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Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera

First published Mon Jul 2, 2007

Shem-Tov ben Joseph ibn Falaquera (ca. 1225–1295), sometime poet and Jewish philosopher, is generally overlooked in histories of Jewish philosophy and is not well known even by students in the field; yet few medieval Jewish philosophers matched his learning and knowledge of the writings of the ancient Greek and medieval Islamic and Jewish philosophers. Falaquera's primary goal seems to have been to interest and educate his co-religionists in philosophy and science, both for its own sake and for the sake of understanding Scripture properly. In so doing, he made important contributions to the history of Jewish philosophy.

1. Life

Not very much is known of Falaquera's life, apart from his writings. Most scholars believe that Falaquera was born and lived in Spain, but even this is not known with certainty (see Jospe, Torah and Sophia, 2–4). His approximate year of birth is calculated from his comment in Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh (9; trans. 2), written in October-November 1263 (Heshvan 5024), that he had passed the midpoint of seventy years and was approaching his fortieth year. His year of death is estimated from references in his last known writing, the letter in defense of Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed. The “midpoint” of life, mentioned by Falaquera in Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, may have had some significance for him. He explains there (11; trans. 5):

After his middle years, the rational soul awakens in him and converses with him. At that time, the life of the body is on the decline and, as physical existence approaches complete extinction, it descends lower and lower, while the soul rises higher and higher. Then the flames of confusion are extinguished, and the sun of the eternal soul shines forth.

Whether or not Falaquera himself went through some sort of mid-life crisis, he tells us that his book is a “bill of divorcement” from the poetry of his youth—an art in which, by his own account, he excelled and composed some 20,000 stanzas of rhymed verse, about half of which he wrote down. In the same breath he announces his betrothal to wisdom, with the implication that a bigamous attachment to both poetry and wisdom is not desirable and should not be tolerated. Falaquera's new attitude toward poetry reflects the concern with this art shared by ancient and medieval philosophers: Poetry is dangerous because it persuades men not by its content and its truth, but by its beauty and eloquence (on Falaquera's attitude toward poetry, see Harvey, Falaquera's Epistle, 128–132). While Falaquera seems, for the most part, indeed to have abandoned writing poetry, he was hardly faithful to her, even in his youth. He openly acknowledges his flirtation with wisdom in Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, listing seven works that he calls “the progeny of my thoughts during my early years” (12; trans., 7–8). It is hard to know how seriously to take such proclamations, although it is certainly true that Falaquera's two lengthy philosophic works, the encyclopedic De‘ot ha-Filosofim and his commentary on Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed, are not listed among these writings. The latter work was written in 1280 (5040) (Moreh ha-Moreh, 365), and is certainly one of his most mature writings. Steinschneider wrote of this work that the “abundance of its citations was sufficient to confer on those who copied from it the appearance of great erudition” (Hebraeischen Übersetzungen, 422), and the same can be said regarding the De‘ot ha-Filosofim. An additional point of interest for Falaquera's biography is his plaint in Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh (11-12; trans., 7-8) of the “difficult times under the powerful hand of the non-Jewish nations who prevailed over us.” This is a theme found in several of his works, and apparently the subject of his lost Megillat ha-Zikkaron. It is a stark reminder today of the background against which medieval Jewish thinkers such as Falaquera engaged in their writing and study.

Jospe makes a reasoned attempt at a chronology of Falaquera's writings, based in part on Falaquera's listing in Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, but it is not completely convincing (Torah and Sophia, 31–33). For example, it is not clear that Falaquera's listing of books is itself chronological and complete. Moreover, it is possible that a reference in one book to another may be a later addition and not necessarily an indication of which book was written first. An important factor that must be considered in any future attempt to fix the chronology of Falaquera's writings is the technical terms he uses and the wording of his translations from other authors. As Jospe himself points out in his book, Falaquera paid great attention to terminology and chose his philosophic terms carefully (18–29). He also, in the course of his career, changed his preference for certain Hebrew words that translate key Arabic philosophic terms. This can be seen most clearly by comparing his different translations in different works of the same Arabic passages. Consider, for example, Shelemut ha-Ma‘asim, the first six chapters of which comprise an abridged Hebrew version of the Summa Alexandrinorum, an epitome of Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics. The language here differs from Falaquera's citations from the Summa in his youthful Sefer ha-Ma‘alot. On the other hand, Falaquera's citations from the Summa in the Moreh ha-Moreh seem to be drawn from his own Shelemut ha-Ma‘asim. Thus the Sefer ha-Ma‘alot was written before theShelemut ha-Ma‘asim, which was written before the Moreh ha-Moreh.

