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Influence of Arabic and Islamic Philosophy on Judaic Thought

First published Mon Dec 10, 2007

The influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on Judaic thought has never been studied as a whole: as a matter of fact, in recent times it has not yet been the object of a comprehensive and detailed analysis, apart from that made in a general article (Zonta 1997a). That article concentrated on some particular subjects of this influence, i.e. on the quotations, translations and interpretations of the texts written by some Arabo-Islamic philosophers (the Brethren of Purity, Avicenna, and Averroes), but did not include other authors, as al-Kindi, al-Ghazali or Ibn Bajja, nor some minor figures which left some traces in Medieval Jewish philosophy. Of course, the question of the general influence of Arabo-Islamic philosophers on a prominent author as Maimonides has been examined in specific articles (see in particular Pessin 2007); however, this has not happened in the case of other Jewish authors, although a number of more or less explicit or implicit references to Medieval Arabic and Islamic philosophy have been found by modern scholars in many Jewish authors, active in the period 900-1500: among the most well-known of them, are Jacob al-Qirqisani, Isaac Israeli, Solomon Ibn Gabirol, Bahya Ibn Paquda, Abraham bar Hiyya, Joseph Ibn Zaddik, Moses Ibn Ezra, Judah Halevi, Abraham Ibn Daud, Moses Maimonides, Samuel Ibn Tibbon, Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, Levi ben Gershom (Gersonides), Moses Narboni, and Hasdai Crescas. Usually, the discovery of these references has not driven modern scholars to arrive at even tentative conclusions about the real extent of this influence and the ways of its spreading among Jewish authors, apart from some particular cases – for example, that of Arabic sources of 14th-century Jewish logic in Provence (see Zonta 1997b).

Due to the complexity of the theme and the substantial shortage of previous works especially and systematically devoted to it, a comprehensive, if not detailed, analysis of the influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on Judaic thought should observe some limits. The concept of “influence” in itself should be restricted to the cases where a direct and evident, if not necessarily explicit, employment of Arabic and Islamic sources by Jewish authors has been or can be clearly ascertained. (For example, it is well-known that Maimonides directly knew and employed a number of Arabic philosophical sources, but it should be admitted that, in many cases, Late Medieval Jewish authors knew and employed these sources not directly, but through Maimonides.) However, this analysis should not limit itself to the cases when the text (or the texts) of an author were merely “translated” into Hebrew or literally quoted in their Arabic originals. These cases have been studied in some books (Steinschneider 1893, Zonta 1996) and in a number of recent articles (see a summary of their contents in Zonta 2003, 543-560), but such analysis should now spread to the cases where these texts were commented on and in some cases directly and actually employed by Jewish thinkers for building up their own philosophy. (In that regard, it should be noted that many Late Medieval Jewish philosophers seem to have known Avicenna's philosophy; in reality, some of them might have known it not directly, but mostly through al-Ghazali – as might have happened even in the case of Maimonides too.) A historical examination of this influence should proceed not according to the main lines of the history of Jewish philosophy, but according to the chronological order of the various Arabic and Islamic philosophers who were read by Jewish authors, either in their original texts, or in Medieval Hebrew translations, or in some cases even in Medieval Latin versions – and it should be clear that Jewish philosophers apparently did not employ as sources Arabic authors active after 1200 circa. Such examination should consider that “Arabic philosophy” and “Islamic philosophy” cannot be totally identified, but their relationship appears at times to be just like the intersection of two not completely identical concepts. (For example, some major works of Islamic philosophy like Avicenna's The Book of Science [Danesh name], were written in Persian, while there were some Medieval Christian philosophers active in the Near East who wrote their works in Arabic, and who should better be put among the cases of “influence of [Christian-]Arabic philosophy on Judaic thought”.)

1. al-Kindi

The traces of the influence of al-Kindi (796-866) on Medieval Judaic thought appear to have been rather scanty, apart from some quotations and passages surely taken from his works, and from one of them in particular; in any case they appeared to have been substantially limited to the first period of it, when the influence of Neoplatonism (or, better, of the first Arabo-Islamic Aristotelianism, where a key role was played by Plotinus and Proclus as interpreters of metaphysics) shows to have been stronger. As a matter of fact, rather than speaking of al-Kindi's influence on Judaic thought, one should speak of a sort of Jewish “Kindism” through the influence of some of al-Kindi's Arabic (in particular Christian Arabic) followers (see below, 11).

The first traces of al-Kindi's influence have been found in Jacob al-Qirqisani, a Karaite Jewish author living in Mesopotamia (where al-Kindi himself was living one century before) in the first half of the 10th century. In al-Qirqisani's main published non-philosophical work, the Book On the Lights and On the Guard Towers (Kitab al-anwar wa-l-maraqib), a study of the legal parts of the Pentateuch, Georges Vajda identified some passages of al-Kindi's Epistle On the Quiddity of the Sleep and the Vision (Risala fi mahiyya al-nawm wa-l-ru'ya), who al-Qirqisani would have employed for his description of the concept of “sleep” (Vajda 1941-1945, 115-122). Other traces of a philosophical work by al-Kindi, his Epistle On the Cause Producing Ebb and Flow (Risala fi l-‘illa al-fa‘ila li-l-madd wa-l-jazr), have been found by Bruno Chiesa in a passage about the world's creation in al-Qirqisani's most important (and still unpublished) theological-philosophical work, the Book of Gardens (Kitab al-riyad), a study of the non-legal parts of the Pentateuch (Chiesa 1989, 95). Of course, a complete analysis of al-Qirqisani's own “philosophy”, as found in the latter work, is still needed, so that the real force of al-Kindi's influence on his thought can be evaluated.

After al-Qirqisani, other traces of al-Kindi's philosophical influence can be found in later Jewish thinkers. The most important of them appears in Isaac Israeli, living in Egypt and Tunisia between ca. 850 and 950 (according to other scholars, between ca. 830 and 932). One of Israeli's main philosophical works, his Book of Definitions (Kitab al-hudud), is substantially a Jewish adaptation of al-Kindi's work on the same subject, the Epistle On Definitions and Descriptions of Things (Risala fi hudud al-ashya’ wa-rusumiha): Israeli adapted to the Jewish readers and sometimes commented on a number of al-Kindi's own definitions of philosophical and theological terms – as it has been shown by Samuel Miklos Stern (Altmann and Stern 1958, 3-78). Israeli's employment of al-Kindi's philosophy for building his own philosophical work appears to be the most relevant case of al-Kindi's influence on Medieval Jewish philosophy. A second case is that of Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera (1225-1295 circa), a Spanish Jewish philosopher who wrote a number of works by fitting quotations (translated into Hebrew and occasionally adapted by him to his own use) from many Arabic sources (Zonta 2004): in his Balm for Sorrow (Seri ha-yagon), he was strongly influenced by, and inserted a number of quotations from, al-Kindi's On the Way of Dispelling Worry (Fi hila li-daf‘ al-ahzan), as proved by a number of scholars (Ritter and Walzer 1938 [1943], Klugman-Barkan 1971). Apart from these two cases, only very scanty traces of the knowledge of al-Kindi's work have been found in Medieval Jewish philosophy: one can mention a reference to al-Kindi's zoology found in Moses Ibn Ezra's still unpublished philosophic-philological work, the Treatise of the Garden On the Metaphorical and the True Meanings (of the Bible) (Maqala al-hadiqa fi ma‘na l-majaz wa-l-haqiqa), written in Christian Spain around 1130 (see ms. of Jerusalem, Jewish National and University Library, 8° 570, pages 206, line 8 – 207, line 7).

