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Descartes' Epistemology

First published Wed Dec 3, 1997; substantive revision Thu Apr 14, 2005

René Descartes (1596-1650) is widely regarded as the father of modern philosophy. His noteworthy contributions extend to mathematics and physics. This entry focuses on his philosophical contributions in the theory of knowledge. Specifically, the focus is on the epistemological project of Descartes' famous work, Meditations on First Philosophy.

1. Conception of Knowledge—Internalist, Indefeasibilist, Methodist, Rationalist

1.1 Analysis of Knowledge

Famously, Descartes defines knowledge in terms of doubt. While distinguishing rigorous knowledge (scientia) and lesser grades of conviction (persuasio), Descartes writes:

I distinguish the two as follows: there is conviction when there remains some reason which might lead us to doubt, but knowledge is conviction based on a reason so strong that it can never be shaken by any stronger reason. (1640 letter, AT 3:64-65)

Elsewhere, while answering a challenge as to whether he succeeds in founding such knowledge, Descartes writes:

But since I see that you are still stuck fast in the doubts which I put forward in the First Meditation, and which I thought I had very carefully removed in the succeeding Meditations, I shall now expound for a second time the basis on which it seems to me that all human certainty can be founded.

First of all, as soon as we think that we correctly perceive something, we are spontaneously convinced that it is true. Now if this conviction is so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting what we are convinced of, then there are no further questions for us to ask: we have everything that we could reasonably want. … For the supposition which we are making here is of a conviction so firm that it is quite incapable of being destroyed; and such a conviction is clearly the same as the most perfect certainty. (Replies 2, AT 7:144-45)

These passages (and others) clarify that Descartes understands doubt as the contrast of certainty. As my certainty increases, my doubt decreases; conversely, as my doubt increases, my certainty decreases. The requirement that knowledge is to be based in complete, or perfect certainty, amounts to requiring a complete absence of doubt—an indubitability, or inability to undermine one's conviction. Descartes' methodic emphasis on doubt, rather than on certainty, marks an epistemological innovation. This so-called ‘method of doubt’ will be discussed below (Section 2).

The certainty/indubitability of interest to Descartes is psychological in character, though not merely psychological—not simply an inexplicable feeling. It has also a distinctively epistemic character, involving a kind of rational insight. During moments of certainty, it is as if my perception is guided by “a great light in the intellect” (Med. 4, AT 7:59). This rational illumination empowers me to “see utterly clearly with my mind's eye”; my feelings of certainty are grounded—indeed, “I see a manifest contradiction” in denying the proposition of which I'm convinced. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

Should we regard Descartes' account as a version of the justified true belief analysis of knowledge tracing back to Plato? The above texts (block quoted) are among Descartes' clearest statements concerning the brand of knowledge he seeks. Yet they raise questions about the extent to which his account is continuous with other analyses of knowledge. Prima facie, his characterizations imply a justified belief analysis of knowledge—or in language closer to his own (and where justification is construed in terms of unshakability), an unshakable conviction analysis. There's no stated requirement that the would-be knower's conviction is to be true, as opposed to being unshakably certain. Is truth, therefore, not a requirement of Descartes' brand of strict knowledge?

Many will balk at the suggestion. For in numerous texts Descartes writes about truth, even characterizing a “rule for establishing the truth” (Med. 5, AT 7:70, passim). It might therefore seem clear, whatever else is the case, that Descartes conceives of knowledge as advancing truth. Without denying this, let me play devil's advocate. It is not inconsistent to hold that we're pursuing the truth, even succeeding in establishing the truth, and yet to construe the conditions of success wholly in terms of certainty; that is, to maintain that to establish a proposition just is to perceive it with certainty. Note again that Descartes says, of the perfect certainty he seeks, that it provides “everything that we could reasonably want,” adding (in the same passage):

What is it to us that someone may make out that the perception whose truth we are so firmly convinced of may appear false to God or an angel, so that it is, absolutely speaking, false? Why should this alleged “absolute falsity” bother us, since we neither believe in it nor have even the smallest suspicion of it? (Replies 2, AT 7:144-45)

On one reading of this remark, Descartes is explicitly embracing the consequence of having defined knowledge wholly in terms of unshakable conviction: he's conceding that achieving the brand of knowledge he seeks is compatible with being—“absolutely speaking”—in error. If this is the correct reading, the interesting upshot is that Descartes' ultimate aspiration is not absolute truth, but absolute certainty. Of course, it should not be ignored (on this reading) that these same remarks imply that achieving this perfect certainty entails being unshakably convinced that we're not in error, absolutely speaking.

On a quite different reading of this passage, Descartes is clarifying that the analysis of knowledge is neutral not about truth, but about absolute truth: he's conveying that the truth condition requisite to knowledge involves truth as coherence.

A definitive interpretation of these issues has yet to gain general acceptance in the literature. What is clear is that the brand of knowledge Descartes seeks requires, at least, unshakably certain conviction.

1.2 Internalism and Justification

One way to divide up theories of justification is in terms of the internalism-externalism distinction. Very roughly: a theory of justification is internalist insofar as it requires that the justifying factors are accessible to the knower's conscious awareness; it is externalist insofar as it does not impose this requirement.

Descartes' internalism requires that all justifying factors take the form of ideas. For he holds that ideas are, strictly speaking, the only objects of perception, or conscious awareness. Independent of this theory of ideas, Descartes' methodical doubts underwrite an assumption with similar force: for almost the entirety of the Meditations, his meditator-spokesperson—hereafter referred to as the ‘meditator’—adopts the assumption that his every thought is occurring in a dream. This assumption is tantamount to requiring that justification come in the form of ideas.

An important consequence of the account is that rigorous philosophical inquiry must proceed via an inside-to-out strategy—a strategy Descartes assiduously follows, and which endures as a hallmark of early modern epistemologies. Ultimately, all judgments are grounded in an inspection of the mind's ideas. Philosophical inquiry is, properly understood, an investigation of ideas. The methodical strategy of the Meditations is designed to force the reader to adopt this mode of inquiry.

1.3 Indefeasibility in Context

In characterizing knowledge as “incapable of being destroyed,” Descartes portrays knowledge as enduring. Our conviction must be, writes Descartes, “so strong that it can never be shaken”; “so firm that it is impossible for us ever to have any reason for doubting.” Descartes wants a brand of certainty/indubitability that is of the highest rank, both in terms of degree and durability. He wants knowledge that is utterly indefeasible.

This indefeasibility requirement implies more than mere stability. A would-be knower could achieve stability simply by never reflecting on reasons for doubt. Referring to such a person, Descartes points out that although a reason for “doubt may not occur to him, it can still crop up if someone else raises the point or if he looks into the matter himself” (Replies 2, AT 7:141).

Many readers conclude that Descartes' standards of justification are too high, for they have the consequence that almost nothing we ordinarily count as knowledge measures up. Before jumping to this conclusion, we should put the indefeasibility requirement into context.

Descartes is a contextualist in the sense that he allows that different standards of justification are appropriate to different contexts. This is not merely to say the obvious: that depending on the context of inquiry, knowledge-worthy justification will sometimes be needed, but other times not. It's to say something stronger: that depending on the context of inquiry, the standards of knowledge-worthy justification might vary. For example, a contextualist might accept that ‘knowledge’-talk is equally appropriate whether one is describing the best achievements of empirical science, or the best achievements of mathematics, while acknowledging that the former rest on weaker standards of proof than the latter. This example is potentially misleading, in that Descartes appears loath to count mere empirical evidence as knowledge-worthy justification. But upon ramping up the standard to what he finds minimally acceptable, the standard admits of context dependent variation.

Descartes' minimum standard targets the level of certainty arising when the mind's perception is both clear and distinct. (For Descartes, clarity contrasts with obscurity, and distinctness contrasts with confusion.) He allows that judgments grounded in clear and distinct perception are defeasible (at least, for those who've not yet read the Meditations). But he regularly characterizes defeasible judgments at this level of certainty using terminology (e.g., ‘cognitio’ and its cognates) that translates well into the English ‘knowledge’ (and its cognates).

In the context of inquiry at play in the Meditations, Descartes insists on indefeasibility. (Typically, he reserves the term ‘scientia’ for this brand of knowledge, though he uses ‘cognitio’ and its cognates for either context.) Descartes' aim is, once and for all, to lay a lasting foundation for knowledge. To achieve this, he contends that we “cannot possibly go too far in [our] distrustful attitude” (Med. 1, AT 7:22). Better to have a standard that excludes some truths, than one that justifies some falsehoods.

An interesting thesis emerges—call it the ‘No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis’. Descartes maintains that though atheists are quite capable of impressive knowledge they are incapable of the indefeasible brand of knowledge he seeks:

The fact that an atheist can be “clearly aware [clare cognoscere] that the three angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles” is something I do not dispute. But I maintain that this awareness [cognitionem] of his is not true knowledge [scientiam], since no act of awareness [cognitio] that can be rendered doubtful seems fit to be called knowledge [scientia]. Now since we are supposing that this individual is an atheist, he cannot be certain that he is not being deceived on matters which seem to him to be very evident (as I fully explained). (Replies 2, AT 7:141)

Hereafter, I refer to the indefeasible brand of knowledge Descartes seeks as ‘Knowledge’ (uppercase ‘K’).

1.4 Methodist Approach

How is the would-be Knower to proceed in identifying candidates for Knowledge? Distinguish particularist and methodist responses to the question. The particularist is apt to trust our prima facie intuitions regarding particular knowledge claims. These intuitions may then be used to help identify more general epistemic principles. The methodist, in contrast, is apt to distrust our prima facie intuitions. The preference is to begin with general principles about proper method. The methodical principles may then be used to arrive at settled, reflective judgments concerning particular knowledge claims.

Famously, Descartes is in the methodist camp. Those who haphazardly “direct their minds down untrodden paths” are sometimes “lucky enough in their wanderings to hit upon some truth,” but “it is far better,” writes Descartes, “never to contemplate investigating the truth about any matter than to do so without a method” (Rules 4, AT 10:371). Though it's prima facie palpable that the earth is unmoved, and that ordinary objects (as tables and chairs) are just as just as they seem, the newly emerging mechanist doctrines of the 17th century imply that such judgments are false. These kinds of cases underscore the unreliability of our prima facie intuitions and the need for a method by which to distinguish truth and falsity.

Descartes' view is not that all our pre-reflective intuitions are mistaken. He concedes that “no sane person has ever seriously doubted” such particular claims as “that there really is a world, and that human beings have bodies” (Synopsis, AT 7:16). His view is that pre-reflective judgments are likely to be ill-grounded, even when true.

The dialectic of the First Meditation features a confrontation between particularism and methodism, with methodism emerging the victor. For example, the meditator (while voicing empiricist sensibilities) puts forward, as candidates for the foundations of Knowledge, such prima facie obvious claims as “that I am here, sitting by the fire, wearing a winter dressing-gown, holding this piece of paper in my hands, and so on”—particular matters “about which doubt is quite impossible,” or so it would seem (AT 7:18). In response (and at each level of the dialectic), Descartes invokes his own methodical principles to show that the prima facie obviousness of such particular claims is insufficient to meet the burden of proof.

1.5 Innate Ideas

Descartes' commitment to innate ideas places him in a rationalist tradition tracing back to Plato. Knowledge of the nature of reality derives from ideas of the intellect, not the senses. An important part of metaphysical inquiry therefore involves learning to think with the intellect. The allegory of the cave portrays this rationalist theme in terms of epistemically distinct worlds. Plato likens what the senses reveal to shadowy imagery on the wall of a poorly lit cave—to wit, images of mere figurine beings; he likens what the intellect reveals to a world of fully real beings illuminated by bright sunshine. The metaphor aptly depicts our epistemic predicament, on Descartes' own doctrines. An important function of his methods is to help would-be Knowers redirect their attention from the confused imagery of the senses, to the luminous world of the intellect's clear and distinct ideas.