2. Falaquera as popularizer

Scholars of the past century have, in general, been quick to dismiss Falaquera as a mediocre and unoriginal thinker, and thus hardly worthy of our attention. While it is no doubt true that Falaquera himself did not seek originality, research of the past few decades has shown him to be a remarkably industrious, well-read, and impressive scholar. Moreover, in certain respects, as we shall see, Falaquera was quite original. That Falaquera did not seek originality is clear from his own statements. For example, he writes in his introduction to Reshit Hokhmah (9):

Most of my words concerning the sciences in this book are the words of the leading philosophers and experts. I have myself not added anything new other than to gather [their words] from their books.

What then was he trying to do in such compilations? Falaquera's agenda is clearly seen in his delightful little treatise, Iggeret ha-Vikkuah (The Epistle of the Debate), whose subtitle is: “In Explanation of the Agreement that Exists between the Law and Wisdom.” At the outset of this treatise he makes known that its purpose is “to explain that the study of the true sciences by whoever is worthy of them and whom God in his mercy has favored with an intellect to discover their depths is not prohibited from the point of view of our Law, and that the truth hidden in them does not contradict a word of our belief” (56; trans., 14–15) Unlike the first two great Jewish Aristotelian philosophers of the century before him, Abraham Ibn Daud and Maimonides, who sought in the introductions to their philosophico-theological works to dissuade the unworthy from reading on, Falaquera wished to awaken his co-religionists to the importance of philosophy. Falaquera, like his distinguished predecessors, realized that philosophy is not for everyone. He explicitly stated that it “is not necessary for all men, but for the one who is meticulous in his faith and endeavors to ascend the rank of the perfect man and to conceive what he conceives by way of the intellect, not by way of the imagination. As for the others who do not perceive this degree, tradition without their knowing the reason is sufficient” (65; trans., 29). Yet, there is a definite sense that Falaquera believed that philosophy could be of benefit to a far greater percentage of Jews than Ibn Daud or Maimonides thought. His Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, which is intended as an introduction to philosophy, provides a good indication of this. It is a dialogue between a scholar and a pietist, both observant Jews, in which the scholar—who investigates the secrets of wisdom and studies the philosophic books—tries to persuade the pietist—who considers such books a stumbling-block and cause of heresy and therefore forbidden—of the permissibility and desirability of philosophic study. The pietist is not perplexed and would certainly not be considered by Maimonides among the few for whom he intended the Guide, yet he is the type of reader Falaquera seeks to win over to philosophy. There may have been an additional reason for Falaquera's interest in persuading the pietist. Falaquera wrote during the respite between the Maimonidean controversy of the 1230s and the controversy that culminated in 1305 with the ban issued by Solomon ibn Adret against the study of Greek philosophy and science by anyone under the age of twenty-five. In writing the Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, he was influenced by the epistolary debate of the former controversy between David Kimhi and Judah Alfakhar, and apparently sought in his dialogue to have his scholar accomplish what Kimhi and the other Maimonideans could not. Perhaps he hoped that if he could counter in his debate the real objections of the anti-Maimonideans with sensitive convincing responses, he could persuade future anti-rationalists of the religious importance of philosophy and the sciences and that the study of them was permissible and required of those who had the intellectual ability to undertake it (Harvey, “Maimonidean Controversy of the 1230s”). If he wished thereby to prevent future such controversies, he did not succeed (cf. in this connection, his much later Mikhtav ‘al Devar ha-Moreh, in defense of Maimonides' Guide). In any case, by the end of the dialogue, the scholar indeed convinces the pietist, and promises to write for him three books: Reshit Hokhmah, Sefer ha-Ma‘alot, and De‘ot ha-Filosofim. Falaquera in fact wrote this trilogy. These works condense into three volumes the finest writings of the Greco-Islamic philosophic tradition and offer the Hebrew reader a rich program of education, beginning with a classification of the sciences and culminating with an encyclopedia of Aristotelian natural science and metaphysics. For Falaquera, philosophy and science are necessary for a complete and true understanding of the Divine Law and for the attainment of ultimate human felicity. His goal in the trilogy seems to have been to interest his fellow Jews in philosophy and science and then to educate them by making available to them the choicest fruits of the philosophic tradition in a form and language they could understand. The Iggeret ha-Vikkuah was one attempt at leading his readers to philosophy and the path to perfection. Another attempt—quite well known to students of Hebrew literature—whose maqâmah form bespeaks the author's desire to reach a wide audience and popularize philosophy, was his Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, the tale of a young man's search for wisdom. The search concludes with the seeker's encounter with a philosopher.