2. Abu Bakr al-Razi

The bad reputation of Abu Bakr al-Razi (850-925 circa) as a “heterodox” and “unbelieving” philosopher of Medieval Islam seems to have generally influenced most of the Medieval Jewish authors, as it appears in particular in Maimonides. However, this did not prevent some of them from quoting and employing some of his works as sources for building their own thought.

As for Maimonides’ harsh judgement of al-Razi as a philosopher, it was clearly based upon the knowledge of the general contents of his metaphysics and theology as found in al-Razi's Book of Divine Science (Kitab al-‘ilm al-ilahi), as found both in his Guide of the Perplexed (Dalalat al-ha'irin) and in one of his letters to the “official” translator of his work, Samuel Ibn Tibbon. In the latter, he affirms that al-Razi's book on Divine Science is not useful, since al-Razi was only a physician (and not a real philosopher) (Marx 1934-1935, 378; about the real influence of Maimonides’ letter, see also Harvey 1992). In part three, chapter 12, of the Guide, in a more explicit way he affirms that al-Razi's book is full of raving ideas and ignorance: according to him, al-Razi thought that in human life there is surely more evil than good, so that even the divine goodness should be seriously questioned (Moses Maimonides 1963, 2:441-442). Notwithstanding this, two other Jewish philosophers at least mentioned al-Razi and employed some of his ideas. Moses Ibn Ezra, in chapter 5 of his Treatise of the Garden, quotes a passage of al-Razi about motion and comments on it by affirming that al-Razi is contrary to Aristotle's opinion and supports Plato's instead (see ms. of Jerusalem, Jewish National and University Library, 8° 570, page 51, lines 5-8). Abu l-Barakat Ibn Malka al-Baghdadi, working in Baghdad around 1150, in his Book about the Point of View (Kitab al-mu‘tabar) — mostly based upon Avicenna's philosophy and possibly written before the author's conversion to Islam – followed in some cases al-Razi's doctrines, in particular his idea of two different ideas of time, “eternal time” and “created one” (see Pines 1979, 151-153).

3. The Brethren of Purity (Ikhwan al-Safa) and Their Followers

The scientific-philosophical Arabo-Islamic encyclopedia bearing the title Epistles of the Brethren of Purity and of the Lovers of Faith (Rasa'il ikhwan al-safa’ wa-khullan al-wafa’), which includes 52 treatises about mathematical sciences, logic, physical sciences, metaphysics, anthropology, and theology, had a relevant, although unexpected and not usually studied influence on Medieval Judaic thought in the 11th-15th centuries in Spain and Provence, and in Yemen as well.

According to a tradition, the encyclopedia, possibly written in the Near East in the first half of the 9th century by a still unknown author (maybe Abu-l Qasim Maslama al-Majriti, d. 964: see Carusi 2000, 500-502), was known in Spain around 1050; as a matter of fact, there might be some traces of its influence on Solomon Ibn Gabirol (Avicebron, 1021-1058 or 1070), one of the most well-known Medieval Jewish philosophers, living and working in Andalusia in the first half of the 11th century. According to Jacques Schlanger (see Schlanger 1968, 94-97), Ibn Gabirol might have taken from the Brethren of Purity the correspondence between the hierarchy of the beings and the series of the first ten numbers, as well as the reference to the doctrine of some sages about the necessity to “cultivate” our souls through the study of celestial things. According to Georges Vajda (see Vajda 1947, 24-33), more relevant traces might be found in chapter two of the Introduction to the Duties of the Hearth (Hidaya ila fara'id al-qulub), written by the Spanish Jewish author Bahya Ibn Paquda in the period 1050-1080, where there might be some agreements with the Brethren's cosmological doctrines, as well as a very similar style in defending them. As a matter of fact, both these cases do not prove a direct use of the Brethren's work by these two Jewish philosophers. The first sure traces of a direct influence of the doctrines of the Brethren of Purity are found in two works written in two different Spanish areas in Judaeo-Arabic (the language of Jews living in Arabic countries) around 1130, and possibly influencing each other: the Book of Microcosm (Kitab al-‘alam al-sagir) by Joseph Ibn Zaddiq (d. 1149), and the Treatise of the Garden by Moses Ibn Ezra. The original text of the work by Joseph Ibn Zaddiq, a rabbinical judge living in Cordoba, is lost, but an anonymous Medieval Hebrew translation is still preserved in some manuscripts, and has been published twice. It includes a number of evident but not literal references to the doctrines of the Brethren of Purity (see Vajda 1949), and its relationship to them was implicitely admitted by the author himself at the very beginning of his work, as follows: “It seems to me that the way for arriving to this great and terrible knowledge (i.e. that of theological truths) consists in understanding the books written by the pure philosophers and the divine sages” (Horovitz 1903, 3). Moreover, in his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon Maimonides explicitely affirmed: “I have not read Joseph Ibn Zaddiq's Microcosm, but I know the author, his value and the value of his book: surely he follows the ideas of the Brethren of Purity” (Marx 1934-1935, 379) – an affirmation which, according to Sarah Stroumsa, should be interpreted as a substantial critique to Ibn Zaddiq's philosophical views (Stroumsa 1990). As for Moses Ibn Ezra, his Treatise of the Garden is clearly full of references to passages and doctrines indirectly inspired by, and in some cases literally taken from the Brethren of Purity. As recently shown by Paul Fenton in his book about the contents of Ibn Ezra's work (Fenton 1997; see also Fenton 1976, 297), the Treatise of the Garden includes at least thirty-six passages of the Epistles of the Brethren of Purity, as well as a number of cases where their influence appears to be rather evident. For example, the Brethren of Purity clearly influenced Ibn Ezra's doctrines about the creation of the world from the First Intellect and the procession of the beings from God to matter, about nature as a power of the Universal Soul, as well as about man as a microcosm. In the same period, even Abraham Ibn Ezra, the well-known Spanish Jewish author and scientist active in Italy, France and England in the period 1140-1160, knew and employed the Brethren of Purity (see Jospe 1994, 46-48).