Further comparisons arise with Plato's doctrine of recollection. The Fifth Meditation meditator remarks—having applied Cartesian methodology, thereby discovering innate truths within: “on first discovering them it seems that I am not so much learning something new as remembering what I knew before” (Med. 5, AT 7:64). Elsewhere Descartes adds, of innate truths:

[W]e come to know them by the power of our own native intelligence, without any sensory experience. All geometrical truths are of this sort—not just the most obvious ones, but all the others, however abstruse they may appear. Hence, according to Plato, Socrates asks a slave boy about the elements of geometry and thereby makes the boy able to dig out certain truths from his own mind which he had not previously recognized were there, thus attempting to establish the doctrine of reminiscence. Our knowledge of God is of this sort. (1643 letter, AT 8b:166-67)

The famous wax thought experiment of the Second Meditation is supposed to illustrate (among other things) a procedure whereby to “dig out” what is innate. The thought experiment purports to help the meditator achieve a “purely mental scrutiny,” more easily apprehending the innate idea of body. (Med. 2, AT 7:30-31) According to Descartes, our minds come stocked with a variety of intellectual concepts—ideas whose content derives solely from the nature of the mind. This storehouse includes ideas in mathematics (e.g., number, line, triangle), logic (e.g., contradiction, necessity), and metaphysics (e.g., identity, substance, causality). Interestingly, Descartes holds that even our sensory ideas involve innate content. On his understanding of the new mechanical physics, bodies have no real properties resembling our sensory ideas of colors, sounds, tastes, and the like, thus implying that the content of such ideas draws from the mind itself. Unlike purely intellectual concepts, however, the formation of these sensory ideas depends on sensory stimulation. I suggest that on Descartes' official doctrine, ideas are innate insofar as their content derives from the nature of the mind alone, as opposed to deriving from sense experience. This characterization allows that both intellectual and sensory concepts draw on native resources, though not to the same extent.

Though the subject of rationalism in Descartes' epistemology deserves careful attention, the present essay generally focuses on Descartes' efforts to achieve indefeasible Knowledge. Relatively little attention is given to his interesting doctrines of innateness, or, more generally, his ontology of thought.

Further reading: On the internalism-externalism distinction, see Alston (1989) and Plantinga (1993). For a partly externalist interpretation of Descartes, see Della Rocca (2005). For coherentist interpretations of Descartes' project, see Frankfurt (1970) and Sosa (1997a). For a stability interpretation of Descartes, see Bennett (1990). On the indefeasibility of Knowledge, see Newman and Nelson (1999). On contextualism in Descartes, see Newman (2004). On the methodism-particularism distinction, see Chisholm (1982). On Descartes' rationalism, see Adams (1975), Jolley (1990), and Newman (forthcoming).

2. Methods: Foundationalism and Doubt

Of his own methodology, Descartes writes:

Throughout my writings I have made it clear that my method imitates that of the architect. When an architect wants to build a house which is stable on ground where there is a sandy topsoil over underlying rock, or clay, or some other firm base, he begins by digging out a set of trenches from which he removes the sand, and anything resting on or mixed in with the sand, so that he can lay his foundations on firm soil. In the same way, I began by taking everything that was doubtful and throwing it out, like sand … (Replies 7, AT 7:537)

The theory whereby justified beliefs are best structured on an analogy to architecture traces back to ancient Greek thought—to Aristotle, and to work in geometry. That Descartes' method effectively pays homage to Aristotle is, of course, welcome by his Aristotelian audience. However, he views Aristotle's foundationalist principles as incomplete, at least when applied to metaphysical inquiry. I suggest that his method of doubt is intended to complement foundationalism. The two methods are supposed to work in cooperation, as conveyed in the above quotation. Let's consider each method.

2.1 Foundationalism

The central insight of foundationalism is to organize one's beliefs in the manner of a well structured, architectural edifice. Such an edifice owes its structural integrity to two kinds of features: a firm foundation and a superstructure of support beams firmly anchored to the foundation. A system of justified beliefs might be organized by two analogous features: a foundation of unshakable first principles, and a superstructure of further propositions anchored to the foundation via unshakable inference.

Exemplary of a foundationalist system is Euclid's geometry. Euclid begins with a foundation of first principles—definitions, postulates, and axioms or common notions—on which he then bases a superstructure of further propositions. Descartes' own designs for metaphysical Knowledge are inspired by Euclid's system:

Those long chains composed of very simple and easy reasoning, which geometers customarily use to arrive at their most difficult demonstrations, had given me occasion to suppose that all the things which can fall under human knowledge are interconnected in the same way. (Discourse 2, AT 6:19).

It would be misleading to characterize the arguments of the Meditations as unfolding straightforwardly according to geometric method. But Descartes maintains that they can be reconstructed as such, and he expressly does so at the end of the Second Replies—providing a “geometrical” exposition of his central constructive steps, under the following headings: definitions, postulates, axioms or common notions, and propositions (AT 7:160ff).

As alluded to above, the Meditations contains a destructive component that Descartes likens to the architect's preparations for laying a foundation. Though the component finds no analogue in the method of the geometers, Descartes appears to hold that this component is needed in metaphysical inquiry. The discovery of Euclid's first principles (some of them, at any rate) is comparatively unproblematic: such principles as that things which are equal to the same thing are also equal to one another (one of Euclid's axioms) accord not only with reason, but with the senses. In contrast, metaphysical inquiry might have first principles that conflict with the senses:

The difference is that the primary notions which are presupposed for the demonstration of geometrical truths are readily accepted by anyone, since they accord with the use of our senses. Hence there is no difficulty there, except in the proper deduction of the consequences, which can be done even by the less attentive, provided they remember what has gone before. … In metaphysics by contrast there is nothing which causes so much effort as making our perception of the primary notions clear and distinct. Admittedly, they are by their nature as evident as, or even more evident than, the primary notions which the geometers study; but they conflict with many preconceived opinions derived from the senses which we have got into the habit of holding from our earliest years, and so only those who really concentrate and meditate and withdraw their minds from corporeal things, so far as possible, will achieve perfect knowledge of them. (Replies 2, AT 7:156-57)

Among Descartes' persistent themes is that such preconceived opinions can have the effect of obscuring our mental vision of innate principles; that where there are disputes about first principles, it is not “because one man's faculty of knowledge extends more widely than another's, but because the common notions are in conflict with the preconceived opinions of some people who, as a result, cannot easily grasp them”; whereas, “we cannot fail to know them [innate common notions] when the occasion for thinking about them arises, provided that we are not blinded by preconceived opinions” (Prin. 1:49-50, AT 8a:24). These “preconceived opinions” must be “set aside,” says Descartes, “in order to lay the first foundations of philosophy” (1643 letter, AT 8b:37). Unless they are set aside, we're apt to regard, as first principles, the mistaken (though prima facie obvious) sensory claims that particularists find attractive. And mistakes in the laying of foundations weaken the entire edifice. Descartes adds:

All the mistakes made in the sciences happen, in my view, simply because at the beginning we make judgements too hastily, and accept as our first principles matters which are obscure and of which we do not have a clear and distinct notion. (Search, AT 10:526)

Though foundationalism brilliantly allows for the expansion of knowledge from first principles, Descartes thinks that a complementary method is needed to help us discover genuine first principles. He devises the method of doubt for this purpose—a method to help “set aside” preconceived opinions.

2.2 Method of Doubt

Descartes opens the First Meditation asserting the need “to demolish everything completely and start again right from the foundations” (AT 7:17). In the architectural analogy, we can think of bulldozers as the ground clearing tools of demolition. For Knowledge building, Descartes construes sceptical doubts as the ground clearing tools of epistemic demolition. Bulldozers undermine literal ground; doubt undermines epistemic grounds.

Descartes' ultimate aims, however, are constructive. Unlike “the sceptics, who doubt only for the sake of doubting,” Descartes aims “to reach certainty—to cast aside the loose earth and sand so as to come upon rock or clay” (Discourse 3, AT 6:28-29). Bulldozers are typically used for destructive ends, as are sceptical doubts. Descartes' methodical innovation is to employ demolition for constructive ends. Where a bulldozer's force overpowers the ground, its effects are destructive. Where the ground's firmness resists the bulldozer's force, the bulldozer might be used constructively—using it to reveal the ground as firm. Descartes' innovation is to use epistemic bulldozers in this way, using sceptical doubts to test the firmness of beliefs put forward as candidates for the foundations of Knowledge—testing their epistemic shakability.

According to at least one prominent critic, this employment of sceptical doubt is unnecessary and excessive. Writes Gassendi:

There is just one point I am not clear about, namely why you did not make a simple and brief statement to the effect that you were regarding your previous knowledge as uncertain so that you could later single out what you found to be true. Why instead did you consider everything as false, which seems more like adopting a new prejudice than relinquishing an old one? This strategy made it necessary for you to convince yourself by imagining a deceiving God or some evil demon who tricks us, whereas it would surely have been sufficient to cite the darkness of the human mind or the weakness of our nature. (Objs. 5, AT 7:257-58; my italics)

Gassendi singles out two features of methodic doubt—its universal and hyperbolic character. In reply, Descartes remarks:

You say that you approve of my project for freeing my mind from preconceived opinions; and indeed no one can pretend that such a project should not be approved of. But you would have preferred me to have carried it out by making a ‘simple and brief statement’—that is, only in a perfunctory fashion. Is it really so easy to free ourselves from all the errors which we have soaked up since our infancy? Can we really be too careful in carrying out a project which everyone agrees should be performed? (Replies 5, AT 7:348)

Evidently, Descartes holds that the universal and hyperbolic character of methodic doubt is helpful to its success. Further appeal to the architectural analogy helps elucidate why. Incorporating these features enables the method to more effectively identify first principles. Making doubt universal and hyperbolic helps to distinguish genuine unshakability from the mere appearance of it.

Consider first the universal character of methodic doubt. In urging a universal doubt, Descartes does not mean simply that we're to apply doubt to all candidates for Knowledge. He is urging something much stronger. He means that in the initial demolition phase of the project we're to apply doubt collectively, undermining the candidates for the foundations of Knowledge all in one go: it is necessary “to demolish everything completely and start again right from the foundations” (Med. 1, AT 7:17). Why must doubt be universal to this extent? Descartes offers the following analogy:

Suppose [a person] had a basket full of apples and, being worried that some of the apples were rotten, wanted to take out the rotten ones to prevent the rot spreading. How would he proceed? Would he not begin by tipping the whole lot out of the basket? And would not the next step be to cast his eye over each apple in turn, and pick up and put back in the basket only those he saw to be sound, leaving the others? In just the same way, those who have never philosophized correctly have various opinions in their minds which they have begun to store up since childhood, and which they therefore have reason to believe may in many cases be false. They then attempt to separate the false beliefs from the others, so as to prevent their contaminating the rest and making the whole lot uncertain. Now the best way they can accomplish this is to reject all their beliefs together in one go, as if they were all uncertain and false. They can then go over each belief in turn and re-adopt only those which they recognize to be true and indubitable. (Replies 7, AT 7:481)

Because one bad apple can spoil the whole bunch, the only sure means to a rot-free basket is to discard the whole lot. What Descartes notices is that even one falsehood that is mistakenly regarded as a genuine first principle—say, the belief that the senses are reliable, or that ancient authorities should be trusted—threatens to spread falsehood to other beliefs in the system. A collective doubt helps avoid such mistakes. It ensures that the method only approves candidate first principles that are unshakable in their own right: it ensures that the appearance of unshakability in a candidate is not owed to its logical relations to other principles, themselves not subjected to collective doubt.

How is the hyperbolic character of methodic doubt supposed to contribute to the method's success? The architectural analogy is again helpful. Suppose that an architect is vigilant in employing a universal/collective demolition in the destructive phase of her project. Suppose, further, that she attempts to use bulldozers for constructive purposes. A problem nonetheless arises. How big a bulldozer is she to use? A light-duty bulldozer might be unable to distinguish a medium-sized boulder, and immovable bedrock. In both cases, the ground would appear immovable. The solution lies in using not light-duty, but heavy-duty tools of demolition—the bigger the bulldozer, the better. The lesson is clear for the epistemic builder: the bigger the bulldozer, the better translates to the more hyperbolic the doubt, the better.

A potential problem remains. Does not the problem of the “light-duty bulldozer” repeat itself? No matter how firm one's ground, it would be dislodged in the face of a yet bigger bulldozer. This raises the worry that there might not be unshakable ground, but only yet unshaken ground. Descartes' goal of utterly indubitable epistemic ground may simply be elusive.