3. Falaquera as paraphraser

Falaquera sought to make available in Hebrew the most important writings of the Greek and Islamic philosophers. Interestingly, Falaquera rarely simply translated a text and rarely identified his precise source. A good illustration of this is Falaquera's Reshit Hokhmah. His intention in this book is to treat concisely “whatever the seeker of wisdom needs to apprehend at the beginning of his studies” (9). He divides it into three parts. Part one is on the moral virtues, for as Falaquera explains, “Whoever wishes to engage in the study of science and to apprehend its truth must begin to accustom himself to the moral virtues” (10). This part blends Biblical verses and rabbinic sayings with short passages from the Summa Alexandrinorum and concludes with a pseudo-Aristotelian letter. The second part is an enumeration of the sciences, which is primarily an abridged version of Alfarabi's Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm (Enumeration of the Sciences), but also incorporates other writings by Alfarabi such as his Kitâb al-hurûf (Book of Letters) and small sections from Avicenna's Fî aqsâm al-‘ulûm al-‘aqliyyah (On the Division of the Rational Sciences). Falaquera integrates these texts into his version of Alfarabi's enumeration of the sciences in order to make a new coherent work, which provides important material not present in his primary text. Thus, for example, chapters 2 and 4 from part 2 of Reshit Hokhmah, “On How Language Originates in a Nation” and “On How the Sciences Originate among Men” — the two selections from the Kitâb al-hurûf — introduce respectively chapters 3 on language and chapters 5–9 on logic and the sciences — chapters translated from Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm. For another example, a section on political science from Avicenna's division of the sciences follows the parallel discussion in Alfarabi, and provides the reader with the traditional Aristotelian division of practical science into governance of the city, governance of the household, and governance of oneself or ethics. Part 3 of Reshit Hokhmah, on explaining that philosophy is necessary for the attainment of true happiness, is an abridged translation of Alfarabi's trilogy on the philosophy of Plato and Aristotle. In this part, Falaquera focuses on the Alfarabian texts he is presenting and incorporates no other texts, but through a judicious choice of what to translate and what not, Falaquera is able to adapt the works to suit his own purposes. Thus, he omits from his paraphrase Alfarabi's controversial statements on the relation between philosophy and religion, such as those that suggest that philosophy alone is necessary for human happiness and perfection, and that religion is an imitation of philosophy that is useful for teaching and governing the multitude, but does not contribute to the perfection of the philosopher's intellect (see Harvey, “Falaquera's Alfarabi”). Another aspect of Falaquera's paraphrasing of texts is his occasional Judaizing of his sources through the insertion of Biblical or Talmudic citations and references or the addition of Jewish material. An example of the latter is in the beginning of Reshit Hokhmah, part 2, where he adds to Alfarabi's list of benefits of an enumeration of sciences that it makes clear that these sciences do not contradict the Torah and that it is permissible for Jews to study them. It may be added that Falaquera's Hebrew abridgements of Alfarabi's books in parts two and three are not attributed to their author; Falaquera simply explains that all “these words on the sciences are the words of Aristotle or those philosophers of his school” (61). Falaquera's selective translation of texts and his not mentioning his sources give him the leeway to alter the content and message of those texts in ways that are not possible for faithful translators.

