Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Cultural Evolution

First published Sun Dec 23, 2007

In the broadest terms, theories of evolution seek to explain why species are the ways they are. For many evolutionists, this means explaining the possession by species of characteristic adaptations. It also means explaining diversity within species. The general mark of modern theories of cultural evolution is their insistence on the significance of cultural inheritance—particularly various forms of learning from others—for both of these questions. The prima-facie case for cultural evolutionary theories is irresistible. Members of our own species are able to survive and reproduce in part because of habits, know-how and technology that are not only maintained by learning from others, they are initially generated as part of a cumulative project that builds on discoveries made by others. And our own species also contains sub-groups with different habits, know-how and technologies, which are once again generated and maintained through social learning. The question is not so much whether cultural evolution is important, but how theories of cultural evolution should be fashioned, and how they should be related to more traditional understandings of organic evolution.

1. What is Cultural Evolution?

Theories of cultural evolution need to be distinguished from theories within evolutionary psychology, even though both may involve an application of evolutionary ideas to the explanation of cultural phenomena. The evolutionary psychologist (e.g. Tooby and Cosmides 1992) tends to assume that the most important inheritance mechanism in all species—our own included—is genetic inheritance. Evolutionary psychology regards the human mind as evolving through a conventional process of natural selection acting on genetically inherited variation. For example, an evolutionary psychologist might explain the widespread taste among humans for fatty foods in terms of the importance in our species' distant past of consuming as much fat as possible on those rare occasions when the circumstances presented themselves. Such a hypothesis can also help to explain novel cultural trends: the recent increase in obesity is explained as the result of a novel environmental change—the increased availability of cheap, high-fat foods—acting in concert with a once-adaptive, now dangerous, gustatory preference.

Darwin believed, as do biologists today, that natural selection can explain the origin of many complex adaptive traits. In Darwin's original presentation of natural selection, he requires that parent organisms differ in their abilities to survive and reproduce, and that offspring resemble their parents in terms of the traits that promote or inhibit these abilities (Darwin 1859/1964). This explanatory schema is largely neutral regarding what mechanism accounts for parent-offspring resemblance. For example, offspring might learn skills from their parents, and thereby come to resemble them behaviourally. From the perspective of natural selection explanations, it does not matter why offspring resemble parents, only that they do resemble them.

Darwin's theory of natural selection explains adaptation by appealing to what we now call vertical transmission—the inheritance of parental traits by offspring. As we have seen, cultural processes such as learning might, in principle, underpin this form of inheritance. But we do not learn only from our parents—we also learn from peers, authority-figures and so forth. This is known as horizontal transmission. Once we acknowledge the possibility that learning can underpin natural selection, we also acknowledge that a theory of evolution—a theory which seeks to explain change, including adaptive change in a population—may also need to be further expanded to encompass horizontal transmission. The admittance of horizontal transmission into evolutionary theory necessitates far more radical revisions to traditional Darwinian models of evolution. This is because horizontal transmission opens up the possibility that some traits may spread through a population in spite of the fact that they reduce the fitness of the individuals who bear them.

2. Natural Selection and Cultural Inheritance

In a classic early work of cultural evolution, Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman (1981) ask (among other things) how we can explain declining birth rates among Italian women in the nineteenth century. These women went from having around five children on average to having only two. It would be extremely implausible to argue that this occurred as result of natural selection (Sober 1991, 482). It would be implausible, for example, to argue that the fitness of women with smaller families was greater than the fitness of women with larger families. True enough, an individual's long-term fitness (measured in terms of numbers of grandchildren, or great-grandchildren) may sometimes be augmented by having a few strong offspring rather than lots of weak ones (Lack 1954). But surely Italian women could have raised more than two children to be healthy adults. Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman instead argue that the practice of having fewer children spread through Italy because women acquired the trait both from peers and from individuals from their mother's generation, through modes of cultural transmission. Forms of horizontal transmission are required to explain this transition, because if cultural transmission was always vertical, then the trait of having greater numbers of offspring would be maintained in the population by natural selection, albeit selection acting via cultural inheritance.

One might react to this with confusion: why is a body of theory needed to make these claims? Of course we acquire traits from others by learning. And of course those others from whom we learn can include peers as well as parents. In part, we can respond to this bewilderment by pointing to the virtues of clarifying the conditions required for cultural inheritance to overcome natural selection. Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman argue that if women simply acquired whichever preference for family size was the most widely adopted in their local cultural environment, then cultural inheritance would not have enough of an effect to overcome natural selection. Women must be disposed to acquire the preference for small family size even when it is present in only a small proportion of their cultural circle, if small family size is to replace large family size in the population as a whole. This is an illuminating claim, and it takes a quantitative model to show it.

This question of what benefit is to be had from setting these sorts of claims in a quantitative theory will be raised in more detail later in this article. For the moment, note that one may also ask why it should be the case that we are able to learn from non-parents at all, given the adaptive costs of such a disposition. If the tendency of Italian women to learn from their peers has led them to reduce their fitness by reducing their family size, why did natural selection allow such learning dispositions to become established in the first place? Boyd and Richerson, two other pioneers in cultural evolutionary theory, claim that the overall adaptive benefits of learning from non-parents in fact outweigh the overall adaptive costs (Richerson and Boyd 2005, Ch. 4). They give several reasons for this view. Suppose an inventive (or lucky) individual is able to discover some behaviour, or technique, which augments fitness. If other individuals in the population can copy that behaviour, then their fitness will probably be augmented, too. It will often be difficult for individuals to ascertain which behaviours in fact augment fitness, hence which behaviours should be copied. The problem, then, is how to tune a learning mechanism so that beneficial behaviours are copied, while non-beneficial behaviours are not.