Perhaps the architectural analogy breaks down in a manner that serves Descartes well. For though there is no most-powerful literal bulldozer, perhaps epistemic bulldozing is not subject to this limitation. Descartes seems to think that there is a most-powerful doubt—a doubt than which none more hyperbolic can be conceived. The Evil Genius Doubt (and equivalent doubts) is supposed to fit the bill. If the method reveals epistemic ground that stands fast in the face of a doubt this hyperbolic, then, as Descartes seems to hold, this counts as epistemic bedrock if anything does.

Hence the importance of the universal and hyperbolic character of the method of doubt. Gassendi's suggestion that we forego methodic doubt in favor of a “simple and brief statement to the effect that [we're] regarding [our] previous knowledge as uncertain” misses the intended point of methodic doubt.

Before turning attention to the First Meditation demolition project, I want to address what I believe are significant misconceptions about the method of doubt. Two of these are suggested in a passage from the pragmatist Peirce:

We cannot begin with complete doubt. We must begin with all the prejudices which we actually have when we enter upon the study of philosophy. These prejudices are not to be dispelled by a maxim [viz., the maxim that the philosopher “must begin with universal doubt”], for they are things which it does not occur to us can be questioned. Hence this initial skepticism will be a mere self-deception, and not real doubt … A person may, it is true, in the course of his studies, find reason to doubt what he began by believing; but in that case he doubts because he has a positive reason for it, and not on account of the Cartesian maxim. Let us not pretend to doubt in philosophy what we do not doubt in our hearts. (1955, 228f)

It is a misconception that universal doubt is intended to result from the mere effort to adhere to the maxim—as if by sheer effort of will. To the contrary, Descartes introduces sceptical arguments precisely in acknowledgement that we need reasons for doubt:

I did say that there was some difficulty in expelling from our belief everything we have previously accepted. One reason for this is that before we can decide to doubt, we need some reason for doubting; and that is why in my First Meditation I put forward the principal reasons for doubt. (Replies 5, appendix, AT 9a:204)

Another misconception is suggested by Peirce's reference to a “doubt in our hearts.” Distinguish two kinds of doubt, in terms of two kinds of ways that doubt can defeat knowledge. Some doubts purport to undermine one's conviction or belief—call these ‘belief-defeating doubts’. Other doubts purport to undermine one's justification (whether or not they undermine belief)—call these ‘justification-defeating doubts’. Descartes' aim of indefeasible Knowledge requires that he overcome both kinds of doubt, since either one defeats Knowledge. But the two kinds of doubt invoke quite different doxastic attitudes. What Peirce calls a “doubt in our hearts” is suggestive of a belief-defeating doubt. Descartes' hyperbolic doubts, however, are intended as justification-defeating. Part of what makes his doubts hyperbolic is that their extravagance renders them unlikely to dislodge our existing beliefs. His doubts are supposed to help us to appreciate that even though we believe that 2+3=5, and believe that we're awake, and believe that there is an external world, we nonetheless lack indefeasible justification.

A related misconception has Descartes calling not merely for doubt, but for disbelief or dissent. For example, Gassendi takes Descartes to be urging us, quite literally, to “consider everything as false” (Objs. 5, AT 7:257-58). Thus read, Descartes is calling for something even stronger than a belief-defeating doubt; he's calling for a disbelief-inducing doubt. But surely the spirit (even if not always the letter) of Descartes' invocation to doubt is that we are to “hold back [our] assent from opinions which are not completely certain and indubitable just as carefully as [we] do from those which are patently false” (Med. 1, AT 7:18).

Finally, a common misconception has it that the universality of doubt renders inert the doubting hypotheses—and thus the entire method—since the hypotheses themselves are dubious in every case. But this misses the point of the method: namely, to extend doubt universally to candidates for Knowledge, but not also to the very tools for founding Knowledge. As Descartes concedes: “there may be reasons which are strong enough to compel us to doubt, even though these reasons are themselves doubtful, and hence are not to be retained later on” (Replies 7, AT 7:473-74).

Further reading: On foundationalism: for Descartes' treatment, see Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Objections and Replies; for its treatment by ancients, see Euclid (1956) and Aristotle (Posterior Analytics); by interpreters of Descartes, see Sosa (1997a) and Van Cleve (1979). On Cartesian inference, see Gaukroger (1989) and Hacking (1980). On methodical doubt: for Descartes' treatment, see Rules, Discourse, First Meditation, and Seventh Replies; by commentators, see Frankfurt (1970), Garber (1986), Newman (forthcoming), Williams (1983), and Wilson (1978). On the analysis-synthesis distinction (closed related to issues of doubt and methodology): see the Second Replies (AT 7:155ff); see also Galileo (1967, 50f), Arnauld (L'Art de Penser, 4.2-3), Curley (1986), and Hintikka (1978).

3. First Meditation Doubting Arguments

3.1 Dreaming Doubt

Historically, there are two distinct dream-related skeptical doubts. The one doubt undermines the judgment that one is presently awake—call this the ‘Now Dreaming Doubt’. The other doubt undermines the judgment that one is ever awake (i.e., in the way normally supposed)—call this the ‘Always Dreaming Doubt’. A textual case can be made on behalf of both formulations being raised in the Meditations. Though it will not be my aim to make this textual case, we will consider both formulations.

Both kinds of dream doubt appeal to some version of the thesis that the experiences we take as dreams are (at their best) qualitatively similar to what we take as waking—call this the ‘Similarity Thesis’. The Similarity Thesis may be formulated in a variety of strengths. A strong Similarity Thesis might contend that some dreams are phenomenally indistinguishable from waking, even subsequent to waking-up; a weaker thesis might contend merely that dreams seem similar to waking while having them, but not upon waking. Debates about precisely how similar waking and dreaming can be, have raged for more than two millennia. The tone of the debates suggests that the degree of qualitative similarity may vary across individuals (or, at least, across their recollections of dreams). Granting such variation, dreaming doubts that depend on weaker versions of the Similarity Theses are (other things equal) apt to be more persuasive. I want to consider a textually defensible formulation that is relatively weak. (Note, however, that some texts suggest a strong thesis: “As if I did not remember other occasions when I have been tricked by exactly similar thoughts while asleep” (Med. 1, AT 7:19, my italics).)

The relatively weak thesis I have in mind is this: that the similarity we take to hold between waking and dreaming is sufficient to render it thinkable that a dream would seem realistic, even when reflecting on it. As Descartes writes: “every sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep” (Med. 6, AT 7:77). This version of the Similarity Thesis is endorsable by those who never recollect dreams that seem (on hindsight) phenomenally indistinguishable from waking; indeed, it's endorsable even by those who simply do not remember their dreams to any significant degree.

This weak Similarity Thesis is sufficient to generate straightaway the Now Dreaming Doubt. Since it is thinkable that a dream would convincingly seem as realistic (while having it) as my present experience seems, then, for all I Know, I am now dreaming. Recall that Descartes' method requires only a justification-defeating doubt, not a belief-defeating doubt. The doubt does its damage as long as I find it thinkable that a dream would seem this good. Descartes concedes that I might believe that I am awake—to wit, my belief might be true. Descartes is only denying that I have indubitable certainty: “there are never any sure signs by means of which being awake can be distinguished from being asleep” (Med. 1, AT 7:19).

The conclusion that I do not Know that I am now awake has widespread sceptical consequences. For if I do not Know this, then neither do I Know that I am now “holding this piece of paper in my hands”—nor do I Know anything suggested by external sensation. For all I Know, the apparent sensible objects around me are players in a vivid dream.

Much to-do has been made about whether dreaming arguments are self-refuting. According to an influential objection, Similarity Theses presuppose that we can reliably distinguish dreams and waking, yet the conclusion of dreaming arguments presupposes that we cannot. Therefore, if the conclusion of such arguments is true, then the Similarity Thesis cannot be. By way of reply, some formulations of the thesis do make this mistake. Of present interest is whether all do—specifically, whether Descartes makes the mistake. He does not. Interestingly, his formulation of the Similarity Thesis presupposes only the truism that we do in fact distinguish dreaming and waking (never mind whether reliably). He states his version of the thesis in terms of what we think of as dreams, versus what we think of as waking: “every sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep” (Med. 6, AT 7:77).

Does Descartes also put forward a second dreaming argument, the Always Dreaming Doubt? There is strong textual evidence to support this, though I'll not make a textual case here. The conclusion of the Always Dreaming Doubt can be generated from the very same Similarity Thesis, together with a further assumption. The further assumption is that, for all I Know, the processes producing what I take as waking are no more veridical than those producing what I take as dreams. As Descartes writes:

[E]very sensory experience I have ever thought I was having while awake I can also think of myself as sometimes having while asleep; and since I do not believe that what I seem to perceive in sleep comes from things located outside me, I did not see why I should be any more inclined to believe this of what I think I perceive while awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:77)

The aim of the Always Dreaming Doubt is not to undermine whether I am now awake, but whether my sensation is produced by external objects even assuming I am awake. For in the cases of both waking and dreaming, my cognitive access extends only to the productive result, but not the productive process. On what basis, then, do I conclude that the productive processes are different—that external objects play more of a role in waking than in dreaming? For all I Know, both categories of experience are produced by some subconscious faculty of my mind. As the meditator says:

[T]here may be some other faculty [of my mind] not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming. (Med. 3, AT 7:39)

The sceptical consequences of the Always Dreaming Doubt are even more devastating than those of the Now Dreaming Doubt. If I do not Know that “normal waking” experience is produced by external objects, then, for all I Know, all of my experiences might be dreams of a sort. For all I Know, there might not be an external world. For my best evidence of an external world derives from my preconceived opinion that external objects produce my sensation:

All these considerations are enough to establish that it is not reliable judgement but merely some blind impulse that has made me believe up till now that there exist things distinct from myself which transmit to me ideas or images of themselves through the sense organs or in some other way. (Med. 3, AT 7:39-40)

The two dreaming doubts are parasitic on the same Similarity Thesis, though their sceptical consequences differ. The Now Dreaming Doubt raises the universal possibility of delusion: for any one of my sensory experiences, it is possible (for all I Know) that the experience is delusive. The Always Dreaming Doubt raises the possibility of universal delusion: it is possible (for all I Know) that all my sensory experiences are delusions (say, from a God's-eye perspective). In either case, dreaming related doubts are supposed to help clarify that external sense, per se, is incapable of grounding Knowledge of external things.

3.2 Evil Genius Doubt

Though dreaming doubts do significant demolition work, they are light-duty bulldozers relative to Descartes' most power sceptical doubt. What further judgments are left to be undermined? Immediately following the First Meditation discussion of dreaming, the meditator tentatively concludes that dreaming motivated doubts undermine the results of empirical disciplines—“physics, astronomy, medicine,” and the like. Whereas:

[A]rithmetic, geometry and other subjects of this kind, which deal only with the simplest and most general things, regardless of whether they really exist in nature or not, contain something certain and indubitable. For whether I am awake or asleep, two and three added together are five, and a square has no more than four sides. It seems impossible that such transparent truths should incur any suspicion of being false. (Med. 1, AT 7:20)

In the final analysis, Descartes holds that such transparent truths—along with demonstrable truths, and many judgments of internal sense—are indeed Knowable. To become actually Known, however, they must be unshakably grounded in the face the most powerful doubts. The stage is thus set for the introduction of this most powerful doubt.

The most famous rendering of Descartes' most hyperbolic doubt takes the form of the Evil Genius Doubt. Suppose I am the creation of a powerful but malicious being. This “evil genius” (or deceiving “God, or whatever I may call him,” AT 7:24) has given me flawed cognitive faculties, such that I am in error even about epistemically impressive matters—even the simple matters that seem supremely evident. The suggestion is unbelievable, but not unthinkable. It is intended as a justification-defeating doubt that undermines our judgments about even the most simple and evident matters.

Many readers of Descartes assume that the Evil Genius Doubt draws its sceptical force from the “utmost power” attributed to the deceiver. This is to misunderstand Descartes. He contends that an equally powerful doubt may be generated on the opposite supposition—namely, the supposition that I am not the creature of an all-powerful being:

Perhaps there may be some who would prefer to deny the existence of so powerful a God rather than believe that everything else is uncertain. … yet since deception and error seem to be imperfections, the less powerful they make my original cause, the more likely it is that I am so imperfect as to be deceived all the time. (Med. 1, AT 7:21).

