practices would efficiently serve the system's goals.

For any instrumentalist theory, whether pure or side-constrained, it is an open empirical question whether we should maintain a system of criminal law at all: we should do so only if this is an efficient means to whatever goals the theory posits. For a pure instrumentalist, the proper structure and contents of a system of criminal law also depend on an empirical inquiry into how those goals can be most efficiently served, whilst side-constrained instrumentalists must also attend to whatever non-consequentialist constraints bear on these issues. We cannot pursue the debates between these two kinds of account, but should note one set of questions that must figure in them, about the relation between criminal and moral wrongs.

Some instrumentalists hold that we should criminalise only conduct that is in some way immoral, and should punish only agents who are morally culpable for such conduct: thus, for instance, Braithwaite and Pettit “assume … that only persons who are morally culpable for a prescribed [sic] encroachment upon the dominion of others should be convicted” (1990: 99), whilst the Model Penal Code declares another purpose of the criminal law to be “to safeguard conduct that is without fault from condemnation as criminal” (s. 1.02(1)(c)). Others seem less sure about this. Walker, for instance, sees reason to criminalise conduct that provokes social disorder, even if we would, speaking morally, blame that disorder on the intolerance of others rather than on the moral wrongness of the conduct (1980: 21). As for moral culpability, Hart argues that we should explain excuse doctrines not as aiming to exempt the morally faultless from criminal liability, but as aiming to protect individual freedom by subjecting to liability only those who had a fair opportunity to avoid it (1968: 17-24).

Thus an instrumentalist approach to the justification of criminal law seems to leave it as something of an open question whether the law should criminalise only immoral conduct, or should subject only morally culpable agents to criminal liability. At the other extreme of the spectrum of theories of criminal law, by contrast, we find accounts that make immorality and moral culpability central to the proper concerns of the criminal law.

Criminal law, Stephen notoriously argued, “is in the nature of a persecution of the grosser forms of vice”; conduct is properly criminalised

not only because [it is] dangerous to society, and so ought to be prevented, but also for the sake of gratifying the feeling of hatred—call it revenge, resentment or what you will—which the contemplation of such conduct excites in healthily constituted minds (1873/ 1967: 152).

One could read Stephen as offering what is still an instrumentalist account of criminal law; it is important to satisfy that “feeling of hatred and the desire of vengeance … a regular public and legal manner” (loc. cit.), because otherwise they will find more violent, uncontrolled and socially harmful expression (compare Gardner 1998: 31-32). But he clearly also believed that such feelings and desires were intrinsically appropriate responses to the grosser forms of vice, which deserved to be thus satisfied; and we find a contemporary version of this kind of view in Moore's claim that criminal law should be understood as a functional kind, whose function is to achieve retributive justice by punishing “all and only those who are morally culpable in the doing of some morally wrongful action” (Moore 1997: 35). This is, as it stands, a wholly non-instrumentalist, intrinsicalist account of the proper purpose of the criminal law: it has no purpose beyond itself, beyond the punishment of culpable agents for their immoral conduct; it does not even, apparently, aim to reduce the incidence of such conduct.

Moore offers what looks at first like an extreme and simple version of ‘Legal Moralism’, the view that “all and only moral wrongs should be criminally prohibited” (1997: 662), but in fact the implications of his account are less dramatic than this might suggest. The immorality of a given kind of conduct creates a presumption in favour of criminalising it—it ‘should be criminally prohibited’. However, that presumption can be defeated by other considerations to do with the impact of criminalisation; in particular, a proper regard for individual liberty will dissuade us from actually criminalising much wrongful conduct (see Moore 1997: ch. 18).

There are, of course, other types of Legal Moralism than Moore's. Any version of Legal Moralism claims that the immorality of a given kind of conduct is significantly relevant to the question of whether it should be criminalised. We can then distinguish positive from negative versions. Positive Legal Moralists hold that immorality is a good reason for criminalisation—not necessarily that it creates a presumption in favour of criminalisation, but that it provides a reason that should carry some weight in our deliberations (see Feinberg 1984: 27; 1988: 324). Negative Legal Moralists hold instead that immorality constitutes only a necessary condition for criminalisation: we must not criminalise conduct unless it is immoral, but its immorality does not give us any positive reason to criminalise it. Negative Legal Moralism, like negative retributivism (see Dolinko 1991: 539-43), acts as a side-constraint on our pursuit of the goals that provide our positive reasons for maintaining a system of criminal law, whereas a positive Legal Moralism helps to set those goals. We should note too that a positive Legal Moralist as defined here need not be a negative Legal Moralist: one can believe that immorality provides a good reason for criminalisation whilst also believing that there are other reasons, including reasons for criminalising conduct that is not immoral. (We will also look later at the argument that whilst immorality as such provides no reason for criminalisation, immorality of the right kind does provide a good reason.) Furthermore, even positive Legal Moralists need not think, with Moore, that the reason for criminalising immoral conduct is precisely and only to secure its retributive punishment: she could instead believe, as Feinberg's Legal Moralist does, that we should criminalise it in order to prevent it, and therefore only if criminalising it would be likely to reduce its incidence (see Feinberg 1988: 324).