Possibly as a consequence of the diffusion of the above works, the influence of the Brethren of Purity seems to have spread among a number of Jewish philosophers working in Spain during the 13th century. In some cases, this influence passed through other minor Arabo-Islamic authors, whose work was well-known among Spanish Jewish readers. The Spanish Islamic philosopher Ibn al-Sid al-Batalyawsi (from Badajoz, d. 1127) wrote a sort of compendium of the Brethren's doctrines, the Book of the Gardens (Kitab al-hada'iq), which was widespread among Jewish authors (Kaufmann 1880, 32-63) either in its original Arabic text, or in its three Medieval Hebrew translations (written between 1200 and 1370: see Steinschneider 1893, 286-288; Richler 1977), often under the title Book of Intellectual Circles (Sefer ha-‘agullot ha-re‘yoniyyot); it was one of the direct sources of a Spanish philosopher and kabbalist, Isaac Ibn Latif, who spoke about the Brethren's doctrine of the five degrees of soul (vegetal, animal, human, sapiential, prophetical) in his Hebrew book The Gate of Heavens (Sha‘ar ha-shamayim), written in the period 1230-1250 (see Heller-Wilensky 1967, 199). Another anonymous work, The Balance of Speculations (Me'ozney ha-‘iyyunim), written in Hebrew (or in a Judaeo-Arabic lost original version) in 13th-century Spain, is full of passages about numerology, cosmology, theology and natural sciences: some of them might have been inspired by al-Batalyawsi's compendium, but some others were evidently taken from the Epistle of the Brethren of Purity, in particular those concerning the essence of faith, mineralogy and botany (Abrahamov 1995). Finally, it should be noted that the Brethren of Purity were employed as a direct philosophical source by Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera in a number of occasions. In his Neoplatonic philosophical anthology, The Book of Degrees (Sefer ha-ma‘alot), a Hebrew quotation ascribed to a “sage” (did Falaquera know that the work was made by al-Majriti?) is in reality a literal passage of the Epistle of the Brethren of Purity dealing with the relationship between the Universal Soul and the particular souls. Falaquera's The Book of the Seeker (Sefer ha-Mevaqqesh), a sort of short popular encyclopedia written in 1263, is full of quotations from most of the Brethren's treatises: these quotations deal with several themes, like the difference between science and faith, some mathematical questions, the principles of astronomy and music, the meaning of the term “nature”, the doctrine of anima mundi, the climates, as well as some doctrines about logic, meteorology, music (about this point, see Shiloah 1968), astrology and natural sciences, and even some moral tales. Also the Brethren's scientific doctrines exerted a considerable influence over 13th-century Jewish authors. In books three and four of his bulky scientific-philosophical encyclopedia, The Opinions of the Philosophers (De‘ot ha-filosofim), written around 1270 and still unpublished, Falaquera quotes a number of passages of the Brethren concerning mineralogy and botany, where a sort of mixture of Aristotelian doctrines and alchemy can be found. Falaquera's mineralogical doctrines should have directly influenced the treatment of mineralogy in other Hebrew texts, written around 1300, in particular in Gershom ben Solomon of Arles' The Gate of Heavens and in an alchemical treatise falsely ascribed to an Arabic author. Finally, the zoology and the mathematics of the Brethren of Purity were employed by Qalonymos ben Qalonymos for writing down his own Hebrew books on morals (Epistle On Animals, Iggeret ba‘aley hayyim) and on mathematics (Book of Kings, Sefer ha-melakim: see Lévy 1996, 69).

The supposed connection between the Epistle of the Brethren of Purity and the Ismailism should have suggested the adoption of this work as one of the main sources of the so-called “Jewish Ismailism” as found in Late Medieval Yemenite Judaism. This “Jewish Ismailism” consisted in adapting to Judaism some Ismaili doctrines about cosmology, prophecy, and hermeneutics (Kiener 1984). There are a number of cases showing that the Brethren of Purity influenced some Yemenite Jewish philosophers and authors in the period 1150-1550 (Langermann 1996). For example, chapter two of the Judaeo-Arabic theologic-philosophical work by Natanael Ibn al-Fayyumi, the Garden of Intellects (Bustan al-‘uqul), written in Yemen in 1165, includes a correspondence between numbers 1-10 and ten scientific and philosophical concepts (soul's faculties, senses, directions, bodily substances and parts, etc.) most of which are identical to those listed by the Brethren of Purity. Some traces of the Brethren's doctrine of the procession of beings from the First Intellect, as well as of their numerology, are found in two Yemenite philosophical midrashim, i.e. Judaeo-Arabic interpretations of Biblical texts, written in 1420-1430: the Glad Learning (Midrash ha-hefez) by Zerahyah ha-Rofé (Yahya al-Tabib) and the Lamp of Intellects (Siraj al-‘uqul) by Hoter ben Solomon (Mansur ibn Sulayman al-Dhamari) (see Zonta 1997a, 140-144; about Hoter ben Solomon and his philosophical sources, see also Blumenthal 2007).

4. al-Farabi

The influence of the Arabic “second Master” (i.e. the second Aristotle), Abu Nasr al-Farabi (870-950), is evident in many fields of Medieval Jewish philosophy: epistemology, logic, metaphysics and theology, ethics, and even physics.

As for epistemology, al-Farabi's major work on it, the Enumeration of Sciences (Ihsa’ al-‘ulum), about the general contents of linguistics, logic, mathematical sciences, physics and metaphysics, ethics and even Islamic jurisprudence and religion, exerted an important influence over a number of Jewish scholars in the period 1200-1400. Joseph ben Judah Ibn ‘Aqnin (d. 1226), a Moroccan Jewish follower of Maimonides, inserted long sections of the original Arabic text in chapter 27 of his main ethical work, The Medicine of Souls (Tibb al-nufus); in his commentary on the Song of Songs, The Revealing of Secrets (Inkishaf al-asrar), he quoted a number of other Farabian works on epistemology, logic, metaphysics, and even music (Zonta 1997a, 118-119). Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera inserted a number of its passages (in Hebrew) into his own “enumeration of sciences”, part two of the Beginning of Science (Reshit hokhmah), probably written around 1250 (Efros 1935; Strauss 1936; about Falaquera's knowledge of al-Farabi's works, see Harvey 2002). Qalonymos ben Qalonymos translated the whole work into Hebrew in 1314, together with another short “introduction to Aristotle” by al-Farabi himself; rather significantly, he himself inserted into it his own treatment of some subjects which were lacking in the original Arabic text, very probably since al-Farabi rejected them as real sciences: medicine, alchemy, magic. Qalonymos' version was later quoted by some Jewish scholars, mainly during the 14th and 15th centuries. As far as philosophy in general is concerned, it should be noted that Falaquera made a sort of complete Hebrew abridgement of three main works by al-Farabi, and inserted them into part three of the Beginning of Science: the Attainment of Happiness (Tahsil al-sa‘ada), the Philosophy of Plato (Falsafa Aflatun) and the Philosophy of Aristotle (Falsafa Aristu), so spreading among Jews the knowledge of the general contents of all works by Plato and Aristotle (Strauss 1936; see also Mahdi 1962). Falaquera also quoted a short introductory passage of al-Farabi's Epistle On the Knowledge of Philosophy in his Book of Degrees (as pointed out in Chiesa and Rigo 1993).

