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The Limits of Law

First published Mon Feb 27, 2006

It is clear that law has limits. It has practical or ‘means-end’ limits; what lawmakers try to do may misfire in many ways. More interestingly, though, does law have principled limits? The best known positive answer to this question is that given by John Stuart Mill. Mill's ‘harm principle’ is examined in this entry, together with the more recent defences of the principle by Joel Feinberg and Joseph Raz. Other influential proposals for principled limits to the law are also examined: for example, the suggestion that law must eschew certain kinds of otherwise valid moral reasons and that the law must be in some sense neutral. Finding principled limits to the law, it will be suggested, is an elusive task.

1. Means-Ends Limits

I think, therefore, that it is not possible to set theoretical limits to the power of the State to legislate against immorality. It is not possible to settle in advance exceptions to the general rule or to define inflexibly areas of morality into which the law is in no circumstances to be allowed to enter.

— Lord Devlin, The Enforcement of Morals (pp.12–13)

Law has limits. That is obvious. Legal officials at various times and in various places have objectives and they need to find the best way of achieving them. Some might seek to end casual street violence, so impose stiff legal penalties on anyone caught engaging in such conduct. Some might seek to end demonstrable harms caused by alcohol or drugs through prohibiting their sale and consumption. Others might seek to meet housing needs by imposing minimum standards for accommodation on those who rent out their properties. Though they seek the best means of reaching their goals, they might fail and the failure could be dramatic.

In all the examples mentioned above the aims sought may not materialize. The stiff legal penalties imposed by those seeking to curtail street violence may lead only to an increase in violence as perpetrators reason they may as well be hung for a sheep as a lamb. The prohibition of alcohol consumption may merely drive consumption underground, failing in its purpose and succeeding only in adding to the stock of societal harms as further criminality incident on the prohibition grows. Property owners, rather than forking out for legally mandated improvements to their rental property, may simply take their properties off the market, resulting in fewer affordable properties available for rental and fewer needs met. In each case the law has overreached itself. Having observed the results of their efforts, the legal officials may conclude that it would have been better to have used other means or maybe even to have done nothing, to have tolerated the former level of harm, since their means of putting it to an end did not solve the problem aimed at, but exacerbated it. In pursuing the best result as they see it, they have achieved only the third-best and now the problem might be the embarrassing one of getting back to second-best.

These are familiar stories in skeletal form and illustrate the commonplace that the methods the law might use can simply misfire. There are limits to what the law can achieve because some of its tools are blunt. Some tools do not work, others are counter-productive; some exacerbate the problem they were supposed to resolve. Knowing what works and what does not and what will be counterproductive is important knowledge indeed. Again, enforcement of a desired policy may be prohibitively expensive and divert resources away from still more important goals a state may wish to pursue. A state may also need to consider in some contexts the psychology of its citizens. Perhaps there is something in the Freudian notion of ‘pale criminality’: ‘the condition of one who commits a crime because of, rather than in spite of, its forbidden status’ (Scheffler 1992, pp. 70-71).[1] There may also be what David Lewis calls a ‘mixture problem.’ Lewis had in mind in particular John Stuart Mill's point that truth and error may be found combined in one package deal, so that there is no way of suppressing the error without suppressing truth as well (Lewis 2000, p. 164). But the point can be made more general: there may be no way for a state to suppress a greatly undesired activity without also disturbing a greatly desired activity.[2] The law in short is limited by the tools it has at its disposal and the effects that these tools will have. We might call these ‘means-ends limits’ or ‘practical limits’. Law can coerce, it can make rules, it can adjudicate, but one can only go so far with these tools (Fuller 1978). Law must seek to do the best possible with the tools available.

Law does have limits. It has at least the means-ends or practical limits that have just been discussed. But this is too uncontroversial to be a particularly interesting claim and it gives nothing of the flavour of what has made this topic such a controversial one. We turn to that in a moment. It is important to bear such practical limits in mind nevertheless, since one possible way to delineate the limits of the law is that such practical limits are the only limits that States must negotiate in its legislative and more broadly legal behaviour, beyond the platitude that it must act in a morally acceptable way. In this sense the immorality of an action or value of the goal to be achieved are none of them sufficient of themselves for state coercion. The controversy begins when the question of principled limits is raised. Means-ends or practical limits apply just as much to evil and unjustified regimes as they do to legitimate ones, albeit in different ways. If we assume that through the instruments of its law a state has or ought to have the formal aim of legitimate government, we should ask whether there are any principled limits to the law? Lord Devlin in the quotation at the start of the essay denies that there are any such limits. As we shall see, answering the challenge to articulate principled limits is a far from straightforward task.

Much of the debate has revolved around the place of moral reasoning in justifying state action, most commonly in justifying the use of coercion. Everyone agrees that the immorality of an action is not a sufficient reason for state coercion since as we have seen there are means-ends limits and practical limits. But there is little more common ground. Must the state abstain from considering and acting upon certain kinds of consideration in order to rise above the sectarian adherence or invocation of one controversial understanding of what makes for a good life? I shall suggest that the central tension is over the recourse that a state should have to moral premises for which truth is claimed. If one denies that there is anything in principle to restrain a state's recourse to moral truth in the passing of the law, there is the problem of disagreement. Disagreement can be widespread and intractable. So what should a state do in the here-and-now where there is no consensus, even among reasonable people, about what ought to be done? Can it simply enforce what it takes, controversially, to be the right solution? On the other hand if one tries to restrain in principle the State's recourse to moral argument, ruling out of consideration certain kinds of argument based on moral truth, the challenge is to do this on a satisfying basis that is not merely ad hoc.

2. Candidates for Principled Limits to the Law

Far and away the best known proposal for a principled limit to the law is the ‘harm principle’ of John Stuart Mill:

The sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilised community against his will is to prevent harm to others. His own good, whether physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. (Mill 1993, ch. 1, para 9)

Mill thought that the principle was ultimately based upon utility[3]—in the ‘largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.’ (Mill 1993, p. 79; Gray 1996, p. 6). He did not think the principle applied to persons living in communities that had not yet progressed to the point of ‘civilisation’ (Mill 1993, p.79). In communities in which there had been sufficient progress towards civilisation, it is of great importance to protect and promote liberty of action for all. States in general should acknowledge the importance of such liberty of action and should limit their law accordingly. Interference with liberty of action, especially by the use of power or coercion, required a special sort of justification: that it was needed to prevent harm to others. To coerce on the basis that one wishes to avoid harm to others is of course to coerce on a moral ground. Mill thought that no other moral ground would be good enough.