Boyd and Richerson suggest that prestige bias can overcome this problem: if individuals copy techniques from those who are in prestigious positions, then this increases the chances that they will copy techniques that are, in fact, beneficial. As they put it, ‘Determining who is a success is much easier than determining how to be a success’ (Richerson and Boyd, 2005, 124). The value of prestige bias relies on the supposition that those individuals who are able to get themselves into prestigious positions have a better than average tendency to make use of fitness-enhancing techniques. This heuristic will not be failsafe: after all, not every technique a prestigious individual uses will also augment fitness, and some individuals may be accorded prestige without good cause. But the question which settles the plausibility of natural selection explaining prestige bias is not whether prestige bias will sometimes lead to the copying of maladaptive techniques; the question, rather, is whether individuals who learn from the prestigious will tend to be fitter on average than individuals who either do not learn at all, or who are equally likely to learn from any member of the population, regardless of their social status.

Richerson and Boyd (2005, 120–22) suggest that other learning heuristics may be adaptive. One of these they call conformist bias. They argue that imitation of the common type—the ‘When in Rome’ rule—is more likely than not imitating at all, and more likely than imitation of a randomly-chosen member of a population, to provide an individual with behaviours that are appropriate to novel situations. This may mean acquiring behaviours appropriate to a new biological environment: when moving into a new habitat, with unknown plants and animals, it is best to eat the foods the locals eat, for one thereby avoids poisoning. But it can also lead to the generation of socially appropriate behaviours, which will obviate ostracism or attack.

These examples show the nature of the interaction between cultural evolutionary thinking and more traditional natural selection thinking. Natural selection acting on genetic variation can establish dispositions to learn from peers in spite of the fact that under some circumstances these dispositions lead to the proliferation of maladaptive traits. Once these learning dispositions are in place, we should not assume that every trait in a population must be explained by reference to the biological fitness benefit it has conferred in the past. Evolutionary adaptationists tend to ask, of any given trait, what effect might have led natural selection to favour that trait. Even if an adaptationist stance of this sort is justifiable for learning mechanisms, this does not mean that an adaptationist stance is justifiable for learned traits.

3. Historical Pedigree

The notion that culture itself evolves, and that Darwinian insights can be applied to understanding cultural change, is by no means new. A very early example of cultural evolutionary thinking comes from William James:

A remarkable parallel, which to my mind has never been noticed, obtains between the facts of social evolution and the mental growth of the race, on the one hand, and of zoological evolution, as expounded by Mr Darwin, on the other. (James 1880, 441)

James's paper is primarily concerned with using what he regards as a proper understanding of Darwinism to undermine the ‘so-called evolutionary philosophy of Mr Herbert Spencer’ (ibid., 422). Spencer had argued that ‘great men’ were of secondary importance in determining the course of history, on the grounds that ‘Before he can remake his society, his society must make him’ (from Spencer's Study of Sociology, quoted in ibid., 449). The great man needs to be made, and society does this. Hence ultimately it is society itself that explains social change.

James argues that the central key to Darwin's natural selection mechanism is to decouple the causes of variation from the causes of selection (see Lewens, 2006, Ch. 2). Variations are produced by unknown causes, and the environment selects among them. Variations themselves (for James's Darwin) are inexplicable. The same is true of great men: ‘The causes of production of great men lie in a sphere wholly inaccessible to the social philosopher. He must simply accept geniuses as data, just as Darwin accepts his spontaneous variations’ (James, 1880, 445). Great men, like spontaneous variations, are essential and inexplicable elements of the evolutionary process. Just as Darwin's theory credits environment and variation with distinctive, yet vital, roles, so both great men and the social environment are important for the explanation of social change:

This social evolution is a resultant of the interaction of two wholly distinct factors: the individual, deriving his peculiar gifts from the play of physiological and infra-social forces, but bearing all the power of initiative and origination in his own hands; and second, the social environment, with its power of adopting or rejecting both him and his gifts. Both factors are essential to change. (Ibid., 448)

There are problems associated with any effort to trace the pedigree of cultural evolutionary theories back to Darwin himself. One of the reasons for this is that cultural evolutionary theories often define themselves in opposition to those which claim that genetic inheritance is the only significant inheritance mechanism. Clearly one cannot cast Darwin as a cultural evolutionist in this manner, for he had no notion of genetic inheritance to oppose. Having said this, Darwin did believe that what was learned in one generation could be inherited in later generations. But far from distinguishing cultural inheritance from organic inheritance, Darwin thought that all inheritance should be explained by the transmission of ‘gemmules’. These were understood to be particles produced throughout the body, of a character specific to the body part that produces them. Darwin believed that gemmules then travelled to the gonads, where they were transmitted to offspring in the sex cells. Darwin claimed that gemmules were produced throughout the body in order to explain the inheritance of acquired characteristics. So in one sense Darwin is in alignment with modern cultural evolutionists—he believed that characteristics learned during the life of a parent could be transmitted to offspring. But in another sense Darwin is opposed to modern cultural evolutionists, for rather than distinguishing between different interacting inheritance systems (e.g. cultural and genetic inheritance), Darwin tends to use the transmission of gemmules to explain the inheritance of all types of trait.