As for logic, al-Farabi even exerted a stronger influence over Medieval Jewish philosophy, which was apparently almost like that exerted by the most highly reputed, “official” commentator of Aristotelian logic: Averroes. According to Maimonides, there was no need to study logical texts, apart from those by al-Farabi, since “all that he wrote… is full of wisdom, and… he was a very valid author” (Marx 1934-1935, 379). Surely, al-Farabi's logical (and also non-logical) works influenced the Treatise On the Art of Logic (Maqala fi sina‘a al-mantiq) usually ascribed to Maimonides, and probably written around 1160 (see Brague 1996; Maimonides’ authorship has been recently challenged by Davidson 2005, 313-322): this text was thrice translated into Hebrew in the 13th and 14th centuries and was obviously widespread among Jewish readers in the Late Middle Ages. As a matter of fact, almost all his logical works were either translated into Hebrew, or at least widely employed by a number of Medieval Jewish philosophers in the 13th-15th centuries, although the real extent of his influence on Jewish logic has not yet been examined in all its aspects. As for the many Hebrew translations of his summaries or “short commentaries” on Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Organon, probably five groups of these translations (not covering the whole series of the summaries) can be identified: some translations were made very early, possibly before 1200; some others should be ascribed to a Spanish Jew, Moses Ibn Lagis; some others were made by members of the family of the Ibn Tibbons, during the 13th century, and were often employed as sources by some 14th- and 15th-centuries Jewish philosophers (Judah ben Isaac Cohen, Abraham Avigdor); other translations consisted in revisions of the Tibbonian ones, were made before 1320 and were surely known to Hezekiah bar Halafta (see below, 7); finally, two translations (the only ones of al-Farabi's summaries of Aristotle's Rhetoric and Poetics) were probably made by Todros Todrosi, a philosophical translator working in Arles, around 1330 (about all these translations, see Zonta 1996, 189-193). In particular, al-Farabi's summary of the Categories was quoted and commented on by an otherwise unknown Jewish philosopher, Sar Shalom, possibly active in Provence around 1300 (Zonta 1997b, 523). Also some of al-Farabi's “long commentaries” (tafasir) on Aristotle's logic, even those now lost in their Arabic original text, can be shown to have influenced Jewish philosophers: the Long Commentary on Categories is preserved almost only due to the many quotations made by a Late Medieval Jewish author, Judah ben Isaac Cohen, and has very recently been published (Zonta 2006a); the Long Commentary on De interpretatione, found in Arabic, was translated into Hebrew before 1334 (the text of its introduction in Hebrew is still extant: see Zonta 1996, 162) and appears to have influenced Gersonides too (Glasner 2002, 252-254); many passages from the Long Commentary on Book Eight of Topics, lost in Arabic, were translated into Hebrew by Todros Todrosi in 1334 (Zonta 1997b, 555-562). As proved by Georges Vajda (Vajda 1965), Maimonides knew and implicitely employed al-Farabi's summary of Topics, book one, chapter 11, as a source of a passage of his Guide of the Perplexed, part two, chapter 25, concerning a discussion between the two different doctrines of the eternity of the world according to Aristotle and Plato; he also knew and paraphrased some passages from other logical works by al-Farabi (the summary of De interpretatione, the Long Commentary on Prior Analytics: see Davidson 2005, 113-114).

As for al-Farabi's most famous work, the Book of the Opinions of the People of the Virtuous City (Kitab ara’ ahl al-madina al-fadila), apart from some short quotations found in Moses Ibn Ezra's Treatise of the Garden (Fenton 1976, 297) and in Isaac Ibn Latif's above mentioned work (Chiesa 1986, 80), the most relevant employment of this text as a source for metaphysics and theology is found in Falaquera's Book of Degrees and in particular in book ten of his encyclopedia The Opinions of the Philosophers, where his general treatment of the nature of God mixed up al-Farabi's and Averroes' opinions about it (Chiesa 1986, 81-84). Al-Farabi's Virtuous City appears to have been ignored by most of Medieval Jewish philosophers: as a matter of fact, Moses Ibn Tibbon did not translate it into Hebrew, but preferred to translate al-Farabi's The Political Regimen (al-Siyasa al-madaniyya) instead (Steinschneider 1893, 290-292) – another Farabian text known and quoted by Falaquera (Plessner 1956, 189-193). According to Pines, although al-Farabi's former work is not explicitely quoted in the Guide of the Perplexed, it was surely among the main sources of Maimonides' doctrine about the different roles played by the philosopher and by the prophet (see Moses Maimonides 1962, 1:lxxxvii-xcii). Al-Farabi's idea about the relationship between philosophy and religion, according to which the former is in a substantially higher position with respect to the latter, as found in his Book on Letters (Kitab al-huruf) and Book on Religion (Kitab al-milla), strongly influenced Maimonides' ideas about this (see Berman 1974); moreover, the Book on Letters was later employed as a source for Falaquera's treatment of linguistics in his Beginning of Science (Zonta 2004, 127). According to Davidson, Maimonides explicitely quoted and employed al-Farabi's Political Regime under the title The Changing Beings (al-Mawjudat al-mutaghayyira) for discussing the question of the world's eternity in part two, chapter 74, of the Guide (Davidson 2005, 113). It should be noted that European Jewish philosophers active in the 13th and 14th centuries show even more interest in another work by al-Farabi: his treatise On the Intellect (Risala fi l-‘aql). This interest was apparently raised by Maimonides, who quoted and commented on some passages of this book about the theologians' idea of the human intellect and the role of the active intellect in his Guide (see what has been written by Pines in Moses Maimonides 1962, 1:lxxxii-lxxxiii). As recently shown by Gad Freudenthal, at least three Arabic-into-Hebrew versions of the work (one by Qalonymos ben Qalonymos, and two anonymous) were written, read and in one case at least commented on in Western Europe between about 1150 and 1320 (Freudenthal 2003). Moreover, Farabian doctrines (if not direct references to al-Farabi's works) about some key concepts of metaphysics and theology (the First Cause, the prophecy, etc.) were still circulating in Spain around 1350 (see Vajda 1962, 216-217, where these doctrines are found in Joseph Ibn Waqqar's work).