Descartes makes essentially the same point in a parallel passage of the Principles:

[W]e have been told that there is an omnipotent God who created us. Now we do not know whether he may have wished to make us beings of the sort who are always deceived even in those matters which seem to us supremely evident … We may of course suppose that our existence derives not from a supremely powerful God but either from ourselves or from some other source; but in that case, the less powerful we make the author of our coming into being, the more likely it will be that we are so imperfect as to be deceived all the time. (Prin. 1:5, AT 8a:6)

Descartes' official position is that the Evil Genius Doubt is merely one among multiple hypotheses that can motivate the more general hyperbolic doubt. Fundamentally, the doubt is about my cognitive nature—about the possibility that my mind is flawed. Descartes consistently emphasizes this theme throughout the Meditations:

God could have given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

I can convince myself that I have a natural disposition to go wrong from time to time in matters which I think I perceive as evidently as can be. (Med. 5, AT 7:70)

I saw nothing to rule out the possibility that my natural constitution made me prone to error even in matters which seemed to me most true. (Med. 6, AT 7:77)

What underwrites the doubt is not a specific story about how I got my cognitive wiring; it's the realization—regardless the story—that I can worry that my cognitive wiring is flawed. Elsewhere, I have suggested that we name the underlying doubt ‘Meta-Cognitive Doubt’, to make clear that it is fundamentally about the implications of having a flawed cognitive nature, not the implications of an omnipotent creator. Even so, I shall regularly speak in terms of the evil genius (following Descartes' lead), as a kind of mnemonic for the more general doubt about our cognitive nature.

Having introduced the Evil Genius Doubt, the First Meditation program of demolition is not only hyperbolic but universal. As the meditator remarks, I “am finally compelled to admit that there is not one of my former beliefs about which a doubt may not properly be raised” (Med. 1, AT 7:21). As will emerge, the early paragraphs of the Third Meditation clarify a further nuance of the Evil Genius Doubt—a nuance consistently observed thereafter. Descartes clarifies there that the Evil Genius Doubt operates in an indirect manner, a topic to which we return (in Section 5.1).

Further reading: On Descartes' sceptical arguments, see Bouwsma (1949), Curley (1978), Newman (1994), Newman and Nelson (1999), Williams (1986 and 1995). For a contrary reading of the Evil Genius Doubt, see Gewirth (1941) and Wilson (1978). For a more general philosophical treatment of dreaming arguments, see Dunlap (1977).

4. Cogito Ergo Sum

4.1 The First Item of Knowledge

Famously, Descartes puts forward a very simple candidate as the “first item of knowledge.” The candidate is suggested by methodic doubt—by the very effort at thinking all my thoughts might be mistaken. Early in the Second Meditation, Descartes has his meditator observe:

I have convinced myself that there is absolutely nothing in the world, no sky, no earth, no minds, no bodies. Does it now follow that I too do not exist? No: if I convinced myself of something then I certainly existed. But there is a deceiver of supreme power and cunning who is deliberately and constantly deceiving me. In that case I too undoubtedly exist, if he is deceiving me; and let him deceive me as much as he can, he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I think that I am something. So after considering everything very thoroughly, I must finally conclude that this proposition, I am, I exist, is necessarily true whenever it is put forward by me or conceived in my mind. (Med. 2, AT 7:25)

As the canonical formulation has it, I think therefore I am (Latin: cogito ergo sum; French: je pense, donc je suis)—a formulation which does not expressly arise in the Meditations.

Descartes regards the ‘cogito’ (as I shall refer to it) as the “first and most certain of all to occur to anyone who philosophizes in an orderly way” (Prin. 1:7, AT 8a:7). Testing the cogito with methodic doubt is supposed to help me appreciate its certainty. For the existence of my body is subject to doubts that the existence of my thinking resist. Indeed, the very attempt at thinking away my thinking is self-stultifying.

The cogito raises numerous philosophical questions and has generated an enormous literature. In summary fashion, I'll try to clarify a few central points.

First, a first-person formulation is essential to the certainty of the cogito. Third-person claims, such as “Icarus thinks,” or “Descartes thinks,” are not unshakably certain—not for me, at any rate; only the occurrence of my thought has a chance of resisting hyperbolic doubt. There are a number of passages in which Descartes refers to a third-person version of the cogito. But none of these occurs in the context of trying to establish categorically the existence of a particular thinker (as opposed merely to the conditional existence of whatever thinks).

Second, a present tense formulation is essential to the certainty of the cogito. It's no good to reason that “I existed since I recall I was thinking,” because methodic doubt calls into question whether I'm having veridical memories. (Maybe I'm merely dreaming that I was thinking, or maybe an evil genius is feeding me false memories.) Nor does it work to reason that “I shall continue to exist since I am now thinking.” As the meditator remarks, “it could be that were I totally to cease from thinking, I should totally cease to exist” (Med. 2, AT 7:27). The privileged certainty of the cogito is grounded in the “manifest contradiction” (cf. AT 7:36) of thinking away my occurrent thinking.

Third, the certainty of the cogito depends on being formulated in terms of my cogitatio—i.e., my thinking, or awareness/consciousness more generally. Any mode of my thinking is sufficient: doubt, understanding, affirmation, denial, volition, imagination, sensation, or the like (cf. Med. 2, AT 7:28). My non-thinking activities, on the other hand, are insufficient. For instance, it's no good to reason that “I exist since I am walking,” because methodic doubt calls into question the existence of my legs. (Maybe I'm just dreaming that I have legs.) A simple revision, such as “I exist since it seems I'm walking,” restores the anti-sceptical potency (cf. Replies 5, AT 7:352; Prin. 1:9).

A caveat is in order. That Descartes rejects the certainty of formulations presupposing the existence of a body commits him to nothing more than an epistemological distinction between mind and body, but not yet an ontological distinction (as in substance dualism). Indeed, in the passage following the cogito, Descartes has his meditator say:

And yet may it not perhaps be the case that these very things which I am supposing to be nothing [e.g., “that structure of limbs which is called a human body”], because they are unknown to me, are in reality identical with the “I” of which I am aware? I do not know, and for the moment I shall not argue the point, since I can make judgements only about things which are known to me. (Med. 2, AT 7:27)

Fourth, and related to the foregoing quotation, is that Descartes' reference to an “I”, in the “I think”, is not intended to presuppose the existence of a substantial self. Indeed, in the very next sentence following the initial statement of the cogito, the meditator says: “But I do not yet have a sufficient understanding of what this ‘I’ is, that now necessarily exists” (Med. 2, AT 7:25). The cogito purports to yield certainty that I exist insofar as I am a thinking thing, whatever that turns out to be. The ensuing discussion is intended to help arrive at an understanding of the ontological nature of the thinking subject.

More generally, one should keep distinct issues of epistemic and ontological dependence. In the final analysis, Descartes thinks he shows that the occurrence of my thought depends (ontologically) on the existence of a substantial self—to wit, on the existence of an infinite substance, namely God (cf. Med. 3, AT 7:48ff). But Descartes denies that an acceptance of these ontological matters is epistemically prior to the cogito: its privileged certainty is not supposed to depend (epistemically) on abstruse metaphysics.

Granting that the cogito does not presuppose a substantial self, what then is the epistemic basis for injecting the “I” into the “I think”? Many critics have complained that, in referring to the “I”, Descartes begs the question—that he presupposes what is supposedly established in the “I exist.” Among the critics, Bertrand Russell objects that “the word ‘I’ is really illegitimate”; that Descartes should have, instead, stated “his ultimate premiss in the form ‘there are thoughts’.” Russell adds that “the word ‘I’ is grammatically convenient, but does not describe a datum.” (1945, 567) Accordingly, “there is pain” and “I am in pain” have different contents, and Descartes is entitled only to the former.

One effort at reply has it that introspection reveals more than what Russell allows—it reveals the subjective character of experience. On this view, there is more to the phenomenal story of being in pain than is expressed by saying that there is pain: in the former case, there is pain plus a point-of-view—a phenomenal surplus that's difficult to characterize except by adding that “I” am in pain, that the pain is mine. Importantly, my awareness of this subjective feature of experience does not depend on an awareness of the metaphysical nature of a thinking subject. If we take Descartes to be using ‘I’ to signify this subjective character, then he is not smuggling in something that's not already there: the “I”-ness of consciousness turns out to be (contra Russell) a primary datum of experience. And though, as Hume persuasively argues, introspection reveals no sense impressions suited to the role of a thinking subject, Descartes, unlike Hume, feels no pressure to reduce all of our concepts to sense impressions. Descartes' idea of the self does ultimately draw on innate conceptual resources.

Fifth, much of the debate over whether the cogito involves inference, or is instead a simple intuition (roughly, self-evident), is preempted by three observations. One observation concerns the absence of an express ‘ergo’ (‘therefore’) in the Second Meditation account. It seems a mistake to emphasize this absence, as if suggesting that Descartes denies any role for inference. For the Second Meditation passage is the one place (of his various published treatments ) where Descartes explicitly details a line of inferential reflection leading up to the conclusion that I am, I exist. His other treatments merely say the ‘therefore'; the Meditations treatment unpacks it. A second observation is that it seems a mistake to assume that the cogito must either involve inference, or intuition, but not both. There is no inconsistency in the view that the meditator comes to appreciate the persuasive force of the cogito by means of inferential reflection, while also holding that his eventual conviction is not grounded in inference. A third observation is that what one intuits might well include an inference: it is widely held among philosophers today that modus ponens is self-evident, and yet it contains an inference. There is no inconsistency in claiming a self-evident grasp of a proposition with inferential structure—a fact applicable to the cogito. As Descartes writes:

When someone says “I am thinking, therefore I am, or I exist,” he does not deduce existence from thought by means of a syllogism, but recognizes it as something self-evident by a simple intuition of the mind. (Replies 2, AT 7:140)

4.2 But is it Knowledge?

There are interpretive disputes about whether the cogito is supposed to count as indefeasible Knowledge. (That is, about whether it thus counts upon its initial introduction, prior to the arguments for a non-deceiving God.) Many commentators hold that it is supposed to count as indefeasible Knowledge. But the case for this interpretation is by no means clear.

There is no disputing that Descartes characterizes the cogito as the “first item of knowledge [cognitione]” (Med. 3, AT 7:35); as the first “piece of knowledge [cognitio]” (Prin. 1:194, AT 8a:7). Noteworthy, however, is the Latin terminology (‘cognitio’ and its cognates) that Descartes uses in these characterizations. As discussed in Section 1.3, Descartes is a contextualist in the sense that he uses ‘knowledge’ language in two different contexts of clear and distinct judgments: the less rigorous context includes defeasible judgments, as in the case of the atheist geometer (who can't block hyperbolic doubt); the more rigorous context requires indefeasible judgments, as with the brand of Knowledge sought after in the Meditations.

Worthy of attention is that Descartes characterizes the cogito using the same cognitive language that he uses to characterize the atheist's defeasible cognition. Recall that Descartes writes of the atheist's clear and distinct grasp of geometry: “I maintain that this awareness [cognitionem] of his is not true knowledge [scientiam]” (Replies 2, AT 7:141). This alone does not prove that the cogito is supposed to be defeasible. It does, however, prove that calling it the “first item of knowledge” doesn't entail that Descartes intends it as indefeasible Knowledge.

Bearing further on whether the cogito counts as indefeasible Knowledge—available even to the atheist—is the No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis (cf. Section 1.3 above). Descartes makes repeated and unequivocal statements implying this thesis. Consider the following texts, each arising in a context of clarifying the requirements of indefeasible Knowledge (all italics are mine):

For if I do not know this [i.e., whether God is a deceiver], it seems that I can never be completely certain about anything else. (Med. 3, AT 7:36, trans. altered)

I see that the certainty of all other things depends on this [knowledge of God], so that without it nothing can ever be perfectly known [perfecte sciri]. (Med. 5, AT 7:69)

[I]f I did not possess knowledge of God … I should thus never have true and certain knowledge [scientiam] about anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions. (Med. 5, AT 7:69)

And upon claiming finally to have achieved indefeasible Knowledge:

Thus I see plainly that the certainty and truth of all knowledge [scientiae] depends uniquely on my awareness of the true God, to such an extent that I was incapable of perfect knowledge [perfecte scire] about anything else until I became aware of him. (Med. 5, AT 7:71)

These texts make a powerful case that nothing can be indefeasibly Known prior to establishing that we're creatures of an all-perfect God, not an evil genius. These texts make no exceptions. Descartes looks to hold that hyperbolic doubt is utterly unbounded—that it undermines all manner of judgments.