This view has been highly influential. There does indeed seem on the face of it to be something special about harm. The point of describing an outcome as harmful, it has been thought by many, is to say that ‘it is deleterious from the point of view of a very wide range of conceptions of the good’ (Barry 1995, pp. 87-88; Scanlon 1975, pp. 655-659). For Mill, harm is uniquely powerful and to many subsequent proponents of ‘the harm principle,’ as we shall see, it has been considered especially powerful if not quite unique. Harm to others, for Mill, is to be contrasted with offence to others, with harm to the person to be coerced herself, who normally consents to the harm, and with the bare (harmless) immorality of the conduct she would otherwise seek to engage in. Mill had in mind in particular the security interests and autonomy interests of persons. The State may legitimately stop A from beating up B, even though this limits his freedom of action, because this prevents harm to B, it protects his interest in security. And it may stop A from stealing from B, as it protects inter alia B's freedom to dispose of his property as he wishes. But the State oversteps its proper limits on this view if it purports to stop A smashing up his own property; or to protect C from the offence she will take knowing that A is doing this.

In more recent times Joel Feinberg has sought to vindicate a broadly Millian understanding of the limits of the law. He proposes a different version of the harm principle, thus:

It is always a good reason in support of penal legislation that it would be effective in preventing (eliminating, reducing) harm to persons other than the actor (the one prohibited from acting) and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values. (Feinberg 1984, p. 26)

In comparison with Mill's principle this seems rather weak. Harm to others, Mill booms, is the ‘only purpose’ that could license State coercion; while Feinberg's formulation claims more gently that it gives the State ‘a good reason’ to coerce. His claim that harm to others merely furnishes ‘a good reason’ allows him to invoke another ‘good reason’ for state coercion—‘the offence principle.’

It is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it is probably necessary to prevent serious offense to persons other than the actor and would probably be an effective means to that end if enacted. (Feinberg 1984 p.26, Feinberg 1985)

Despite the fact that Mill claimed his Harm Principle was ‘one very simple principle’ which excludes offence from its purview, Feinberg in fact thinks there is support to be found for his own ‘Offense Principle’ in Mill's text, though, whether or not that is true, his deeper claim is that his principle is worthy of support. So if ‘harm to others’ and ‘offence to others’ can each constitute ‘a good reason’ for state coercion, how many more ‘good reasons’ are there, in Feinberg's view, for state coercion? He proposes a broad answer over the course of his four volume study of the limits of the law, albeit with some trepidation: it is, quite simply, none—there are no other good reasons for State coercion. The ‘liberal position’ he suggests demands of the State that it should recognize as legitimate only the two grounds for coercion just mentioned. If there is no harm to others and no offence to others to counter, there must be no coercion. Many other ‘good reasons’ have been proposed for state coercion, he acknowledges, but though they are reasons for coercion, they are not good enough or legitimate reasons. In this way Feinberg professes his fidelity to the animating spirit of Mill's On Liberty.

Feinberg to some extent echoes Mill in his understanding of harm in relation to the ‘interests’ of persons. He does not, to be sure, adopt Mill's emphasis on ‘the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.’ He understands a harmed condition as one in which there is a ‘set-back to interests;’ and there is a good reason for coercion if the set-back is wrongful, not simply a setback of the order of losing a professional tennis competition or being driven out of business by a rival's superior product. The two sorts of reason that Feinberg is keenest to exclude, on the other hand, are ‘Legal Paternalism’ and ‘Legal Moralism’. The former he describes thus:

It is always a good reason in support of a prohibition that it is probably necessary to prevent harm (physical, psychological, or economic) to the actor himself and that there is probably no other means that is equally effective at no greater cost to other values. (Feinberg 1984, pp. 26-27, Feinberg 1986)

Important as ‘Legal Paternalism’ is to the question of the limits of the law, I shall say very little about it as it has an entry of its own elsewhere in this Encyclopaedia (G Dworkin, 2002). Suffice it to say here that Feinberg is not equally hostile to all forms of legal paternalism. He distinguishes ‘soft paternalism’ from ‘hard paternalism’. In many cases the forcible implementation of a person's will can accord with his personal autonomy. Feinberg describes such cases as involving ‘soft paternalism’ and contrasts them with those involving ‘hard paternalism’ (Feinberg 1986, p. 26). It is the ‘hard’ variety that Feinberg sets himself against, the forcible coercion of a person against her will for her own good. This he rules out on grounds of legitimacy. In fact he does not believe that ‘soft’ paternalism is really paternalism at all, properly called and so stops short of adding it to his list of potentially legitimating reasons for legal coercion.

Feinberg is as keen to deny the legitimacy of ‘Legal Moralism’ as a legitimating ground as he is (hard) paternalism.

[It] can be morally legitimate to prohibit conduct on the ground that it is inherently immoral, even though it causes neither harm nor offense to the actor or to others. (Feinberg 1984, p. 27; Feinberg 1990)

In the next section we will be centrally concerned with this as a rival to the Harm Principle.

The introduction of ‘Offence’ and certain kinds of paternalism as potentially legitimating grounds, makes it a little misleading to speak of the ‘Harm Principle’ as one principle shared by all the leading thinkers associated with the principle. I shall continue to do so merely as shorthand. The table below illustrates some divergence in the views of the leading thinkers associated with the Harm Principle as to the proper limits of the legal coercion. No one of them has an account with exactly the same conclusions as any of the others.

Liberal Accounts of potentially legitimating grounds for legal coercion
Legitimate basis
for coercion?
Harm to Others? Offence to
to Self?
Legal Moralism?
Mill Yes No No No
Feinberg Yes Yes No No
Hart Yes Yes,
Raz Yes No[4] Yes,

I will later come to another strand of thinking about the limits of the law: that the law must remain neutral between different understandings of the nature of the good. It must coerce, when it coerces, neutrally between such understandings.

3. Legal Moralism

H.L.A Hart began his essay entitled ‘Social Solidarity and the Enforcement of Morality’ in this way:

It is possible to extract from Plato's Republic and Laws, and perhaps from Aristotle's Ethics and Politics, the following thesis about the role of law in relation to the enforcement of morality: the law of the city state exists not merely to secure that men have the opportunity to lead a morally good life, but to see that they do. According to this thesis not only may the law be used to punish men for doing what morally it is wrong for them to do, but it should be so used; for the promotion of moral virtue by these means and by others is one of the ends or purposes of a society complex enough to have developed a legal system. This theory is strongly associated with a specific conception of morality as a uniquely true or correct set of principles—not man-made, but either awaiting man's discovery by the use of his reason or (in a theological setting) awaiting its disclosure by revelation. I shall call this theory “the classical thesis” and not discuss it further. (Hart 1983, p. 248)

Having gone to the trouble to state the thesis in question—that the State should see to it that people live good lives—and to cite two heavyweights in its support, Hart's final sentence comes as something of a surprise. He took the view, it would seem, that there was little to be said for a view of morality according to which it awaited discovery by reason or disclosure through revelation. So much so that it was not worthy of serious discussion. It is contrasted with ‘man-made’ morality which Hart does consider worth discussing in the present context.