There are other respects in which one might choose to regard Darwin as a proto-cultural evolutionist. Darwin sometimes integrates discussion of technological evolution into his broader discussions of natural selection. In the Descent of Man, Darwin pauses to discuss technical innovation, arguing that successful innovations will usually be imitated, thereby increasing the success of a group as a whole, increasing the size of that group, and consequently increasing the chances of inventive members being born into it (Darwin 1877/2004). This explanation combines natural selection's central concern with reproductive output, and cultural evolution's central concern with imitation. Darwin writes:

…if some one man in a tribe, more sagacious than the others, invented a new snare or weapon…the plainest self-interest, without the assistance of much reasoning power, would prompt the other members to imitate him; and all would thus profit…If the new invention were an important one, the tribe would increase in number, spread, and supplant other tribes…In a tribe thus rendered more numerous there would always be a rather greater chance of the birth of other superior and inventive members. (Darwin 1877/2004, 154)

Finally, Darwin endorses the view, widely favoured these days, that natural selection need not act on organisms. Rather, natural selection is substrate-neutral. A natural selection process can occur whenever certain abstract conditions—these days often expressed as differential reproduction with inheritance—are met. Darwin explicitly endorses the view that natural selection can act on entities other than organisms in the context of language change, a cultural phenomenon. This position is briefly explored in the Origin of Species, and further expanded in the Descent of Man. In this work, he endorses the opinion of Max Müller:

A struggle for life is constantly going on amongst the words and grammatical forms in each language. The better, the shorter, the easier forms are constantly gaining the upper hand, and they owe their success to their own inherent value. (Darwin 1877/2004, 113)

Darwin asserts that this is no mere analogy: ‘The survival or preservation of certain favoured words in the struggle for existence is natural selection.’ This claim—that cultural entities of various sorts can undergo natural selection processes in their own right—is not a necessary feature of a theory of cultural evolution. Cultural evolutionary theory in general requires only a systematic effort to model the effects of cultural inheritance, and one might decide that thinking in terms of natural selection acting on units of culture is not the best way of doing this. We will investigate these issues in more detail later in this article.

We have already mentioned Herbert Spencer, and Spencer is sometimes regarded as a key early advocate of efforts to apply evolutionary thinking to human culture (e.g. Jablonka and Lamb 2005, 21–22). As early as 1855, in his Principles of Psychology, Spencer proposed a form of evolutionary epistemology, arguing for a third way between empiricism's emphasis on the necessity of experience for knowledge, and rationalism's insistence on the importance of a priori knowledge. Spencer reasoned that if the experiences of past generations were imprinted on human minds, then it would be true both that some forms of knowledge in current generations were a priori, and also that this knowledge had its origins in experience, albeit the experience of our ancestors. Darwin himself had made a brief note along similar lines in his M notebook: ‘Plato…says in Phaedo that our ‘necessary ideas’ arise from the preexistence of the soul, are not derivable from experience.—read monkeys for preexistence.’ (Barrett et al 1987, 551) Much later in the twentieth century, Konrad Lorenz would argue for a similar set of views in his efforts to see the Kantian a priori through the lens of evolutionary biology (Lorenz 1941).

Although Spencer is sometimes credited with initiating the application of evolutionary thinking to culture, Spencer's contributions in this domain and others are often regarded as scientifically worthless (although see Jablonka and Lamb 2005, 372-3 for an exception). Ernst Mayr, for example, claimed that ‘It would be quite justifiable to ignore Spencer totally in a history of biological ideas because his positive contributions were nil’ (Mayr 1982, 386). Spencer is usually treated harshly for his adherence to the importance of ‘use-inheritance’, according to which habits initially learned are eventually inherited automatically in offspring. This form of inheritance would be classed by many as ‘Lamarckian’, in contrast to the ‘Darwinian’ forms of inheritance that are typically placed in the foreground in presentations of modern evolutionary theory.

Some recent modern theorists have argued that Lamarckian inheritance should not be dismissed out of hand (e.g. Jablonka and Lamb 1995). Whatever we think of this move, the tendency to praise Darwin while damning Spencer often overlooks the fact that Darwin, too, believed in the biological significance of use-inheritance, and it figured strongly in his own views of cultural evolution. Spencer is also criticised for his ‘social Darwinist’ beliefs, but Darwin, too, was a social Darwinist of sorts, and held evolutionary views regarding race, social degeneration and other such topics that most would dismiss today (see Lewens 2006, chapter eight). As we have seen, Darwin's theory of pangenesis was developed partly in order to explain what he took to be the phenomena of use-inheritance, and a general account of use-inheritance played an important role in Darwin's cultural evolutionary account of human moral progress. Indeed, at one point in the Descent of Man, Darwin quotes Spencer at length and with approval:

