Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri Dec 4, 1998; substantive revision Fri Oct 3, 2008

A dialetheia is a sentence, A, such that both it and its negation, ¬A, are true (we shall talk of sentences throughout this entry; but one could run the definition in terms of propositions, statements, or whatever one takes as her favourite truth-bearer: this would make little difference in the context). Assuming the fairly uncontroversial view that falsity just is the truth of negation, it can equally be claimed that a dialetheia is a sentence which is both true and false.

Dialetheism is the view that there are dialetheias. One can define a contradiction as a couple of sentences, one of which is the negation of the other, or as a conjunction of such sentences. Therefore, dialetheism amounts to the claim that there are true contradictions. As such, dialetheism opposes the so-called Law of Non-Contradiction (LNC) (sometimes also called the Law of Contradiction). The Law can, and has been, expressed in various ways, but the simplest and most perspicuous for our purposes is probably the following: for any A, it is impossible for both A and ¬A to be true.

In Book Γ of the Metaphysics, Aristotle introduced (what was later to be called) the LNC as “the most certain of all principles” (1005b24) — firmissimum omnium principiorum, as the Medieval theologians said. The property of being firmissimum manifests the fact that the LNC has been taken as the most indubitable and incontrovertible law of thought and being, and as the supreme cornerstone of knowledge and science. Aristotle's defence of the LNC in the Metaphysics was sociologically so successful that hardly any philosopher has taken upon herself to defend the law afterwards. Thomas Reid put the LNC, in the form ‘No proposition is both true and false’, among the dictates of common sense (together with other alleged self-evident truths, such as that every complete sentence must have a verb, or that those thing did really happen which I distinctly remember as having happened).

As a challenge to the LNC, therefore, dialetheism flies in the face of what most philosophers take to be common sense. Actually, that dialetheism challenges the LNC needs qualification, since the LNC is accepted as a general logical law in the mainstream versions of the theory. But a dialetheist manifests her dialetheism in accepting, together with the LNC, sentences that are inconsistent with it, that is, true sentences whose negations are true: dialetheias.

In spite of the majority view, there are some dialetheists in the history of Western Philosophy. Moreover, since the development of paraconsistent logic in the second half of the twentieth century, dialetheism has now become a lively issue once more. In the rest of this article, 1) we will start by explaining the connection between dialetheism and other important related concepts, such as the ones of trivialism and paraconsistency. Next, we will describe 2) the history of dialetheism and 3) the motivations for the modern dialetheic renaissance, among which the logical (semantic and set-theoretic) paradoxes figure prominently, though not exclusively. We will then 4) indicate and discuss some of the objections to dialetheism, and 5) its connections with the notion of rationality. Finally, 6) we will point at some possible themes for further inquiry and future philosophical research in the field.

1. Some Basic Concepts

Though dialetheism is not a new view, the word itself is. It was coined by Graham Priest and Richard Routley (later Sylvan) in 1981 (see Priest, Routley and Norman, 1989, p. xx). The inspiration for the name was a passage in Wittgenstein's Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, where he describes the Liar sentence (‘This sentence is not true’) as a Janus-headed figure facing both truth and falsity (1978, IV.59). Hence a di-aletheia is a two(-way) truth. Unfortunately, Priest and Routley forgot to agree how to spell the ‘ism’, and versions with and without the ‘e’ appear in print.

Dialetheism should be clearly distinguished from trivialism. This is the view that all contradictions are true (and hence, assuming that a conjunction entails its conjuncts, it is also the view that everything is true). Though a trivialist must be a dialetheist, the converse is not the case: a dialetheist typically claims that some (and, usually, very specific) sentences are dialetheias, not that all of them are. How one can do the former without being committed to the latter is one of the main topics in the dialetheic theory, since trivialism is considered by most philosophers theoretically repugnant, if anything is. The standard solution for the dialetheist consists in subscribing to the view that entailment (deductively valid inference) is paraconsistent.

A general conception of entailment (and, by extension, a logic that captures such a conception) is explosive if, according to it, a contradiction entails everything (ex contradictione quodlibet: for all A and B: AAB). It is paraconsistent iff it is not explosive. By adopting a paraconsistent logic, a dialetheist can countenance some contradictions without being thereby committed to countenancing everything and, in particular, all contradictions. It is likely that the recent development of paraconsistent logics, together with the impressive expansion of their successful applications, has contributed to the resurgence of dialetheism.

However, dialetheism should also be clearly distinguished from paraconsistency (see Berto 2007a, Ch. 5). Whereas a dialetheist had better embrace some paraconsistent logic or other in order to avoid trivialism, a paraconsistent logician need not be a dialetheist: she may subscribe to a non-explosive view of entailment for other reasons; for example, that, though the actual truth is consistent, entailment must preserve what holds in non-actual situations, some of which may be inconsistent; or that entailment must preserve more than just truth, e.g., information content. The core thought behind paraconsistency is to provide logics that do not permit one to infer anything indiscriminately from inconsistent premises. These may come around in databases, counterfactual-impossible situations, inconsistent evidence presented in a trial, works of fiction, etc., and a paraconsistent logician may not want to assume their truth in order to provide a satisfying treatment. This position is sometimes called weak paraconsistency in the literature, and opposed to dialetheism, taken as a ‘strongly’ paraconsistent view. Most relevant logicians, the Brazilian proponents of the paraconsistent logics of formal inconsistency, and those who embrace a form of logical pluralism on the nature of entailment, can be weak paraconsistentists; they can treat inconsistent models, in which contradictions hold, as useful mathematical tools without admitting that they represent real possibilities.