The reason-based, revelation-based and the man-made versions of the view all tend to arouse suspicion. The moralist has been branded a kill-joy and, more darkly, an inquisitor. Shakespeare's Sir Toby Belch makes the first sort of complaint: ‘Dost thou think that because thou art virtuous there shall be no more cakes and ale?’ (Twelfth Night Act II, Scene III). Harmless activities which give pleasure or are otherwise valued by some are thought fair game by the moralist because immoral or vice-ridden. Arthur Miller's image of the crucible is an apt characterisation of the second sort of suspicion: a crucible is ‘a vessel in which metals are heated to extreme temperatures, melted down, and purified’ (Miller 1952, Singer and Singer 2005, p. 568). The moralist, on this view, is the inquisitor apt to see those who fail to conform to the ‘right ideas’ as impure and prepared to go to great lengths—to heat to extreme temperatures—in order to ‘purify’ such persons.

The specific version of Legal Moralism that Hart was opposing was that of Lord Devlin. Lord Devlin, at the time an English High Court judge, was reacting to a government report recommending the legalisation of homosexual behaviour between consenting adults in private. The report, known as the ‘Wolfendon Report’, concluded that there ‘must remain a realm of private morality and immorality which is, in brief and crude terms, not the law's business’ (‘Wolfendon Report’ 1957, para 61). Devlin's main point was to argue that this specific theoretical conclusion did not stand up. Mill of course believed that harmless behaviour was not the law's business, whether or not it could be styled immoral, and Hart's purpose in challenging Devlin was to reassert a modified version of Mill's view.

Mill's canonical formulation of his Harm Principle begins as we have seen with the following words: ‘the sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection.’ Devlin, while of course implacably opposed to how Mill was to continue the passage, seems to agree. ‘Self protection,’ for him, stretches to the idea of self-protection on the part of the state. In Devlin's view a society is in part constituted by its morality and it therefore has a right to defend itself against any attack on that morality.

For society is not something that is kept together physically; it is held by the invisible bonds of common thought. If the bonds were too far relaxed the members would drift apart. A common morality is part of the bondage. The bondage is part of the price of society; and mankind, which needs society, must pay its price. (Devlin 1965, p. 10)

A society needs its morality as it needs a government and it is therefore, for the sake of self protection, entitled to ‘use the law to preserve morality in the same way as it uses it to safeguard anything else that is essential to its existence’ (Devlin 1965, p. 11). For Devlin, then, to say, as the Wolfendon Committee does, that there is an area of the morality and immorality that is not the law's business is not just ‘crude’ and ‘brief’; it is downright mistaken. The law must do what it has to do to exact the price of society, which is the protection of the morality of that society.

It was said earlier that Devlin's moralism is in Hart's terms of the ‘man-made’ variety. He believed that the invisible bonds of common thought in a given society are not the same in different societies. Some societies abhor polygamy for example and others find it a worthy form of social organisation. In different ways both monogamy and polygamy can partly constitute the invisible bonds of common thought in different societies. For Devlin, it follows that in one society the law can be used to enforce monogamy against polygamy and in the other it can be used to enforce polygamy against monogamy, should the latter threaten the former in either case. In industrialized societies, Devlin tells us, it is generally true that monogamy ‘is built into the house in which we live and could not be removed without bringing it down’ (Devlin, 1965, p. 10). But this is merely a contingent truth and if our houses were built differently the content of the law to be enforced could legitimately be the opposite of what it is. Morality is, for Devlin, conventional.

The relevant sense of morality for Devlin is relative. One is to consider the views of the ordinary person living in that society to determine the content of the morality; in Devlin's English terms, it is ‘the juryman’ whose views one should ask for, or the ‘man on the Clapham omnibus’. In enforcing the criminal law ‘there must be toleration of the maximum individual freedom that is consistent with the integrity of society.’ (Devlin 1965, p. 16). Devlin famously says that the limits of toleration are reached not simply when a majority dislikes a practice; ‘no society, he says, ‘can do without intolerance, indignation and disgust, they are the forces behind the moral law, and indeed it can be argued that if they or something like them are not present, the feelings of society cannot be weighty enough to deprive the individual of freedom of choice.’ (Devlin 1965, p. 17). In the late 1950s in English society, it was at least arguable in Devlin's view that there was enough intolerance, indignation and disgust to justify the criminal law prohibition against homosexual behaviour between consenting adults.

There is nothing to be said in favour of Devlin's construal of homosexuality as ‘addictive’ or a ‘miserable way of life’ (Devlin 1965, p. v), but he himself does not rest much theoretical weight on this construal himself: what matters to him theoretically appears to be the beliefs of a population, backed up by the emotion of disgust and a degree of cool reflection. Presumably, if alive today, Devlin would argue on the same premises for the illegitimacy of the criminalisation of homosexual behaviour between consenting adults. In English society today none of the mainstream political parties takes the view of homosexuality Devlin thought widespread in the 1950s, or, more pertinently in Devlinite terms, believes that there are votes to be gained from advocating such a view.

But it is this very aspect of his thought which makes his view untenable. Bernard Williams has shown that the tempting line of thought of the sort adopted by Devlin is often underlain by an unstable amalgam of relative and non-relative views.

  1. ‘Activity X is wrong’
  2. ‘Activity X is wrong in the functional sense, i.e. for the persistence of that society’
  3. Therefore ‘Society S has the right to do what is necessary to preserve its own existence; it may do what is necessary to suppress Activity X’ (slightly adapting Williams 1972, pp. 34-39; cf. the distinction between ‘positive morality’ and ‘critical morality’ in Hart 1963, pp. 17-24)

But the conclusion does not follow. It may be true that if certain steps are not taken, the society will disintegrate. Apartheid in South Africa disintegrated. What if by a more sustained enforcement of its central racist elements it had managed to persist longer? Would this continued existence be underwritten by a moral right? Does anyone now owe the society the duty to restore the system or did such a duty lie for a period after its disintegration? The suggestions are absurd. The point of course is that some societies are so lacking in legitimacy that it may be emphatically for the best that they disintegrate. Devlin is in error when he says ‘What is important is not the quality of the creed but the strength of the belief in it. (Devlin 1965, p. 114)’

According to Ronald Dworkin what is wrong with the Devlin thesis is that it misidentifies what a moral argument is. We do not argue morally, he says, when we prejudge, when we parrot, when we rationalize and when we merely emote. Certainly one will occasionally overhear exchanges with genuine moral content, some of them robust, if one takes Devlin's advice and catches the Clapham omnibus, but one will also get served up as much prejudgment, as many rationalizations and parrotings, and as much mere emotion. Devlin gives us nothing to help us discriminate: it all counts equally for him. Not everybody accepts in turn Dworkin's claim that emotional responses cannot be moral responses; but Devlin has nevertheless picked on an emotion—disgust—that is particularly susceptible to distortion (cf. Nussbaum 2004). It is clear that in arguing for ‘the enforcement of morality’ Devlin has not focussed on moral argument at all.