Our great philosopher, Herbert Spencer, has recently explained his views on the moral sense. He says, “I believe that the experiences of utility organised and consolidated through all past generations of the human race, have been producing corresponding modifications, which, by continued transmission and accumulation, have become in us certain faculties of moral intuition—certain emotions corresponding to right and wrong conduct, which have no apparent basis in the individual experience of utility.” (Darwin 1877/2004, 148)

4. Memes

Serious efforts to construct cultural evolutionary theories can be traced to the work of Lumsden and Wilson (1981), Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman (1981), and Boyd and Richerson (1985). All of these authors have attempted, in one way or another, to produce formal models that can integrate the effects of cultural inheritance into more standard biological models of evolution. We have already looked at some of the claims of these theorists, but before looking at their work in more detail, let us look at the theory of memetics. This theory, originally put forward by Richard Dawkins (1976), is perhaps the best known attempts to apply evolutionary thinking to culture. It seeks to draw a very strong analogy between evolution at the cultural level, and biological evolution. Memetics begins with an abstract characterisation of selection as a process requiring entities that reproduce, such that parents resemble offspring. Memetics takes the view, popularised by Dawkins, that entities which have the ability to make faithful copies of themselves—so-called ‘replicators’—are required to explain this trans-generational resemblance. In standard biological models of evolution it is assumed that genes are the relevant replicators. Genes make copies of themselves, and this ability explains why offspring organisms resemble their parents. If culture is to evolve, it therefore becomes necessary to find some form of cultural replicator that explains cultural inheritance. Memes play this role. Dawkins gives a list of some exemplary memes: ‘tunes, ideas, catch-phrases, clothes fashions, ways of making pots or of building arches.’ Note that while it is sometimes assumed that all memes are ideas (and vice versa) Dawkins's list includes other types of thing, such as ways of making pots, which are techniques.

Dawkins's claim is that ideas, for example, can be conceptualised as entities that hop from mind to mind, making copies of themselves as they go. On the face of things, this seems an attractive proposition. Just as genes make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments, so ideas make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments. In a community of scientists, for example, different hypotheses are entertained, and some come to be believed more widely than others. A hypothesis that begins in the mind of one or two scientists thereby spreads, until it is widely held in the research community. Another hypothesis quickly dies. We can perhaps characterise the features that make some hypotheses likely to spread, and others likely to perish. ‘Fit’ hypotheses may have predictive power, or simplicity, or they may integrate well with existing bodies of theory. Note that what this example shows is that taking the meme's-eye perspective does not literally show that we are being manipulated by selfish cultural replicators. One can describe scientific change as a struggle between selfish memes, but one can also describe just the same process in terms of scientists choosing to accept, or to reject, theories by reference to familiar criteria of explanatory power, theoretical elegance and so forth. It is only an incidental feature of the metaphor of memetic selfishness that appears to deprive humans of control over which ideas they do, and do not, accept.

5. Problems with Memes

There are various problems associated with memetic views, most of which focus on limitations of the gene/meme analogy. These worries are sometimes raised by theorists from the social sciences who are hostile to evolutionary theories of culture. But they are also raised quite frequently by cultural evolutionists who argue that the meme concept is not the right way to ground a theory of cultural evolution. Here are some of the most frequently encountered arguments against the meme concept (the remainder of this section draws on Lewens, 2006, Ch. 7):

Cultural units are not replicators: Replicators, remember, are supposed to be units that make copies of themselves. Some critics of the meme concept argue that there is no known mechanism that could explain how memes are copied. But this is a mistake. An idea can be copied simply through observation and inference: agent B can observe the behaviour of agent A, infer that A holds some belief X, and thereby come to hold the same belief as A. Ideas can also be copied using linguistic communication. Agent A might be convinced of belief X, she tells B about it, and B comes to believe X too. In both cases one can say that belief X makes a copy of itself, albeit via language, inference, and so forth. A more pressing worry for memetics is that imitation is usually too error-prone to underpin replication. If I make a cake on the basis of a secret family recipe, you eat the cake, and you then attempt to make another one, then the chances are that the recipe you hit upon will not, in fact, be exactly the same as the one I used, even if you are able to make a similar-tasting cake. Another significant worry for memetics is that when the same ideas do spread through a population, it is rarely because they are literally copied from each other. Sperber argues that cultural reproduction is rarely meme-like, but instead makes use of what he calls ‘attractors’—culturally shared patterns of thought, which enable representations to spread through a population without literal copying. Sticking with the cake example, perhaps you eat a slice of my Victoria sponge, you like it, and you decide to make one for yourself. Perhaps the recipe you use is very similar to mine. But you have not figured out by tasting my cake which ingredients needed to go in and in what order. Rather, you already knew how to make a Victoria sponge. Eating my cake simply triggered the use of a recipe that was already in your repertoire. In this case, the recipe has appeared in my head, and because of this it has appeared in yours, but not because your recipe is a copy of mine. Sperber argues that memetics is mistaken because most cases of the spread of ideas are like this:

… most cultural items are ‘re-produced’ in the sense that they are produced again and again—with, of course, a causal link between all these productions—but are not reproduced in the sense of being copied from one another…Hence they are not memes, even when they are close ‘copies’ of one another (in a loose sense of ‘copy’, of course). (Sperber 2000, 164–65)

Both of these concerns raise serious problems for the generality of memetics: not all ideas are replicators, hence not all ideas are memes. Whether this shows the meme concept to be useless depends on whether there are insights to be had by distinguishing cultural inheritance that is meme-like from cultural inheritance that is not (Sterelny 2006).