As for Farabian ethics, the first traces of al-Farabi's doctrine about the difference between the philosophers and inferior classes of men are found in Abraham bar Hiyya (Vajda 1938). However, al-Farabi's affirmation, as found in his lost commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, about human moral perfection and its connection to an intellectual perfection apparently limited to man's life in this world seems to have influenced Maimonides' idea of perfection as found in part three, chapter 18, of the Guide of the Perplexed (Moses Maimonides 1962, 1:lxxix-lxxxii; Davidson 2005, 113). Other ethical works by al-Farabi, the Epistle of the Guide to the Way of Happiness (Risala fi l-tanbih ‘ala sabil al-sa‘ada) and the Selected Aphorisms (Fusul muntaza‘a), were also both translated into Hebrew, probably around 1300, and quoted by some Jewish philosophers: Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera (Plessner 1956, 179-183), Qalonymos ben Qalonymos, Josef Ibn ‘Aqnin (Steinschneider 1893, 290-292).

According to Yair Shiffman, a lost work by al-Farabi on physics, his Long Commentary on Aristotle's Physics, was also implicitely quoted by Falaquera in his Guide to the Guide (Moreh ha-Moreh), a philosophical commentary on Maimonides' Guide written in 1280 (Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera 2001, 234); as a matter of fact, a passage of it about the formal and material differences between the heavens and the stars is explicitely quoted and commented on by Maimonides himself in chapter 19 of part two of the Guide of the Perplexed (see Moses Maimonides 1962, 2:239).

5. Avicenna

The main reason for the interest of a number of Medieval Jewish philosopher towards Avicenna (Ibn Sina, 980-1037) might have been Avicenna's own interest in a tentative conciliation between Aristotelian philosophy and religion. Such interest was due to the philosopher's special attitude towards Islam, and towards Shi‘ite Islam in particular, an attitude which the Avicennian Jewish philosophers obviously applied to Judaism. It seems that these philosophers regarded Avicenna as a substantial defender of religion over philosophy, so associating him with al-Ghazali's own position with regard to philosophy. In this way, “Jewish Avicennism” was slowly absorbed into a sort of “Jewish Ghazalism”, aiming at a defense of Judaism against Averroism (see below, 6).

Avicenna was the main source of an important doctrine which spread among a number of 11th- and 12th-century Jewish philosophers, as once shown by Harry A. Wolfson (Wolfson 1935): according to this doctrine, there are in man's mind five internal senses (common sense, estimation, imagination, thought, and memory). A first trace of this doctrine was found in Bahya Ibn Paquda: however, he might have taken it from an Arabic philosophical or theological compendium inspired by Avicenna. Such occasional employment of Avicenna as a source for one particular point of a Medieval Jewish philosopher's thought might have happened in the case of Joseph Ibn Zaddiq's Book of the Microcosm, as observed by Vajda in his study about the philosophical sources of the latter (see Vajda 1949, 180). A more important case is that of the well-known Spanish Jewish author Judah Halevi (1085-1141). In his main Judaeo-Arabic work, the Book of the Khazar (in Hebrew, Sefer ha-Kuzari), an explicit defence of Judaism with respect to the other religions and to philosophy as well, he significantly employed Avicenna's Epistle On the Soul (Risala fi n-nafs) as a direct and literal, albeit implicit source for his description of man's soul in chapters 2-12 of book five, as definitively shown by David H. Baneth (see his introduction to Judah Halevi 1977). Also a more “mystical” work by Avicenna, Living Son of the Watchful (Hayy ibn Yaqzan), apparently inspired Abraham Ibn Ezra in writing his own work in Hebrew on the same subject, the Iggeret Hay ben Meqits (around 1150), as shown by Israel Levin (see Levin 1983).

In any case, a wider influence of Avicenna's philosophy on Medieval Judaic thought appeared after 1150. The first significant case is that of Abraham Ibn Daud, living in Toledo between 1110 and 1180 circa. As it is clear from his philosophical work, the Exalted Faith (al-‘Aqida al-rafi'a, lost in its Judaeo-Arabic original, but preserved in two 14th-century Hebrew translations), he was the first Jewish Aristotelian, but surely employed as his main sources both Avicenna and al-Ghazali. As shown in recent studies by Amira Eran, and in particular in her book about the contents of Ibn Daud's work (Eran 1998, 27), Avicennian influences appear mostly in book one of the Exalted Faith, where such philosophical themes as categories, matter and motion, souls and celestial bodies are studied. However, in treating these themes, Ibn Daud did not directly refer to the contents of Avicenna's main extant encyclopedia, The Cure (al-Shifa’), but to his minor encyclopedia of logic, physics and metaphysics: The Salvation (al-Najat). Moreover, it might be suggested that in reality instead Ibn Daud employed al-Ghazali as his main source for constructing his own “Avicennism” rather than Avicenna himself (see below, 6), just as a number of later Medieval Jewish philosophers did, beginning with Maimonides. Maimonides appears to have regarded Avicenna not as a really direct and important philosophical source. Although clear echoes of Avicennian doctrines about the distinction between essence and existence, between necessary and contingent beings, as well as the well-known Avicennian proof of the existence of God, have been found in the Guide of the Perplexed (see Moses Maimonides 1962, 1:xciii-ciii), the explicit judgement of Maimonides about Avicenna's thought appears to be substantially cool (for a different interpretation of this judgement, see however Dobbs-Weinstein 2002). In his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon, he affirms that “Avicenna's books, although they are subtle and difficult, are not like those by al-Farabi; however, they are useful, and he too is an author whose words should be studied and understood” (Marx 1934-1935: 380).

Maimonides' lukewarm judgement about Avicenna did not prevent many later Jewish scholars from studying his works and employing them as sources for their own philosophy. Even the translator of Maimonides' Guide, Samuel Ibn Tibbon, directly referred to Avicenna's doctrines and affirmations about meteorology both in his Hebrew translation (including some comments) of Aristotle's Meteorology, and in his work Treatise on “Waters Did Gather” (Ma'amar be-yiqqawu ha-mayim), as shown by Resianne Fontaine in her critical edition and English translation of the former (Fontaine 1995). Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, whose many works appear to have been a sort of “basin of quotations”, referred to a number of Avicenna's philosophical works, and employed them as sources for his own expositions of Maimonides' and Aristotle's thought, in the Guide to the Guide and in the Opinions of the Philosophers, as well as for some other minor works. In particular, he quoted some passages from The Cure about celestial bodies, mineralogy, zoology, psychology, and metaphysics; he quoted a number of passages of The Salvation about logic and psychology; he made an abridgement of the contents of the Epistle On the Soul; he even quoted short passages from Avicenna's Remarks and Admonitions (al-Isharat wa-l-tanbihat); finally, Avicenna was probably one of the main sources for Falaquera's philosophical dictionary, put at the beginning of the Opinions of the Philosophers, as well as for his own classification of sciences in part two of the Beginning of Wisdom (Zonta 2004, 128-129). The influence of Avicenna on Jewish scientific thought continued after 1300: for example, some traces of it are found also in the Hebrew paraphrase of a pseudo-Avicennian work, made by a Provençal Jewish scholar, Solomon ben Moses of Melgueil (d. between 1306 and 1309) (see Glasner 1996).