Devlin's account unacceptably implies that a corrupt and immoral society has as much right to perpetuate itself as a decent society, provided it is able to integrate the society. He also as we have just seen operates with an unsatisfactory understanding of what morality is. This leaves the possibility of another account of legal moralism that does not make these errors and sees morality aright as reason-based, but which also holds to Devlin's claim quoted right at the beginning of the paper that ‘there is no area of morality into which the law is under no circumstances allowed to enter.’ His own account fails to give any clear route, but his challenge to those who propose the harm principle and similar limitation principles is to show an adequate basis for insulating certain domains of morality from the state in the passing of its law.

4. A Perfectionist Harm Principle

The most influential recent defence of the ‘harm principle’—from a theorist with a reason-sensitive account of morality—is that of Joseph Raz (Raz, 1986).[5] I shall come in a moment to Raz's proposed basis for the harm principle. But first a word about Mill's original grounding of the principle. Mill declared utility to be the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions. But given some other things that Mill says about it, it is initially puzzling why he should think that utility gives any support to the harm principle. For he also held of the principle of utility that ‘actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness’(Mill 1993 p.7). This last formulation seems to counsel states to keep their options open in their lawmaking. ‘Do what you can to reverse unhappiness,’ the advice seems to be, ‘and do what you can to promote happiness.’ ‘Coerce to prevent harm to others if that will reverse unhappiness; coerce for some other end if that will equally do the trick.’ But as we have just seen, coercion to prevent harmless wrongdoing is ruled out by Mill, irrespective of whether such an action is the State's best bet for reversing unhappiness. Never mind if that harmless wrong makes everyone miserable; never mind if coercing those who perpetuate it would take away the misery: the State must not coerce and the misery must remain. Has confusion here wrought Mill's masterpiece?

Not on certain accounts. For all this tension points to is the need for more care in stating the correct basis of Mill's utilitarianism. John Gray argues, with great subtlety that cannot be reproduced here, that what is needed is a form of indirect utilitarianism or indirect consequentialism (Gray 1996). Acting always to promote happiness can be self-defeating and although Mill does say, as we have seen, ‘actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness,’ this remark cannot be taken literally, according to Gray, when read with the remainder of the Millian corpus. What Mill recommends, in Gray's interpretation, is that the successful maximization of happiness must proceed with a ban in certain contexts on its direct pursuit: in particular the state must respect the harm principle instead of appealing directly to the principle of utility (Gray 1996 p. 136). That way happiness, which in substance turns out to require a considerable measure of liberty for persons, will be maximized the better. Gray himself, however, in the second edition of his book, comes to the conclusion that the reconciliation cannot succeed. He gives many arguments. One of them claims that the proposed reconciliation cannot give liberty strong enough priority:

It is true that, in forbidding restraint of liberty save when harm to others is at issue, Mill's Principle of Liberty rules out any number of illiberal limits on liberty such as are demanded by paternalist and moralist considerations. It rules these out because, unless and until harm to others is at issue, no other consideration—and, in particular, no utilitarian consideration—can even count as a good reason in favour of restraint of liberty. The problem is that, once the trip-wire set by the Principle of Liberty has been crossed, even trivial harms to others, could sanction substantial restraints of liberty. The protection afforded the priority of liberty by Mill's principle, though apparently stringent, is for this reason in reality slight. (Gray 1996, pp. 136-137)

In general and in a variety of ways, the principle of liberty sailing under the protection of the harm principle and the principle of utility end up after all at war with one another, and Utility simply cannot be guaranteed to underwrite as strong a principle of liberty as the harm principle.

Raz does not follow Mill's utilitarian path to the defence of the harm principle. Adopting a value-pluralist notion of morality, he argues in short that even though:

  1. There are no principled limits to the pursuit of moral goals on the part of the state.
  2. There are (nevertheless) limits to the means that can legitimately be adopted in promoting the well-being of people and in the pursuit of moral ideals (Raz 1986, p. 420; George 1993, pp. 161-188).

On this argument even if the seemingly very strong concession in (1) is made to the legal moralist, the issue is very far from concluded. For principled limits can be generated out of the means that the law proposes to achieve its aims. (2), not (1), leads Raz to endorse the Harm Principle. At first sight it seems strange that a proponent of the claim in (1) can also be a proponent of the harm principle. For is not the principle precisely aimed at imposing principled limits on the law, ruling out justifications based on the goodness or worthiness of options? How can this be reconciled with the claim that there are no principled limits to the pursuit of moral goals on the part of the state?

Before addressing this, a few more words are in order about the deep structure of Raz's ‘perfectionism.’ To reiterate as far as (1) is concerned, Raz's view of morality is light years from that of Lord Devlin: it is emphatically reason-based. There is no hint of Devlin's idea that morality is constituted simply by the moral beliefs, feelings of disgust etc of a given society. Morality is reason-based, but Raz's concern is limited to states with ‘autonomy-respecting cultures’ and with what it is to live a good life in such societies. The key, as the phrase ‘autonomy-respecting culture’ would suggest, is autonomy. It is a state's primary duty in the relevant kind of society to promote, protect and foster the autonomy of all citizens. This requires furnishing all with an ‘adequate range of valuable options.’ But the qualification ‘valuable’ is of fundamental importance to the account. The state need not lift a finger in defence of worthless options; it has no duty of, say, neutrality to keep itself above the fray between the options that people desire to pursue. Raz is clear, moreover, that the autonomy principle ‘permits and even requires governments to create morally valuable opportunities, and to eliminate repugnant ones’ (Raz 1986, p. 417).