Other texts can be cited in support of the interpretation of the cogito as indefeasible Knowledge. For example, we have seen texts making clear that it resists hyperbolic doubt. Often overlooked, however, is that it is only subsequent to the introduction of the cogito that Descartes has his meditator first notice the manner in which clear and distinct perception is both resistant and vulnerable to hyperbolic doubt: the extraordinary certainty of such perception resists hyperbolic doubt while it is occurring; it is vulnerable to hyperbolic doubt upon redirecting one's perceptual attention. This theme is developed more fully in the next Section below.

As will emerge, there are two main kinds of interpretive camps concerning how to deal with the Cartesian Circle. The one camp contends that hyperbolic doubt is utterly unbounded. On this view, the No Atheist Knowledge Thesis is taken quite literally. The other camp contends that hyperbolic doubt is bounded; that is, that the cogito, and a few other special truths, are in a lock box of sorts, utterly protected from even the most hyperbolic doubt. This view allows that atheists can have indefeasible Knowledge. These two kinds of interpretations are developed in Section 6.

Further reading: For important passages in Descartes' handling of the cogito, see the second and third sets of Objections and Replies. In the secondary literature, see Beyssade (1993), Hintikka (1962), and Markie (1992). For especially innovative interpretations, see Broughton (2002) and Vinci (1998).

5. Epistemic Privilege and Defeasibility

The extraordinary certainty and doubt-resistance of the cogito marks an Archimedean turning point in the meditator's inquiry. Descartes builds on its impressiveness to help clarify further epistemic theses. The present Section considers two such theses about our epistemically privileged perceptions. First, that clarity and distinctness are, jointly, the mark of our epistemically best perceptions (notwithstanding that such perception remains defeasible). Second, that judgments about one's own mind are epistemically privileged compared with those about bodies.

5.1 Our Epistemic Best: Clear and Distinct Perception and its Defeasibility

The opening four paragraphs of the Third Meditation are pivotal. Descartes uses them to codify the phenomenal marks of our epistemically best perceptions, while clarifying also that even this impressive epistemic ground falls short of the goal of indefeasible Knowledge. This sobering realization is what leads to Descartes' infamous efforts to refute the Evil Genius Doubt, by proving a non-deceiving God.

The first and second paragraphs portray the meditator attempting to build on the success of the cogito by identifying a general principle of certainty: “I am certain that I am a thinking thing. Do I not therefore also know what is required for my being certain about anything?” (AT 7:35). What are the phenomenal marks of this impressive perception—what is it like to have perception that good? Descartes' descriptive answer: “In this first item of knowledge there is simply a clear and distinct perception of what I am asserting” (ibid.).

The third and fourth paragraphs help clarify (among other things) what Descartes takes to be epistemically impressive about clear and distinct perception, though absent from external sense perception. The third paragraph has the meditator observing:

Yet I previously accepted as wholly certain and evident many things which I afterwards realized were doubtful. What were these? The earth, sky, stars, and everything else that I apprehended with the senses. But what was it about them that I perceived clearly? Just that the ideas, or thoughts, of such things appeared before my mind. Yet even now I am not denying that these ideas occur within me. But there was something else which I used to assert, and which through habitual belief I thought I perceived clearly, although I did not in fact do so. This was that there were things outside me which were the sources of my ideas and which resembled them in all respects. Here was my mistake; or at any rate, if my judgement was true, it was not thanks to the strength of my perception. (Med. 3, AT 7:35)

The very next paragraph (the fourth) draws the contrast, emphasizing the impressive certainty of clear and distinct perception. As earlier noted (Section 1.1), the certainty of interest to Descartes is psychological in character, though not merely psychological. Not only does occurrent clear and distinct perception resist doubt, it provides a kind of cognitive illumination. Both of these epistemic virtues—its doubt-resistance, and its luminance—are noted in the fourth paragraph:

[Regarding] those matters which I think I see utterly clearly with my mind's eye … when I turn to the things themselves which I think I perceive very clearly, I am so convinced by them that I spontaneously declare: let whoever can do so deceive me, he will never bring it about that I am nothing, so long as I continue to think I am something; or make it true at some future time that I have never existed, since it is now true that I exist; or bring it about that two and three added together are more or less than five, or anything of this kind in which I see a manifest contradiction. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

The contrast drawn in the third and fourth paragraphs gets at a theme that Descartes thinks crucial to his broader project: namely, that there is “a big difference”—an introspectible difference—between external sense perception, and perception that is genuinely clear and distinct. The external senses result in, at best, “a spontaneous impulse” to believe something, an impulse we're able to resist. In contrast, occurrent clear and distinct perception is utterly irresistible: “Whatever is revealed to me by the natural light—for example that from the fact that I am doubting it follows that I exist, and so on—cannot in any way be open to doubt.” (Med. 3, AT 7:38) As Descartes repeatedly conveys: “my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true” (Med. 5, AT 7:69; cf. 3:64, 7:36, 7:65, 8a:9).

Because of the epistemic impressiveness of clarity and distinctness (notably, as exhibited in the cogito), the meditator concludes that it will issue as the mark of truth, if anything will. He tentatively formulates the following candidate for a truth criterion: “I now seem [videor] to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive very clearly and distinctly is true” (Med. 3, AT 7:35). I shall call this general principle the ‘C&D Rule’. The announcement of the candidate criterion is carefully tinged with caution (videor), as the C&D Rule has yet to be subjected to hyperbolic doubt. Should it turn out that clarity and distinctness—as ground—is shakable, then, there would remain some doubt about the general veracity of clear and distinct perception: in that case, the mere fact that a matter was clearly and distinctly perceived “would not be enough to make me certain of the truth of the matter” (ibid.). This cautionary note anticipates the sobering realization of the fourth paragraph, that, for all its impressiveness, even clear and distinct perception is in some sense defeasible.

In what sense defeasible? Recall that the Evil Genius Doubt is, fundamentally, a doubt about our cognitive natures. Maybe my mind was made flawed, such that I go wrong even when my perception is clear and distinct. As the meditator conveys in the fourth paragraph, my creator might have “given me a nature such that I was deceived even in matters which seemed most evident,” with the consequence that “I go wrong even in those matters which I think I see utterly clearly with my mind's eye” (AT 7:36). The result is a kind of epistemic schizophrenia:

Moments of epistemic optimism: While I am directly attending to a proposition—perceiving it clearly and distinctly—I enjoy an irresistible cognitive luminance and my assent is compelled.

Moments of epistemic pessimism: When I am no longer directly attending—no longer perceiving it clearly and distinctly—I can entertain the sceptical hypothesis that the irresistible cognitive luminance is epistemically worthless, being simply a trick played on me by an evil genius.

The doubt is thus indirect, in the sense that these moments of epistemic pessimism arise when I am no longer directly attending to the propositions in question. This indirect operation of hyperbolic doubt is conveyed not only in the fourth paragraph, but in numerous other texts, including the following:

Admittedly my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true. But my nature is also such that I cannot fix my mental vision continually on the same thing, so as to keep perceiving it clearly; and often the memory of a previously made judgement may come back, when I am no longer attending to the arguments which led me to make it. And so other arguments can now occur to me which might easily undermine my opinion, if I were unaware of God; and I should thus never have true and certain knowledge about anything, but only shifting and changeable opinions. For example, when I consider the nature of a triangle, it appears most evident to me, steeped as I am in the principles of geometry, that its three angles are equal to two right angles; and so long as I attend to the proof, I cannot but believe this to be true. But as soon as I turn my mind's eye away from the proof, then in spite of still remembering that I perceived it very clearly, I can easily fall into doubt about its truth, if I am unaware of God.For I can convince myself that I have a natural disposition to go wrong from time to time in matters which I think I perceive as evidently as can be. (Med.5, AT 7:69-70; cf. AT 3:64-65; AT 8a:9-10).

Granted, this indirect doubt is exceedingly hyperbolic. Even so, it means that we lack fully indefeasible Knowledge. Descartes thus closes the fourth paragraph as follows:

And since I have no cause to think that there is a deceiving God, and I do not yet even know for sure whether there is a God at all, any reason for doubt which depends simply on this supposition is a very slight and, so to speak, metaphysical one. But in order to remove even this slight reason for doubt, as soon as the opportunity arises I must examine whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver. For if I do not know this, it seems that I can never be quite certain about anything else. (Med. 3, AT 7:36)

(Note: The leading role played by the cogito in this four paragraph passage is easily overlooked. Not only is it the exemplar of judging clearly and distinctly (paragraph two), it is listed among the propositions (paragraph four) that are compellingly certain while attended to, though undermined when we no longer thus attend.)

What next? How are we to make epistemic progress if even our epistemic best is subject to hyperbolic doubt? This juncture of the Third Meditation (the end of the fourth paragraph) marks the beginning point of Descartes' notorious efforts to refute the Evil Genius Doubt. The efforts involve an attempt to establish that we are the creatures not of an evil genius, but an all-perfect creator who would not allow us to be deceived about what we clearly and distinctly perceive. Before turning our attention (in Section 6), to these efforts let's digress somewhat to consider a Cartesian doctrine that has received much attention in its subsequent history.

5.2 The Epistemic Privilege of Judgments About the Mind

Descartes holds that judgments about one's own mind are epistemically better off than judgments about bodies. In our natural, pre-reflective condition, however, we're apt to confuse the sensory images of bodies with the external things themselves, a confusion leading us to think our judgments about bodies are epistemically impressive.The confusion is clearly expressed (Descartes would say) in G. E. Moore's famous claim to knowledge—“Here is a hand”—along with his more general defense of common sense:

I begin, then, with my list of truisms, every one of which (in my own opinion) I know, with certainty, to be true. … There exists at present a living human body, which is my body. This body was born at a certain time in the past, and has existed continuously ever since … But the earth had existed also for many years before my body was born … (1962, 32-33)

In contrast, Descartes writes:

[I]f I judge that the earth exists from the fact that I touch it or see it, this very fact undoubtedly gives even greater support for the judgement that my mind exists. For it may perhaps be the case that I judge that I am touching the earth even though the earth does not exist at all; but it cannot be that, when I make this judgement, my mind which is making the judgement does not exist. (Prin. 1:11, AT 8a:8-9)

Methodical doubt is intended to help us appreciate the folly of the commonsensical position—helping us to recognize that the perception of our own minds is “not simply prior to and more certain … but also more evident” than that of our own bodies (Prin. 1:11, AT 8a:8). “Disagreement on this point,” writes Descartes, comes from “those who have not done their philosophizing in an orderly way”; from those who, while properly acknowledging the “certainty of their own existence,” mistakenly “take ‘themselves’ to mean only their bodies”—failing to “realize that they should have taken ‘themselves’ in this context to mean their minds alone” (Prin. 1:12, AT 8a:9).