Probably, the most important case of “Jewish Avicennism” appeared in 14th-century Provence and Spain. Its main character was the employment of some aspects of Avicenna's philosophy in favour of the Jewish religious tradition and against the Aristotelian philosophical tradition as represented by Averroes' rationalism. As a matter of fact, some of these “Jewish Avicennians” tried to arrive at a substantial agreement between Jewish religion and philosophy; some others might have had an opposite effect, as happened for example in the case of Abner of Burgos (see Zonta 1997a, 459-462).

Judah ben Solomon Natan, a physician and translator active in Provence around 1330, explicitely declared the reason for his interest in Avicenna in the introduction to his Hebrew translation of al-Ghazali's Intentions of the Philosophers (Maqasid al-falasifa), where he affirmed that he translated that book since it was very useful for reconciling religious tradition and philosophy, and he found a substantial correspondence between that book and some parts of Avicenna's The Cure about physics and metaphysics, as well as Avicenna's The Salvation (see Zonta 1997a, 459). Judah Natan's translation was employed by his friend Todros Todrosi for his own translation of the “Avicennist” work The Sources of Questions (‘Uyun al-masa'il): in the introduction to the latter, he affirms to have found there the same opinion expressed in al-Ghazali's above mentioned book. Here and in his philosophical anthology (dating back to 1334) Todros quoted some of Avicenna's passages about logical, physical and metaphysical questions: he took them both from the logical sections of The Cure (he also quoted a passage about infinite motion from book three, chapter 8 of the physical section of this work), and from Avicenna's Remarks and Admonitions. Finally, he was the unique Medieval Hebrew author who wrote an almost complete translation of one of Avicenna's philosophical works: books two and three of The Salvation, about physics and metaphysics (Zonta 1997b, 529, 565-575). Two other Provençal Jewish authors employed Avicenna: Judah Cohen, who might have been active in Provence around 1350, was apparently inspired by Avicenna's Epistle On Love (Risala fi l-‘ishq) (Vajda 1977, 136); the well-known Jewish philosopher and commentator of Averroes Moses Narboni, living there in the period 1300-1360, occasionally quoted some passage from The Cure and The Salvation in his own “Averroistic” commentary on the Intentions of the Philosophers (Steinschneider 1893, 318). Various approaches to Avicenna are found in 13th- and 14th-century Spain: Avicenna's metaphysics was the main source of Moses ha-Levi's Metaphysical (lit. “divine”)Treatise (Maqala ilahiyya), written in Judaeo-Arabic probably before 1300, whose contents were studied in detail by Vajda (see Vajda 1948); the Jewish philosopher Abner of Burgos (1270-1350 circa), both before and after having converted to Christianity, seems to have often employed Avicenna in favour of determinism and against Averroes (he seems to have transmitted some passages of Avicenna's lost metaphysical section of The Oriental Wisdom [al-Hikma al-mashriqiyya]); Josef Ibn Waqqar, in his Treatise for Reconciling Philosophy and Religious Law (Maqala al-jami‘a bayna l-falsafa wa-l-shari‘a), written in Judaeo-Arabic around 1360 and analyzed by Vajda, even tried to reconcile Averroes, Avicenna and al-Ghazali in a very difficult field: metaphysics (Vajda 1962, 132). In a different, indirect way the Neoplatonic circle of Jewish authors of Hebrew supercommentaries on Abraham Ibn Ezra's Biblical commentaries, active in Spain in the second half of the 14th century and in Provence in the first decades of the 15th century, could have employed Avicennian ideas for defending the doctrine of astral determinism (see Schwartz 1996); still indirectly, Avicenna's thought might have influenced some aspect of Hasdai Crescas' philosophy (see below, 6). According to Dov Schwartz, the role played by Avicenna in influencing some aspects of 14th- and also 15th-century Judaic thought was even more widespread than that played by Averroes, who was until now regarded as the most important “master” in Late Medieval Jewish philosophy after Maimonides (Schwartz 1995, 420).

6. al-Ghazali

Remarkably, there are clues that even the main representative of Arabo-Islamic Sunnite theology, al-Ghazali (1058-1111), exerted an important influence over some aspects of Medieval Jewish philosophy and thought. This fact has not yet been systematically studied and explained by scholars, but it cannot be easily neglected. Moreover, in the 14th century there was apparently a sort of “Jewish Ghazalism”, based upon al-Ghazali's works (both philosophical and theological ones), so that many aspects of his thought as a typical Islamic thinker were curiously employed for defending some similar aspects of Jewish religious tradition.

The first sure traces of an influence of al-Ghazali on Judaic thought appeared rather early, around 1160, when Abraham Ibn Daud employed his major philosophical work, The Intentions of the Philosophers, as one of the main unavowed sources of his Exalted Faith (see Eran 1998, 27). Significantly enough, al-Ghazali's work influenced not only the contents of book one of the Exalted Faith, about some aspects of Aristotelian philosophy (logic, physics, and metaphysics), but also book two of it, about theology (God's incorporeity, unity, attributes, as well as divine creation, prophecy, and providence). Possibly, al-Ghazali might have exerted a similar influence over Maimonides too, and over his philosophical thought in particular. As a matter of fact, there are no direct and explicit mentions of al-Ghazali either in the Guide of the Perplexed or in Maimonides' above mentioned letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon; but some traces of Avicennian doctrines in some of Maimonides' works (both in the Guide and in other ones) could also be explained as the results of an influence of Avicenna by means of al-Ghazali, and of the latter's Intentions of the Philosophers in particular, as pointed out by Herbert Davidson and other scholars (Davidson 2005, 104; see also Pines 1971, 958; for a particular case-study, see Eran 2001). Davidson, in particular, affirms that “virtually every of a metaphysical character attributed by Maimonides to Aristotle but actually deriving from Avicenna was available to him through Ghazali”: according to him, there are striking similarities, even in some points of the phraseology, between Maimonides and al-Ghazali, about these points (Davidson 2004, 732; see also Davidson 2005, 115).