Cultural units do not form lineages: A closely-related criticism of memetics draws on the fact that while in genetic replication we can trace a new copy of a gene back to a single parent, ideas are rarely copied from a single source in a way that allows us to trace clear lineages (Boyd and Richerson 2000). Memeticists are fond of analysing religious belief in terms of the spread of memes. But while religious beliefs may well spread through populations of humans, it seems unlikely that we will always be able to trace token instances of faith back to one source. Of course, on some occasions religious believers may indeed be converted by a single evangelist. On other occasions individuals acquire belief in God through exposure to several believers in their local community. In these circumstances, belief in God is not caused by one identifiable earlier token of the same type. Within the realm of biological evolution, an understanding of Mendel's laws has been important in explaining some aspects of evolutionary dynamics. Mendel's laws rely on an understanding of genes as discrete, transmitted units. But if token ideas can appear in an individual in virtue of that individual's exposure to several sources or just one, then this makes it unlikely that anything close to Mendel's laws will be discovered within cultural evolution. This suggests a practical limitation on enquiry that may result from this disanalogy between ideas and genes.

Culture cannot be atomised into discrete units: Ideas stand in logical relations to each other. Whether an individual is able to acquire some belief, for example, depends on their related conceptual competencies. It is impossible to believe in the theory of relativity without understanding it, and one cannot understand it without holding many additional beliefs relating to physics. The same is true for non-technical beliefs. Depending on which religion one is talking about, belief in God is likely to be related to various other beliefs concerning forgiveness, retribution, love and so forth. This has led some critics to argue that it is a mistake to take a view of culture which atomises it into discrete units, assigning replicative power to them individually. The anthropologist Adam Kuper complains that ‘Unlike genes, cultural traits are not particulate. An idea about God cannot be separated from other ideas with which it is indissolubly linked in a particular religion’ (Kuper 2000, 180). Memeticists are likely to respond by saying that although ideas are inter-linked, this does not undermine the meme-gene analogy. For there is a sense in which genes, too, need to be studied in a context that takes other genes into account. A DNA sequence can have different effects in different organisms, depending on the network of relations it enters into with other genetic and developmental resources. Just as the significance of belief in God can vary with social context, with the result that it can make little sense to think of ‘belief in God’ as a meme, so the function of some DNA sequence can vary with organic context, with the result that it makes little sense to identify some sequence type as a gene for the purposes of evolutionary analysis.

These criticisms focus on whether there truly are memes. But there are also criticisms of the usefulness of the meme concept, regardless of whether memes exist. As was already indicated above, one might worry that memetics merely offers a cosmetic re-packaging of a familiar set of stories about cultural change. Perhaps science is composed of replicating entities struggling against various selection pressures, but what insight does this offer us, if in the end it presents us with nothing more than an alternative idiom in which to describe the various factors that affect the evaluation of scientific hypotheses? Perhaps clothes fashions are memes, but even if that is the case, one still needs to explain what makes one clothing meme fitter than another, and the fear is that once spelled out this will quickly boil down to a well-known appeal to consumer psychology.

6. Cultural Evolution without Memes

The most serious and most respected efforts to apply evolutionary thinking to culture begin from a different starting point to memetics. Meme theorists tend to begin with a general characterisation of evolution by natural selection, namely as a process that requires differential competition between replicators. Hence the meme theorist looks for some strict analogue to the gene in the cultural realm, which can play the replicator role. Dawkins implies that it is only because humans are subject to colonisation by replicators other than genes that human evolution escapes ‘the tyranny of the gene’. On this view, memes are required in order to free our species from a form of biological determinism.

The alternative to this view begins with the observation that cultural inheritance is important, and it seeks to integrate cultural inheritance into traditional evolutionary models. But this general motivation leaves open the issue of whether cultural evolution requires the existence of cultural replicators. Clearly one can accept many of the criticisms of the meme concept, and still attempt to model the effects of cultural inheritance. Rather than seek to show that there are cultural replicators, one can instead seek to build models that allow for error-prone learning, and that acknowledge that an individual's beliefs are often the result of exposure to many sources, rather than copying from just one source. The interest of cultural evolutionary models in this tradition is sometimes simply to show how cultural change of various sorts—not necessarily adaptive cultural change—can subsequently affect genetic evolution, and vice versa. This is the general goal of models of gene-culture co-evolution. But cultural evolutionary models also aim to assess the role of cultural inheritance in the construction of adaptation.

One might think that even if cultural change does not require cultural replicators, at least adaptive cultural change does. The general Darwin scheme for explaining adaptation demands reliable inheritance—it demands that once a fitness-augmenting mutation arises, it can be retained in future generations. If cultural learning is error-prone, or if individuals acquire cultural traits by taking an average of many different models, then one might think that if some individual is able to discover a fitness-enhancing behaviour, that trait will be lost to future generations either because it is mis-copied, or because it is combined with other less adaptive traits to produce an averaged mish-mash of a behaviour.