Sometimes, a further sub-distinction is made between strong paraconsistency and dialetheism (see Priest, Beall and Armour-Garb, 2004, p. 6): the former admits ‘real possibilities' in which contradictions can be true; the latter makes the final step, and accepts true contradictions simpliciter, that is, contradictions that are true at the actual world.

2. Dialetheism in the History of Philosophy

In Western Philosophy, a number of the Presocratics endorsed dialetheism. At least, Aristotle takes them to have done it, and with apparent justification. For example, in Fragment 49a, Heraclitus says: “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and we are not” (Robinson, 1987, p. 35). Protagorean relativism may be expressed by the view that man is the measure of all things. According to Aristotle, since “Many men hold beliefs in which they conflict with one another”, it follows that “the same thing must be and not be” (1009a10–12). The Presocratic views triggered Aristotle's attack in Metaphysics, Book Γ. In Chapter 4 of this occurs Aristotle's defence of the LNC. As we said above, historically this attack was almost completely successful: the LNC has been high orthodoxy in Western Philosophy ever since. It is perhaps worth noting that in Metaphysics Γ (Chapter 7) Aristotle also defends the dual of the LNC, the Law of Excluded Middle, LEM, particularly in the version which has nowadays been distinguished as the Law of Bivalence: for any A, it is necessary for (at least) one of A and ¬A to be true. But the LEM has always had a less secure place in Western Philosophy than the LNC. Aristotle himself, in fact, appears to attack the Law in De Interpretatione, Chapter 9, when he comes to the famous subject of future contingents.

Despite the orthodoxy about the LNC, there have been a few dialetheists since Aristotle. It is arguably the case that some of the Neoplatonists were dialetheists. During the Middle Ages, the problem surfaced in connection to the paradoxes of the divine omnipotence — for instance: can God make a stone too heavy for Him to raise? We find St. Pier Damiani getting close to dialetheism in the De divina omnipotentia, by blaming St. Girolamus for having claimed that God cannot overturn the past and twist what happened into something that didn't happen. Since God lives an eternal present, denying Him power on the past equals to denying Him power on current and future events, which is blasphemous. So God must have the power of making what is done undone. Later on, Nicholas of Cusa placed at the core of his book De docta ignorantia the idea that God is coincidentia oppositorum: as a truly infinite being, He includes all the opposite and incompatible properties, therefore being all things, and none of them: God has all properties, including contradictory ones (Heron, 1954, I.4).

According to some interpretations, Meinong, too, was a dialetheist, holding that some non-existent objects, such as the round square, have inconsistent properties (see Routley, 1980, Chapter 5). But the most obvious dialetheists since the Presocratics and before the 20th century are Hegel and his successors in dialectics, such as Marx and Engels (see Priest 1990, 1991). According to them, reality (in the form of Geist for Hegel, or social structures for Marx) may be literally inconsistent. For example, in the Logic Hegel says: “Something moves, not because at one moment it is here and another there, but because at one and the same moment it is here and not here, because in this ‘here’, it at once is and is not” (1831, p. 440). Indeed, it is the resolution of these contradictory states that drives the development of the history of thought (or society) forwards. In fact, Hegel was driven to embrace dialetheism by his assessment of Kant's achievements in the Critique of Pure Reason. With a little bit of rubdown, even the current debate on logical paradoxes may be viewed as a ramification and formal specification of the Kant-Hegel dialectics.

Kant believed that rational antinomies were produced by an illicit use of pure concepts; nevertheless, he also held that such an illicit use was a “natural and inevitable illusion” (Kant, 1781, p. 300) — a side effect of the reason's pursuit of completeness in knowledge. Given some phenomenon, we can be curious about its ‘condition’, as Kant says. This condition being another phenomenon, now we can be curious about its condition. Et cetera. Reason asks us to inquire further, but it also gives us some idea of an unconditioned totality of all conditions of a certain realm. The antinomies of pure reason, in particular, are originated by such basic concepts as before, part of, cause, depends on. As soon as children begin to make use of reason, they start asking, What is beyond that? What was before this? And the question can be iterated — What is beyond that, then? Curiosity is good — makes us human. The “transcendental illusion” begins when we turn what should just be a regulative ideal into a limit-object. Legitimate inferences on the world as a whole (a totality which is never given to us as such) can lead us to dialetheic conclusions: that it has a beginning in time and a limit in space, and that it has no beginning nor limits in space, that it is infinite in space and time. Both horns assume the opposite thesis and seemingly perform a reductio. According to Kant (at least in one way of resolving the antinomies), the fallacy lies in treating the world as a whole as an object — in mistaking a subjective condition for an objective reality.

Now, according to Hegel such a conception has a pro and a contra. Kant has a point in showing, via the antinomies, that dialectics is “a necessary function of reason”; in defending the “objectivity of the illusion and the necessity of the contradiction which belongs to the nature of thought determinations” (Hegel, 1831, p. 56.) However, Kant mistakenly imputes objectification, as an error, to reason: the result is only the familiar one that reason is incapable of knowing the Absolute, that is, the actual reality. On the contrary, we should abandon such “tenderness for the things of this world”, and the idea that “the stain of contradiction ought not to be in the essence of what is in the world; it has to belong only to thinking reason” (Hegel, 1830, p. 92.) Contrary to what Kant held, the Kantian antinomies are not a reductio of the illusions of reason. They are perfectly sound arguments, deducing the dialetheic nature of the world.

