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Descartes' Modal Metaphysics

First published Mon Apr 15, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jun 15, 2006

Descartes sometimes speaks of things that have possible existence, in addition to speaking of things as having actual existence. He also speaks of eternal and necessary truths that God could nonetheless make false. One of the interpretive projects that is inspired by Descartes' claims about possibility and necessity is the construction of a general Cartesian theory of modality. Any such theory would of course need to be sensitive to what Descartes says about possibility and necessity, but it must also be sensitive to his larger metaphysical system.

1. Modality and Clear and Distinct Perception

Though Descartes makes a number of claims about possibilities and necessities, not all of them are to be considered in determining his views on modality if we take seriously his view that when doing metaphysics we ought not affirm what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive. Descartes reveals his commitment to this view in a number of places:

I should like you to remember here that, in matters which may be embraced by the will, I made a very careful distinction between the conduct of life and the contemplation of the truth. As far as the conduct of life is concerned, I am very far from thinking that we should assent only to what is clearly perceived. …But when we are dealing solely with the contemplation of the truth, surely no one has ever denied that we should refrain from giving assent to matters which we do not perceive with sufficient distinctness.[1]

If Descartes holds that when doing strict metaphysics we ought not speak of what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive, a general Cartesian theory of modality should not be sensitive to claims about possibilities or necessities that are confused.

One reason why it is important to highlight the distinction between modal claims that are confused and modal claims that are not is that there are many modal claims that we might want to give a rigorous analysis but that Descartes would not. He will not construct his theory of modality around modal claims that his system entails are confused, and so the theory that he offers will not account for all of our pre-reflective modal intuitions. For example, we might observe a blue table in front of us and put forward the claim that it is not necessary that the table be blue; it could have been black. Descartes himself is going to be careful about accepting such a claim at face-value. He subscribes to the view that strictly speaking our senses “provide only very obscure information” (The Sixth Meditation, AT 7:84, CSM 2:58) about the bodies located outside of us. Our “knowledge of the truth of such things [located outside of us] seems to belong to the mind alone, not to the combination of mind and body” (Ibid., AT 7:82-3, CSM 2:57), but the mind alone knows such qualities of bodies as their extendedness and flexibility (The Second Meditation, AT 7:30-1, CSM 2:20). The certainty that we seek in metaphysical inquiry “occurs in the clear perceptions of the intellect and nowhere else” (Second Replies, AT 7:145, CSM 2:104). However the debate is resolved about the distinctness of Cartesian sensory perceptions, it is important to keep in mind that Descartes' theory of modality will be somewhat circumscribed.[2]

Another reason why it is important to highlight the distinction between modal claims that are confused and modal claims that are not is that sometimes Descartes himself puts forward modal claims that in the final analysis he will reject. For example, in the First Meditation he entertains a number of possibilities that suggest that we might be mistaken about results that seem perfectly evident to us. One such possibility is that we have been created by a supremely good God but that, for reasons unbeknownst to us, our nature is such that we “go wrong every time [we] add two and three or count the sides of a square, or in some even simpler matter” (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). Another is that we have not been created by God but have “arrived at [our] present state by fate or chance or a continuous chain of events” (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). A third is that we have been created by a malicious demon (AT 7:22, CSM 2:15). Descartes mentions all of these possibilities to set up his Third Meditation point that until we know what made our minds, we are not in a position to trust them and so not in a position to know anything at all (AT 7:36, CSM 2:25). None of these is an actual possibility, though Descartes allows that we may not appreciate this until later:

In order to philosophize seriously and search out the truth about the things that are capable of being known, we must first of all lay aside all our preconceived opinions, or at least we must take the greatest care not to put our trust in any of the opinions accepted by us in the past until we have first scrutinized them afresh and confirmed their truth. Next, we must give our attention in an orderly way to the notions that we have within us, and we must judge to be true all and only those whose truth we clearly and distinctly recognize when we attend to them in this way. …When we contrast all this knowledge with the confused thoughts we had before, we will acquire the habit of forming clear and distinct concepts of all the things that can be known. These few instructions seem to me to contain the most important principles of human knowledge. (Principles I:75, AT 8A:38-9, CSM 1:221)

For Descartes, a person who thinks that it is possible that God is a deceiver or that there is no such being as God is very confused.

It might seem surprising that Descartes flirts with these confusions at all. When he does so he is just employing his analytic method — what he calls the “best and truest method of instruction…” (Second Replies, AT 7:156, CSM 2:111). Descartes does not hide that he sometimes makes claims early in the Meditations that from a later and more sophisticated point of view he will retract. He says,

The analytic style of writing that I adopted there [in the Meditations] allows us from time to time to make certain assumptions that have not yet been thoroughly examined; and this comes out in the First Meditation where I made many assumptions which I proceeded to refute in subsequent Meditations.[3]