It might seem that negative Legal Moralism is straightforwardly undermined by the fact that many of the offences defined by a modern criminal law constitute mala prohibita rather than mala in se. Mala in se, as normally understood, are crimes consisting in conduct that is wrong independently of the criminal law—that would have been wrong even had there been no criminal law. Mala prohibita, on the other hand, consist in conduct that is not wrongful independently of the law that prohibits it: if they are wrong, their wrongfulness depends essentially on their illegality. The distinction between mala in se and mala prohibita is neither clear nor uncontroversial, but does point to something important: malicious killing, for instance, is wrong, something that we all have very good reason not to do, independently of law of murder; by contrast, there is nothing wrong with driving from north to south down a narrow street in the absence of a regulation making it a south to north one-way street. However, Legal Moralists can easily justify a category of mala prohibita. If the legislature is justified in creating the kinds of regulation that mala prohibita involve (such as traffic regulations), to serve some aspect of the common good, breaches of such regulations might be moral wrongs (though their weongfulness will need to be shown, not just assumed); that wrongfulness provides, for the Legal Moralist, a reason to criminalise such breaches—to define them not merely as morally neutral breaches of a regulation, but as criminal (see further Green 1997; Duff 2007: chs 4.4, 7.3; and, for criticism, Husak 2005).

Were we faced by a stark choice between an instrumentalist view of the criminal law and a view like Moore's, we might think that some form of instrumentalism has to be right. Even if we think that, once we have a system of criminal law, we must justify criminal punishment in retributivist terms (which is itself controversial), it seems much less plausible to think that we should create and maintain the whole edifice of criminal law simply in order to condemn and punish immoral actions; surely at least a central part of the purpose of a modern system of criminal law must be to protect citizens against various kinds of harm, by preventing kinds of conduct that cause such harm. We must also ask whether positive Legal Moralists are right to believe that every kind of immoral conduct is, in principle, the law's business—that even if in the end the balance of reasons argues against criminalising some kind of immoral conduct, its immorality provided a good reason in favour of its criminalisation. Suppose that I betray a friend by frivolously revealing a secret that she had entrusted to me and that I knew mattered a lot to her: I have done her a grievous moral wrong, and might indeed have fatally damaged our friendship; but are we really to say that such conduct should (ceteris paribus) be criminal, or that its immorality gives us good reason to criminalise it?

We will return to Legal Moralism (in § 6 below), but should not here that there are also some serious questions for instrumentalists. A purely instrumentalist account faces the same questions, the same moral worries, as does any purely consequentialist theory of moral, social or political action: put crudely, the general worry is that any such theory will fail to do justice to individuals and their rights, since it will too easily sanction unjustly sacrificing individuals to the greater social goods that it posits as the justifying aim of our actions. Side-constrained instrumentalists avoid that kind of objection, since the side-constraints that they recognise are precisely intended to rule out such injustice, such infringements of individual rights: but there is a serious question about their conception of criminal law—whether we should see it simply as a technique whose positive justification lies solely in its beneficial effects.

For instrumentalists, whether pure or side-constrained, it is a contingent, empirical issue whether the criminal law is an appropriate institution: it is appropriate if and because it does, as a matter of contingent fact, make an efficient contribution to whatever ends we posited for the state. Now we can agree that this instrumental dimension is crucial to the justification of a system of criminal law: we must surely believe, for instance, that a system which on balance did more harm than good could not be justified. However (leaving aside the question of what is to count as ‘harm’ or ‘good’ for the moment), it does not follow from this that instrumental efficiency is the only positive justifying reason for maintaining a system of criminal law: we could still also believe that such an institution can be justified only if it can be shown to be an intrinsically appropriate way of dealing with and responding to the kinds of conduct that fall within its proper ambit.

Consider what I will argue is an apt analogy. If I believe that a friend ought (morally) to go to visit her sick aunt, I might try to persuade her to do so; and if she is initially unwilling, I will then try to work out how I can best persuade her. What counts as ‘best’ here is in part an instrumental matter: I want to find something to say, or do, that will in fact persuade her. But it is not just an instrumental matter, since I should rule out some possibly effective means of persuading her to visit her aunt—bribery, for instance, or blackmail, or deception. What rules such means out is not that they would not be effective (they might well be), nor merely that they are inconsistent with some non-consequentialist side-constraint, but rather that they are intrinsically inappropriate to the end that I should be pursuing. For if I am to show my friend the respect that is due to her as a moral agent (and as my friend), my aim must be not merely to persuade her, by whatever means will be effective, to act as I think she ought to act: it must be to bring her by a process of rational moral discussion to see for herself that that is how she ought to act; but bribery, blackmail or deception cannot count as means to that end (see Duff 1986: 47-54).

To see how this is an apt analogy to the questions we are pursuing here, about the proper aims of a system of criminal law, we must turn to a question which is not addressed as often as it should be, about the voice—the tones, and the terms—in which the criminal law should address those whom it claims to bind.

5. The Law's Voice

On some accounts, the law is not addressed to the citizens at all: it is, rather, addressed to the courts, laying down what actions they should take (what punishments they should impose, for instance) when certain conditions are satisfied (see Hart 1994: 35-38, on Kelsen). Perhaps the law should also be made known to, or easily knowable by, the citizens on whom it is liable to impinge, as a matter of fairness to them: but they are not its direct addressees. Such a view is no doubt true for some aspects of law, including some aspects of criminal law: laws that deal, for instance, with sentencing, or that define various legal excuses, seem to be addressed to courts rather than to the citizens (on the distinction implied here between ‘rules for courts’ and ‘rules for citizens’ see Fletcher 1978: chs. 6.6-8, 7, 9; Dan-Cohen 1984; Robinson 1997). But it is not a plausible view of law as a whole, or of the central, offence-defining aspects of criminal law in particular: the law speaks to all of us, as citizens. We may hear its voice most loudly, most dramatically, if we find ourselves as defendants in a criminal court, when we are called to answer a charge of criminal wrongdoing, and to hear the law's condemnation of our conduct if we are convicted: but in defining which kinds of conduct are criminal, and which are legally permissible, the law speaks to all of us, about what we may or may not do. (Some aspects of the substantive offence-defining criminal law are not addressed to all citizens, but only to those engaged in particular activities: only drivers are addressed by most of the road traffic laws, for instance, and only those who deal in shares are directly addressed by the laws concerning insider trading.)