In epistemological treatments Descartes underwrites the mind-better-known-than-body doctrine with methodic doubt. Other reasons motivate him as well. The doctrine is closely allied with his commitment to a representational theory of sense perception. On his view of sense perception, our sense organs and nerves serve as literal mediating links in the perceptual chain: they stand between (both spatially and causally) external things themselves, and the brain events that occasion our perceptual awareness (cf. Prin. 4:196). In veridical sensation, the immediate objects of sensory awareness are not states of our sense organs and nerves—much less are they external things themselves. Rather, the immediate objects of awareness—whether in veridical sensation, or dreams—are the mind's ideas. Descartes thinks that the fact of physiological mediation helps explain delusional ideas:

[I]t is the soul which sees, and not the eye; and it does not see directly, but only by means of the brain. That is why madmen and those who are asleep often see, or think they see, various objects which are nevertheless not before their eyes: namely, certain vapours disturb their brain and arrange those of its parts normally engaged in vision exactly as they would be if these objects were present. (Optics, AT 6:141; cf. Med. 6., AT 7:85ff; Passions 26)

Various passages of the Meditations lay important groundwork for this theory of perception. For instance, one of the messages of the wax passage is that sensory awareness does not reach to external things themselves:

We say that we see the wax itself, if it is there before us, not that we judge it to be there from its colour or shape; and this might lead me to conclude without more ado that knowledge of the wax comes from what the eye sees, and not from the scrutiny of the mind alone. But then if I look out of the window and see men crossing the square, as I just happen to have done, I normally say that I see the men themselves, just as I say that I see the wax.Yet do I see any more than hats and coats which could conceal automatons? I judge that they are men. (Med. 2, AT 7:32)

Descartes thinks we're apt to be “tricked by ordinary ways of talking” (ibid.). In colloquial contexts we don't say it seems there are men outside the window; we say we see them. But that this is our ordinary way of talking does not help clarify the metaphysical nature of perception. These ordinary ways of talking do suggest something about our ordinary ways of judging, namely that judgments about external things are not the result of complex, conscious inference, as if: “Well, I appear to be awake, and the window pane looks clean, and there's plenty of light outside, and so on, and I thus conclude that I am seeing men outside the window.” But again, from facts about our ordinary ways of judgment formation it does not follow that we directly perceive external things themselves. (To suppose otherwise is to conflate epistemic directness and perceptual directness.) When all is considered carefully, Descartes thinks we should conclude that our perception does not, strictly speaking, extend beyond the mind's own ideas. This is an important basis of the mind-better-known-than-body doctrine. In the concluding paragraph of the Second Meditation, Descartes writes:

I see that without any effort I have now finally got back to where I wanted. I now know that even bodies are not strictly perceived by the senses or the faculty of imagination but by the intellect alone, and that this perception derives not from their being touched or seen but from their being understood; and in view of this I know plainly that I can achieve an easier and more evident perception of my own mind than of anything else. (Med. 2, AT 7:34)

It is generally overlooked that the mind-better-known-than-body doctrine is intended as a comparative rather than a superlative thesis. For Descartes, the only superlative perceptual state is that of clarity and distinctness: only it is correctly characterized as our epistemic best. While holding that introspective judgments are privileged, Descartes regards them as nonetheless subject to error. Even introspective perception—e.g., our awareness of occurrent pains and other sensations—must be rendered clear and distinct to be counted among our epistemic best. Such matters are clearly and distinctly perceivable, writes Descartes,

…provided we take great care in our judgements concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception—no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Prin. 1:66, AT 8a:32; cf. Prin. 1:68)

Elsewhere, Descartes writes that we do “frequently make mistakes, even in our judgements concerning pain” (Prin. 1:67). These mistakes arise because “people commonly confuse this perception [of pain] with an obscure judgement they make concerning the nature of something which they think exists in the painful spot and which they suppose to resemble the sensation of pain” (Prin.1:46, AT 8a:22). For Descartes, the key to infallibility is not simply that the mind's attention is on its ideas, but that it renders its ideas clear and distinct.

But how could I be mistaken in judging, say, that I seem to see a speckled hen with two speckles? Some philosophers hold that such judgments are infallible. Descartes holds, to the contrary, that we can be mistaken—quite simply, by thinking confusedly. To help appreciate his view, notice that our question is the same, in kind, as asking whether I might be mistaken in judging that I seem to see a speckled hen with two hundred forty seven speckles. Of course I might be confused in that case. (Indeed, it is plausible to hold that only in confusion could my thought seem like that.) Yet there is no relevant difference that would explain why the one judgment is infallible (not merely correct), while the other is fallible. For Descartes, both are fallible; the relevant consideration distinguishing their susceptibility to error is that the two-speckled case is so much easier to render clear and distinct. But though simpler ideas are generally easier to make clear and distinct, simplicity is not a requirement: “A concept is not any more distinct because we include less in it; its distinctness simply depends on our carefully distinguishing what we do include in it from everything else” (Prin. 1:63, AT 8a:31; cf. Prin. 1:45).

Though Descartes is quite clear as to the fallibility of introspective judgments, people widely attribute to him a variety of related doctrines that he rejects. Compare the doctrines of the infallibility of the mental—roughly, the doctrine that sincere introspective judgments are always true; the indubitability of the mental—roughly, that sincere introspective judgments are indefeasible; and omniscience with respect to the mental—roughly, that one has Knowledge of every true proposition about one's own present contents of consciousness. (There is some variation in the way these doctrines are formulated in the literature.) Consider two key texts often cited by those who attribute such doctrines to Descartes:

I certainly seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed. This cannot be false; what is called “having a sensory perception” is strictly just this, and in this restricted sense of the term it is simply thinking. (Med. 2, AT 7:29)

Now as far as ideas are concerned, provided they are considered solely in themselves and I do not refer them to anything else, they cannot strictly speaking be false; for whether it is a goat or a chimera that I am imagining, it is just as true that I imagine the former as the latter. As for the will and the emotions, here too one need not worry about falsity; for even if the things which I may desire are wicked or even non-existent, that does not make it any less true that I desire them. Thus the only remaining thoughts where I must be on my guard against making a mistake are judgements. (Med. 3, AT 7:37)

On close inspection, these texts make no claim about the possibility of introspective judgment error, because these texts are not about formed judgments. In these passages Descartes is isolating the components of judgment. His two-faculty theory of judgment requires an interaction between the perceptions of the intellect and the will's assent (a theory elaborated in the Fourth Meditation). A sine qua non of judgment error is that there be an act of judgment, but acts of judgment require both a perceptual act and a volitional act. Descartes' claim that mere seemings “cannot strictly speaking be false” is therefore innocuous: for in isolating the mere seeming, he isolates the perceptual from the volitional. My merely seeming to see a speckled hen with two speckles could not, per se, involve judgment error, because it does not involve judgment.

Further reading: On discussions of truth criteria in the 16th and 17th centuries, see Popkin (1979). On Descartes' doctrine of ideas, see Chappell (1986), Hoffman (1996), Jolley (1990), and Nelson (1997). On the defeasibility of clear and distinct perception (including the cogito), see Newman and Nelson (1999). On contemporary treatments of infallibility, indubitability, and omniscience, see Alston (1989) and Audi (1993).

6. Cartesian Circle

In Section 5.1, we left off with the fourth paragraph of the Third Meditation. That passage makes clear that the Evil Genius Doubt undermines even clear and distinct perception. In his Principles treatment, Descartes summarizes the broader problem:

The mind, then, knowing itself, but still in doubt about all other things, looks around in all directions in order to extend its knowledge [cognitionem] further. … Next, it finds certain common notions from which it constructs various proofs; and, for as long as it attends to them, it is completely convinced of their truth. … But it cannot attend to them all the time; and subsequently, when it happens that it remembers a conclusion without attending to the sequence which enables it to be demonstrated, recalling that it is still ignorant as to whether it may have been created with the kind of nature that makes it go wrong even in matters which appear most evident, the mind sees that it has just cause to doubt such conclusions, and that the possession of certain knowledge [scientiam] will not be possible until it has come to know the author of its being. (Prin. 1.13, AT 8a:9-10)

How can we overcome this lingering hyperbolic doubt? At the close of the fourth paragraph of the Third Meditation, Descartes lays out an ambitious plan: “in order to remove even this slight reason for doubt, as soon as the opportunity arises I must examine whether there is a God, and, if there is, whether he can be a deceiver” (Med. 3, AT 7:36).

The broader argument that unfolds has seemed to many readers to be viciously circular—the so-called Cartesian Circle. Descartes first argues from clearly and distinctly perceived premises to the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists; he then argues from the premise that a non-deceiving God exists to the conclusion that what is clearly and distinctly perceived is true. The worry is that he presupposes the C&D Rule in the effort to prove the C&D Rule. In what follows, I first clarify the key steps in the broader argument for the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule. I then turn to the Cartesian Circle.

6.1 Establishing the Divine Guarantee of the C&D Rule

Descartes' broader argument unfolds in two main steps. The first step is to argue for the conclusion that an all-perfect God exists—a case he makes in the Third Meditation. (The Fifth Meditation advances a further such argument.) Though there is much of interest to say about his case for an all-perfect God, it will not be considered here, in the interests of space, and of focusing on epistemological issues.

The second main step is to argue from the premise (now established) that an all-perfect God exists, to the general veracity of the C&D Rule—the conclusion that whatever is clearly and distinctly perceived is true. As Descartes tells us: “In the Fourth Meditation it is proved that everything that we clearly and distinctly perceive is true” (Synopsis, AT 7:15). It is this second main step of the broader argument that I want to develop here.

It is tempting to suppose that the second main step is unneeded. For is not the C&D Rule a straightforward consequence of there being an all-perfect God? This is too fast. It is by no means obvious why only the C&D Rule would be a straightforward consequence, but not also a more general infallibility of all our judgments. Essentially this point is made in the First Meditation, immediately upon introducing the sceptical hypothesis that a supremely powerful but deceitful creator “made me the kind of creature that I am”: the meditator notices that this sceptical hypothesis is at odds with the standard view of the creator, as being not only supremely powerful but “supremely good,” adding:

But if it were inconsistent with his goodness to have created me such that I am deceived all the time, it would seem equally foreign to his goodness to allow me to be deceived even occasionally; yet this last assertion cannot be made. (Med. 1, AT 7:21)

In short, the most obvious upshot of an all-perfect creator would seem to be the following perfectly general rule for truth: If I form a judgment, then it is true. But quite clearly, this rule for truth doesn't hold. The implied reasoning makes this a special case of the tradition problem of evil—applied here to judgment error:

  1. There is judgment error.
  2. Judgment error is incompatible with the hypothesis that I am the creature of a non-deceiving God.
  3. Therefore, I am not the creature of a non-deceiving God.

This First Meditation passage helps set the stage for the further inquiry that will ensue. It anticipates Descartes' Fourth Meditation plans to offer a theodicy for error. Indeed, the Fourth Meditation opens by revisiting the problem, but this time having just proven that an all-perfect God exists—a scenario generating cognitive dissonance:

To begin with, I recognize that it is impossible that God should ever deceive me. … I know by experience that there is in me a faculty of judgement which, like everything else which is in me, I certainly received from God. And since God does not wish to deceive me, he surely did not give me the kind of faculty which would ever enable me to go wrong while using it correctly.

There would be no further doubt on this issue were it not that what I have just said appears to imply that I am incapable of ever going wrong. For if everything that is in me comes from God, and he did not endow me with a faculty for making mistakes, it appears that I can never go wrong. (Med. 4, AT 7:53-54)

In an effort to resolve the cognitive dissonance, the meditator begins an investigation into the causes of error—an inquiry that eventually results in a theodicy. It is in the course of developing the theodicy that Descartes makes his case for the infallibility of the C&D Rule—in effect, arguing that God is compatible with some error, but not with error flowing from clear and distinct judgments.

In the course of the discussion Descartes puts forward his theory of judgment, whereby judgment arises from the cooperation of the intellect and the will. The investigation concludes that the cause of error is an improper use of the will: error arises when the will gives assent to propositions of which the intellect lacks clear and distinct understanding. It is therefore within our power to avoid error:

[If] I simply refrain from making a judgement in cases where I do not perceive the truth with sufficient clarity and distinctness, then it is clear that I am behaving correctly and avoiding error. But if in such cases I either affirm or deny, then I am not using my free will correctly. (Med. 4, AT 7:59-60)

The theodicy that emerges is a version of the freewill defense. Accordingly, we should thank God for giving us freewill, but the cost of having freewill is the possibility of misusing it. Since judgment error results only when we misuse our freewill, we should not blame God for these errors.

Not only is the theodicy used to explain the kinds of error God can allow, it is used to clarify the kinds of error God cannot allow. From the latter arises a proof of the C&D Rule. God can allow errors that are my fault, though not errors that would be God's fault. When my perception is clear and distinct, giving assent is not a voluntary option—thus not explainable by the freewill defense. In such cases, assent is a necessary consequence of my cognitive nature: “our mind is of such a nature that it cannot help assenting to what it clearly understands” (AT 3:64); “the nature of my mind is such that I cannot but assent to these things, at least so long as I clearly perceive them” (AT 7:65). Since, on occasions of clarity and distinctness, my assent arises from the cognitive nature that God gave me, God would be blamable if those judgments resulted in error. Therefore, they are not in error; indeed they could not be. That an evil genius might have given me my cognitive nature casts suspicion on these judgments. That an all-perfect God gave me my nature guarantees that these judgments are true. A clever strategy of argument thus unfolds—effectively inverting the usual reasoning in the problem of evil:

  1. There is a non-deceiving God.
  2. A non-deceiving God is incompatible with the hypothesis that I am in error about what I clearly and distinctly perceive.
  3. Therefore, I am not in error about what I clearly and distinctly perceive.