Direct and explicit proofs of the influence of al-Ghazali on Medieval Jewish philosophy appeared in Spain and Provence from 1270 onwards. The first case is found in Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera's Book of Degrees, two passages of which were surely taken from the Intentions of the Philosophers (Chiesa 1986, 86). The second and more important case is that of Isaac Albalag, a Catalan or Provençal Jewish philosopher who first translated the work into Hebrew, and then commented on it in his work Correction of the Opinions (of the Philosophers) (Tiqqun ha-de‘ot), written at the end of the 13th century. As shown by Vajda, who published a critical edition of Albalag's commentary and studied its philosophical contents in detail (Vajda 1960, Yishaq Albalag 1973), he did not employ al-Ghazali for defending him, but for criticizing him instead: contrary to al-Ghazali, Albalag even seems to have adopted the doctrine of the existence of two truths, the philosophical one (reserved for wise and experienced philosophers) and the religious one (reserved for common people). After Albalag, in the first half of the 14th century al-Ghazali's Intentions were translated into Hebrew in Provence twice: by Judah Natan, who allegedly wrote this translation for refuting the arguments of the “philosophists” (in Hebrew, mitfalsefim), i.e. the Averroists (see above, 5); and by an anonymous translator, possibly identical to, or working for, Moses Narboni. As a matter of fact, Narboni commented on the Intentions in a totally different, substantially Averroist way (Zonta 1997a, 127; see Steinschneider 1893, 311-319). Other evident proofs of the direct influence of al-Ghazali's philosophical work on 14th-century Judaic thought are found in some Spanish authors, active after 1350, for example in Moses ben Judah's philosophical encyclopedia, The Love of (Intellectual) Pleasures (Ahavah ba-ta‘anugim), written in 1354 (Eisenmann 2000). In 15th-century Spain and even later, many commentaries, mostly on the metaphysical section of the Intentions, were written by some philosophers (Isaac Ibn Shem Tov, Eli Habillo, Moses Almosnino, and some anonymous authors): they were identified by Steinschneider (Steinschneider 1893, 320-325) but are still in need of a deeper study. This wide employment of al-Ghazali's work as a philosophical source might be explained as an easier way to the knowledge of the general contents of Aristotelian logic, physics, and metaphysics (see Harvey 2001).

However, al-Ghazali's Intentions was not his only work known and employed as a source by Late Medieval Jewish authors. They were surely influenced by other two philosophical works by him about logic: The Balance of Knowledge (Mi‘yar al-‘ilm) and The Touchstone of Intellect (Mihakk al-nazar). Both were explicitely quoted by Todros Todrosi in his philosophical anthology (Zonta 1997b, 566-575), and the first of them, possibly translated into Hebrew before the end of the 15th century, was surely employed as a source by two Jewish philosophers, Zerahyah Hen (active in Rome, 1277-1290) and Moses Narboni. Some of these authors, mostly living in the Northern Spanish area, knew and employed some of al-Ghazali's ethical and even theological works (see Steinschneider 1893, 328-330, 342-347): the Balance of Actions (Mizan al-a‘mal) was translated into Hebrew by Abraham Ibn Hasdai of Barcelona around 1210-1230; the Lamps of Lights (Mishkat al-anwar) was twice translated in the 14th century; the Incoherence of Philosophy (Tahafut al-falasifa) was translated before 1411 by Zerahyah ha-Levi Saladin (about Zerahyah's introduction to his translation, see Zonta 1997a, 129-130) – probably, a member of the Catalan circle of Hasdai Crescas, who might have employed al-Ghazali's work as one of the undeclared sources of his famous Light of the Lord (Or Adonai), a deep critique of some key points of Aristotelian philosophy. (However, this hypothesis has been criticized by Harry A. Wolfson: see Wolfson 1929a, 11-16.)

7. Ibn Bajja

A number of philosophical works by the Spanish Arabo-Islamic author Abu Bakr Ibn Bajja (d. 1138), usually called “Ibn al-Sa'igh” by the Jewish tradition, were known and employed by Medieval Jewish philosophers.

The first of these philosophers who gives evidence of having been influenced by him is a well-known Jewish fellow-countryman and contemporary, Judah Halevi: as shown by Shlomo Pines (see Pines 1980, 210-217), in chapter 1 of book one of his Book of the Khazar he reflects not Avicenna's philosophy (as in another place of his work: see above, 5), but rather Ibn Bajja's as expounded in his Epistle On the Conjunction of the Agent Intellect with Man (Risala al-ittisal), and gives a sort of summary of his main ideas about God and the world. Maimonides had the highest esteem of Ibn Bajja: he affirmed that “he was a great and wise philosopher, and all his works are right and correct”, and possibly appreciated him as a commentator of Aristotle too (Marx 1934-1935, 379). In some cases he was surely influenced by Ibn Bajja's thought: in the Guide of the Perplexed, he explicitely refers to some of his philosophical and scientific ideas, and reveals in particular the influence of his doctrines about the existence of only one intellect after death, the possibility of the conjunction between man and the Active Intellect, the division of men into three classes (according to their different degrees of knowledge of the highest truths), as well as the idea of the prophet as a perfect solitary man, which seems to have been inspired by Ibn Bajja's well-known work, the Regimen of the Solitary Man (Tadbir al-mutawahhid); moreover, Maimonides knew also Ibn Bajja's hypothesis, according to which God would be the spirit of the celestial body which includes all that is around the earth (see Pines' observations in Moses Maimonides 1963, 1:ciii-cvii; about Maimonides' knowledge of Ibn Bajja's doctrines, see also Davidson 2005, 114-115). The last idea was found by Maimonides in Ibn Bajja's commentary on Aristotle's Physics, a work which appears to have been well-known to a later Medieval Jewish philosopher: Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera. As shown by Bruno Chiesa and Yair Shiffman (Chiesa 1986, 85-86; Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera 2001, 156-157, 180, 207, 221-223, 265-266, 277, 318, 323-328, 331-332), for commenting on Maimonides' Guide Falaquera more or less literally quoted and shortly commented on a number of passages taken from various works by Ibn Bajja: not only his Regimen of the Solitary Man and his Epistle On the Conjunction, but also his Epistle of Farewell (Risala al-wada‘) and some less known works, like the already mentioned commentary on Physics and the commentary on Aristotle's De anima; some of these quotations are found in Falaquera's Book of Degrees too.

A substantial interest in Ibn Bajja's philosophical thought was shown by three other Jewish philosophers living in the first half of the 14th century: Hezekiah bar Halafta, David Ibn Bilia and Moses Narboni. Hezekiah bar Halafta (nicknamed “Bonenfant de Millau”), a Provençal Jewish philosopher, wrote in 1320 a commentary to Petrus Hispanus' Summulae, where a number of passages taken from Ibn Bajja's supercommentaries on al-Farabi's own summaries of Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Categories and De interpretatione are found and commented on: this was the first and possibly unique case of the influence of Ibn Bajja as a logician and as an interpreter of al-Farabi on Medieval Jewish treatment of logic (Zonta 1997b, 576-583). David Ibn Bilia, a Portuguese Jew working in the period 1320-1340, commissioned a translation of the Epistle of Farewell to a certain Hayyim Ibn Vivas: he wrote marginal notes on some points of it (see Steinschneider 1893, 358-359). Moses Narboni too commented on this Epistle (see Hayoun 1990a; critical edition in Hayoun 1990b); moreover, he commissioned (or wrote himself) and commented on a Hebrew compendium of Ibn Bajja's Regimen (critical edition in Hayoun 1987). Narboni's positive approach to this Arabo-Islamic philosopher might have been suggested by Maimonides' affirmations about Ibn Bajja. Narboni was a declared Averroist (see below, 9), but he might have tried to find in Ibn Bajja something in agreement with Averroes' philosophical thought.