Descartes makes these claims because he is trying to teach his metaphysics and because he thinks that his readers will not be in a position to grasp that metaphysics if he only makes claims that are true.[4] Reflecting the epistemic individualism that is common in 17th-Century Philosophy, Descartes insists that we should not accept a view until we see its truth for ourselves (Appendix to Fifth Replies, AT 9A:208, CSM 2:272-3). But he also holds that at the start of inquiry our conceptions and commitments are way off: we (or at least most of Descartes' readers) think that what we know best we know through the senses; our conceptions of mind and God represent mind and God as sensible; our conceptions of qualities like color and sound represent these as existing mind-independently; we think and speak by way of terms that we do not understand or that may have no corresponding idea; and what we take to be the paradigm of a distinct perception is hardly distinct at all.[5] We take in information against the background of our current commitments and conceptions, and so are primed to reject what conflicts with them.[6] When we work through the Meditations from the first-person point-of-view, we accept or reject things when we see for ourselves that they are to be accepted or rejected, but until our intellects are emended we do not have the best perspective from which to see the truth.

In order to maneuver his readers into a position in which they are able to understand his metaphysics, Descartes needs to help them to clear up their ideas. If he simply tells us his view, we will hear it in terms of the confused ideas that (on his view) it is imperative we discard. The view that we would walk away with would not be Descartes' view but something else. Descartes therefore opts for a special strategy for presenting his metaphysics: he puts things in terms of the confusions that we understand, otherwise we will not understand him. If we object (as does Gassendi) to this kind of maneuver, Descartes insists that under the circumstances it is only appropriate. He says,

A philosopher would be no more surprised at such suppositions of falsity than he would be if, in order to straighten out a curved stick, we bent it round in the opposite direction. The philosopher knows that it is often useful to assume falsehoods instead of truths in this way in order to shed light on the truth… (Fifth Replies, AT 7:349-350, CSM 2:242).

The falsehoods that Descartes assumes early in the Meditations include claims about the possibility of God's deception and the possibility of His non-existence. But these are not real possibilities in Descartes' ontology. When Descartes talks about these alleged possibilities, he is not interested in truth. Rather, he is interested in helping his reader to move through and past confusion.[7] Descartes holds that when doing metaphysics, we ought refrain from making judgments about what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive. Along with anything else that we do not clearly and distinctly perceive, the alleged possibilities of God's deception and His non-existence do not belong in Descartes' ontology.

2. Unactualized Possibles

Descartes is unambiguous that there are some things that we clearly and distinctly perceive to be possible. To Mersenne he speaks of beings whose existence we clearly perceive to be possible (“To Mersenne, March 1642,” AT 3:544-545, CSMK 211); he also says that God “can bring about everything that I clearly and distinctly recognize as possible” (Fourth Replies, AT 7:219, CSM 2:154). In First Replies he says that

…we must distinguish between possible and necessary existence. It must be noted that possible existence is contained in the concept or idea of everything that we clearly and distinctly understand; but in no case is necessary existence so contained except in the case of the idea of God.[8]

In addition, he says to Mesland that “our mind is finite and so created as to be able to perceive as possible things which God has wished to be in fact possible.”[9] The interpretive issue here is what Descartes is talking about when he speaks in such terms. One interpretation that immediately suggests itself is that Descartes holds that there are things or states of affairs that, though not actual, are counterfactually possible.[10] A number of considerations speak in favor of such a reading. One is that Descartes' view that mind and body are really distinct appears to be the view that minds and bodies that are in fact united can exist apart.[11] Another is that Descartes says that we have clear and distinct perceptions of possible existence and of what is possible, thus making it appear that he holds that God's creatures include not only actuals but also unactualized possibles.[12] Finally, this sort of reading fits Descartes within a long tradition of figures like Scotus and Brandwardine who posit possible being to secure the meaning and reference of claims about things that could be but aren't.[13] If Descartes wants to make claims about unactualized possibles and if he does not want those claims to be non-sensical, unactualized possibles need to have some kind of ontological status in his system.

Descartes may in fact be committed to attributing reality to unactualized possibles, but a few interpretive problems arise if he does. One is that Descartes says elsewhere that unactualized being is nothing. In the Third Meditation, he argues that the objective reality of the idea of God cannot have been caused by potential perfections towards which a finite being might be evolving because potentialities are nothing and so have no causal power. He says,

… I perceive that the objective being of an idea cannot be produced merely by potential being, which strictly speaking is nothing, but only by actual or formal being. (AT 7:47, CSM 2:32)

If Descartes holds that potential being is nothing, then it is difficult to see how he can include unactualized possibles in his ontology.

Another interpretive problem is that it is difficult to see exactly where possible reality would fit into Descartes' ontology. For Descartes, all reality depends for its existence on God — even possible reality (“To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118-9, CSM 3:235). A possible being is thus a creature with an ontological status. Indeed, Descartes holds that “truth is the conformity of thought with its object” ("To Mersenne, 16 October 1639," AT 2:597, CSM3:139), that “[t]ruth consists in being” (“To Clerselier, 23 April 1649,” AT 5:356, CSM3:377), and that true ideas are “ideas of real things” (The Third Meditation, AT 7:43, CSM 2:30). Clear and distinct perceptions of possibilities conform to reality and are of real things; they have a truth-maker. A clearly and distinctly perceived possibility has some ontological status, and the question is what exactly that is. This is a question on which the Descartes literature has been largely silent, but the options would appear to be that possibilities are either creatures or ideas in the mind of God.