In what tones and terms, then, does or should the criminal law address the citizens? One view, familiar from the classical positivist theories of Austin and Bentham (see The Nature of Law, § 2), tells us that the law, as addressed to the citizens, consists in a set of commands or orders backed by threats to secure obedience from those who might otherwise disobey. The law says to us “Don't do this!” (or, less frequently, “Do this!”); and if we ask why we should obey that command, the answer will refer either to the law's authority (“Because it is the law and you ought to obey the law”) or to its power (“Because the law will make you suffer if you do not”)—though for classical positivists like Austin and Bentham the law's authority seems to reduce to its power. That simple positivist view of law is no longer widely held, but we can see a vestige of it in the very widespread view that the substantive, offence-defining criminal law consists essentially in a set of ‘prohibitions’ (rules that ‘forbid’ certain kinds of conduct), which citizens are supposed to ‘obey’—which, indeed, they supposedly have an obligation to obey.

Now this might indeed be how the law's voice sounds to those who feel no allegiance to the polity whose law it is, and it is how the law's voice should sound to those who relationship to it and to the polity is that of oppressed subject to alien sovereign: the law does speak to them in the threatening coercive tones of one who demands, and claims to have the power to exact, their obedience. But it is not how the law should speak to the citizens of a liberal polity (see further Duff 2001: 56-68). As citizens, we are members of the normative community whose values the law purports to express: if it is to address us as citizens, and as responsible agents, it must speak to us not in the peremptory, coercive voice of a sovereign who commands our obedience, but in the rational, normative voice of values which demand our allegiance as the values of our polity. The law of a liberal polity, that is to say, must aim to be a common law: a law which belongs to the citizens, as a reflection of the values they share, rather than a law which is imposed on them by an alien sovereign (compare Cotterrell 1995: ch. 11).

The law, or the legislators who create and declare the law, must claim that there are good reasons to criminalise the kinds of conduct it defines as crimes. Since to criminalise conduct is to declare that it should not be done, that claim must be that there are good reasons why the citizens should not engage in such conduct—reasons reflecting the polity's values. If the law is to address us as responsible members of the normative political community, it must address us in terms appropriate to those reasons. In the example offered in § 4, I treat my friend as a responsible agent only if the reasons I offer her for going to visit her aunt are of the right kind—the very reasons that, as I see it, make it right for her to do this. Similarly, I am now suggesting, if the law is to address us as responsible citizens, it must address us in terms that appeal to the right kind of reason for refraining from the conduct that it defines as criminal: in terms that appeal, that is, to the reasons which justified criminalising such conduct in the first place.

What kinds of reason could those be? We will return to this question in the following two sections, but should note here that it will be hard to resist the initial conclusion that they must be moral reasons, to do with the moral wrongfulness of the conduct that is criminalised. For, first, the law's voice is an insistent one. It declares that these things must not be done, even if (it implies) it might suit our individual interests to do them; it attaches significant penalties to the conduct it criminalises: how could such a voice be justified other than by claiming that it is speaking to us of moral duties that we owe to each other and to the polity? Second, the law speaks in terms that appear closely related to the extra-legal languages of morals. It speaks of guilt, of fault, of culpability and wrongdoing; it speaks of murder, rape, dishonesty, theft and the like: unless we are to say that these terms are systematically ambiguous as between their legal and their extra-legal uses (in which case the law would not be making itself accessible or readily intelligible to its citizens), we must conclude that the law's definitions of offences are meant to be legal definitions of moral wrongs—of kinds of conduct that are wrong either pre-legally, as mala in se are; or as breaches of legal regulations which, once they are created, citizens have a moral obligation to obey (see Green 1997). The criminal law's definitions of offences will not always aspire to match precisely our extra-legal understanding of the relevant moral wrongs: there will often be good reasons, to do with the practical and moral constraints of law enforcement and the criminal process, for the law's definitions to diverge from extra-legal moral understandings. But the law's definitions must be grounded in those extra-legal moral understandings. What the criminal law must say to the citizens is therefore not that they must refrain from such conduct because the law forbids it and can demand their obedience, but that they should refrain from such conduct because it is wrong.