While in books like Reshit Hokhmah (particularly parts 2 and 3), Falaquera basically pieces together abridged versions of books by others without mentioning their names, the Sefer ha-Ma‘alot – the book that follows Reshit Hokhmah in the trilogy — is filled with numerous short quotations, most of which are attributed to an author, such as Plato, Aristotle (although often in connection with citations from the Summa Alexandrinorum and the Pseudo-Aristotle, Theology of Aristotle), Alfarabi, and Maimonides, or to the Philosopher (by which he usually means Ibn Bâjjah) or to the Scholar (by which he usually means Averroes). This work is also replete with quotations from the Bible and rabbinic literature

4. Falaquera as an encyclopedist

Falaquera's use of his sources is a bit different in his De‘ot ha-Filosofim, one of the first Hebrew encyclopedias of science and philosophy, and the third book of the trilogy. Falaquera states his goals and methods in his encyclopedia in his introduction.

I endeavored to translate these opinions [of the philosophers] from Arabic to Hebrew, and to compile them from the books that are scattered there, so that whoever wishes to grasp these [opinions] will find them in one book, and will not need to weary himself by reading all the books [on these subjects], for all the opinions [of the philosophers], general and particular, on natural science and divine science are included in this composition. … There is not a word in this entire composition that I say of my own; rather all that I write are the words of Aristotle as explained in the commentaries of the scholar Averroes, for he was the last of the commentators and he incorporated what was best from the [earlier] commentaries.

Falaquera's goal in the encyclopedia, his longest work, was to make possible the serious study of the sciences by his fellow Jews. The encyclopedia is divided into two parts, one on the natural beings and one on the divine ones. The first part basically follows the traditional order of Aristotle's books on natural science. When Falaquera writes that there “is not a word in this entire composition that I say of my own,” he is hardly exaggerating. His main source in the work is usually the middle commentaries of Averroes or his epitomes when the middle commentaries were not available. These texts are often translated literally, but with no hesitation to abridge them and to blend them with other sources, in particular other commentaries by Averroes, for the sake of clarification or completeness. Short passages from other works and other authors are inserted when it suits Falaquera's purposes. But apart from connecting phrases, references to other parts of the book, and occasional attributions, there is indeed hardly a word that is Falaquera's own. It is thus remarkable that Falaquera was often able to improve upon his sources and even intentionally part from them solely through his combining of texts. It has been shown, for example, that “by advisedly and creatively combining [Averroes'] commentaries [on the Meteorology],” Falaquera was able to present an account of Aristotle's teachings clearer than that of either of Averroes' commentaries [Fontaine, “Why Is the Sea Salty?” 213–218], and that by inserting a brief passage from Avicenna into his abridged paraphrase of Averroes' Epitome of the Parva naturalia, he was able to provide a response to Averroes' argument therein that theoretical knowledge cannot be acquired in dreams [Harvey, “Falaquera's De‘ot ha-Filosofim,” 232-233]. Other such examples abound, but can usually be detected only through a careful comparison of the encyclopedia with its sources. Falaquera's intended reader, who did not know Arabic, would thus have been unaware of his skill and particular goals in weaving together his sources, but this would not have bothered Falaquera. He had a far greater goal in mind. The De‘ot ha-Filosofim presents the reader with an ambitious and comprehensive account of Aristotelian science and philosophy, indeed the first full in-depth treatment of Aristotelian science in Hebrew.

5. Falaquera as a commentator

Reference has been made to Falaquera's Moreh ha-Moreh, one of the first commentaries on Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed. The commentary is not on the entire book, but on only a little over a quarter of its chapters. Yet Maimonides had urged readers of the Guide “not to comment upon a single word of it and not to explain to another anything in it.” Falaquera was aware of this plea, but also knew that people were already misreading and misinterpreting the text. His own commentary is the first scholarly study of Maimonides' philosophic sources, a topic that continues to engage scholars to this day. The knowledge of these sources – usually cited by Falaquera by name or epithet – and Maimonides' agreement or disagreement with them is essential for a proper understanding of the Guide. Like the Deot ha-Filosofim, most of the commentary is pieced together from translated passages from other works, although here in the commentary he allows himself to comment, usually briefly and in his own name, on these passages. In addition to translating these sources, Falaquera retranslated his selections from the Guide