If possible beings are creatures, there is some difficulty in making room for them in Descartes' ontology. Descartes is fairly clear that the only creatures that exist are finite minds and bodies and their modes:

I recognize only two ultimate classes of things: first, intellectual of thinking things, i.e. those which pertain to mind or thinking substance; and secondly, material things, i.e. those which pertain to extended substance or body. Perception, volition and all the modes both of perceiving and willing are referred to thinking substance; while to extended substance belong size (that is, extension in length, breadth and depth), shape, motion, position, divisibility of component parts and the like.[14]

One category of being in Descartes' ontology is thinking substance (and its modes), and another is extended substance (and its modes). If Descartes' possibles are just created thinking or extended substances, then presumably they are actuals and not possibles.

Of course, one might suggest that Descartes' dualism entails that there are two kinds of things — thinking things and material things -- but that in each of these classes there are substances with actual existence and also substances with possible existence. On such a view, the class of thinking substances (for example) includes thinking substances with actual existence and thinking substances with possible existence.

There are a couple of problems with this view, however. One is that Descartes holds that it follows from God's essence that God is eternal and that His will is wholly immutable (The Third Meditation, AT 7:45, CSM 2:31; Principles I:56, AT 8A:26, CSM 1:211; “To Mersenne, 15 April 1630,” AT 1:145-6, CSM 3:23; Principles II:36, AT 8A:61, CSM 1:24). Indeed, it appears that Descartes holds that there is a single series that God preordains and that cannot be changed (Principles I:40-1, AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). If God created things that were merely possible, it is unclear how He would be able to actualize them instead of the things that are actualized in the series, and so it is unclear how they would constitute possibilities. These alleged possibilities (if they are anything) would be among all of the other creatures; they would be actuals.

It might of course be the case that Descartes just insists that there are possible existents in addition to actual existents. It might also be the case that “possible existence” is just another name for actual existence. Descartes suggests this equation in a few places. To describe the kind of existence had by creatures, Descartes uses ‘possible existence’ and ‘contingent existence’ interchangeably: he sometimes speaks of the beings that depend on God for their existence as having “possible or contingent existence” (Second Replies, AT 7:166, CSM 2:117; Notae, AT 8B:361, CSM 1:306), and sometimes he speaks of them as having just “contingent existence” (Principles 15, AT 8A:10, CSM 1:198). When he says that creatures have possible or contingent existence, he identifies the two kinds of existence: “possible or [vel] contingent existence.” If contingent existence is just the kind of existence had by beings that depend for their existence on God's will, then the fact that a thing has possible existence in Descartes' ontology does not suggest that the thing does not actually exist. Such a thing exists, but in a way that has it wholly dependent on God. Descartes also suggests this definition of “possible existence” when he contrasts necessary existence with the kind of existence had by creatures in First Replies: unlike necessary existence, the existence had by a creature is marked by the fact that it “has no power to create itself or maintain itself in existence” (AT 7:118, CSM 2:84). It might be that like some of his predecessors Descartes is using ‘possible existence’ to describe a kind of being had by actually existing things.[15]

If possibilities are not creatures that exist in addition to thinking substances and extended substances, another interpretive option is to say that they are ideas in the mind of God, but that God does not actualize. This interpretive option is precluded by Descartes' commitment to the identity of God's will, intellect, and creative activity:

…in God, willing, understanding, and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (“To Mersenne, 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25-26)
In God willing and knowing are a single thing in such a way that by the very fact of willing something he knows it and it is only for this reason that such a thing is true. (“To Mersenne, 6 May 1630,” AT 1:149, CSMK 24)

A philosopher like Leibniz will insist on a distinction between God's understanding and will so as to secure the existence of things in God's understanding that God does not actually create. A philosopher like Spinoza will point out that a thinker who is committed to the identity of God's will and intellect is committed to the view that there is nothing that God understands that God does not create. Spinoza will add that such a thinker is not restricting God's omnipotence if God is the cause of all being and if alleged unactualized possibilities are outside the scope of God's intellect and will. Descartes appears to be siding with Spinoza here: what is not the object of God's understanding is nothing at all, and what is the object of God's understanding is created and made actual.[16] If Descartes is seriously committed to the identity of God's intellect and will, it is difficult to see how he can also be committed to the existence of unactualized possibles.