Why should we maintain an institution that speaks to its citizens in such terms of wrongs that should not be committed? Part of the reason is obviously to dissuade the citizens (if they need dissuading) from committing such wrongs—that is the truth in the instrumentalist view. Indeed, nothing said so far rules out the familiar suggestion that a central purpose of a system of criminal law is to reduce the incidence of the relevant kinds of wrongdoing by threatening those who might commit them with punishments that will deter them—whether punishment should be justified as a deterrent is a further issue. But this is not to say that instrumentalists are wholly right, or that Moore is wholly wrong to think that the sole purpose of criminal law is to provide for the retributive punishment of those who culpably commit such wrongs. For, first, even if we are in the end justified in using punishment as a deterrent for those who will not otherwise be dissuaded from crime, the law's initial appeal to the citizens must be in the moral language of wrongdoing, not simply in the coercive language of deterrence (see Legal Punishment, s. 6): not because such a moral appeal is likely to be instrumentally effective, but because it is intrinsically appropriate to the law's dealings with the citizens of a liberal polity. Second, we can now plausibly suggest that another purpose of the criminal law is to provide a suitable response to criminal wrongs that are committed. It publicly recognises and condemns them as wrongs by defining them as crimes; it calls those who are alleged to have committed them to account, to answer for that alleged wrongdoing, through a process of criminal trials; it condemns those who are proved to have committed such wrongs by convicting them—and by punishing them, if we understand punishment as involving the communication of censure (see again Legal Punishment, s. 6). The truth in Moore's view is that such responses to crime are justified not merely as instrumentally efficient means to the reduction of harmful conduct, or to other further ends, but as intrinsically appropriate responses to the kinds of wrongdoing that properly concern the criminal law. We must take such wrongdoing seriously, if we take seriously the values against which it offends, the victim's standing as one who has suffered such a wrong, and the wrongdoer's standing as a responsible agent who has done wrong: but to take it seriously is to be prepared to declare it to be wrong it, and to call to account and to condemn those who engage in it.

I have suggested in this section the central purpose of criminal law, as a distinctive kind of law marked out from the other kinds and aspects of law by the features discussed in s. 2, is to define, and to declare the wrongfulness of, certain kinds of wrongdoing, in order not only to dissuade citizens from committing such wrongs, but also to provide appropriate responses to those who commit, or are alleged to have committed, such wrongs. In defining conduct as criminal, the law identifies it as conduct from which we have good reason to refrain, and thus also as conduct for which we will be called to public account, and condemned and punished, if we engage in it. To ask whether we should have a system of criminal law is therefore to ask whether there are kinds of wrongdoing that the state should identify and respond to in such a way—kinds of wrongdoing that the state should take seriously as wrongdoing, and expect its citizens to take similarly seriously.

But what kinds of wrongdoing could these be? We noted that the simple Legal Moralist's claim, the claim that we have good reason to criminalise any kind of immoral conduct simply in virtue of its immorality, seems implausible. My betrayal of my friend, wrong though it is, does not seem like the kind of wrong that merits public denunciation by the criminal law, or for which I should be called to account by the whole polity through its criminal process; it is, surely, a private matter between me and my friend and perhaps the circle of friends to which we both belong), not a public matter that concerns the state, or my fellow citizens as such.

This natural response to this example points us towards one common way of identifying the kinds of wrong that do properly concern the criminal law—the idea that conduct which is to be criminalised ought to constitute a ‘public’, rather than a merely ‘private’, wrong.

6. Crimes as Public Wrongs

What makes simple Legal Moralism seem implausible is not just the thought that some moral wrongs are not serious enough to attract the attention of the criminal law: though that is true, the wrong I do my friend is not a trivial one—it might destroy our friendship. Nor is it simply the thought that there are very good reasons against criminalising such wrongdoing—reasons that will forcibly strike us as soon as we begin to think how a law criminalising such conduct could be drafted and enforced: Legal Moralists themselves will, as we have seen, argue that such countervailing reasons can often outweigh the reasons in favour of criminalisation; but my example was supposed to make us doubt whether the moral wrongfulness of this kind of conduct constituted any reason at all for criminalising it. The objection to Legal Moralism is naturally expressed by saying that this kind of wrongdoing is a ‘private’ matter that is simply ‘not the law's business’ (Wolfenden 1957: para. 61).

Must we then reject every species of positive Legal Moralism outright, and insist that the immorality of a kind of conduct is never in itself a good reason for criminalising it? If so, we might still be able to preserve some form of negative Legal Moralism, and hold that conduct that is not immoral cannot properly be criminalised; but we would need to look elsewhere for positive reasons for criminalisation. This, however, seems equally implausible—especially if the argument of the previous section was sound. For I argued there that the criminal law must aim to identify and condemn kinds of morally wrongful conduct, which implies that it is the very immorality of the conduct that gives us reason to criminalise it; and it would anyway be very strange if the reasons for counting such central mala in se crimes as murder and rape as criminal had nothing to do with the moral wrongfulness of such actions. There is, however, a third way between the two extremes of holding that any kind of immorality provides a good reason for criminalisation, and holding that immorality itself never provides a good reason in for criminalisation: we can hold that immorality of the right kind provides a good reason for criminalising conduct that involves it. Moral wrongdoing that could in principle be justifiably criminalised would thus form a subcategory of the larger category of moral wrongdoing.

But how could we identify that subcategory? One familiar slogan is that the criminal law is properly concerned only with ‘public’ wrongs, whereas merely ‘private’ wrongs are either not matters for the law at all, or matters for a civil rather than a criminal legal process (see s.2 above). To gain any help from this slogan, however, we need to know what ‘public’ means in this context, and how to distinguish ‘public’ from ‘private’ wrongs; in the rest of this section, I will explore some suggestions (see also Limits of Law; Lamond 2007).