All of these inferences have been challenged by recent cultural evolutionary theory. Cultural evolutionists agree that at the level of the population, cumulative evolution requires that fitness-enhancing cultural traits are preserved in the offspring generation. However, they deny that this requires faithful transmission between individuals. A formal model from Henrich and Boyd (2002) shows how so-called ‘conformist bias’ can overcome the effects of error-prone learning to produce reliable inheritance at the population level. ‘Conformist bias’ is the tendency of individuals to adopt what they believe is the most common representation in a population. Henrich and Boyd cite evidence that conformist bias is a real phenomenon. Henrich and Boyd's theoretical model assumes that individuals are poor at inferring the representations of others. Even so, they argue that when we look to the population level, conformist bias helps to correct the effects of such errors, producing a population-wide distribution of representations in the offspring generation that is close to the population-wide distribution of representations in the parent generation. Henrich and Boyd explain the reason for this. In general, error-prone transmission has a tendency to produce a mixture of different representations. In a population that already contains several different representations at significant frequencies, the effect of error on a population-wide distribution of representations is therefore low. In a population in which one representation is common, the effects of error are much more significant. But if we add conformist bias, we increase the chances of a commonly held representation remaining commonly held in future generations, even with error-prone imitation.

Boyd and Henrich acknowledge that this does not make population-level distributions perfectly reliably inherited. But this does not show that cumulative evolution acting on cultural inheritance is impossible. At the genetic level, highly faithful copying processes allow even very small selective forces to preserve adaptive variation. Less faithful copying demands stronger selective forces if adaptive variation is not to be lost. Boyd and Henrich are confident that selective forces in the cultural realm are stronger than selective forces in the genetic realm. The moral, once again, is that it is important not to focus too closely on genetic evolution as a model for cultural evolution.

Boyd and Henrich also argue that a cultural evolutionary theory can accommodate Sperber's claim that cultural reproduction rarely works through genuine copying. Even if there is a small number of ‘attractors’—ways of thinking that we are particularly likely to adopt given some external stimulus—it does not follow that evolutionary models have no role to play. Most obviously, one can still argue that various selective forces affect which of a number of attractors comes to predominate in a population. Returning once again to the cake example, there may be attractors corresponding to Victoria Sponges, Ginger Cakes and Banana Bread. Even so, one can seek to understand why at a given moment in time more Victoria Sponges are being produced than Ginger Cakes, and the framework of cultural evolutionary theory, which looks to the factors that make individuals likely to be used as models for imitation, and the factors that make representations (recipes, in this case) likely to be emulated once a model is picked, can be used to explain this differential success without strict copying.

Memetics tends to be driven by a desire to see cultural analogies to genetic evolution. Cultural evolutionary models in the manner of Boyd and Henrich are driven instead by a desire to find ways of understanding how cultural inheritance affects evolutionary processes. These sorts of cultural evolutionary models do not assume that cultural inheritance works in the same way as genetic inheritance. Indeed, they are free to model cultural inheritance in ways that depart quite markedly from genetic inheritance. Yet they remain recognisably evolutionary in style, primarily because they seek to explain the changes in trait frequencies in a population over time. They do this by making broad assumptions about how individuals acquire cultural traits—for example, they may assume that an individual's representations are the product of learning from a variety of peers, or that they arise from attending particularly to authority figures—and by assessing how such rules will play out at the population level. Moreover, these rules for cultural acquisition are not merely conjectured, they are given experimental support. Cultural evolutionary theorists seek to document the effects of various empirically confirmed forms of bias, such as conformist bias and prestige bias. Just as Darwin's own theory of evolution by natural selection remained largely conjectural until supplemented by empirical work showing how inheritance worked, and by statistical work focusing on the population-level consequences of inheritance, selection, mutation and other forces, so cultural evolutionary theory has gained its insights from a similar combination of empirical and mathematical approaches.

7. The Explanatory Role of Cultural Evolutionary Theories

At the beginning of this entry it was claimed that the case for cultural evolution was irresistible. No one can deny that cultural inheritance is an important factor in explaining how our species has changed over time. Cultural inheritance is not merely a process that acts in parallel to genetic evolution, it is intertwined with genetic evolution. Cultural changes bring about alterations to the environment, which in turn affect both how genes act in development, and what selection pressures act on genes. In spite of all this, one might still worry that it is a mistake to understand the importance of culture using the tools of evolutionary theory. This is because one may be sceptical of the existence of a theory that is both general enough to cover all forms of cultural change, and informative enough to be enlightening.