The first premise was argued in the Third Meditation. The second premise arises out of the discussion of the Fourth Meditation. The result is a divine guarantee of the C&D Rule.

By the end of the Fourth Meditation, important pieces of Descartes' broader argument are in place. Whether further important pieces arise in the Fifth Meditation is a matter of interpretive dispute. (Elsewhere, I argue that significant contributions are made.) In any case, the Fifth Meditation comes to a close with Descartes asserting that indefeasible Knowledge has finally been achieved:

I have perceived that God exists, and at the same time I have understood that everything else depends on him, and that he is no deceiver; and I have drawn the conclusion that everything which I clearly and distinctly perceive is of necessity true. … what objections can now be raised? That the way I am made makes me prone to frequent error? But I now know that I am incapable of error in those cases where my understanding is transparently clear. … And now it is possible for me to achieve full and certain knowledge of countless matters, both concerning God himself and other things whose nature is intellectual, and also concerning the whole of that corporeal nature which is the subject-matter of pure mathematics. (Med. 5, AT 7:70-71)

6.2 Circularity and the Broader Argument

Students of philosophy can expect to be taught a longstanding interpretation according to which Descartes' broader argument is viciously circular. Despite its prima facie plausibility, commentators generally resist that interpretation.

Consider first what every plausible interpretation must concede: that the two main steps of the broader argument unfold in a manner suggestive of a circle—I'll indeed refer to them as ‘arcs’. The Third Meditation arguments for God define one arc:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived.

The Fourth Meditation argument defines a second arc:

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

That the broader argument unfolds in accord with these two steps is uncontroversial. The question of interest concerns whether, strictly speaking, these arcs form a circle. The statement of Arc 1 admits of considerable ambiguity. How one resolves this ambiguity determines whether vicious circularity is the result. Let's begin by clarifying what Arc 1 would have to mean to generate vicious circularity, and then consider the two mains kinds of ways that commentators prefer instead to construe the first arc.

Vicious Circularity interpretation:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived—premises accepted because of the general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Thus rendered, Descartes' broader argument is viciously circular. The italicized segment of Arc 1 marks a revision to the original statement of it. Some such revision is needed for the vicious circularity interpretation. Thus interpreted, Descartes does at the outset of the Third Meditation proofs of God presuppose the general veracity of clear and distinct perception. That is, he starts by presupposing the C&D Rule; he then tries to demonstrate the C&D Rule. Evidently, this way of reading Descartes' argument has pedagogical appeal, for it is ubiquitously taught (outside of Descartes scholarship) despite the absence of any textual merit. If there is one thing on which there is general agreement in the secondary literature, it is that the texts do not sustain this interpretation.

How then should Arc 1 be understood? There are countless interpretations that avoid vicious circularity, along with numerous schemes for cataloguing them. For present purposes, I'll catalogue the various accounts according to two main kinds of non-circular strategies that commentators attribute to Descartes. (The secondary literature offers multiple variations of each these two main kinds of interpretations, though I won't here explore these variations.)

Unbounded Doubt interpretations:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived—premises that are accepted, despite being defeasible, because our cognitive nature compels us to assent to clearly and distinctly perceived propositions.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Again, the italicized segment marks a revision to the original statement of Arc 1. I call this an ‘Unbounded Doubt’ interpretation, because this kind of interpretation is, in part, a consequence of construing hyperbolic doubt as unbounded. The Evil Genius Doubt is unbounded in the sense that it undermines all manner of judgments—even the cogito, even the premises of the Third Meditation proofs of God. It is the unboundedness of hyperbolic doubt that underwrites the No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis. But if doubt is unbounded, then there is no circularity. For Arc 1 does not presuppose the general veracity of the C&D Rule.

A question immediately arises for such Unbounded Doubt interpretations. Given that hyperbolic doubt is unbounded, why then are the arguments of God accepted? Why does the meditator assent to them, given lingering hyperbolic doubts? The answer arises from our earlier discussion of the schizophrenic manner in which hyperbolic doubt operates (Section 5.1). Lingering hyperbolic doubt can only take hold when we are no longer attending clearly and distinctly to the propositions in question. While we thus attend, the propositions are assent-compelling: “my nature is such that so long as I perceive something very clearly and distinctly I cannot but believe it to be true” (Med. 5, AT 7:69; cf. 3:64, 7:36, 7:65, 8a:9).

The other main kind of interpretation avoids circularity in a different kind of way. Let's consider that alternative.

Bounded Doubt interpretations:

Arc 1: The conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists is derived from premises that are clearly and distinctly perceived—premises that are, however, taken from a special class of protected truths, in that the general veracity of clear and distinct perception remains in doubt.

Arc 2: The general veracity of propositions that are clearly and distinctly perceived is derived from the conclusion that a non-deceiving God exists.

Once again, the italicized segment marks a revision to the original statement of Arc 1. I call this an ‘Bounded Doubt’ interpretation, because this kind of interpretation is, in part, a consequence of construing hyperbolic doubt as bounded. The Evil Genius Doubt is bounded in the sense that its sceptical potency does not extend to all judgments: a special class of propositions is outside the bounds of doubt. Exemplary of this special class of propositions are the cogito and, importantly, the premises of the Third Meditation proofs of God. Propositions in this special class can be indefeasibly Known even by atheists.

Not all clearly and distinctly perceivable propositions are in the special class. In order to extend indefeasible Knowledge to all such propositions, it is necessary to establish the general veracity of the C&D Rule. Thus, the need for Arc 2 in the broader project, and thus the lack of circularity.

Though both Bounded Doubt and Unbounded Doubt interpretations avoid vicious circularity, each must confront a host of further difficulties, both textual and philosophical. Avoiding the charge of vicious circularity marks the beginning of the interpreter's work, not the end. Charity minded interpreters must confront hard questions arising from their positions concerning the bounds of doubt. The Unbounded Doubt interpreter must explain why, in the final analysis, Descartes thinks the Evil Genius Doubt eventually loses it undermining potency. The Bounded Doubt interpreter must explain why, in the first place, Descartes thinks the Evil Genius Doubt's potency does not extend to propositions in the special class. Space does not permit us to develop these further difficulties here.

The present essay surely paints a more sympathetic picture of the Unbounded Doubt strategy, for that strategy accords well with the more global interpretive account that I have been portraying. Putting to the side my interpretive preferences, it must be said that both kinds of interpretations are developed very subtly and persuasively in the secondary literature.

Further reading: For Descartes' response to the charges of circularity: see the Fourth Replies. For texts concerning his final solution to hyperbolic doubt: see Fifth Meditation; Second Replies; letter to Regius (24 May 1640). For a treatment of the Fourth Meditation proof of the C&D Rule, see Newman (1999). For examples of Unbounded Doubt interpretations, see Curley (1978 and 1993), DeRose (1992), Loeb (1992), Newman and Nelson (1999), Sosa (1997a and 1997b), and Van Cleve (1979). For examples of Bounded Doubt interpretations, see Broughton (2002), Doney (1955), Della Rocca (2005), Kenny (1968), Morris (1973), Rickless (forthcoming), and Wilson (1978). For an anthology devoted largely to the Cartesian Circle, see Doney (1987).

7. Proving the Existence of the External Material World

The opening line of the Sixth Meditation makes clear Descartes' principal objective, in this final chapter of his work: “It remains for me to examine whether material things exist” (AT 7:71). Establishing their existence is not a straightforward matter of perceiving them, because “bodies are not strictly perceived by the senses” (see Section 5.2 above). Descartes' strategy has two main parts: first, he argues for the externality of the causes of sensation; second, he argues for the materiality of these external causes. From these two steps it follows that there exists an external material world. Let's consider each phase of the argument.

7.1 The Case for the Externality of the Causes of Sensation

Descartes builds on a familiar argument in the history of philosophy, an appeal to the involuntariness of sensory ideas. The familiar argument is articulated back in the Third Meditation. Speaking of his apparently adventitious ideas (putative sensations), the meditator remarks:

I know by experience that these ideas do not depend on my will, and hence that they do not depend simply on me. Frequently I notice them even when I do not want to: now, for example, I feel the heat whether I want to or not, and this is why I think that this sensation or idea of heat comes to me from something other than myself, namely the heat of the fire by which I am sitting. (Med. 3, AT 7:38)

At this Third Meditation juncture, the meditator remains in doubt about the existence of anything but himself—that is, himself insofar as he is a thinking thing, a mind. The familiar, involuntariness argument amounts to this:

  1. Sensations come to me involuntarily (I'm unaware of causing them with my will).
  2. Therefore, sensations are caused by something external to me.
  3. Therefore, there exists something external to my mind—an external world.

Though some such involuntariness argument has convinced many philosophers, the inference from 1 to 2 does not hold up to methodic doubt, as the meditator explains:

Then again, although these [apparently adventitious] ideas do not depend on my will, it does not follow that they must come from things located outside me. Just as the impulses which I was speaking of a moment ago seem opposed to my will even though they are within me, so there may be some other faculty not yet fully known to me, which produces these ideas without any assistance from external things; this is, after all, just how I have always thought ideas are produced in me when I am dreaming. (Med. 3, AT 7:39)

Methodic doubt raises the problem of the existence of the external world. For all I Know, my “waking” experiences are produced by processes similar to those producing my dreams. I cannot with certainty rule out the hypothesis that my sensations are produced by a subconscious faculty of my mind, rather than by external objects. For all I Know, there might not be an external world. My inability to rule out this sceptical hypothesis explains why the familiar involuntariness argument fails. For the inference from 1 to 2 presupposes exactly what is at issue—that involuntarily ideas are not caused by a subconscious faculty of my mind.

Many philosophers have assumed that we lack the epistemic resources to solve this sceptical problem. For example, Hume writes:

By what argument can it be proved, that the perceptions of the mind must be caused by external objects … and could not arise either from the energy of the mind itself … or from some other cause still more unknown to us? It is acknowledged, that, in fact, many of these perceptions arise not from anything external, as in dreams, madness, and other diseases. … It is a question of fact, whether the perceptions of the senses be produced by external objects … But here experience is, and must be entirely silent. (Enquiry Sec. 12)

Interestingly, Descartes would agree that experiential resources cannot solve the problem. By the Sixth Meditation, however, Descartes purports to have the innate resources he needs to solve it—namely, the innate ideas of mind and body. Among the metaphysical theses he develops is that mind and body have wholly distinct essences: the essence of thinking substance is pure thought; the essence of body is pure extension. In a remarkable maneuver, Descartes invokes this distinction to refute the sceptical worry that sensations are produced by a subconscious faculty of the mind: “nothing can be in me, that is to say, in my mind, of which I am not aware,” and this “follows from the fact that the soul is distinct from the body and that its essence is to think” (1640 letter, AT 3:273). This result allows Descartes to supplement the involuntariness argument, thereby strengthening the inference from line 1 to line 2. For from the additional premise that nothing can be in my mind of which I am unaware, it follows that if sensation were being produced by activity in my mind, then I'd be aware of that activity on the occasion of its operation. Since I'm not thus aware, it follows that my sensations are produced by causes external to my mind. The cause, remarks the meditator,

cannot be in me, since clearly it presupposes no intellectual act [viz., no volition] on my part, and the ideas in question are produced without my cooperation and often even against my will. So the only alternative is that it is in another substance distinct from me … (Med. 6, AT 7:79)

If follows that there exists an external world that causes my sensation. It remains to be shown that the external causes are material objects.