Dialetheism appears to be a much more common and recurrent view in Eastern Philosophy than in the West. In ancient Indian logic/metaphysics, there were standardly four possibilities to be considered on any statement at issue: that it is true (only), false (only), neither true nor false, or both. Buddhist logicians sometimes added a fifth possibility: none of these. (Both positions were called the catushkoti.) The Jains went even further and advocated the possibility of contradictory values of the kind: true (only) and both true and false. (Smart, 1964, has a discussion of the above issues.)

Contradictory utterances are a commonplace in Taoism. For example, the Chuang Tsu says: “That which makes things has no boundaries with things, but for things to have boundaries is what we mean by saying ‘the boundaries between things'. The boundaryless boundary is the boundary without a boundary” (Mair, 1994, p. 218). When Buddhism and Taoism fused to form Chan (or Zen, to give it its Japanese name), a philosophy arose in which contradiction plays a central role. The very process for reaching enlightenment (Prajna) is a process, according to Suzuki (1969, p. 55), “which is at once above and in the process of reasoning. This is a contradiction, formally considered, but in truth, this contradiction is itself made possible because of Prajna.”

Of course, interpreting the philosophers we have mentioned is a sensitive issue; and many commentators, especially Western ones who have wanted to make sense of their chosen philosopher whilst subscribing to the LNC, have suggested that the contradictory utterances of the philosopher in question are not really contradictory. There are a number of standard devices that may be employed here. One is to claim that the contradictory utterance is to be taken as having some non-literal form of meaning, e.g., that it is a metaphor. Another is to claim that the contradictory assertion is ambiguous in some way, and that it is true on one disambiguation (or in one respect) and false in another. This technique is called parameterisation and is adopted quite generally: when one collides with a seemingly true contradiction, A & ¬A, it is a common strategy to treat the suspected dialetheia A, or some of its parts, as having different meanings, that is to say, precisely as ambiguous (maybe just contextually ambiguous). For instance, if it seems that P(a) & ¬P(a), one claims that, actually, a is P and is not P under different parameters or respects — say, r1 and r2. This discrimination not emerging, inconsistency jumps in. But it can be resolved by clarifying that Pr1(a) & ¬Pr2(a) (Juliette Binoche is and is not a star, but she is a star in the sense that she is a great actress, not a star in the sense of Alpha Centauri). Therefore, in the Metaphysics Aristotle also hints that the rival of the LNC does not get the point insofar as he plays with the equivocal meanings of some words: “for to each formula there might be assigned a different word” (1006b 1–2).

Now, it is certainly the case that contradictory utterances that one sometimes hears are best construed in some such way. Whether this is so in the case of the philosophers we have mentioned, is a matter for detailed case-by-case consideration. In most of these cases, it may be argued, such interpretations produce a manifestly inaccurate and distorted version of the views of the philosopher in question. In any case, parameterisation as such is hardly an argument against the rival of the LNC. An a priori claim that contradictions can always be avoided by parameterisation begs the question against the dialetheist: sometimes parameterisation may be the best thing to do, but independent justification is required on each occasion.

3. Modern Motivations for Dialetheism

Turning now to contemporary philosophy, the second half of the twentieth century saw a resurgence of dialetheism, driven by largely new considerations. Probably the major argument used by modern dialetheists invokes the logical paradoxes of self-reference.

3.1 The Paradoxes of Self-Reference

It is customary to distinguish between two families of such paradoxes: the semantic and set-theoretic. The former family typically involves such concepts as truth, denotation, definability, etc. The latter, such notions as membership, cardinality, etc. After Gödel's and Tarski's well known formal procedures to obtain non-contextual self-reference in formalized languages, it is difficult to draw a sharp line between the two families (among other things, because of the fact that Tarskian semantics is itself framed in set-theoretic terms). Nevertheless, the distinction is commonly accepted within the relevant literature.

Prominent among the set-theoretic paradoxes are Russell's (produced by the set of all non self-membered sets), and Cantor's (produced by the universal set, which can be taken as the set of all sets, or also as the set of everything, depending on one's favourite version of set theory). Prominent among the semantic paradoxes is the so-called Paradox of the Liar. Although cases for the existence of dialetheias can be derived from almost any paradox of self-reference, we will focus only on the Liar, given that it is the most easily understandable and its exposition requires no particular technicalities.

3.2 A Simple Case Study: the Liar

In its standard version, the Liar paradox arises by reasoning on the following sentence:

(1) (1) is false.

As we can see, (1) refers to itself and tells us something about (1) itself. Its truth value? Let us reason by cases. Suppose (1) is true: then what it says is the case, so it is false. Then, suppose (1) is false: this is what it claims to be, so it is true. If we accept the aforementioned Law of Bivalence, that is, the principle according to which all sentences are either true or false, both alternatives lead to a contradiction: (1) is both true and false, that is, a dialetheia, against the LNC.

The paradox can also be produced without any direct self-reference, but via a short-circuit of sentences. For instance, here is a looped Liar:

(2a) (2b) is true

(2b) (2a) is false.