This account, to my mind, is highly plausible. But in the light of it, how does the harm principle get a look in? Why should coercion not be used to eliminate repugnant options? There are certainly bound to be what we earlier called ‘means-ends’ or ‘practical’ problems in using coercion to eliminate a repugnant option. The use of coercion may be prohibitively expensive, for example, denting seriously the resources a state might otherwise use to promote other valuable options. There is likely to be a formidable ‘mixture’ problem: eliminating what is worthless by coercive means may increase the chance that what is of genuine value will be dragged down along with it. Repugnant options are unlikely to subsist in society entirely isolated from other options that are not worthless. But let us imagine that this has all been taken into account and whatever price has to be paid is not adjudged excessively high. Is there an argument to show why a state may still not use coercion to suppress the worthless option that goes beyond arguments from ‘practical’ or ‘means-ends’ limits? Let us look in detail at Raz's argument. His central claim is that the harm principle is defensible on the basis of the principle of autonomy for one simple reason: ‘the means used, coercive interference, violates the autonomy of the victim.’ He explains:

First it violates the condition of independence and expresses a relation of domination and an attitude of disrespect for the coerced individual. Second, coercion by criminal penalties is a global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy. (Raz 1986, p. 418)

Both of these points require some attention. I will begin with the second point for this way around the first point will emerge more clearly. Is, then, the use of coercion a ‘global and indiscriminate invasion of autonomy? There is no doubt whatsoever that sometimes it is. ‘Depriving a person of opportunities or of the ability to use them is’, as Raz says, ‘a way of causing him harm.’ Again ‘frustrating [a person's] pursuit of projects and relationships he has set upon’ can cause harm (Raz 1986, p. 413). The most common context for the invocation of the harm principle is the criminal law. Much behaviour that is criminalized is done under the threat of imprisonment and imprisonment can cut off a very large range of options; or it can reduce them considerably by various forms of disruption or destruction: of family life, deep personal relations, work opportunities, pursuit of valuable outdoor activities, political participation and so on.

This is correct and important to stress. However, it is also clear there are many more forms of coercion in regular use to back up criminal proscriptions than simple imprisonment: fines, community service orders and electronic tagging orders are three examples. Even if one restricts oneself to the criminal law, there are many methods short of imprisonment which can affect options, but which may not leave the convicted criminal short of an adequate range of valuable options. The methods may well be to varying degrees coercive, but the assault on autonomy will not in most be total or near-total.

Take the last mentioned example of the previous paragraph: the mandatory wearing of electronic tagging devices. Jermaine Pennant, an England Under-21 soccer international, was included in Birmingham's starting line-up to face Spurs in a game in the top division of the English football league: the stuff that most English lads' dreams are made of! Only while Pennant was playing he was in the process of serving a sentence following his conviction for a drink-driving offence. Part of his sentence required him to wear an electronic tag. The referee decided the tagging device was safe so long as it was suitably padded under his sock. ‘He just wants to get on with his life again and go out and play football’ his manager Steve Bruce announced. By all appearances he was doing an excellent job of it, notwithstanding the cloud he was under. As he was running around the pitch, we clearly would not say that he had an inadequate range of valuable options, while he was at the same time serving out a criminal sentence.[6]

Similarly, fining is an extremely common form of criminal penalty. Robert Adams in developing a view of the limits of the law stressing, like Raz, the evils of coercion cites the following case:

I believe it would be wrong to subject the possession and use of tobacco (where it does not foul the air for others) to serious criminal penalties, because of the evils of coercion and punishment. Other governmental action to discourage smoking or make it more difficult, without coercion, perhaps by raising taxes on tobacco products, seems entirely appropriate’ (Adams 1999, p. 327).

A number of arguments could be made in support of Adams' view for the specific conclusion that one should not criminalize the possession of tobacco by those who choose to smoke it, despite the demonstrable harm to which smoking leads. But the threat to the adequacy of such a person's valuable options seems not to be one of them. Imagine a state that taxes smoking heavily—an entirely appropriate course of action in Adams' view that discourages something of little value without a heavy coercive bludgeon. Imagine next that it changes tack and criminalizes possession and use of tobacco. It will therefore stop taxing tobacco. One could also imagine, finally, that the fines imposed add up to much less money to be paid per annum, even by the most recalcitrant of offenders, than was paid formerly by anyone in taxes. The stigma attaching to such a crime is unlikely to be much higher than for a parking offence, so again the conclusion seems to be that much can be criminalized without any serious assault on the adequacy of a person's options. In fact sometimes criminal penalties might affect options less than taxation (cf. Alexander 2003).

Perhaps what this shows is that one of the key functions of the harm principle needs to be restricted in scope. Perhaps it should be thought of in this context not as a principle of criminalization or even of fixing the law's limits in general, but as a principle governing the appropriate use of imprisonment?[7] Such a principle could be coupled with a principle of precaution in relation to the less coercive sanctions mentioned above, which would require serious scrutiny in the use of these sanctions precisely due to the presence to some extent of coercion in them. This would, however, be to cut down severely the job description of the sort of limitation principle that has been sought by means of the harm principle. Not only would it no longer be a general principle limiting the scope of the law; it would be dramatically curtailed in relation to the criminal law as well.

But such a conclusion would be premature. Raz is well aware that coercion will not always impinge seriously on a person's autonomy. This is where his other argument comes in, based on the condition of independence. We should now consider whether this argument can make up the slack. We have already stated that for Raz autonomy is to be understood as an adequate range of valuable options. That one has such a range of options is not yet sufficient, in his view, to establish that one is autonomous: one must also satisfy the condition of independence. This is best explained with the conceivable, if practically unlikely, possibility of the willing slave: a slave who engages in valuable activity and would choose to do whatever he actually does under the command of the slave-owner, even if not so commanded. Such a person is not independent and so is not autonomous, irrespective of the adequacy of his valuable options.

Coercion, the second argument runs, violates the condition of independence and expresses a relation of domination and an attitude of disrespect for the coerced individual. I will suggest that the claim turns on an argument about social meanings and the argument may be difficult to contain in a way that would be necessary to support the harm principle. In detail the argument is this:

It is commonplace to say that by coercing or manipulating a person one treats him as an object rather than as an autonomous person. But how can that be so even if the consequences of one's coercion are negligible? The natural fact that coercion and manipulation reduce options or distort normal processes of decision and the formation of preferences has become the basis of a social convention loading them with meaning regardless of their actual consequences. They have acquired a symbolic meaning expressing disregard or even contempt for the coerced or manipulated people. … [S]uch conventions are not exceptionless. There is nothing wrong with coercion used to stop one from stepping into the road and under a car. Such exceptions only reinforce the argument for the conventional and symbolic or expressive character of the prohibition against coercion and manipulation, at least to the extent that it transcends the severity of the actual consequences of these actions. (Raz 1986, p. 378)

For present purposes the essential steps of the argument seem to be these:

  1. ‘Coercion/manipulation tend to reduce options or distort normal processes; this is a natural fact.
  2. This natural fact has become the basis of a social convention which loads acts of coercion/manipulation with symbolic meaning expressing disregard, even where there is no significant diminution in the adequacy of valuable options.