There are a number of passages in which Descartes speaks of what is possible. To fix an interpretation of these passages, we can look to a number of different places. One is common-sense. We might argue that any view is crazy that does not admit that there are things that could happen or exist but that do not. Since Descartes is not crazy, what he must mean when he speaks of the possible is unactualized being. Or, we might argue that Descartes is continuing in the tradition of thinkers who clearly do posit unactualized possibles. If these figures include unactualized being within their ontologies, and if Descartes is building on their work, then his claims about the possible are about unactualized being. Or, we might attempt to isolate parts of Descartes' system that have a bearing on what “possible” might mean in his system. Parts of this system entail that ‘possible existence’ is just the actual existence of dependent beings. If by “possible existence” Descartes just means the dependent existence of actually existing creatures, then passages in which Descartes speaks of a thing as being possible or having possible existence are not evidence that Descartes holds that there are things that could be but are not. Of course, it might just be the case that Descartes has reason to help himself to entities that the rest of his system shuts out.

If Descartes does hold that there are things that could be but are not, his view still demands the important qualification discussed in the first section above. He of course realizes that in everyday discourse we speak of things that can happen but don't. However, if our understanding of these things is not clear and distinct, and if our understanding of them as possible is not clear and distinct, then Descartes will not introduce them as possibilities. Descartes appreciates that according to common ways of speaking, all kinds of things are possible. He considers this concept of ‘possible’ after Mersenne introduces it in Second Objections:

If by ‘possible’ you mean what everyone commonly means, namely ‘whatever does not conflict with our human concepts’, then it is manifest that the nature of God, as I have described it, is possible in this sense…. (Second Replies, AT 7:150, CSM 2:107)

Here Descartes might seem to be offering a theory of possibility according to which what it means for something to be possible is just for it to be conceivable.[17] However, this cannot be Descartes' view. Descartes holds that whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive is true and that truth is “the conformity of thought with its object” (“To Mersenne, 16 October 1639,” AT 2:597, CSMK 139). If a possibility that we are considering is clearly and distinctly perceived, then our clear and distinct perception conforms to reality, and the possibility that we are conceiving is not merely conceptual. Instead, there is also an object to which the clear and distinct perception conforms — the sort of thing posited by commentators who argue that Descartes holds that God's creation consists not only of actuals but of unactualized possibles. Thus, for any possibility of which we have a conception, if there is no object to which that conception conforms — that is, if the possibility exists only in thought — the possibility is not clearly and distinctly perceived. Possibilities which exist only in thought are not part of Descartes' ontology and so on Descartes' view are not possibilities at all. Descartes' remarks to Mersenne actually bear this out. He is indeed considering the view of possibility as conceivability, but in doing so he is merely acknowledging what “everyone commonly means” by ‘possible’. Descartes sometimes speaks of the possible as clearly and distinctly perceived. It is on these passages that any interpretation of Descartes' views on possibility must be built.

3. The Eternal Truths

Descartes is infamous for his doctrine of the divine creation of the eternal truths:

You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. ("To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630," AT 1:152, CSMK 25)

On the surface the position is baffling, especially when considered in conjunction with Descartes' view that God is omnipotent. The author of Fifth Objections, Pierre Gassendi, complained that the view is very difficult to conceive. Descartes' reply is interesting:

You say that you think it is ‘very hard’ to propose that there is anything immutable and eternal apart from God. You would be right to think this if I was talking about existing things, or if I was proposing something as immutable in the sense that its immutability was independent of God. But just as the poets suppose that the Fates were originally established by Jupiter, but that after they were established he bound himself to abide by them, so I do not think that the essences of things, and the mathematical truths which we can know concerning them, are independent of God. Nevertheless I do think that they are immutable and eternal, since the will and decree of God willed and decreed that they should be so. Whether you think this is hard or easy to accept, it is enough for me that it is true. (Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261)

Descartes holds that each and every thing depends on God for its existence and that, as things, eternal truths depend on God as well. One of Gassendi's worries is that if God can do anything and thus can alter any item that He creates, nothing that He creates is immutable.

We can zero in on Gassendi's worry if we consider that Descartes is putting forward the view that the eternal truths are created by a free act of God but are also necessary. Descartes is clear that the eternal truths are necessary: he says that “the necessity of these truths does not surpass our knowledge” (“To Mersenne, 6 May 1630,” AT 1:150, CSMK 25). If eternal truths are necessary, however, then it should not be the case that they could have been otherwise. Yet Descartes' commitment to divine omnipotence appears to commit him to this view:

You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal — just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. (“To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25)

It appears that something in Descartes' comments about the eternal truths has to give. It might be that, since Descartes is clearly not prepared to adjust his commitment to divine omnipotence, he instead abandons his view that they are necessary.[18] On this interpretation, developed and defended by Harry Frankfurt, all eternal truths are inherently contingent because they could have been false, and they could have been false because God could have made their contradictories true. Frankfurt's interpretation is motivated not only by Descartes' commitment to divine omnipotence; there are also some texts:

… God cannot have been determined to make it true that contradictories cannot be true together, and therefore… he could have done the opposite.[19]
I do not think that we should ever say of anything that it cannot be brought about by God. For since every basis of truth and goodness depends on his omnipotence, I would not dare to say that God cannot make a mountain without a valley, or bring it about that 1 and 2 are not 3.[20]