It is noteworthy that Falaquera speaks explicitly in his own name in the commentary, but rarely in most of his other works. Shiffman characterizes Falaquera in the commentary as a “critical thinker who does not hesitate to disagree with those he cites, accepting only those opinions which he considers philosophically sound” (“Falqerah As Interpreter,” 7 [219]). On occasion Falaquera disagrees with and even criticizes Maimonides. At times the sources cited by Falaquera strengthen Maimonides' views and at times they part from them. The idea to explain the Guide and its teachings through citations of Maimonides' possible sources is the great innovation of the commentary. Usually these passages speak for themselves with only short comments added by Falaquera. Occasionally he is more verbose, but even when not, there is a sense that he is considering the passage at hand carefully to determine to what extent Maimonides followed its teachings and to what extent he himself should. This is one of Falaquera's last writings and likely the most useful of his books for discerning his own views on theological-philosophical matters, such as creation from eternal matter; God's will; the negation of corporeality, privation, and potentiality with regard to God; the nature of prophecy; the possibility of conjunction with the Active Intellect; and the ultimate and intermediate causes in nature, will, and chance.

6. Falaquera as an exegete

Falaquera in his various writings shows great familiarity with the Bible and rabbinic literature. It is possible to understand quite a bit from these books on how Falaquera read the Bible. In general, Falaquera repeatedly states that he views the Torah as a source of truth, and that its teachings are in accord with the true teachings of philosophy and science for which there are demonstrative proofs. In other words, if the Torah seems to contradict something that has been proven demonstratively, the passage in the Torah needs to be interpreted. Indeed, for Falaquera, philosophy is at times necessary for the correct interpretation of Scripture. The correct interpretation of it is not always apparent, but philosophy can help us to uncover it. Moreover, for Falaquera, Scripture is replete with scientific teachings and allusions (Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, 69-71; trans., 34-37). On the other hand, he never tires of reiterating in almost all his works that if a statement of the philosophers contradicts something from the Torah, we reject it. A close examination of Falaquera's proof texts in his various writings reveals his methods of Biblical interpretation. For example, the allegorical interpretation of Prov. 27:26 and Song of Songs 4:11 as referring to the need to conceal certain profound matters from the many (Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, 74; trans., 42); or the reading of Jer. 9:22 as referring to man's confusing the pseudo-perfections for the true one (Reshit Hokhmah, 72); or the understanding of Prov. 25:5 as teaching that man needs divine help in order to attain the truth (Iggeret ha-Halom, 488); or simply taking Ps. 31:20, 27:13, and 69:29 to each be referring to man's eternal life (Sefer ha-Ma‘alot, 15).

A clearer picture of Falaquera as an exegete may be drawn from the recent editions and translations of extant passages from his lost commentaries on the Bible (Jospe, Torah and Sophia, 468–484, and Jospe and Schwartz, “Falaquera's Lost Bible Commentary,” 186–200).

Here one can see Falaquera's focus on understanding the meaning of certain equivocal terms in Scripture; on explicating certain ambiguous terms; on providing scientific explanations of certain terms; on pointing out that certain verses must be taken metaphorically; and on suggesting the inner meaning (‘inyan penimi) when appropriate. At times Falaquera strove to understand and explain the literal meaning of the verse, while at other times he sought to uncover its allegorical interpretation and secret meaning.

7. Conclusion: Falaquera as a philosopher

Shem-Tov Falaquera sought to interest his fellow Jews in philosophy and science and to make available to them in Hebrew the most important teachings of the ancient Greek and medieval Islamic philosophers. As is clear from his encyclopedia of science, he was an Aristotelian, and like virtually all post-Maimonidean Jewish Aristotelians, his two leading philosophic authorities were Averroes and Maimonides. Nonetheless, he had an open mind and seems to have been influenced also by Neoplatonic writings. This is most evident from his decision to prepare Hebrew versions of Ibn Gabirol's Fons vitae and Pseudo-Empedocles' Five Substances, and from his many citations from Ibn Gabirol in his Moreh ha-Moreh (see Shiffman's intro., 83–85). He knew the works of the Islamic falâsifah better than any Jewish thinker of his time, and made many of them available to the Hebrew reader – often without attribution (as in Reshit Hokhmah); yet he was not hesitant to modify unobtrusively their texts when it suited his purposes. In this way, for example, he turned Alfarabi's account of the origin of philosophic religion into a discussion of the origin of the virtuous city (Harvey, “Falaquera's Alfarabi,” 104–109).