Not all coercion is a global assault on autonomy—it is true—but there is ample support for a principled limit to the law based on coercion, because a social convention takes up the slack in cases in which coercion is not a serious threat to autonomy. This, then, is the argument. Less serious forms of coercion disrespect persons and express contempt for them. Presumably, to return to the criminalization of smoking example, it would not be enough, on this argument, to point to the fact that there may be no diminution in the adequacy of valuable options available to the smoker if the conclusion is to be that criminal fines should legitimately be imposed. Criminalizing the smoking would express disrespect or contempt for the smoker, not because his options are in fact left inadequate, but because a convention has formed giving coercion this sort of meaning.[8]

One worry with this argument is that it may be difficult to determine what the authority of such a convention would be, especially as it may not prove easy to determine the difference in a given case between an exception to the convention and an application of it. In a given context, the question that needs to be answered is: are we confronted with a case in which the meaning of the convention condemns a token action that does not contain the original consequence that gave meaning to the convention, viz. the reduction of the adequacy of valuable options, or simply with an exception to the convention. Another problem, on which I will focus more, is what I will call the problem of discrimination. If there exist such conventions based on natural facts that invest acts of coercion with such meaning, what will guarantee that such conventions only countenance coercion when used against harmful behaviour, not when used against (harmless) immoral or worthless behaviour? Can the coercion-based account be discriminating enough to do the job for which it is intended? After considering whether the convention-based argument just sketched can deal satisfactorily with the discrimination problem, I go on to consider whether a different argument, which I will call ‘the asymmetry’ argument, can also help to deflect the discrimination problem away from the perfectionist defence of the harm principle.

To explore the first, convention-based argument, let us consider a thesis of Meir Dan-Cohen's, with a similar structure to that of Raz, but with a very different, indeed inconsistent, conclusion. Dan-Cohen's focus is on the criminal law rather than the law in general, but his concern is to argue for a replacement of the harm principle with the dignity principle. The main goal of the criminal law, he proposes, ‘is to defend the unique moral worth of every human being’ (Dan-Cohen 2002, p. 150). Dignity demands ‘that our actions, practices, and institutions convey an attitude of respect to people.’ (Dan-Cohen 2002, p. 161). He also alludes to the ‘happy slave’ thought-experiment, arguing that it makes compelling a strong notion of dignity that is independent of autonomy and welfare and prior to both. ‘If,’ he argues, ‘two people can enjoy in fact the same level of welfare and exercise the same degree of choice, yet one of them be a slave while the other is not,’ the evil of slavery must ultimately not lie in the ideas of autonomy or welfare (Dan-Cohen 2002, pp. 156-157). Slavery is evil even in such a case because of its violation of dignity. The lesson of the happy slave hypothetical for Raz is that independence is part and parcel of autonomy; for Dan-Cohen its lesson is different: it points to a dignity principle altogether independent of autonomy.

After citing with approval the Kantian imperative that persons must be treated as ends and not merely as means, Dan-Cohen continues:

Exploiting a person for one's own ends by inflicting on him harm or suffering with disregard for his own needs, interests and desires is the paradigm violation of this imperative. Now ordinarily slavery does just that. Given this record, it is not surprising that slavery should be associated in our minds with indignity. My present point is that although the association has an empirical basis, it need not be limited to those instances in which the empirical conditions obtain. The meaning that attaches to slavery as an insult to dignity is retained even in the situation we imagined, in which the typical derogatory effects on the slave's welfare and autonomy are stipulated away. (Dan-Cohen 2002, p. 161)

The argument has a similar structure to Raz's second argument above. Slavery tends to inflict suffering, harm and disregard’ and this fact has become the basis of a social convention which loads slavery with symbolic meaning expressing indignity, even (sometimes) where there is no suffering, harm or disregard. As Dan-Cohen summarizes his point: ‘Once an action-type has acquired a symbolic significance by virtue of the disrespect it typically displays, its tokens will possess that significance and communicate the same content even if the reason does not apply to them.’ (Dan-Cohen 2002, p. 162).

In State v Brown for example, the assumed facts were that the defendant beat his wife when she drank alcohol, doing so at her prior request, as she thought this would be the most effective way to cure her severe alcoholism. The defendant was convicted of an assault offence and rightly so, suggests Dan-Cohen. But the (assumed) justice of the conviction can be explained satisfactorily neither by recourse to the principle of autonomy (as the victim consented to the beatings), nor to the principle of welfare (if this really was the best way to end the blight that alcoholism had become on Mrs Brown's life it would arguably enhance her welfare). There is legitimate coercion here, Dan-Cohen argues; the harm principle cannot explain why, and so much the worse for the harm principle.

Raz and Dan-Cohen's arguments are similar in structure. If they are combined we can claim that coercion, violence and slavery are very commonly associated with severe setbacks to the autonomy and welfare of persons, but not invariably so. Where they are not, their condemnation is still secure on the basis of the conventional understanding of the nature of those ideas. Perhaps neither argument is correct—as we have already mentioned, it may not be clear how such conventions gain moral authority for one thing. Or perhaps Dan-Cohen's argument is wrong and Raz's is correct: their similarity, perhaps, more apparent than real. The matter cannot be settled here. But on the face of it, if there is plausibility in both arguments, then the law may legitimately coerce to prevent harm and it may legitimately coerce to prevent, in some cases, (harmless) indignity. If so, the perfectionist argument does not succeed in restricting the limits of the law to harm-based considerations.

What, then, of the second way of negotiating the discrimination problem, of explaining why the evil of coercion itself rules out coercion on the basis of (harmless) immoralities, but not on the basis of harm? According to the asymmetry argument: coercing to prevent harm leads to autonomy-gain, coercing to prevent (harmless) immorality leads to autonomy-loss; and that explains why legal coercion should be limited by harm-based considerations. It is for the sake of autonomy.