If Frankfurt is right, Cartesian eternal truths are not really necessary; they “are inherently as contingent as any other propositions” (42). They may appear to be necessary to our rational faculties, but this is just a function of the makeup of our rational faculties and not of the necessity of the truths themselves.[21]

If Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary in any robust sense, Frankfurt's view has an obvious drawback. But it also suffers from the problem that it cannot be formulated without supposing that Descartes would allow that human minds can know that there is a perspective from which eternal truths can be seen to be contingent, but an important component of the view is that Descartes thinks that it is part of the structure of a human mind to regard eternal truths as wholly necessary. An alternative view (developed and defended by Edwin Curley) is that Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary, but that they are not necessarily so. On this reading, Descartes' view involves iterated modalities: a number of truths are possibly necessary, but God chooses only some of these possibilities to be the actual necessary truths.[22] One of the passages that supports such a reading is from the already-cited letter to Mesland:

And even if God has willed that some truths should be necessary, this does not mean that he willed them necessarily; for it is one thing to will that they be necessary, and quite another to will this necessarily, or to be necessitated to will it.[23]

On Curley's reading, Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary and that it is false that they could have been otherwise, but he also holds that they are not necessarily necessary and that it could have been the case that they could have been otherwise. The main interpretive problem with Curley's reading is that, as a matter of logic, if it could have been the case that a given truth could have been otherwise then that claim is not a necessary truth.[24] A related problem is that the reading supposes that God's eternal will could have been otherwise. There exists the possibility that God's will might have been otherwise only if God produces it, but God's eternal and immutable will would not be able to actualize it even if He did produce it, raising the question of what entitles it to be identified as a possibility in the first place.

An alternative reading of Descartes' comments on the eternal truths suggests still another interpretation. Jonathan Bennett has pointed out that in some of the key passages in question Descartes does not say that God can make contradictories true but that we should not say that God cannot make contradictories true (Bennett 1994, 653-655). Here Descartes is not saying anything about God's power but about us and what we ought not say. Presumably, Descartes is just invoking his Fourth Meditation rule for judging in these passages, for he is clear that when doing metaphysics we ought not affirm what we do not clearly and distinctly understand.[25] Since we do not come close to a clear and distinct understanding of what it would be for one and two to add up to something other than three, and since we do not understand God's being unable to do something, the prospect that God cannot make 1 and 2 not add to 3 is hopelessly confused. Accordingly, we ought not speak of it. This analysis applies also to the important passage in the Mesland letter. Immediately after saying that God can make contradictories true together, Descartes takes it back: “… even if this be true, we should not try to comprehend it, since our nature is incapable of doing so.” Descartes' claim that God can make contradictories true is something that we ought not affirm when doing metaphysics and thus something that should have no bearing on our interpretation of Descartes' system. Here Descartes may just be speaking in the language of faith and devotion in an attempt to gesture at God's perfection.

This last view handles very easily the passages in which Descartes says that we ought not say of impossibilities that God cannot bring them about. The view also opens up the interpretive possibility that Descartes holds that the eternal truths are wholly necessary. As we have seen, Descartes says that the necessity of the eternal truths “does not surpass our knowledge.” God is the author of everything, and so is the author of the necessary truths as necessary. Descartes does make the claim that God is free to make the radii of a circle unequal, and that nothing necessitates God to create the eternal truths that He does, but God's freedom to do this has to be understood in terms of Descartes' view of divine freedom and not some other. For Descartes, the view that God is free is the Spinozistic view that God is supremely indifferent and independent, and his view of God's freedom to create the eternal truths is to be understood accordingly.[26] God has willed certain truths to be necessary. Nothing can change God's immutable will, nor can God change it Himself and make eternal truths false:

It will be said that if God had established these truths he could change them as a king changes his laws. To this the answer is: Yes he can, if his will can change. 'But I understand them to be eternal and unchangeable.' — I make the same judgment about God. 'But his will is free.' — Yes, but his power is beyond our grasp. (“To Mersenne, 15 April 1630,” AT 1:145-6, CSM 3:23).

Descartes appears to hold that God's omnipotence is such that God's will is wholly immutable, even if such omnipotence is difficult for us to conceive as omnipotence.[27] He appears to subscribe to the view that the eternal truths are necessary in the strictest sense possible.[28] As he is reported to have said in Conversation with Burman:

Concerning ethics and religion,… the opinion has prevailed that God can be altered, because of the prayers of mankind; for no one would have prayed to God if he knew, or had convinced himself, that God was unalterable…. From the metaphysical point of view, however, it is quite unintelligible that God should be anything but completely unalterable. It is irrelevant that the decrees could have been separated from God; indeed, this should not really be asserted. For although God is completely indifferent with respect to all things, he necessarily made the decrees he did, since he necessarily willed what was best, even though it was of his own will that he did what was best. We should not make a separation here between the necessity and the indifference that apply to God's decrees; although his actions were completely indifferent, they were also completely necessary. Then again, although we may conceive that the decrees could have been separated from God, this is merely a token procedure of our own reasoning: the distinction thus introduced between God himself and his decrees is a mental, not a real one. In reality the decrees could not have been separated from God: he is not prior to them or distinct from them, nor could he have existed without them. (AT 5:166, CSM 3:348)

The view that Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary is also sensitive to the important worry raised by Broughton (1987) and Nadler (1987) — that Descartes presumably should not say that physical laws follow from God's nature and so are absolutely necessary, in a way that has them admitting of more necessity than the truths of mathematics and geometry. If Descartes does hold that there are possible eternal truths that God does not actualize, it is difficult to see where they would fit in his ontology. It is also difficult to see how he could admit the existence of such truths and continue to adhere to his conceptions of divine omnipotence and divine immutability.