Falaquera did not seek originality, yet was quite creative in his presentation of philosophy and science. He was, for example, one of the first Hebrew authors to write a philosophic dialogue, an encyclopedia of science and philosophy, a commentary on the Guide of the Perplexed, and poetic philosophic tales. His method of seamlessly blending various philosophic texts together to form a coherent whole is perhaps unique to him. But the fact is that his most important works are comprised of Hebrew versions of the writings of others. We have seen that his personal views on theological-philosophical matters may be discerned from his Moreh ha-Moreh, particularly when he speaks in his own name. Yet even in his earlier works, he often asserted his personal views, but he usually let his sources do the talking. When proper care is taken in the study of these works not to jump to conclusions regarding his views on the basis of his translations, it is possible to uncover his own theology. The role played by his occasional critical comments in his commentary is played by the selection, blending, and abridgment of sources in the earlier works. The theology derived from such careful study of his translations and from his commentary may not always accord completely with that expressed in his more popular independent treatises (such as the Iggeret ha-Vikkuah and Iggeret ha-Halom), where he explicitly maintains the existence and unity of God, His knowledge of particulars, His providence over human individuals, His creation of the world, divine prophecy, miracles, reward and punishment, and eternal life, which is the World to Come. Scholars will no doubt debate his views on particular topics, but the thinker who emerges from virtually all his writings is a moderate Maimonidean, committed to the essential harmony between the true teachings of Torah and those of philosophy.

The problem of creation of the world is a good illustration of a topic where Falaquera seems to convey different opinions in different works. In his popular introductory works, Falaquera writes that among the true opinions of the Torah is that God “brought into existence the rest of the existents from non-existence” (Iggeret ha-Halom, 489), that it is the “root of the Torah to believe that there is a Creator of the world … and He brought into existence all the created beings from nothing, and to believe that the world is produced and is not eternal” (Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, 65), and that while most of the philosophers disagree with our beliefs concerning creation, some of them actually do “believe in the production [of the world], but not in the way that we believe in it” (Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, 77; trans., 46). He thus seems to propound a view of creation ex nihilo, while acknowledging that most philosophers believe in eternity, although some believe in creation, but in a way different than we do, that is perhaps, creation from eternal matter. Falaquera does state in these works that knowledge of the true sciences is needed to comprehend the secrets of the Torah (e.g., Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, 70-72). One could wonder that if knowledge of philosophy and science is necessary for understanding the secrets of the Torah and if creation is one of these secrets, why the philosophers do not believe in it “in the way that we believe in it.” In the Moreh ha-Moreh, Falaquera clearly states that among the divine secrets is “how God, may He be exalted, created the created beings” (116). In this commentary, perhaps of all Falaquera's writings the least likely to be read by the multitude, he reveals his own opinion that the world is not created from nothing. His precise view is debated, but he seems to hold that the world is created from eternal matter, a view that Maimonides had ascribed to Plato. In his introduction, he suggests that Plato's view that the world is created and never destroyed derives from the Sages, but since the Sages knew the true interpretation of the Torah, this would seem to mean that Plato's view was the true one (117). Later in the commentary, he repeats this view and writes that it appears to him that “Plato's opinion inclines toward the opinion of our holy Torah” (259, on Guide II, 13). A bit later in the chapter he writes explicitly (261):

It appears to me that there is no need to say that the Creator, may He be exalted, brought into existence the existent from non-existence [me-ha-he‘der], but rather that he brought it into existence after complete non-existence, for this is possible according to our faith. Therefore, those that say that He, may He be exalted, brought [the world] into existence from nothing [do] not [express] a precise belief; rather, He brought it into existence after nothing, that is, He brought it into existence after the thing did not exist.