The argument depends on a particular understanding of harm as autonomy. One often voiced complaint against the harm principle is that the idea of harm is something of a black box into which anything one objects to could potentially be placed. Seeing harm in terms of autonomy, as Raz does, gives the idea content and does so on the basis of an obviously highly significant moral concept. The argument is this. Coercing persons out of harmful behaviour, viz. autonomy-damaging, is at least for the sake of autonomy in the end. But coercing persons out of behaviour that is (harmlessly) worthless gives one no autonomy-gain. There is no autonomy-loss to be sure, in doing away with worthless behaviour, but that is not the point: one must factor in the autonomy-loss involved in the coercion itself. So coercing against harmful behaviour, if done properly, leaves one with an autonomy-gain on balance. But coercing against (harmless) immorality gives one an autonomy-loss, due to the coercion itself, which puts the account in debit, with no positive gain in autonomy to counterbalance the loss. Unlike coercion against harmful behaviour, autonomy simply loses. In Raz's words:

A moral theory which values autonomy highly can justify restricting the autonomy of one person for the sake of the greater autonomy of others or even of that person himself in the future. That is why it can justify coercion to prevent harm, for harm interferes with autonomy. But it will not tolerate coercion for other reasons. The availability of repugnant options, and even their free pursuit by individuals, does not detract from their autonomy. Undesirable as those conditions are they may not be curbed by coercion. (Raz 1986, pp. 418-419)

But is there such an asymmetry? It might be true that ‘the availability of repugnant options, and even their free pursuit by individuals, does not detract from their autonomy,’ but this is largely an empirical matter. Prior to looking and seeing it is not clear that this is so. Could it not be that the availability of some repugnant options does detract from the autonomy of some people? The image of the tree surgeon comes to mind. Some branches are lopped off by the tree surgeon for the health of the tree. Taking off a branch gives the tree a better chance to flourish. Could there not be some worthless options in society that are like one of the branches on the tree? If one assumes for the sake of argument that gambling for non-trivial amounts is a worthless option and that some who pursue this option will do so to the detriment of what is valuable and what they care about most, their families, jobs and long-term hobbies. Might it not be that the existence of the option detracts from the chances of many to achieve success in these valuable pursuits? I actually suspect, to be sure, that any attempt to coerce gambling along these lines would have many negative side-effects and for this reason should not be pursued in practice, but this would largely be due to practical and means-ends limits rather than any matter of principle. Serious gambling probably does get in the way of valuable options of many and does not enhance the value of the life of anyone. Perhaps this judgement is wrong. But it would in any case be a surprising empirical result to discover that autonomy could never be enhanced by the societal equivalent of tree surgery in this case or in any other. It is not implausible to think that the availability of some repugnant options just makes the autonomous life harder.[9] If this is the case, the asymmetry argument seems not to work. Perhaps coercion to prevent harmless immorality may lead to an autonomy gain, just as it does, all going correctly, when the aim is to prevent harm.

Raz's account I think succeeds in establishing the very great significance of autonomy in political morality. As far as the limits of the law is concerned, it establishes that very great caution is in order in the use of imprisonment, given what this can do to the adequacy of the prisoner's valuable options. Caution, too is important over lesser degrees of coercion. It does not, however, seem able to support the harm principle for the coercion based considerations do not neatly settle only on harm-based considerations.

5. Neutrality and Epistemic Restraint

The perfectionist, as we have seen, denies there is anything in the nature of morality itself that should impose principled limits on the law's pursuit of moral goals: such limits are thought rather to get in via the back door, through reflection on the nature of coercion. It was the purpose of the last section to examine the latter view. Many, however, challenge the former view and assert there is something in the nature of human morality itself that should lead us to conclude that principled limits to the law do exist. Most notably, it is said, the fact of persistent moral disagreement should push us in this direction. As Rawls has argued, it is not reasonable to think that moral disagreement will disappear in the medium- or even the long-term. And much of this disagreement cannot simply be blamed on the bloody-mindedness of some or on those biased in favour of themselves, their families or groups. If it could, perhaps their views might be safely ignored. Some of the disagreement is based, rather, on differences over what evidence is appropriate, how much weight should be given to the evidence where it can be agreed upon, how priorities and choices should be made among the vast range of possible values and so on. Rawls describes factors such as these as ‘the burdens of judgment’ (Rawls 1993, 56-57). This sort of disagreement is not unreasonable and perhaps morality itself may mandate a self-denying ordinance against coercing persons out of their (possibly mistaken) reasonable views.

Earlier another strand of thinking about the limits of the law, that the law must remain neutral between different understandings of the nature of the good, was briefly noted. The state, according to this view, may coerce only if it does so neutrally between such understandings. The broad intuition is that the right is prior to the good. The state need not be neutral as between matters of the right, on the one hand, and the good, on the other, between murderers and charity workers (Mulhall and Swift 1996, pp. 29-30). It must be neutral between different views of what makes life good or worthwhile, between, say, charity workers and opera lovers.

In general the kind of neutrality most often supported by the proponents of this view is neutrality of justification, rather than neutrality of effect. Neutrality of justification implies that the justification for laws must not involve reference to judgements about the relative merits of those different ways of life (Mulhall and Swift 1996, p. 30). For example, imagine one group who love the outdoors and another who love television. Assume the establishment of national parks would make the outdoor life easier to enjoy and a life of television watching more difficult, since the beautiful trees would mess up the broadcasts. According to neutrality of effect, the state must not establish the parks unless it can find a way of improving the broadcasts to the appropriate degree as well. To help the hearty outdoor types, the neutrality-of-effect lawmaker must help the couch potatoes too. According to neutrality of justification, on the other hand, it would not matter in itself that television watching would get less enjoyable. Provided the justification for this is not to favour the outdoor enthusiasts or shake up the lazy television watchers a bit, but is instead, say, to provide for clean air, it would be perfectly legitimate. Setting up the national parks is no violation of the principles held dear by the neutrality-of-justification lawmaker (Brighouse 2000, p. 7). This can make state support for high art such as opera difficult to justify, a problem not faced by the perfectionist (Dworkin 1985; Mulhall and Swift 1996, pp. 302-308).

In Thomas Nagel's view a state's law has to do better than just tell those with certain conceptions of the good that they are mistaken; something more must be offered them relating, he argues, to the point of view of such persons. According to him we must support:

… the exclusion of certain values from the admissible grounds for the application of coercive state powers. We must agree to refrain from limiting people's liberty by state action in the name of values that are deeply inadmissible in a certain way from their point of view. (Nagel 1991, p. 155)

This argument is slightly different from the argument of neutrality, though they are close cousins.[10] If we assume:

  1. A state believes X is wrong for various reasons
  2. It can coerce persons out of X without violating means-ends or practical limits.


  1. 1 and 2 are not sufficient for legitimate coercion, because the law must eschew some moral premises irrespective of whether or not they are true.

There can in Nagel's view be values that, while true or valid, are inadmissible from the point of view of the coercee. He has produced a number of arguments for this position (Nagel 1987)[11]. Recently he has stressed the Kantian imperative against treating people as a means only (Nagel 1991). Can a principled limit to the law emerge from such considerations?