Thus far we have considered the interpretive issue of whether or not Descartes' eternal truths could have been otherwise. A question that still remains to be considered concerns the ontological status of Descartes' eternal truths, regardless of whether or not they could have been otherwise.

One view is that since Descartes' eternal truths are neither finite mental things, finite physical things, nor God, they must be something akin to Platonic forms.[29] A problem with this view, of course, is that it does violence to Descartes' parsimonious dualism. Another problem with the view is that Descartes says that eternal truths are beings which “have no existence outside our thought” (Principles I:48, AT 8A:23, CSM 1:208).

A second view is that eternal truths are to be located in God.[30] One of the merits of this view is that it provides for eternal truths to be eternal in a very robust sense. Since God is eternal, eternal truths are eternal presumably only if they are in God (unless some of God's creation is co-eternal with God). Still, this view conflicts with the fact that Descartes holds that eternal truths are creatures.

A third reading of Descartes on eternal truths is that they are true ideas that conform to God's creation. If truth is the conformity of thought with its object, then eternal truths are simply a subset of true ideas. On this reading it is easy to see why Descartes would say that eternal truths have no existence outside of our thought. They are true ideas, but not true ideas in the mind of God, for (1) eternal truths are creatures, and (2) whatever is the object of God's intellect is the object of His creative activity. Eternal truths are thus ideas in finite minds. A problem with this reading, however, is that, although it allows eternal truths to be truths, it is not clear that it allows them to be eternal.[31] In some passages Descartes does distance himself from the appellation 'eternal truth': he refers to “those truths which are called eternal” (“To Mersenne, 27 May 1638,” AT 2:138, CSM 3:103) and to “[t]he mathematical truths which you call eternal” (To Mersenne, 15 April 1630, AT 1:145, CSM 3:23). And he allows that things can be identified as ‘eternal’ so long as they “are always the same” (Fifth Replies, AT 7:381, CSM 2:262). So a deflationary view of the eternality of Cartesian eternal truths might be in order. However, Descartes says to Mersenne that “from all eternity [God] willed them [eternal truths] to be, and by that very fact he created them” (“To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25). Here Descartes appears to attribute to eternal truths an eternality that they cannot have if they have no existence outside of our thought.[32] Perhaps a compromise interpretation would be that Descartes holds that God has willed the series of creatures from eternity and that some of these creatures are truths that are “always the same” once created.

4. Real Distinction

Any interpretation of Descartes' views on modality needs to be sensitive to his view that mind and body are really distinct. The conclusion of his Sixth Meditation argument for substance dualism is that “I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it” (AT 7:78, CSM 2:54). A natural reading of Descartes' conclusion has him saying that, for any minds and bodies that are united, it is counterfactually possible that they be separated.[33] His argument would be as follows:

  1. I clearly and distinctly understand mind apart from body and body apart from mind.
  2. God can bring about whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive.
  3. God can bring about that mind is apart from body and body is apart from mind.
  4. If God can bring about that mind is apart from body and body is apart from mind, then mind and body can exist apart.
  5. Mind and body can exist apart.

Such a reading is sensitive not only to Descartes' Sixth Meditation comments but also to his further remarks on real distinction in Fourth Replies. There Descartes says that for “establishing a real distinction it is sufficient that two things can be understood as ‘complete’ and that each one can be understood apart from the other” (AT 7:221, CSM 2:156). A thing is complete, for Descartes, when it is a substance:

… [B]y a ‘complete thing’ I simply mean a substance endowed with the forms or attributes which enable me to recognize that it is a substance. (AT 7:222, CSM 2:156)

Since a Cartesian substance is a thing that is ontologically independent (Principles I:51-52), a complete thing is an ontologically independent thing. When we clearly and distinctly perceive mind and body to be complete, we know that they are substances. When we still clearly and distinctly perceive them to be substances after clearly and distinctly perceiving them apart from each other, we know that they are not the same substance under different descriptions. On this view, Descartes holds that mind and body are ontologically independent substances, and their distinctness consists in their ability to continue to exist even after God separates them.[34]

An alternative interpretation of Descartes on the real distinction between mind and body reads the distinction as consisting in the the ontological independence of mind and body, but not in their separability.[35] Descartes holds that a sufficient condition for establishing a real distinction between two things is clearly and distinctly perceiving them to be non-identical substances (“Synopsis of these following six Meditations,” AT 7:13, CSM 2:9; Fourth Replies, AT 7:221-223, CSM 2:156-156). He therefore holds that the substantiality of two non-identical substances does not consist in their being separable but is just an indication of their separability.[36] On this view, mind and body are separable for Descartes; it's just that their separability is a consequence of the (different) fact that they are really distinct.[37]