This is as old as Buridan (his Sophism no. 9: Plato saying ‘What Socrates says is true’; Socrates replying ‘What Plato says is false’). If what (2a) says is true, then (2b) is true. However, (2b) says that (2a) is false …. And so on: we are in a paradoxical loop.

Paradoxes of this kind have been known since antiquity (for instance, the standard Liar is attributed to the Greek philosopher Eubulides, probably the greatest paradox-producer of antiquity). But they were thrown into prominence by developments in the foundations of mathematics around the turn of the twentieth century. In the case of each paradox, there appears to be a perfectly sound argument ending in a contradiction. If the arguments are sound, then dialetheism is true. Of course, many have argued that the soundness of such arguments is merely an appearance, and that subtle fallacies may be diagnosed in them. Such suggestions were made in ancient and medieval logic; but many more have been made in modern logic — indeed, attacking the paradoxes has been something of a leitmotiv of modern logic. And one thing that appears to have come out of this is how resilient the paradoxes are: attempts to solve them often simply succeed in relocating the paradoxes elsewhere, as so called ‘strengthened’ forms of the arguments show. Let us have a look.

Various authors (notably Martin, 1967, van Fraassen, 1968, Kripke, 1975) have proposed to solve the Liar paradox by dismissing Bivalence, that is, by admitting that some sentences are neither true nor false, and that the Liar is one such truth value ‘gap’. The admission of truth value gaps, and the inclusion of the Liar among them, is differently motivated in the various approaches (and some motivations appear to be decidedly ad hoc). But the common core thought is the following: even though the Liar is a sentence such that, if it were true, it would be false, and vice versa, no explicit contradiction according to which it is both true and false need follow. We can avoid the contradiction by rejecting the idea that truth and falsity are the only two options for a sentence, and maintain that the Liar is neither.

These approaches face difficulties with the so-called ‘strengthened’ Liars — sentences such as the following:

(3) (3) is not true.

(4) (4) is false or neither true nor false.

Now these sentences should be, in the gapper's non-bivalent approach, either true, or false, or neither. But, for instance, if (3) is true, then things are as it claims they are; therefore, (3) is not true (either false or truth-valueless). If (3) is false, or neither true nor false, in both cases it is not true; but this is precisely what it claims to be; therefore, it is true. We seem to have to conclude that (3) is both true and not true, against the LNC. A similar line of reasoning goes for (4).

According to Priest the strengthened Liars show that a single essence of the semantic paradox underlies its different formulations. The totality of sentences is divided into two subsets: the true ones, and their ‘bona fide complement’ — call it the Rest. Now the essence of the liar is “a particular twisted construction which forces a sentence, if it is in the bona fide truths, to be in the Rest (too); conversely, if it is in the Rest, it is in the bona fide truths” (Priest, 1987, p. 23). The standard Liar, ‘This sentence is false’, is just a particular instance of this, producing a contradiction within the bivalent framework, in which the Rest is identified with the set of the false sentences. Now, we can try to resolve the problem by admitting sentences that are neither true nor false, so that the false ones become a proper subset of the Rest. However, the strengthened Liars show that we can use the notions introduced to solve the previous paradox to re-describe the Rest. In a framework in which the set of sentences undergoes a trichotomy (true, false, and neither true nor false), ‘This sentence is false or neither true nor false’ embraces with its disjunction precisely the whole Rest, i.e. the new(ly described) complement of the set of the true sentences. Adding more values is, of course, useless. If there is some fourth thing that a sentence can be, besides true, false, and neither true nor false, we can always take the notion fourth thing and produce another strengthened Liar:

(5) (5) is false, or neither true nor false, or the fourth thing.

(See Kirkham, 1992, pp. 293–4). It comes as no surprise, then, that there is no generally agreed upon solution to the semantic paradoxes. The strengthened paradoxes force us to admit that the proposed theory was formulated in a language different from, and expressively more powerful than, the one whose semantics it was supposed to express. This entails a limitation of the Tarskian T-schema, and a fallback into a rigid distinction between an object language and its metalanguage. Such a distinction, though introduced by Tarski to expel the Liar paradox from formalized languages, was doomed by Tarski itself as inapplicable to natural languages, that do not appear to depend upon some (ineffable?) metalanguage for their semantics. As Kripke has admitted at the end of Outline of a Theory of Truth, “the ghost of the Tarski hierarchy is still with us” (scil. the gappers: see Kripke, 1975, p. 80).

It is these facts that give dialetheism about the paradoxes of self-reference one of its major appeals. It is not the only one, though: the simplicity of a dialetheic account of truth (as developed, for instance, in Priest, 1987), is another. The truth predicate is simply characterized by the unrestricted T-schema, which is an overwhelmingly intuitive — one may dare say, ‘analytic’ — principle concerning truth. It is admitted that some sentences — notably, the Liars — are truth value gluts, that is, both true and false (the construction may also sustain sentences which are both true and not true); and no artificial hierarchy of metalanguages is needed — not to speak about the further epicycles of the (allegedly) consistent solutions to the Liar paradoxes.

Overall, such paradoxes as the Liar provide some evidence for the dialetheist's claim that some contradictions are provably true, in the sense that they are entailed by plain facts concerning natural language and our thought processes. Extended Liar paradoxes like ‘This sentence is not true’ are spelt in ordinary English. Their paradoxical characteristics, as dialetheists stress, are due exactly to the intuitive features of ordinary language: unavoidable self-reference; failure of metalinguistic hierarchies producing only languages that are expressively weaker than English; and the obvious presence of a truth predicate for English, ‘is true’, which is characterized (at least extensionally) by the Tarskian T-schema.