It has been pointed out many times by Kantians that treating someone as a means only is not the same as treating someone as a means. One can take a taxi even though that involves treating the taxi-driver as a means to one's ends, but the driver must not be treated as a means only. However:

It implies that if you force someone to serve an end that he cannot be given adequate reason to share, you are treating him as a mere means—even if the end is his own good, as you see it but he doesn't. In view of the coercive character of the state, the requirement becomes a condition of political legitimacy. (Nagel 1991, p. 159)

Nagel is not here appealing in any straightforward way to the consent of the coercee. For one cannot simply allow that the withholding by someone of their actual consent should block legal enforcement, no matter what the basis of the view is in reason. On his view it might be permissible to force someone to serve an end if that person can be given adequate reason to share the end, even if he does not accept it. Giving someone adequate reason then is not a matter of simply deferring to the views of others.

A major worry here is that this has not advanced us at all. The idea is that the law should not use controversial premises about the good in order to make law. Take for example a lawmaker, perhaps religious, who adopts the view of a small minority that personhood begins from the moment of conception and makes a law declaring abortion illegal on this basis. This is precisely the sort of move that Nagel and Rawls want to rule out. A controversial view such as this one has, for them, no place in making law for the public backed up by coercion. Irrespective of whether or not it is true metaphysically that personhood begins from the moment of conception, a view of this sort should be firmly locked out.

Rawls thus argues for a ‘duly qualified right’ on the part of a woman ‘to decide whether or not to end her pregnancy during the first trimester.’(Rawls 1993, p. 243). In his view ‘any comprehensive doctrine that leads to a balance of political values excluding that duly qualified right in the first trimester is to that extent unreasonable.’ The lawmaker in our example would therefore, on this argument, be acting illegitimately and overstepping the proper limits of the law. But why is this? What sorts of argument could possibly be raised against the lawmaker? First, one might say his legislation is inadmissible because it is not based on public reason. Secondly, one might say it is illegitimate because it concerns the good and not the right. Third, one might say the argument is inadequate because it is a highly controversial view, believed only by a small number and rejected by most. Finally—and this clearly is the line that Rawls and Nagel wish to avoid—one might simply say that it is untrue to say that personhood begins at conception. Let us take these considerations in turn.

As for the first, there does not seem to be any basis for thinking that reasons cannot be adduced for this rule that could be presented publicly, combined with the claim that they are reasons all should share. Robert George for one spends some time arguing this, claiming that from the point of conception there is ‘a genetically complete organism directed towards its own functioning.’ (George 1999, pp. 209-213). As for the second point, the argument about abortion also shows the difficulty of trying to separate out arguments about ‘the good’ from arguments about ‘the right.’ For if George is right that abortion is murder, it cannot be relegated to a question of the right and excluded from political justification. As we saw when discussing neutrality, no neutralist argues the law need be neutral about what is right. A group, call them the ‘evolutionary exterminators,’ could not be heard by the neutralist to argue that their desire to kill all homeless people should be treated in the same way as the desires of bird-watchers. Bird watchers, the neutralist would say, do not violate rights; ‘evolutionary exterminators’ do, or would if allowed their way. This still leaves open the question of what counts as a rights violation. If abortion is murder that would.

The third point is no help either. It would no doubt be tempting to say to our imagined lawmaker: ‘You might call abortion murder and you might think you've based your view on good reasons. But look around you; virtually everyone thinks you are wrong. So you must restrict your views only to those others who share your views, not impose them on everyone else.’ The lawmaker would have an easy response to this, namely that the argument amounts to little more than head-counting. It seems to be drifting back into Lord Devlin's territory, assimilating legal morality to moral beliefs and gut reactions. This, as we have seen, will not do: if most people believed slavery permissible, that would not make it so.[12] None of these arguments do anything to show that our imaginary legislator is acting illegitimately. George's argument is perfectly public, it can be placed in terms of the right rather than the good; qua argument against homicide, it violates no neutrality constraint. And it is no objection to say that the view is a minority one. It is only the fourth argument that would show the illegitimacy of the imaginary legislator's actions. For what it is worth I believe George's arguments are unconvincing and could be shown to be mistaken simply on the basis of substantive counter-arguments to his own. But, of course, even if that is right, it is the very kind of argument that Rawls and Nagel want excluded from the debate, so could not help them, on their premises, to establish the conclusion of illegitimacy they seek to establish. The best arguments against George's position would be ruled out of court.

Nagel's argument claims that one treats a person as a means only if one does not give him adequate reason to share the end you are coercing him into. One starts to wonder if any work is being don[1]e by anything other than the idea of ‘adequate reason’. Coerce where you have adequate reason! If the idea of ‘a reason he can share’ becomes a reason he ought to share, then there may be nothing to this latter idea other than a useful heuristic device. The idea of ‘sharing reasons’ simply drops out of the picture. John Finnis, like Robert George a well known proponent of Natural Law theory, rather disarmingly announces that ‘Natural Law theory is nothing other than the account of all the reasons-for-action which people ought to be able to accept, precisely because these are good, valid and sound as reasons.’ (Finnis 1996, pp. 10-11). Now clearly if a comprehensive doctrine such as natural law theory with its robust conception of the good life can pass the test, the test is likely to be a blunt instrument. It will need to show it can avoid ruling out too little to become a live option.


For all the fatal deficiencies of Lord Devlin's own view of the limits of the law, his challenge is extremely difficult to meet. Principled limits beyond means-ends or practical limits are elusive and hard to justify. The central dilemma revolves around the question of recourse on the part of law-makers to moral truth. Should this be unlimited except by practical and means-ends limits and the considerable internal limits that a genuine sensitivity to the truth brings? In this case it will be difficult to dispel the notion that law-makers are being cut too much slack and that some persons are being specially blessed by the law in comparison to others: for disagreement on matters of what is genuinely demanded by truth and morality is showing no sign of going away. This may merely be a facet of the human condition and in fighting it we may be tilting at windmills.[13]

On the other hand, is the better view that law-makers should, as a matter of principle, be denied recourse to certain moral premises based on the good life, not because the premises are false, but in an attempt to dissipate the feeling that partisan conceptions of the good, held by some only, are being especially favoured? Here one soon runs into the problem that in eschewing full recourse to the truth in political argument, one is apt to come up against some awkward opponents, espousing sometimes unpalatable views, who are happy to render their arguments public, happy to make them subject to ‘reasonable rejectability’ and happiest of all to assert that their principles cannot be reasonably rejected. The debate is set to continue for some time yet.



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I am very grateful to Joseph Raz, Liam Murphy, Dori Kimel and Alan Bogg for their helpful comments. Special thanks are due to Grant Lamond for many illuminating discussions on the topic of this paper.