In other words, Falaquera in the context of his commentary on Maimonides' Guide reveals his own view on creation of the world, one of the secrets of the Torah. This view differs from the one commonly held in the Jewish community of his time, which he himself called a root and true opinion of the Torah in his more popular works. The view presented in the commentary – for Falaquera, the true interpretation of the teaching of the Torah and a precise formulation of it – still speaks of God's creation, not ex nihilo, but rather after non-existence (ahar ha-he‘der) or after privation of form. In other words, it appears that for Falaquera, creation is through informing prime matter (cf. Shiffman, “Falqerah As Interpreter,” 7–14 [220]). This interpretation of Falaquera's teaching is strengthened by his explanation of ‘creation’ (beri‘ah) in his Commentary on the Torah: “The word ‘creation’ teaches creation of the substance and quiddity of the thing, through which it is what it is … for the giving of the spirit to the bodies of this world is called ‘creation’. … [God] gives all creatures substantive form, that is, specific form, by which the thing is distinguished from something else” (Jospe, Torah and Sophia, 468). For Falaquera then, some of the philosophers do share a view of creation of the world precisely “in the way that we believe in it.”

The importance of Falaquera for the history of philosophy is not, however, in his personal beliefs regarding theological-philosophical subjects. It is rather in his broad and profound knowledge of the teachings of the ancient and medieval philosophers, his mastery of their science, his commitment to the ultimate accord between their true teachings and the correctly interpreted teachings of the Torah, and his life-long effort to interest his fellow Jews in science and philosophy and to make their teachings available to them.


Shem-Tov ibn Falaquera was a prolific author. Most of his philosophic works and translations are extant and have been edited at least once. In fact, the only extant work of Falaquera's that has not been edited and printed is his encyclopedia of science and philosophy, De‘ot ha-Filosofim (The Opinions of the Philosophers), which is extant in two manuscripts. Falaquera mentions in his writings books of his that are no longer extant: Megillat ha-Zikkaron (Scroll of Remembrance), in which “I spoke of our trials of the past, for at present, hordes of afflictions come upon us daily” (Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh, 12; trans., 7]); Sefer ha-Derash, apparently a philosophic commentary on the Midrashim (Moreh ha-Moreh, II, 26, 287); a Commentary on the Torah and a Commentary on other books of the Bible (Moreh ha-Moreh, introduction, 116), and a Commentary on Proverbs (Moreh ha-Moreh, addendum chap. 1, 337; cf. Reshit Hokhmah, 10, and Sefer ha-Ma‘alot, 39). He also expresses his intention to write aCommentary on Ecclesiastes (Iggeret ha-Vikkuah, 71; trans., 37). Passages from Falaquera's lost Bible commentaries and perhaps also from his Sefer ha-Derash have been preserved in two writings of Samuel ibn Sarsa. These have been edited and translated in Jospe, Torah and Sophia, 468–484 (from Ibn Sarsa's Meqor Hayyim) and in Jospe and Schwartz, “Falaquera's Lost Bible Commentary,” 186–200 (from Ibn Sarsa's Mikhlol Yofi).

Below is a list of editions and translations of Falaquera's works. References above are to the first edition listed. For a description of these works and for information on additional editions of them, see Jospe, Torah and Sofia, 31–76. Where editions are available on-line without charge, I have provided the URL. Some of these editions are quite faulty and must be checked against the modern critical editions (where available). A selected list of the secondary literature follows that of Falaquera's writings. The past decades have seen a dramatic increase in studies on various aspects of Falaquera's philosophic writing. In part, this is due to Colette Sirat, whose History of Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages (in various languages) was the first history to discuss Falaquera's thought and to recognize the importance of lesser known Jewish philosophers for the history and development of Jewish thought. In general, special attention may be paid to the writings of the following present day scholars who have carefully studied the philosophy and science of Falaquera: Bruno Chiesa, Resianne Fontaine, Steven Harvey, Raphael Jospe, Yair Shiffman, and Mauro Zonta.

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Related Entries

Al-Farabi | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, historical and methodological topics in: influence of Arabic and Islamic Philosophy on Judaic thought | Ibn Daud, Abraham | Ibn Rushd | Maimonides