A pure instrumentalist will of course argue that this is a pragmatic issue: supposing that we do have good reason to criminalise only conduct that is in some way immoral, we decide which kinds of immorality to criminalise, and which to deal with in other ways (or to ignore) by asking which techniques are likely to constitute efficient means to our preferred ends. The range of possible techniques is very wide, even if our only aim was to reduce the incidence of such conduct (which it would not be): extra-legal techniques, such as education, advertising, and situational crime prevention (on which see von Hirsch, Garland & Wakefield 2000); the taxation system (we might as efficiently reduce the incidence of a certain kind of conduct by taxing it as by criminalising it); and the threat of civil liability to pay damages for any harm that was caused. But an implication of the argument of the previous section is that the choice between these techniques should not be a purely pragmatic one: although issues of efficiency are clearly relevant and important, we must first ask which kinds of measure are intrinsically appropriate to the kind of conduct, to the kind of wrong, we are dealing with. We have to ask, that is, whether the conduct in question involves a kind of wrongdoing that merits the public calling to account and condemnation of those who engage in it that the criminal law involves: if it does, we then have at least a good reason to criminalise it; if it does not, we do not. This might be only the first stage in a long and complex deliberation about whether a given type of wrongful conduct should be criminalised, and pragmatic issues would certainly need to loom large in later stages of that process: but my suggestion here is that it is an essential first stage. (Compare the ‘filtering’ model of how we should decide questions of criminalisation offered by Schonsheck 1994. See also Ashworth 2006: chs. 2-3, on the range of ‘principles and policies’ that should bear on questions of criminalisation; and Husak 2007 for a very useful general discussion).

So what should count as a ‘public’ wrong? A first and familiar suggestion, implicit in the way I have talked throughout of criminalising ‘conduct’, is that ‘mere thought’ should not be criminalised: for thought is private; only action or conduct is public. This suggestion captures at least one central aspect of the slogan that criminal liability requires an act (or a ‘voluntary act’, as it is sometimes put), and it does seem to have some force: although mere thoughts can be morally improper (entertaining sadistic fantasies about my opponents, for instance), surely only what actually impinges on our shared social or material world can properly be of interest to the state or its criminal law; but mere thought which is not expressed or acted upon has no such impact. We must note, however, first, that this sets only extremely modest limits on the scope of the criminal law—it does not even protect speech from criminalisation, since speech certainly has an impact on the world. Second, if the ‘act requirement’ is to do any substantive work, we need an account of the concept of ‘action’ or ‘conduct’—an account which will also need to deal with such questions as that of criminal liability for omissions (see Hughes 1958; Feinberg 1984: ch. 4), or for statuses such as being drunk or an addict (see Glazebrook 1978): such an account is notoriously difficult to provide. (For contrasting views on the act requirement see Moore 1993: chs. 2-3; Husak 1998; Duff 2007: ch. 5.)

Within the realm of ‘conduct’ as distinct from thought, and leaving aside the question of omissions, how might we try to identify the subcategory of ‘public’ wrongs? Another familiar suggestion is suggested by Mill's Harm Principle—“the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilised community against his will is to prevent harm to others” (Mill 1859, ch. 1, para. 9): could we not say that only conduct that wrongfully harms or threatens to harm others is a suitable candidate for criminalisation; that the criminal law is properly concerned only with harmful immorality? This leads us into some notoriously difficult questions: for instance, about whether the paternalist criminalisation of conduct that harms only the agent can ever be justified (see Feinberg 1986); about whether we might also have reason to criminalise conduct that, though it does not cause harm, is seriously offensive to others (see Feinberg 1985; Simester& von Hirsch 2006); about whether there are kinds of immorality so gross that, even if they cause no harm, we have reason to criminalise them (see Feinberg 1988; Dworkin 1994). We also need an account of the concept of harm itself, which raises further problems (see e.g. Kleinig 1978; Feinberg 1984; Raz 1986: ch 15, 1987). For instance, can we plausibly so define ‘harm’ as to rule out the argument that any immoral conduct is itself harmful, either to those whom it wrongs (since I am harmed by being wronged), if it does wrong anyone, or by doing moral harm to the society or culture in which it is done (see Devlin 1965; Dworkin 1994)? Can we so define ‘harm’ as to exclude purely trivial wrongdoings from the scope of the criminal law, for instance by focusing on setbacks to ‘welfare interests’ (Feinberg 1984: ch. 1)? We cannot pursue these issues here, but we should note two ways in which the Harm Principle fails to set any very tight constraints on the scope of the criminal law (see generally Holtug 2002; Duff 2007: ch. 6).

First, as I expressed the principle, it allows the criminalisation of conduct that threatens, as well as conduct that actually causes, harm. Even the more limited category of conduct that causes harm becomes problematic when we ask what counts as causing harm (see von Hirsch 1996): our existing laws criminalise not only conduct that immediately causes harm, but also kinds of conduct whose causal relationship to the harm is more remote—for instance conduct that enables or assists another's commission of a crime; so we need to ask how far we should extend the law's reach in this direction. The problems multiply when we turn to conduct that, whilst it does not actually cause harm, is criminalised because it threatens harm, or creates a danger of harm: to the broad category of ‘nonconsummate’ offenses (see Husak 1995). This category includes conduct that is intended to cause harm (attempts to commit crimes, for one obvious instance); conduct that, though not intended to cause harm, recklessly or negligently endangers others (dangerous driving, for instance, or breaches of health and safety rules); and conduct that, although it might not itself be dangerous, is of a kind that is usually dangerous (speeding, for instance). Again, we need to ask how far the criminal law should reach in this direction (see Harcourt 1999; also Dubber 2001).