3.3 Other Motivations for Dialetheism

Dialetheias produced by the paradoxes of self-reference have a limited range, being confined in the realm of such abstract notions as sets, or semantic concepts — although the concepts involved are very basic ones, such as truth. However, the paradoxes of self-reference are not the only examples of dialetheias that have been mooted. Other cases involve contradictions affecting concrete objects and the empirical world, and include the following.

(1) Transition states: when I exit the room, I am inside the room at one time, and outside of it at another. Given the continuity of motion, there must be a precise instant in time, call it t, at which I leave the room. Am I inside the room or outside at time t? Four answers are available: (a) I am inside; (b) I am outside; (c) I am both; and (d) I am neither. (a) and (b) are ruled out by symmetry: choosing either would be completely arbitrary. As for (d): if I am neither inside not outside the room, then I am not inside and not-not inside; therefore, I am either inside and not inside (option (c)), or not inside and not-not inside (which follows from option (d)); in both cases, a dialetheic situation.

(2) Some of Zeno's paradoxes concerning a particular — though, perhaps, the most basic — kind of transition, that is, local motion: the moving arrow is both where it is, and where it is not. The orthodox way out of the paradoxical situation, as formulated, e.g., by Russell, 1903, has it that motion is the mere occupation of different places at different times (this is, clearly, another case of attempted parameterisation). But this seems to imply a denial of the phenomenon itself, that is, of the actuality of motion: it entails that motion is not an intrinsic state of the (allegedly) moving thing, for, at each instant, the arrow is not moving at all. Even if time is dense, a continuum of states each one of which is indistinguishable from a state of rest, one may argue, is not motion. Can a going-somewhere be composed by an (even more-than-denumerable) infinity of going-nowheres? An alternative, dialetheic account of motion, which takes at face value the aforementioned Hegelian idea that “Something moves, not because at one moment it is here and another there, but because at one and the same moment it is here and not here, because in this ‘here’, it at once is and is not”, is exposed in Priest, 1987, Ch. 12.

(3) Borderline cases of vague predicates. With the exception of the so-called epistemic solutions, the main approaches to vagueness (such as the ones based on many-valued logics, or supervaluations) require some under-determinacy of reference, and/or the rejection of Bivalence: if an adolescent, m, is a borderline case of adultness, A, then A(m) may turn out to have an intermediate truth value between truth and falsity, or no truth value at all. But it may be conjectured that a borderline object like m, instead of satisfying neither a vague predicate nor its negation, satisfies them both: an adolescent both is and is not an adult. Given the obvious dualities between the LEM and the Law of Bivalence on the one side, and (respectively, syntactic and semantic formulations of) the LNC on the other, it is not too difficult to envisage a ‘sub-valuational’ semantic approach, dual to the supervaluation strategy. Sub-valuational paraconsistent semantics have been proposed by Hyde, 1997, and Varzi, 1997. To be sure, it is an open option to assume that the inconsistencies due to vague predicates and borderline objects are, as a matter of fact, only de dicto, due to merely semantic under- and over- determination of ordinary language. But if the aforementioned phenomena have a de re reading, then actually inconsistent objects are admitted, together with vague objects. And this spreads inconsistency all over the empirical world: if borderline cases can be inconsistent, inconsistent objects are more or less everywhere, given how pervasive the phenomenon of vagueness notoriously is: adolescents, borderline bald men, etc.

(4) Multi-criterial predicates. We may assume that the semantics of a predicate is specified by means of its criteria of application. Now ordinary language hosts predicates with different, and occasionally conflicting, criteria of application: some criteria for applying P( ) may entail that object m is in the extension of the predicate, some others, that m is in its anti-extension, or negative extension. Criteria can in some cases be encoded by such things as meaning postulates (or other similar, albeit more sophisticated, semantic devices); but conflicting meaning postulates may be embedded in our standard linguistic practices, and difficult to detect and identify. If the extensions of our ordinary predicates are constrained by our intuitions, and such intuitions turn out to be inconsistent, a good semantic account of the situation may well have to reflect this fact, instead of destroying it by means of some regimentation (e.g. via the usual parameterisation, or distinction of respects).

(5) Certain legal situations, such as inconsistent bodies of law. Suppose, for instance, that some norm states that a marriage performed by the captain of a ship counts as a legal marriage only if the ship was in open water throughout the ceremony. It turns out, then, that some other law has established that such a marriage is valid also if the ceremony has only begun with the ship in open water, but has ended with the ship in the port. Then someone may turn out to be both a married man and a bachelor, therefore, given the meaning of bachelor’, both a married man and not a married man (and, of course, nobody would infer from this that he is not a man anymore, or both a man and not a man, etc.; so we have another counterexample to ex contradictione quodlibet). If one accepts the plausible view that statements concerning legal rights, obligations, and statuses, can be truth-value apt, we seem to have a dialetheia. Of course, legal systems have mechanisms that can be used sometimes to remove such inconsistencies (e.g., by ordering different kinds of laws in a hierarchy from customary laws, to established jurisprudence, to ordinary legislation, to constitutional norms, etc.; or via the lex posterior principle, giving priority to the more recent norm in case of conflict). But this is not always the case: the inconsistent laws may be of the same rank, enacted at the same time, etc.