There is no doubt that it is often important to remind overly-enthusiastic orthodox Darwinians of the importance of culture. For example, it seems that the increased incidence of lactose-tolerance among human populations has arisen as a consequence of a cultural innovation—namely dairy farming. The relatively recent appearance of this genetically-controlled adaptation demonstrates that human physiological nature is something that continues to change, and it also demonstrates the causal impact of culture on genes (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 191–92). Such examples by themselves show the rashness of any view that claims either that human nature has remained fixed since the Stone Age, or that genes are somehow in the evolutionary driving seat. Yet none of this shows that we can develop a general, informative theory of cultural evolution. One might fear that in the end cultural change, and the influence of cultural change on other aspects of the human species, are best understood through a series of individual narratives. Our brief examination of memetics illustrated this concern. We gain no real explanatory insight if we are told that ideas spread through populations, some more successfully than others. We want to know what makes some ideas fitter than others. And it is not clear that there will be any general rules that can help us to answer this question. In the biological realm we need detailed accounts of local environmental circumstances, species-specific physiology and anatomy, and so forth, to tell us what makes one organic variant fitter than another. Similarly, in the cultural realm we will need to look at local psychological dispositions to explain why some ideas are more likely to spread than others. So any explanatory value to be had from memetics is parasitic on conventional work done in psychology. And if individual preferences are subject to change over time, then there may be no general and informative theory of cultural evolution to be had; rather, we will have to settle for local explanations that look to shifting preferences. Rather than provide a new scientific framework for an understanding of culture, memetics will tend to degenerate into conventional narrative cultural history.

There are two broad sets of responses to this line of argument, each of which picks up on a different explanatory element of mainstream evolutionary theory. Boyd and Richerson argue that informative insights arise out of cultural evolution's ‘population thinking’ (Richerson and Boyd 2005). Sterelny (2001, 2003, 2006, forthcoming) argues that illuminating insights regarding the general conditions required for evolvability also apply in the cultural realm. We will look at each line of defence in turn.

8. Population Thinking

‘Population thinking’ means many things to many people. For Boyd and Richerson it denotes any effort to abstract from a characterisation of individual psychological profiles, in a way that allows an exploration of the consequences of these individual-level dispositions for population-level properties. We have already seen an example of this sort of population thinking in action. It is far from obvious that conformist bias among individuals can enable population-level inheritance in spite of individual-level errors in copying. To show that these properties of individual psychology (conformist bias and error-prone learning) combine to yield population-level inheritance requires some abstract mathematical modelling. And the establishment of this population-level consequence is important, for it enables the investigator to revise the constraints one might naively think must bear on cultural inheritance if cumulative cultural evolution is to occur.

In a useful article, Elliott Sober (1991) suggests that theories of cultural evolution may have limited value for the work of social scientists, on the grounds that social scientists are primarily interested in explaining what makes individuals likely to adopt one idea, rather than another. They want to know, for example, why nineteenth-century Italian women decided that they would rather have two children than five, not what the population-level consequences of their decisions might be. Richerson and Boyd respond by saying that Sober's argument assumes, erroneously, that ‘we are all good intuitive population thinkers’ (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 97). In Sober's original article he points out that population thinking might save cultural evolutionary models from vacuity in just this way:

So the question about the usefulness of these models of cultural evolution to the day-to-day research of social scientists comes to this: Are social scientists good at intuitive population thinking? If they are, then their explanations will not be undermined by precise models of cultural evolution. If they are not, then social scientists should correct their explanations (and the intuitions on which they rely) by studying these models. (Sober 1991, 492)

Many of Richerson and Boyd's models are enlightening. As we have seen, it takes work to show that cumulative cultural adaptation does not require replication. Note, however, in favour of Sober's scepticism, that the most interesting cultural evolutionary models are often those which show the general circumstances under which it is possible for cultural inheritance to be effective in producing adaptation. Boyd and Richerson's claim in favour of the importance of prestige bias is primarily an effort to show how natural selection might have favoured cultural learning. Sober's concern is with whether models such as these will also affect ‘the day-to-day research of social scientists’, who are not so interested in establishing such general conditions for cumulative cultural evolution, but who are instead interested in understanding particular episodes of social and cultural change. Even here, Richerson and Boyd's population thinking may have some bite. They seek, for example, to explain the disappearance of important technologies on Tasmania. Drawing on the work of Joseph Henrich, they suggest (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 138) that the maintenance of technologies and the associated behaviours required to produce and operate them may require a population that is large enough for the rate of innovation to offset the degradation that results from error-prone imitation. If Boyd and Richerson are right about this episode in the history of Tasmania, then we may be able to explain the differences in the abilities of the Tasmanians, compared with other peoples, to maintain a set of technologies, merely by citing population size, rather than other forms of social or cultural difference.

9. Evolvability

A second, related, way to vindicate models of cultural evolution looks to the question of the general features of inheritance systems that make for evolvability in a lineage. This project has been pioneered in recent years by Kim Sterelny (e.g. 2001, 2003, 2006, forthcoming). Once again, let us illustrate the general nature of these issues by beginning in the organic realm. Darwin's theory is intended to explain adaptation. The basic conditions for natural selection do not, in spite of appearances, suffice for the appearance of functional traits. A system in which offspring resemble parents with respect to fitness-enhancing traits may not develop complex adaptations. The environment needs to cooperate: if selective pressures change very quickly then there will be no sustained environmental demands of the sort that might build complex adaptations over time. Development also matters. If ontogeny is set up in such a way that changes to any one trait tend to be accompanied by changes to all other traits, then the chances are that cumulative adaptation will be particularly hard to come by. For even in those cases where a mutation contributes positively to the function of one trait, the chances are that it will contribute negatively to overall fitness in virtue of its disruption of the functioning of other traits. Development also needs to make a wide range of variation available. If it is highly constrained, so that only a small number of forms are possible, then selection is not presented with a broad enough range of raw materials from which to fashion complex traits. It also seems that cumulative adaptation relies on the suppression of ‘outlaws’ (Sterelny 2001). Group selection, for example, is often held to be an ineffective agent of group-level adaptation, on the grounds that it is vulnerable to ‘subversion from within’. This occurs when individual organisms go it alone, sabotaging complex features of group organisation in favour of their own fitness. Individual-level selection, in contrast, can build individual-level adaptations. This is because, by and large, genes in a given human organism share a ‘common fate’—they do not behave as though they were in direct competition, struggling for representation in future generations. When genes genuinely ‘go it alone’, for example by sabotaging meiosis so that some have greater chances of appearing in future generations than others, then the overall integrity of the organism can be compromised, and individual-level adaptation is undermined.