Second, even if we limit our attention to conduct that obviously and directly causes what must surely count as non-trivial harm, not all such conduct seems even in principle to be apt for criminalisation. The friend whom I betray would surely count herself as seriously harmed by my betrayal; someone whose spouse betrays their marriage by committing adultery might reasonably claim to be seriously harmed by that betrayal. But we should not therefore see any good reason to criminalise betrayals of friendship; and although adultery is indeed a crime in some states, arguments about whether it is in principle apt for criminalisation do not typically depend on claims that it is, or is not, harmful to the betrayed spouse—the reality of that harm is taken for granted. Nor will it help to suggest, for instance, that the kinds of wrongful harm that are apt for criminalisation are those and only those that set back ‘welfare interests’ (see Feinberg 1984: 37-38, 61-63): if our welfare interests concern those goods that constitute the ‘basic requisites of [our] well-being’ (Rescher 1972: 6, quoted approvingly in Feinberg 1984: 37), they surely include such goods as friendship and other loving relationships.

So even if the Harm Principle can do some substantial work in limiting the proper scope of the criminal law, it does not take us far enough, since there are kinds of seriously harmful conduct that we do not think should, even in principle, be criminalised.

Perhaps, if crimes are ‘public’ wrongs, we should now distinguish within the category of wrongfully harmful conduct between public and private harms: the betrayal of a friendship or a marriage is not apt for criminalisation if and because it causes only private harm. But what is to count as a public harm, or public wrong?

On one familiar reading, a wrong or harm is ‘public’ if and because it affects, i.e. wrongs or harms, ‘the public’, rather than only an individual victim (see Blackstone 1765-9: Bk. IV, ch. 1, 5); wrongs or harms that affect only individual victims are—if they are matters for the law at all—appropriately pursued by those individual victims through the civil courts.

We can understand some crimes as harming or wronging ‘the public’—‘the public’ being understood either a set of individuals among whom we cannot identify determinate individual victims, or as a collectivity with shared goods that crime impairs. Three examples will serve to illustrate this point.

First, ‘public order’ offences involving violent, riotous conduct are injurious to the public in that they pose a threat of serious harm to any of the indeterminate number of individuals in the area, and might threaten to undermine that shared sense of assured security on which our civic life depends. (Compare Braithwaite & Pettit 1990: 60-68, on ‘dominion’ as the central civic good. There is of course enormous scope there is for the political abuse of public order laws—see Lacey et al 2003: ch. 2; but our concern here is with the issue of whether we have any in principle reason to define a category of public order crimes.) Similarly, offences of endangerment that involve no ‘disorder’ (driving offences which endanger other road users generally, for instance, and offences involving public health and safety) often threaten the public, rather than determinate individuals.

Second, some crimes attack or threaten the polity's own institutions, and thus threaten or harm ‘the public’ as a collectivity. This category includes such crimes as perjury, attempts to pervert the course of justice, the offering of bribes to, or their acceptance by, public officials, and various kinds of electoral malpractice. In some such cases a determinate individual might be wrongfully harmed—an innocent person might be wrongly convicted, or might lose a civil case, because a witness commits perjury: but whether or not we can identify any such individual victim, the crime attacks a public institution which is crucial to the public interest.

Third, other kinds of wrongful conduct are apt for criminalisation because they involve serious unfairness towards one's fellow citizens. Someone who evades their taxes might cause no identifiable consequential harm, either to any individual or to the social institutions which are funded by taxation; if asked to explain the wrong she commits, we would appeal to some version of ‘What if everyone did that?’, rather than trying to identify any consequential harm that she causes. We would appeal, that is, to the unfair advantage that she takes over all those who pay their taxes: she gains the benefits that accrue to all citizens from the taxation system, but refuses to make her appropriate contribution to that system.

So we can explain why some kinds of conduct are properly criminalised by showing how they wrong or harm ‘the public’, or ‘the public interest’: but can we explain all crimes in this way? Can we sustain the general claim that conduct should, in principle, be criminalised only if and because it wrongs or harms ‘the public’ in this sense? There are two ways in which we might try to do this—by appealing either to the idea of public order and stability, or to that of unfairness.

Consider, first, the idea of public order, and the suggestion that the criminal law's proper purpose is to protect the “smooth functioning of society and the preservation of order” (Devlin 1965: 5). We find relatives of this suggestion in Becker's argument (1974) that the criminal wrongfulness of crimes consists in their tendency to cause ‘social volatility’, and in Dimock's argument (1997) that it lies in their tendency to undermine the kinds of trust upon which civic life depends. What makes crimes—including such crimes as murder and rape—wrongful in a way that properly concerns the criminal law is, on such accounts, not the wrongful harm that they do to their immediate individual victims, but their wider effects on social stability or trust.

Consider second the idea of unfairness. According to one well-known theory of punishment (see Murphy 1973; Dagger 1993), crimes deserve punishment because the offender takes an unfair advantage over all his law-abiding fellow citizens: he accepts the benefits of their law-abiding self-restraint (the mutual security provided by an effective system of law) but refuses to make his proper contribution to that system by exercising such self-restraint himself. Might we ground a theory of criminalisation on such a theory of punishment? We should criminalise murder, rape and other central mala in se because, apart from the wrongful harm that they do to their individual victims, they wrong ‘the public’ (the generality of law-abiding citizens) by taking unfair advantage of them.