Each of the above arguments undoubtedly calls for further development, which cannot be done here; but one can check Priest, 1987, for detailed discussions of all of them.

4. Objections to Dialetheism

We now turn to arguments against dialetheism. The only sustained defence of the LNC in the history of philosophy is, as mentioned, that given by Aristotle in Chapter 4 of Metaphysics, Γ. Given the influence this chapter has had, the arguments are surprisingly poor. Aristotle's main argument, which takes up the first half of chapter, is tangled and contorted. It is not clear what it is, let alone that it works. About the best one can say for it is that it depends on substantial and moot principles of Aristotelian metaphysics, and, in any case, as a suasive argument, begs the question. The six or seven arguments that Aristotle deploys in the second half of the chapter are varied, swift, and fare little better. Many of them seem also to beg the question. Worse: many of them simply confuse dialetheism and trivialism. (For an analysis of Aristotle's arguments, see Priest, 1998b.)

4.1 The Argument from Explosion

A standard modern argument against dialetheism is to invoke the logical principle of Explosion, in virtue of which dialetheism would entail trivialism. Given that trivialism is absurd, which has been granted in this entry (though why this is so is not as easy a question as it might appear: see Priest, 2000, and Priest, 2006, Ch. 3), dialetheism must be rejected. It is clear that this argument will fail against someone who subscribes to a paraconsistent, non-explosive logic, as dialetheists certainly will.

Interestingly enough, whereas Aristotle's defence of the LNC cheerfully slides between attacking dialetheism and trivialism (that is, between attacking the claim that some contradictions are true, and the one that all contradictions are), Aristotelian syllogistic — the first formally articulated logic in Western philosophy — is not explosive. Aristotle held that some syllogisms with inconsistent premises are valid, whereas others are not (An. Pr. 64a 15). Just consider the inference:

(P1) Some logicians are intuitionists;

(P2) No intuitionist is a logician;

(C) Therefore, all logicians are logicians.

This is not a valid syllogism, despite the fact that its premises are inconsistent. The principle of Explosion had a certain tenure at places and times in Medieval logic, but it became well-established mainly with the Fregean and post-Fregean development of classical logic, as it is nowadays called (rather inappropriately, as we can see).

4.2 The Argument from Exclusion

Another argument against dialetheism that is sometimes deployed (it can be found, for instance, in McTaggart, 1922, 8; see also Berto, 2006) is as follows. A sentence is meaningful only if it rules something out. But if the LNC fails, A does not rule out ¬A, or, a fortiori, anything else. Hence meaningful language presupposes the LNC.

There are many problems with this argument. One is, for instance, that even though a dialetheia does not rule our its negation, it still may rule out several other things. But the central trouble is that the first premise is simply false. Consider the sentence ‘Everything is true’. This entails everything, and so rules out nothing. Yet it is quite meaningful. It is what everyone, except a trivialist, rejects.

One might attempt a more sophisticated explanation of the notion of ruling out, for instance in terms of information theory, or perhaps possible worlds. One may claim that a statement ‘rules out’ something insofar as there are situations, or worlds, at which it fails. In this sense, ‘Everything is true’ does rule something out. But now, it is this account of propositional meaning which is wrong in general. If mathematical truths have a strictly necessary status (which may safely be assumed here), Fermat's Last Theorem rules out nothing: being a necessary truth, it holds at all possible worlds. But it is perfectly meaningful; people have been wondering whether it was true or false for centuries; and its proof by Andrew Wiles has been a substantial discovery.

Finally, even if one persisted in subscribing to an account of propositional content in terms of splitting situations, or worlds, between those where it holds and those where it does not, this would not affect a dialetheic challenge to the LNC. For a given A to be a dialetheia, putting things in these terms, it is sufficient that there be overlap between the worlds where A holds, and those where its negation holds. And this is compatible with the idea of propositional content as splitting the totality of worlds. Of course, such an overlap requires dismissing the account of negation embodied in (so-called) classical logic, and to this issue we now turn.

4.3 The Argument from Negation

There are other arguments one might take into account in this context, which are focused on the concept of logical negation. The main one goes as follows. The truth conditions for negation are: ¬A is true iff A is not true. Hence, if A and ¬A were true, A would be both true and not true, which is impossible.

Also this argument has various troubles. First, the truth conditions for negation employed here are contentious. An alternative view has it that ¬A is true iff A is false, and ¬A is false iff A is true — and in the semantics of many paraconsistent logics (for instance, the logic of First Degree Entailment), truth and falsity may overlap. Such an account preserves our intuition that negation is the operator which (truth-functionally) switches truth and falsity. It also preserves our intuition on contradictoriness, in the form: A and B are contradictories iff, if A is true, B is false, and if A is false, B is true. What has to go is ‘only’ the assumption that truth and falsity are exclusive in all cases: there exist dialetheias, that is, sentences falling simultaneously under both categories.

Secondly, and more importantly, the argument against dialetheism based on the truth conditions for (classical) negation fails, since it clearly begs the question at last step: why should we assume that it is impossible for A to be both true and not true? Well, because it is a contradiction. But we were supposed to be arguing for the impossibility of any contradiction holding, to begin with. Many other arguments for the LNC, whatever other failings they have, seem ultimately to beg the question in similar ways.