7.2. The Case for the Materiality of the Causes of Sensation

On Descartes' analysis, the possible options for the external cause of sensation are three:

  1. God
  2. material/corporeal substance
  3. some other created substance

That is, the cause is either an infinite substance (God), or finite substance; and if finite, then either corporeal, or something else. Descartes eliminates options (a) and (c) by appeal to God being no deceiver:

But since God is not a deceiver, it is quite clear that he does not transmit the ideas to me either directly from himself, or indirectly, via some creature … For God has given me no faculty at all for recognizing any such source for these ideas; on the contrary, he has given me a great propensity to believe that they are produced by corporeal things. It follows that corporeal things exist. (Med. 6, AT 7:79-80, italics added)

This is a highly problematic passage. The “great propensity” here referred to is not the irresistible compulsion of clear and distinct perception, and yet Descartes is nonetheless invoking a divine guarantee. The moves Descartes is here making raise difficult interpretive questions. According to the early position of the Meditations, we're to withhold judgment except when our perception is clear and distinct. Yet here, Descartes appears to think we're licensed to form a judgment in a case where our perception is not clear and distinct. Why does Descartes think this inference is licensed?

On one kind of interpretation, Descartes relaxes his epistemic standards in the Sixth Meditation. He no longer insists on indefeasible Knowledge, now settling for probabilistic arguments. Though there are no decisive texts indicating that this is Descartes' intent, the interpretation does find some support. For instance, in the Synopsis Descartes writes of his Sixth Meditation arguments:

The great benefit of these arguments is not, in my view, that they prove what they establish … The point is that in considering these arguments we come to realize that they are not as solid or as transparent as the arguments which lead us to knowledge of our own minds and of God … (AT 7:15-16)

The remark can be read as a concession that the Sixth Meditation arguments are weaker than the earlier arguments about minds and God. Of course, one need not read the remark this way. And other texts are unfavorable to this interpretation. For example, in the opening paragraphs of the Sixth Meditation Descartes considers a probabilistic argument for the existence of external bodies. Though he accepts it as an argument to the best explanation, the argument is dismissed for the express reason that it grounds “only a probability”—it does not provide the “basis for a necessary inference that some body exists” (Med. 6, AT 7:73). This is a puzzling dismissal, assuming Descartes has relaxed his standards to probable inference.

On another kind of interpretation, the troubling argument does not mark a relaxing of epistemic standards. Instead, Descartes is extending the implications of his discussion of theodicy in the Fourth Meditation. I earlier argued (Section 6.1) that Descartes thinks he demonstrates the divine guarantee of the C&D Rule by showing that an all-perfect God cannot allow us to be in error about what we clearly and distinctly perceive. Suppose Descartes holds that there are other cases in which an all-perfect God cannot allow us to be in error; and suppose these other cases are circumstances like those instanced in the highly problematic passage—namely, the following circumstances: (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief. The upshot would be a proof similar in structure to the proof of the C&D Rule, though one that argues to a more expansive conclusion:

  1. There is a non-deceiving God.
  2. A non-deceiving God cannot allow me to be in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.
  3. Therefore, I am not in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.

The conclusion of this argument presents a more expansive rule of truth than the C&D Rule, in that it licenses more kinds of judgments. Assuming Descartes could establish premise 2, he would be entitled to this more powerful rule, and without having relaxed his standards of indefeasibility.

I believe that Descartes holds that premise 2 follows from his Fourth Meditation discussion. Prima facie, this may seem ad hoc. But I believe that Descartes takes the Fourth Meditation discussion to clarify a more general circumstance of error that an all-perfect God cannot allow, than merely the circumstance of clear and distinct perception. In the relevant Sixth Meditation passage Descartes adds that from “the very fact that God is not a deceiver” there is a “consequent impossibility of there being any falsity in my opinions which cannot be corrected by some other faculty supplied by God” (Med. 6, AT 7:80). And elsewhere he writes that we would be “doing God an injustice” if we implied “that God had endowed us with such an imperfect nature that even the proper use of our powers of reasoning allowed us to go wrong” (Prin. 4:43, AT 8a:99). Assuming this interpretation is correct (I defend it elsewhere), Descartes' moves in the problematic passage are not ad hoc. And as will emerge, Descartes looks again to call on this same more expansive rule, in his effort to prove that he is not dreaming.

A final observation. It is often unnoticed that the conclusion of Descartes' argument for the existence of an external material world leaves significant scepticism in place. Granting the success of the argument, there is an external material world causing my sensations. But for all the argument shows—for all the broader argument of the Meditations shows, up to this point—I might be a mind that is linked to a brain in a vat, rather than to a full human body. This isn't an oversight on Descartes' part. It's all he thinks the argument can prove. For even at this late stage of the Meditations, the meditator does not yet Know himself to be awake.

Further reading: For a variation of the Sixth Meditation argument for the existence of the external material world, see Descartes' Prin. 2.1. See also Friedman (1997), Garber (1992), and Newman (1994). On the respects in which the Sixth Meditation inference draws on Fourth Meditation work, see Newman (1999).

8. Proving that One is Not Dreaming

By design, the ambitious project of founding Knowledge unfolds all the while the meditator is in doubt about being awake. This of course reinforces the ongoing theme that Knowledge does not properly include judgments of external sense. In the closing paragraph of the Meditations, Descartes revisits the issue of dreaming. He claims to show how, in principle—even if not easily in practice—it is possible to achieve Knowledge that one is awake.

A casual reading of the passage might suggest that Descartes offers a naturalistic solution to the problem (viz., a non-theistic solution), in the form of a continuity test: since continuity with past experiences holds only of waking but not dreaming, checking for the requisite continuity is the test for ascertaining that one is awake. Remarks taken from the final paragraph of the Sixth Meditation suggests this reading:

I now notice that there is a vast difference between [being asleep and being awake], in that dreams are never linked by memory with all the other actions of life as waking experiences are. … But when I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89-90)

This naturalist “solution” prompts two obvious criticisms, both raised by Hobbes in the Third Objections. First, the solution runs contrary to Descartes' No Atheistic Knowledge Thesis: since the continuity test does not invoke God, it appears, as Hobbes notes, “that someone can know he is awake without knowledge of the true God” (AT 7:196). (Evidently, Hobbes too interprets Descartes as holding the No Atheist Knowledge Thesis.) Second, as Hobbes adds, it seems one could dream the requisite continuity: one could “dream that his dream fits in with his ideas of a long series of past events,” thus undermining the credibility of the continuity test (AT 7:195).

Mirroring our discussion in Section 7.2, one kind of interpretation has it that Descartes relaxes his epistemic standards in the Sixth Meditation. He's aware that the naturalistic “solution” does not stand up to methodic doubt, but he's not attempting to refute the Now Dream Doubt by establishing indefeasible Knowledge. A problem for this interpretation is that it does not square with Descartes' reply to Hobbes' first objection. Writes Descartes: “an atheist can infer that he is awake on the basis of memory of his past life” (via the continuity test), but “he cannot know that this criterion is sufficient to give him the certainty that he is not mistaken, if he does not know that he was created by a non-deceiving God” (Replies 3, AT 7:196). Evidently, Descartes' “solution” is not supposed to be available to the atheist. Taken at face value, this reply rules out that Descartes' intended solution involves relaxed standards—indeed, it rules out any naturalistic solution.

On closer inspection, the Sixth Meditation passage does not put forward a naturalistic solution, but a theistic solution. The argument there has the meditator concluding that he is awake, in part, because “God is not a deceiver” (AT 7:90). How does the argument go? Recall, in the proof of the external material world, that Descartes invokes the following (divinely guaranteed) truth rule, namely:

I am not in error in cases in which (i) I have a great propensity to believe, and (ii) God provided me no faculty by which to correct a false such belief.

I suggest that in the dreaming passage Descartes is again invoking this rule. The passage opens with the meditator observing the following:

I can almost always make use of more than one sense to investigate the same thing; and in addition, I can use both my memory, which connects present experiences with preceding ones, and my intellect, which has by now examined all the causes of error. Accordingly, I should not have any further fears about the falsity of what my senses tell me every day; on the contrary, the exaggerated doubts of the last few days should be dismissed as laughable. This applies especially to … my inability to distinguish between being asleep and being awake. (Med. 6, AT 7:89)

Referring to the worry that he's dreaming as exaggerated suggests that condition (i) is met—that is, suggests that he has a great propensity to believe that he is awake. As such, he needs only to establish condition (ii), and he'll have a divine guarantee of being awake. Notice that an important theme of this opening passage concerns the meditator's faculties for correcting sensory error—suggesting condition (ii). In context, Descartes' appeal to the continuity test can indeed be understood in conjunction with condition (ii). The meditator remarks (speaking of apparently waking experience):

[W]hen I distinctly see where things come from and where and when they come to me, and when I can connect my perceptions of them with the whole of the rest of my life without a break, then I am quite certain that when I encounter these things I am not asleep but awake. And I ought not to have even the slightest doubt of their reality if, after calling upon all the senses as well as my memory and my intellect in order to check them, I receive no conflicting reports from any of these sources. For from the fact that God is not a deceiver it follows that in cases like these I am completely free from error. (Med. 6, AT 7:90; italics added)

Central to the inference is the meditator's effort to check the correctness of his belief, by means of his various faculties. The cases like these to which Descartes refers look to be those where conditions (i) and (ii) are both satisfied. Recall what Descartes writes in conjunction with the proof of the external material world: from “the very fact that God is not a deceiver” there is a “consequent impossibility of there being any falsity in my opinions which cannot be corrected by some other faculty supplied by God” (Med. 6, AT 7:80). On the reading that I am proposing, Descartes' theistic solution to the dreaming problem turns out continuous with his argument for the external material world.

What about Hobbes' second objection—in effect, that one could dream both (i) and (ii)? Descartes' response to the objection is somewhat ambiguous: “A dreamer cannot really connect his dreams with the ideas of past events, though he may dream that he does” (AT 7:196). No one denies the truism that the dreamer cannot really connect his dream with his waking past, which is one reading of this response. And the concession that the dreamer can nonetheless “dream that he does” is, on the most obvious reading, devastating to the broader account: for the account is supposed to entail, as Descartes writes, that “from the fact that God is not a deceiver it follows that in cases like these I am completely free from error.” So, if the dreamer can dream conditions (i) and (ii), then the implication is that God is a deceiver. If, therefore, the broader account is to be plausible, Descartes needs it that the continuity test cannot be performed in a dream—not with rigor, at any rate. What Descartes' concession must mean is that it can mistakenly seem to a dreamer that he has rigorously applied the continuity test, just as it can mistakenly seem to a perceiver who's wide awake that her perception is clear and distinct. Perhaps, then, in saying that the “dreamer cannot really connect his dreams with the ideas of past events,” Descartes means that the dreamer cannot rigorously perform the continuity test, no matter how hard he tries. By analogy, it is plausible for Descartes to hold that a drunken perceiver cannot really render her ideas clear and distinct, no matter how hard she tries.

Whatever is the correct interpretation, Descartes is cognizant of the impractical nature of proving that one is awake. In the closing lines of the Meditations, he thus writes:

But since the pressure of things to be done does not always allow us to stop and make such a meticulous check, it must be admitted that in this human life we are often liable to make mistakes about particular things, and we must acknowledge the weakness of our nature. (Med. 6, AT 7:90)

Further reading: See Newman (1999), Williams (1978), and Wilson (1978).


Primary Sources

Abbreviations Used:

Rules = Rules for the Direction of our Native Intelligence
Discourse = Discourse on Method
Synopsis = Synopsis of the Meditations
Meditations = Meditations on First Philosophy
Med. = any one of the six Meditations
Objs./Replies = any of the seven sets of objections/replies that Descartes published along with the Meditations
Prin. = Principles of Philosophy
Passions = The Passions of the Soul
Search = The Search for Truth
AT = Oeuvres de Descartes, Adam, Charles, and Paul Tannery, (eds.) 1904. Paris: J. Vrin. (References are to volume number and page.)
CSM = The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Cottingham, John, and Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch. (eds.) 1984. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Dates in parentheses indicate a reference to Descartes' correspondance. All quoted texts are from CSM. For full bibliographic information on Descartes' writings, see the entry on Descartes.

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

a priori justification and knowledge | certainty | Descartes, René | Descartes, René: modal metaphysics | Descartes, René: theory of ideas | Gassendi, Pierre | idealism | idealism: British | ideas | innateness: historical controversies | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | knowledge: analysis of | moral particularism | original position | perception: epistemological problems of | primary and secondary qualities | rationalism vs. empiricism | realism | reasoning: defeasible | sense-data | skepticism | truth


Thanks to Robert Audi, Alan Nelson, Ram Neta, and Shaun Nichols, for helpful discussions about the ideas in this essay.