The obvious objection to such ways of explaining the idea of crimes as public wrongs or harms is that, precisely by portraying crimes as wrongs done to ‘the public’, they distort their character as wrongs that merit criminalisation. We are now to criminalise murder or rape, not because of the wrongs that they do to their individual victims, but because of their effects on social stability or trust, or the unfair advantage they take over the law-abiding; from which it follows, if the criminal law should address the citizens in terms of the reasons and values that inform its definitions of crimes (see s. 5 above), that a murderer or rapist is to be condemned and punished not for what he did to his individual victim, but for acting in a way that created social volatility, or undermined trust, or took unfair advantage over his law-abiding fellows. This is surely not how we should understand the criminal wrongfulness of such crimes.

To illustrate this point, consider the example of domestic violence and abuse. In English law intra-marital rape was recognised as a crime only in 1991 (see R [1991] 4 All ER 1981); until then, a husband who forced sexual intercourse on his wife without her consent was not guilty of rape. Similarly, although domestic violence (typically husbands violently beating up their wives) was formally speaking a crime, it was often not taken seriously as a crime by the criminal justice system: the police were often unwilling to intervene in ‘domestic disputes’ or to prosecute domestically violent men, seeing it rather as an issue for the couple to work out for themselves. No doubt part of what lay behind these practices was a view that the wrongs being done were, if wrongs at all, not that serious; but we can also discern the view that these were ‘private’ rather than ‘public’ wrongs. If we then ask what justified the change towards recognising intra-marital rape as genuine, criminal rape, and domestic violence as a genuine crime that should be prosecuted, it is not plausible to answer in terms of either of the accounts noted above. It would not be plausible to argue that domestic violence or intra-marital rape is liable to create social volatility (indeed, such crimes are often committed by men who in their lives outside the home are models of peaceful conformity); or that it undermines the kinds of trust on which social life depends (such crimes, if confined to the home, do not undermine the trust that we can have in our dealings with strangers, which is the kind of trust that is relevant here); or that it takes unfair advantage over all those law-abiding people (or men) who refrain from these or other kinds of crime—as if the law-abiding would love to commit such wrongs if only they were not restrained by the demands of fairness.

To explain why such domestic abuse should be criminal, and taken seriously as criminal, we must look not for some ‘public’ harm or wrong that it involves distinct from the wrongful harm it does to its individual victims, but at that wrongful harm itself. What matters is that we come to see the wrongs suffered by abused wives not just as their private business, but as our collective business as citizens of a polity to which we belong with them; we come to recognise that they have as strong a claim to the protection and support of their fellow citizens as do the victims of attacks by strangers—a claim grounded simply in their fellow membership of the polity, as our fellow citizens. The wrongs done to them are ‘public’ wrongs not because they wrong the ‘public’, but because they are wrongs that properly concern the public—their fellow citizens; even when they are committed in what might count, empirically, as ‘the privacy of the home’, they belong in what should count, normatively, as the ‘public’ realm. We could then also say, if we wish, that such wrongs are wrongs against, or injurious to, the public—the polity and its members: they implicitly deny the core values by which the polity defines itself, and the basic normative bonds by which we define our civic relationships with each other; they are wrongs not just against their individual victims, but against all of us insofar as we identify with those victims as our fellow citizens—they are wrongs in which we collectively share, and which we make ‘ours’ (see Marshall & Duff 1998). But to talk in this way of ‘public’ wrongs or injuries is not to try to ground the claim that such wrongs should be criminal: the appeal to the idea of a ‘public’ wrong now expresses, rather than trying to ground, the claim that it is a wrong that concerns us all, and that is therefore apt for criminalisation.

If that is right, however, we cannot look to the idea of public wrongs or harms to provide criteria or principles of criminalisation. We can say that the criminal law should be concerned with ‘public’, rather than ‘private’, wrongs, but that is because to call a wrong ‘public’ in this sense is already to class it as a kind of wrong that is apt for criminalisation—a kind of wrong which should be publicly denounced and whose perpetrators should be publicly investigated, prosecuted, condemned and punished; a kind of wrong whose perpetrators should be called to account by the polity as a whole, not just by the individual victim.

The upshot of this section is that we still lack any clear criteria or principles by appeal to which we can try to determine which kinds of conduct should be criminal. However, though this might be frustrating, we should at least by now be clearer about what kinds of claim we must be able to make about kinds of conduct that we want to show are apt for criminalisation. First, we must be able to show that and how they involve wrongdoing: for as we saw in s. 2, the criminal law focuses on wrongs that should be condemned, rather than just on harms that need to be repaired or compensated; and as we saw in s. 5, the criminal law must speak to us of wrongs that we should not commit. Second, we must be able to claim that the wrong is of such a kind that it should concern us all as citizens—we should not leave it to the individual victim to pursue, or not to pursue, a civil case against the wrongdoer. I have not suggested determinate criteria by which we can identify such wrongs, nor do I think that any determinate criteria can be provided; although theorists might yearn to find a single principle, or a single set of principles, by reference to which we could determine the (in principle) proper scope of the criminal law, such yearnings are doomed to be frustrated (for two recent examples, see Dan-Cohen 2002, Ripstein 2006; for critical discussion see Duff 2007: 138-9; Husak 2007). We can, however, identify the main kinds of consideration that should be relevant. Is the wrong one that injures ‘the public’ rather than any individual victim? Is it one that flouts or implicitly denies the core values by which we define ourselves as a polity, and which supposedly underpin our civic relationships? Is it one from which we should be able to expect the protection of our fellow citizens (which is to ask whether it is a wrong from which we should be able to expect to be categorically safe as we go about our normal lives, rather than a kind of wrong that we can be expected to risk on condition that we can seek compensation if we suffer it)? Answers to these questions will be contestable, and will properly emerge only from a collaborative attempt to understand what joins us as citizens and what we owe to each other as citizens—an attempt which will lead to different results in different political communities: but we have made progress if we have at least identified more clearly the questions that we must ask.