A variant on the anti-dialetheic argument from negation comes from a Quinean conception of the logical vocabulary. It goes as follows. Even granting that there is an operator, say, *, which behaves as dialetheists claim (namely, such that in particular in some cases A is true together with *A), it is still perfectly possible to define a Boolean negation with all the properties of classical negation (in particular, the property of being explosive). And since Boolean negation is the standard operator in logic, it is not worth translating anything non-Boolean as ‘not’: such a translation may simply amount to calling ‘negation’ something different. A change in logical vocabulary is a “change of subject”, as the Quinean slogan goes.

One line of reply available to the dialetheist is that the objection is confused between a logical theory and what the theory is a theory of. There are many different and well-worked out logical theories of negation (minimal negation, intuitionistic negation, De Morgan negation, etc.). Insofar as each one of them characterizes its own theoretical object, there is no rivalry between logics. Rivalry begins when we wonder whether some account or other captures the meaning and functioning of negation as it is used in the vernacular. An applied account of negation is a theory of something, and the theoretical object has to fit the real object. Now, to assume beforehand that the classical, Boolean account of negation is the correct one, in the sense that it captures how negation works in the vernacular, begs the question against the dialetheist again (and against most non-classical logicians, indeed): one cannot just assume that classical negation gets it right. Someone who proposes a treatment of negation alternative to the classical-Boolean one is not thereby proposing to revise negation, but an account of it, the Boolean one, which she considers incorrect.

There certainly are various other arguents against dialetheism in the philosophical market. One worth mentioning is by Zalta, who argues that preserving “our pretheoretic understanding of what it is to exemplify or instantiate a property” requires us to preserve the LNC (2004, 432). This entry is not the place to debate them all. But it is worth noting that, by forcing philosophers to struggle to find arguments for what previously was an undisputed belief, namely the one in the LNC, dialetheism would have rendered a valuable service to philosophy even if it turned out that it is ultimately wrong.

5. Dialetheism and Rationality

5.1 Consistency and Other Epistemic Virtues

Some have felt that what is wrong with dialetheism is not so much violation of the LNC itself, as that an acceptance of the LNC is a precondition for rationality. For example, it is often suggested that it could not possibly be rational to accept a contradiction.

Whilst the question of the conditions under which it is rational to accept something is a moot one, it is commonly agreed that, as Hume put it, the wise person “proportions his beliefs to the evidence” (1955, p. 118). Hence, if a sufficient case can be made out for a contradiction, it will be rational to believe it. And cases there are. For example, the case for the truth of the strengthened Liar sentence, ‘This sentence is not true’, was previously gestured at. And whether or not one takes the case in question to be completely persuasive, it illustrates the fact that there is nothing in principle impossible about the existence of such a case. Of course, if there were conclusive evidence for the LNC, then no case for a contradiction could be strong enough. But conclusive evidence for any philosophical position is difficult to achieve.

A more persuasive worry about dialetheism, relating to rationality, is the claim that if a person could legitimately accept a contradiction, then no one could be forced, rationally, to abandon a view held. For if a person accepts A then, when an argument for ¬A is put up, they could simply accept both A and ¬A.

But this is too fast. The fact that some contradictions are rationally acceptable does not entail that all are. There is certainly a case that the Liar sentence is both true and false, but this in no way provides a case that Brisbane is and is not in Australia. (Of course, if one subscribes to the claim that entailment is explosive, a case for one contradiction is a case for all; but if entailment is paraconsistent, this argument is of no use.) As orthodox philosophy of science indicates, there are, in fact, many different considerations that speak for or against the rational acceptability of a theory or a view. Among the epistemic virtues of a theory are: its adequacy to the data; its simplicity, cleanness and elegance; its unity and freedom from ad hoc hypotheses; its explanatory and predictive power; etc. Not only these (and other) criteria come in degrees, but they may also be orthogonal to each other. In the end, the rational evaluation of a view must balance it against all criteria of this kind (of which, inconsistency is, arguably, one), each, on its own, being defeasible. And it may well turn out that a theory lacking the virtue of consistency overcomes its rivals in all or most of the other entries. According to dialetheists, this is actually the case with the dialetheic account of the semantics of ordinary language, whose advantages with respect to consistent accounts have already been hinted at above. And conversely, of course, ad inconsistent theory may well be trumped by a consistent theory, all things considered. So it may be rational to reject an inconsistent position, even if it is logically possible that it is true.

5.2 Accepting and Asserting Dialetheias: the Rationality Principle

Given all this, it is natural to expect that a dialetheist will sometimes accept, or believe in, contradictions, and assert them. Priest (2006, p. 109) adopts the following Rationality Principle:

(RP) If you have good evidence for (the truth of) A, you ought to accept A.

Belief, acceptance, and assertion have a point: when we believe and assert, what we aim at is believing and asserting what is the case or, equivalently, the truth. Therefore, the dialetheist will accept and, sometimes, assert both A and ¬A, if she has evidence that A is a dialetheia — that both A and ¬A are true, as it happens, for instance, with the Liar sentences.