By applying these sorts of considerations to the cultural realm we can attempt to understand the likely costs and benefits associated with various different forms of cultural inheritance (vertical, horizontal, meme-like and so forth). We can also perhaps come to an understanding of the different evolutionary forces that might bring these different forms of cultural inheritance into existence. And, in turn, these insights may facilitate comparative work that seeks to document the general conditions that are required for a species to make use of cultural inheritance in order to build complex adaptations such as tools. This way of thinking offers the promise, for example, of explaining why few, if any, non-human species are able to build progressively more and more complex cultural features in a cumulative manner (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 107). The exploration of the significance of these conditions in the cultural realm is contentious, partly because the conditions for evolvability themselves are disputed. Boyd and Henrich's work brings out the fact that although population-level inheritance is important for adaptation, parent-offspring resemblance is not, in fact, necessary. Questions relating to evolvability are also tied up with difficult issues relating to the units-of-selection debate. As we have seen, natural selection at a higher level of organisation may be required to generate mechanisms that suppress the ability of disruptive ‘outlaws’ to go it alone at lower levels of organisation. Does something like this occur in the cultural realm? Does selection on human groups act so as to limit the ability of individual humans to go it alone? In what ways might cultural inheritance be involved in these processes? These questions are complex, both in terms of how they should be posed and how they should be answered. But some of the most interesting work in cultural evolutionary theory may come from efforts to answer them.

Issues relating to evolvability are sometimes framed in terms of systems of information transfer. On this view, if offspring are to resemble parents, developmental information must be transmitted from one generation to the next. The question is what forms of information transmission system do this job. This mode of framing the issue is contentious, for it is not always clear how we are to understand the concept of information, and what it means for some causal contributor to development to count as an information-bearer, rather than some other kind of developmental participant, such as an information-reader, say, or a background condition for information transfer (see Oyama 2000 and Griffiths 2001 for discussion of these issues). This general way of thinking about inheritance has, however, been influential in characterising so-called ‘major evolutionary transitions’ (Maynard Smith and Szathmary 1995). Key transitions in the history of life are said to include the development of DNA-based inheritance, the emergence of chromosomes, the advent of the ‘genetic code’, and events such as the arrival of sociality and language. Maynard Smith and Szathmary propose that we can think of these events as modifications to the mechanisms of inter-generational information transmission.

Jablonka and Lamb (2005) argue that thinking in terms of information transmission systems also allows us to point out salient differences in the forms of social transmission underlying cultural evolution. They claim that only some forms of social transmission make use of a system of symbols. Consider, for example, that to say that some birds inherit their song by social transmission is not to say that birdsong is a symbolic system. Humans, on the other hand, trade in publicly-accessible symbols. Moreover, repositories of symbols, most obviously in the form of libraries and computer databases, are vital inheritance systems for humans, allowing the preservation and accumulation of knowledge across generations. Note, also, that there are different types of symbol system. In some cases the relationship between a symbol and what is represented is arbitrary. The is the case for a word like ‘man’, which does not look or sound like a human male. In other cases of iconic symbolism, the relationship is one of resemblance: a sign for the gents' toilet looks like a man.

Jablonka and Lamb use the characteristic differences between typical modes of social inheritance in animals and humans to illuminate the impact our own symbolic transmission systems have on human cultural evolution (see also Deacon 1997). Although they argue that there can be non-linguistic symbolic systems (2005, 224), language exemplifies nicely the way in which systems of symbols contain elements that can be recombined in countless ways to yield a vast array of different meaningful messages. Repositories of symbolically stored information, such as books, can also be searched, annotated, edited and so forth, in ways that add to their power and versatility. This manner of thinking opens up a number of challenging issues. The question of the degree to which symbolic systems resemble other inheritance systems is an illuminating one. Consider, by way of example, Stegmann's (2004) discussion of the sense in which the genetic code is ‘arbitrary’. One quickly realises that any attempt to say precisely what makes some inheritance system a symbolic system, and any attempt to differentiate between types of symbolic systems (linguistic, non-linguistic and so forth), will be exceptionally philosophically demanding.


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Related Entries

Darwin, Charles | Darwinism | epistemology: evolutionary | evolution | heritability | James, William | natural selection | psychology: evolutionary | replication | Spencer, Herbert


The editors would like to thank Christopher von Bülow for carefully reading this entry and identifying a good number of typographical errors for correction.