7. International Criminal Law

We have focused so far, explicitly or implicitly, on the domestic criminal law of nation states—a criminal law that typically claims jurisdiction only over crimes committed within the state's territory, by and against citizens of or visitors to that state (for some of the complications here, see Hirst 2003; Duff 2007: ch. 2.2). However, recent years have seen also seen significant developments in international criminal law, culminating in the creation of the International Criminal Court in 2002 (see Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court 1998; Cassese 2003: 340-405). Behind a range of particular questions about the proper scope of international criminal law (over what kinds of crime should the ICC have jurisdiction), about the relationship of the ICC to domestic courts and systems of criminal justice, and about the appropriate procedures for international criminal trials, lies a deeper question about the moral authority or legitimacy of any such court: by what moral right does it calim jurisdiction over this range of wrongs and over these wrongdoers? This question becomes particularly acute in relation to crimes whose impact is intra- rather than inter-national. Crimes committed by one state against another, or against another's population (war crimes, the crime of aggression; Rome Statute arts. 5, 8), are clearly better dealt with by an international court: but why should such a court have jurisdiction over ‘widespread or systematic attack[s]’ committed by a state's officials against its own citizens (Rome Statute art. 7, defining ‘crimes against humanity’)? What could give such a body the moral authority to hold those who commit such wrongs to account—and just what kinds of wrong can it claim as its business?

One answer to these questions appeals to the impersonal demand of retributive justice that those who commit such wrongs should not escape punishment: the ICC acts in the name of justice. Another answer is that the ICC acts in the name and on behalf of the more local polity within and against which the crimes were committed, when the domestic courts will not or cannot act effectively. Another answer takes seriously the idea of ‘crimes against humanity’, and portrays the ICC as acting in the name and on behalf of ‘humanity’: those who commit such wrongs must answer not merely to their particular polities, but to humanity itself, since their crimes ‘deeply shock the conscience of humanity’, and are ‘of concern to the international community as a whole’ (Rome Statute, Preamble). Each of these answers is problematic: a central task for theorists of criminal law is to work towards a clearer understanding of the questions to which such answers are offered (see generally Altman & Wellman, 2004; Luban, 2004; May 2005; Besson & Tasioulas 2008).

8. The Internal Structure of the Criminal Law

Once we have articulated an account of the proper aims and limits of the criminal law, we can tackle various issues about its internal structure—about the general principles and conditions of criminal liability (the so-called ‘general part’ of the criminal law), and about its definitions of specific offences (the ‘special part’). I cannot pursue these issues here, but our approach to them must clearly be based on our account of the proper purposes of the criminal law. Thus if the criminal law should aim to define, to condemn, and to call perpetrators to public account for wrongs whose character and implications are such that they properly count as ‘public’, its definitions of crimes and its principles of liability must be apt to identify such wrongs and the conditions under which agents can be justly condemned for them. In discussing such issues as whether the law should contain offences of ‘strict liability’, which can be committed by those who are not even negligent as to the harm they cause or risk; or what kind of ‘fault elements’ should be required for criminal liability, either in general or for particular crimes; or whether criminal liability should depend solely on the ‘subjective’ character of an action (on what the agent intended to do or believed herself to be doing), or also on its ‘objective’ character (its actual connection with and impact on the world); or whether and how the law should distinguish offences from defences, either substantively or procedurally; or what kinds of excuse or justification the law should recognise, and how they should be defined: we must first ask which doctrines and principles would capture the relevant kinds of wrongdoing and identify the culpable agents of such wrongs. This can only be the first stage of the discussion, since we will need to go on to ask whether those doctrines and principles can satisfy the wide range of other normative and practical constraints that must bear on a system of criminal law and justice, or how they could be adapted so as to satisfy those constraints: but it is where we must start. (For introductions to these issues see Fletcher 1978; Robinson 1997; Tadros 2005; Ashworth 2006; Dressler 2006; Simester & Sullivan 2007; Duff 2007; Gardner 2007.)

Theorists of criminal law must also attend, however, more seriously than they have often attended, to the criminal process that leads from (alleged) crime to punishment, and in particular to the criminal trial. It is through the criminal trial that criminal responsibility and liability are formally assigned, and the norms and doctrines of the substantive criminal law are articulated and applied. We therefore need an account of the proper aims and values of the criminal trial, and of the larger criminal process of which it is part—an account that can then underpin a more adequately grounded critique of our existing criminal processes. Should we, for instance, see the trial as an attempt to establish the truth (but what truth?), albeit an attempt that is constrained by a range of independent principles and rules that aim to protect us against the potentially oppressive and intrusive power of the state? Or should we see it as a process through which alleged wrongdoers are called to answer the charges that thay face and to answer for their crimes if their guilt is proved? What kinds of criminal process are appropriate to a liberal democracy that aims to treat all its members as responsible citizens? (See generally Burns 1999; Ashworth & Redmayne 2005; Duff et al 2007.)


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legal obligation and authority | legal philosophy | limits of law | nature of law | nature of law: natural law theories | rule of law and procedural fairness