Notice that this need not entail that the dialetheist both accepts and rejects A at the same time at all. That rejecting A is tantamount to accepting its negation is a common view, famously endorsed and defended (more precisely in terms of the corresponding speech acts: assertion and denial) by Frege and Peter Geach. But this fusion is a confusion from a dialetheic viewpoint (see Berto, 2008, on this issue). The point can be made independently of the issue of dialetheism: it is apparent as soon as we get out of the standard, bivalent framework. Supporters of truth-value gaps maintain that some sentences (notably, the Liars) are neither true nor false. Now if A is a truth-value gap (therefore, in particular, not a truth), one may well want to deny A; but it would be unfair to take such a denial as equivalent to the assertion of ¬A. If A is truth-valueless, ¬A is normally considered as truth-valueless, too, therefore, not a truth, and so it should not be asserted in its turn. A dual position can hold for dialetheism: given that accepting ¬A is different from rejecting A, a dialetheist can do the former and not the latter — exactly when she thinks that A is a dialetheia.

6. Peeking at the Future: Themes for Further Research

One of the signs of maturity in a research program is shown by its beginning to confront itself with some major topics in traditional and mainstream philosophy. Among such topics, a prominent one is the debate between realists and anti-realists (idealists, constructivists). To be a realist about some kind of entities is to maintain that such entities objectively exist apart from, and antecedently to, anyone's thought of them; and, therefore, that our thoughts, beliefs and theories concerning such entities are made objectively true or objectively false by them, apart from what we think of them (more refined definitions of realism and anti-realism are certainly available; but this characterization will suffice for our purposes).

Now, it has been claimed (see Priest, 2000, and Priest, 2006, Ch. 2) that dialetheism is not by itself committed to a specific conception of truth (deflationist, semantic, correspondentist, coherentist, constructivist, etc.). Nevertheless, if we accept even a mild form of realism, the truth of some contradictions entails the existence of inconsistent objects and/or states of affairs: those that make the contradictions true (see Berto, 2007b). One may claim that it makes no sense to talk of inconsistent objects, situations, or states of affairs. The world is all there, all together: how could some pieces of it contradict some other pieces? Consistency and inconsistency might be taken as properties of sentences, or theories (sets of sentences closed under logical consequence), or propositions (what sentences express), or maybe thoughts, or (sets of) beliefs, etc. Contradiction (Widerspruch, the Latin contradictio) has to do with discourse (diction, sprechen, dicere). The world, with its non-mental and non-linguistic inhabitants — armchairs, trees, people — is not the right kind of thing that can be consistent or inconsistent, and ascribing such properties to (a part of) the world is, to use Gilbert Ryle's terminology, a category mistake.

These considerations might drive dialetheism towards an anti-realist interpretation of the claim that there are dialetheias, true contradictions; and anti-realist dialetheic theories of truth have, in fact, been proposed lately (see e.g. JC Beall's ‘constructive methodological deflationism’, in Beall, 2004). But other options are available to a dialetheist who wants to embrace some form of metaphysically robust realism about truth. For instance, she can stress that consistency and inconsistency can be ascribed to (pieces of) the world in a derived sense: to say that the world is (locally) inconsistent just is to say that some true purely descriptive sentences about the world have true negations. Consequently, and not accidentally, it is quite common in the current literature on (pro and contra) dialetheism to straightforwardly speak of inconsistent objects, states of affairs, and entire inconsistent worlds. A dialetheic correspondence theory of truth might be committed, in particular, to negative facts (requiring the simultaneous existence of truth-makers both for A and for its negation, when A is a dialetheia); but these may be not too difficult to handle (see e.g. Priest, 2006, pp. 51–3).

There may also be room for a further intermediate position, that is to say, a ‘semantic dialetheism’ which accepts true contradictions without inconsistent objects or states of affaires as their truth-makers. This position has been surprisingly little explored in the literature, and calls for further investigations (but one may consider Kroon 2004 and Mares 2004 as early and interesting efforts in this direction).

Of course, such debates on realism and anti-realism quickly spill over into questions concerning the nature of reality in general, that is, into metaphysical issues: if reality is dialetheic, how should the ontology of a dialetheic world be spelt out? It is likely that this is another major direction for future dialetheic research. If metaphysics should be placed (once again) at the very core of philosophy, the debate on the possibility of dialetheias occupies a central place in the core. This was, after all, Aristotle's view, too: he decided to speak on behalf of the unconditional validity of the LNC, not in his Organon (his writings on the subject of logic), but in the Metaphysics, for this was for him an issue to be addressed ontologically, not (only) via formal logical tools.

7. Conclusion

We think it fair to say, that since Aristotle's defence of the LNC, consistency has been something of a shibboleth in Western philosophy. The thought that consistency is a sine qua non for central notions such as validity, truth, meaningfulness, rationality, is deeply ingrained into its psyche. One thing that has come out of the modern investigations into dialetheism appears to be how superficial such a thought is. If consistency is, indeed, a necessary condition for any of these notions, it would seem to be for reasons much deeper than anyone has yet succeeded in articulating. And if it is not, then the way is open for the exploration of all kinds of avenues and questions in philosophy and the sciences that have traditionally been closed off.


We break up the references into sections corresponding to those of the text. Where a reference is not explicitly referred to in the text, we add a sentence concerning its relevance.

Some Basic Concepts

Dialetheism in the History of Philosophy

Modern Motivations for Dialetheism

Objections to Dialetheism

Dialetheism and Rationality

Peeking at the Future: Themes for Further Research

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | Aristotle, Special Topics: on non-contradiction | contradiction | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | logic: paraconsistent | paradoxes: and contemporary logic | Russell's paradox


The authors would like to thank an anonymous referee for providing helpful comments and suggestions.