A third reading of the Cartesian real distinction stresses the difficulty in making room for unactualized possibilities in Descartes' system. The reading also highlights that Descartes holds that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical but says (in his proof of real distinction) that God can bring about whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive. Descartes is clear in other texts that the reason why he mentions God's power in the proof of real distinction is to remind us that no matter how unlikely we think it is that our intimately united minds and bodies could also be really distinct, God has enough power to have made all of our clear and distinct perceptions veridical:

You agree that thought is an attribute of a substance which contains no extension, and conversely that extension is an attribute of a substance that contains no thought. So you must also agree that a thinking substance is distinct from an extended substance. For the only criterion we have enabling us to know that one substance differs from another is that we understand one apart from the other. And God can surely bring about whatever we can clearly understand; the only things that are said to be impossible for God to do are those which involve a conceptual contradiction, that is, which are not intelligible. But we can clearly understand a thinking substance that is not extended, and an extended substance that does not think, as you agree.[38]

In Fourth Replies Descartes say that his reason for mentioning God's power in the Sixth Meditation proof of real distinction is to remind his reader that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical (AT 7:226, CSM 2:159). In the Sixth Meditation itself he arrives at a clear and distinct perception of mind as an immaterial substance and body as a material non-thinking substance and is immediately struck by the union of his mind and body: “It is true that I may have… a body that is very closely joined to me” (AT 7:78, CSM 2:54). He says that "nevertheless" his mind and body are really distinct. Descartes appreciates that the facts of mind-body union and mind-body separation are opposed.[39] In the context of demonstrating the real distinction between mind and body he reminds us that God's power is such that there can be creatures that have nothing in common but that are intimately united.[40]

If we take seriously the consideration that there is no room in Descartes' ontology for unactualized possibilities, the real distinction between mind and body does not amount to their counterfactual separation.[41] God has willed the series of creatures from eternity, and the claim that mind and body can exist apart might amount to the claim that when a given mind and body are separated in the series, each is ontologically independent and so continues to exist.[42] That is, instead of reflecting that there is anything more in Descartes' ontology that what is contained in the series that God wills and preordains, the claim that mind and body can exist apart might amount to Descartes' note in “Synopsis of these following six Meditations” that in the Sixth Meditation he is attempting to re-assure us that "the decay of the body does not imply the destruction of them mind" (AT 7:13, CSM 1:10).

The interpretive issue of reading Descartes' particular views in the light of his systematic commitments is especially pressing when it comes to his view that mind and body are really distinct. If Descartes holds that potential being is strictly speaking nothing, and if his parsimonious ontology and his commitment to divine immutability, divine preordination, and (his particular conception of) omnipotence bar possibilities from his system, it is not exactly clear what to make of the possibility of mind and body existing in separation. One view is that Descartes is committed to the reality of this possibility and that, with his commitment to other possibilities, this commitment is part of a pattern of Descartes' helping himself to entities that his system does not allow. That is, it might be the case that Descartes wants his system to be rich enough to posit possibilities and that, when it isn't, he posits them anyway. Or, it might be the case that the 'can' in Descartes' claim that mind and body can exist apart is the not yet analyzed 'can' of the vernacular.[43]

5. Possibility and Human Freedom

The whole project of the Fourth Meditation would appear to suggest that Descartes is committed to the view that human beings can do something other than what God preordains. The Fourth Meditation tells us that error is avoidable, that we err not as as a result of the way that we are constructed but as a result of our mis-use of one of the faculties that God has provided us, and that to avoid error we must refrain from affirming what we do not perceive clearly and distinctly.

But there are passages in Descartes' corpus that make the Fourth Meditation view problematic. One is of course the Principles I:40-1 text in which Descartes says that God pre-ordains everything from eternity. He does admit that "we can easily get ourselves into great difficulties if we attempt to reconcile this divine preordination with the freedom of our will, or attempt to grasp both these things at once" (AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). But this just means that he himself appreciates the problem.

There are other difficult texts as well:

...[P]hilosophy by itself is able to discover that the slightest thought could not enter a person's mind without God's willing, and having willed from all eternity, that it should so enter. ...When Your Highness speaks of the particular providence of God as being the foundation of theology, I do not think that you have in mind some change in God's decrees occasioned by actions that depend on our free will. No such change is theologically tenable; and when we are told to pray to God, that is not so that we should inform him of our needs, or that we should try to get him to change anything in the order established from all eternity by his providence...[,] but simply to obtain whatever he has from all eternity, willed to be obtained by our prayers. (“To Princess Elizabeth, 6 October 1645,” AT 4:314-6, CSM 3:272-3)
As for free will, I agree that if we think only of ourselves we cannot help regarding ourselves as independent; but when we think of the infinite power of God, we cannot help believing that all things depend on him, and hence that our free will is not exempt from this dependence. ...The independence which we experience and feel in ourselves, and which suffices to make our actions praiseworthy or blameworthy, is not incompatible with a dependence of quite another kind, whereby all things are subject to God. (“To Princess Elizabeth, 3 November 1645,” AT 4:332-3, CSM 3:277)
Henceforth, because he [the man who meditates upon God] knows that nothing can befall him which God has not decreed, he no longer fears death, pain or disgrace. He so loves this divine decree, deems it so just and so necessary, and knows that he must be so completely subject to it that even when he expects it to bring death or some other evil, he would not will to change it even if, per impossible, he could do so. (“To Chanut, 1 February 1647,” AT 4:609, CSM 3:310)

In the Principles I:40-1 discussion, Descartes appeals to divine incomprehensibility to make sense of how human freedom and divine preordination are to be reconciled. God is infinitely powerful, and He somehow made a universe in which it is true both that human beings are free and that God has preordained everything from eternity (AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). Perhaps we should just take Descartes' lead here. But it is still unclear if the appeal to divine incomprehensibility is supposed to help us to accept that God preordains everything and that there is a freedom that conflicts with divine preordination, or if it is supposed to help us to accept that there is a kind of freedom that is consistent with divine preordination but is still freedom.

A final issue to consider in the context of discussing Descartes' view on human freedom is the issue of the extent to which finite minds are compelled or drawn to affirm clear and distinct perceptions. There are a number of texts in which Descartes reflects that view that finite minds are wholly unable to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception.[44] Indeed, we might think that the only way that we would be able to know that God's non-deceiverhood secures the truth of clear and distinct perceptions is if those perceptions are utterly compelled. There are passages, however, in which Descartes appears to reflect the view that it is within the power of the will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. One is Principles I:37, in which Descartes says that “when we embrace the truth, our doing so voluntarily is much more to our credit than would be the case if we could not do otherwise” (AT 8A:19, CSM 1:205). But this passage is especially odd given that only a few lines later in Principles I:43 Descartes offers one of his statements of the view that we are unable to doubt clear and distinct perceptions (in which we are embracing the truth…).[45]

Another passage in which Descartes appears to reflect the view that it is within the power of a finite will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception is in “To [Mesland], 9 February 1645.” There Descartes writes that

absolutely speaking… it is always open to us to hold back from pursuing a clearly known good, or from admitting a clearly perceived truth, provided we consider it a good thing to demonstrate the freedom of our will by so doing. (AT 4:173, CSM 3:245)

An examination of the larger context of this passage in the shows that it is not in fact evidence that Descartes holds that it is within the power of a finite will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. In the previous letter to Mesland Descartes had said that

I agree with you when you say that we can suspend our judgment; but I tried to explain in what manner this can be done. For it seems to me certain that a great light in the intellect is followed by a great inclination in the will; so that if we see very clearly that a thing is good for us, it is very difficult — and on my view impossible, as long as one continues in the same thought — to stop the course of our desire. “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:115-6, CSM 3:233)

Descartes' view that clear and distinct perceptions are will-compelling is the view that so long as the intellect has a clear and distinct idea, it is impossible for the will to refrain from affirming it. What it is for a finite mind to clearly and distinctly perceive X is for its intellect to have a clear and distinct idea of X and for its will to affirm X, but while the intellect is presenting this clear and distinct idea, the will cannot stop affirming it to turn its attention to something else. Instead, another idea must be put in place of the clear and distinct idea, and by something other than the will.[46] As Descartes says by way of qualification in the February 1645 letter, we suspend judgment when something else distracts the will from a clear and distinct idea (AT 4:173, CSM 3:245) — for example the desire to exhibit our freedom.[47]

It is tempting to assume that Descartes accepts the Spinozistic view that the will is at the mercy of the clarity with which the intellect has ideas. (Of course, in Spinoza's language the view is that there is no distinction between will and intellect and that to the extent that we understand something our will is drawn to affirm it.) Descartes appears to accept this view in the case of clear and distinct ideas at least, and it would make sense for him to think that the compellingness of truth and goodness does not disappear when our grasp of it is slightly weakened. But such a reading is speculative at best.

6. The System and its Pillars

It is presumably an adequacy condition on the interpretation of the work of any systematic philosopher that the work be interpreted in light of the central tenets of that philosopher's system. The interpretive problem of course is that for almost any such philosopher there are controversies about what these central tenets are. It is uncontroversial that Descartes sometimes speaks of possibility and necessity. What is not so uncontroversial is what he is talking about when he talks about these. In particular, if Descartes is committed to the view that there is unactualized possible being, then either (1) the alleged parts of his system that seem to disallow such being are not parts of his system, (2) the parts of his system that seem to disallow such being do not really disallow it, or (3) he is not a wholly systematic philosopher.


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Related Entries

actualism | Descartes, René: epistemology | Descartes, René: ontological argument | Gassendi, Pierre | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: modal metaphysics | modality: medieval theories of | possible objects | possible worlds