8. Ibn Tufayl

The unique well-known work by the Spanish Arabo-Islamic philosopher Ibn Tufayl (d. 1185), the Living Son of the Watchful (Hayy ben Yaqzan), exerted a substantially limited influence over Medieval Jewish philosophy. For example, Pines affirms that “there is no evidence to show that Maimonides was in any way influenced by Ibn Tufayl's philosophic tale”, although this influence cannot be totally excluded (Moses Maimonides 1963, 1:cviii; see also Davidson 2005, 115-116).

The main one among the very few cases of a direct influence of Ibn Tufayl on a relevant figure of Medieval Judaic thought is the anonymous Hebrew translation of his work (bearing the title Iggeret Hayawan ben Yaqtsan), which was commented on by Moses Narboni; Narboni's commentary (apparently, the only extant one on this text) was written in 1349 and has been very recently published by Maurice-Ruben Hayoun (Hayoun 2002). Narboni's commentary bears the title Epistle of Conjunction (Iggeret ha-devequt), so showing that Narboni might have commented on this particular text in order to find in it a substantial confirmation of the well-known doctrine about the conjunction between man and the Active Intellect. As a matter of fact, like in the case of Ibn Bajja's philosophical works, Narboni himself might have been the translator of this work from Arabic into Hebrew, or at least might have assigned this translation to a member of his “team”. Narboni's interpretation of Ibn Tufayl's work influenced a number of 15th-century Jewish philosophers, mostly in Spain and Italy, who knew and in some cases were strongly connected to Averroism (see Steinschneider 1893, 366-368): Joseph Ibn Shem Tov (living around 1450), Abraham Bibago (d. 1489), Isaac Arama, Isaac Abravanel (1437-1508), Yohanan Alemanno (living in the second half of the 15th century). Finally, it should be noted that Ibn Tufayl's works (not only the Living Son of the Watchful, but also some minor works, apparently lost in their original Arabic texts) appeared among the main sources of a typical example of 14th-century “Jewish Avicennism” in Spain: Joseph Ibn Waqqar's Treatise for Reconciling Philosophy and Religious Law (see Vajda 1962, 128, 132).

9. Averroes (Ibn Rushd) and Some of His Followers

Averroes (Ibn Rushd, 1126-1198) is usually regarded to have been the major “master” of Islamic philosophy among Jews in the Late Middle Ages – although he might have had to share this key position with Avicenna and al-Ghazali. Almost all his philosophical works were translated from Arabic into Hebrew in the period 1230-1330, sometimes even more than once (only one of them was later translated from Latin into Hebrew, around 1480); almost all of them were quoted, summarized, paraphrased, annotated and commented on by a number of philosophers during the 14th and 15th centuries. As a matter of fact, some of these texts are preserved only through these translations, due to the loss of their original versions, and their success among Jewish philosophers was surely wider than the success they gained among Arabic thinkers, and probably equal to the success they gained among Latin Christian ones. A real history of “Jewish Averroism” has not yet been written (for a very general sketch of it, see Zonta 1997a, 463-474), so that most information about it can be found in Steinschneider's book about Medieval Jewish translations (Steinschneider 1893, 49-339).

Maimonides set the tone of this Jewish approach to Averroes by affirming in his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon: “Take care not to read Aristotle's books without the commentaries on them: those by Alexander (of Aphrodisias), those by Themistius, and those by Averroes” (Marx 1934-1935, 378). There are some clues to the fact that Maimonides and Averroes agreed in some key points of their doctrines, especially in the fields of metaphysics and theology; however, Maimonides explicitely declared in a letter to his disciple Joseph ben Judah, written when he had just completed some parts of the Guide, that he had received a copy of most of Averroes' commentaries on Aristotle, but had not yet read them (about the relationship between Maimonides and Averroes, see Pines' observations in Moses Maimonides 1963, 1:cviii-cxxi). As a matter of fact, a concrete, sure proof of Averroes' influence on Maimonides' philosophical thought has not yet been found; but this does not exclude that he really knew well Averroes' philosophy. In any case, Maimonides opened the way to a sort of adoption of Averroes as an unofficial, “Judaizing” interpreter of Aristotle: the many Western European Jewish followers of Maimonides' thought (active in Spain, Provence, and Italy in the 13th-15th centuries) seem to have referred to the above words as a justification for employing the commentaries of Averroes in reading and interpreting Aristotle's works. Significantly, they did not usually employ either Alexander or Themistius, i.e., the other two commentators recommended by Maimonides. Their particular choice of Averroes might be explained either because of the example given by contemporary Latin Christian commentators, or because of the easier availability of his commentaries in Spain (where they had been written and had spread during Averroes' life) with respect of those by al-Farabi, Avicenna and Ibn Bajja, or because of the didactic usefulness of them for knowing in detail Aristotle's words and the opinions of all the other Greek and Arabic commentators, whom Averroes quoted and discussed in his works. Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera, in the introduction to his work The Opinions of the Philosophers (a detailed commentary on Aristotle's physics and metaphysics), affirms: “All that I have written here corresponds to Aristotle's words, as they are commented on by the sage Averroes. He was the last of the commentators (of Aristotle), and collected the cream of the works of the previous commentators, as well as of Aristotle's words” (see Zonta 1996, 158).

A key role in transmitting to Jewish philosophers a direct knowledge of Averroes' philosophy was obviously played by the Arabic-into-Hebrew translations of his works, including Averroes' various commentaries on Aristotle's texts (see Tamani and Zonta 1997, 29-49). This translation process involved a number of scholars: in approximate chronological order, they were Jacob Anatoli (who finished in Naples in 1232 his translation of Averroes' “middle commentaries” [talkhisat] on Porphyry's Isagoge, as well as on Aristotle's Categories [both published in a critical edition in Averrois Cordubensis 1969], De interpretatione, Prior and Posterior Analytics), Moses Ibn Tibbon (who wrote in Provence in the period 1244-1261 his translations of Averroes' summaries of Aristotle's Physics, De caelo, De generatione [critical edition: Averrois Cordubensis 1958], Meteorology, De anima, De sensu et sensato [critical edition: Averrois Cordubensis 1954], Metaphysics, as well as that of the “middle commentary” on the De anima [critical edition: Ivry 2003]), Solomon Ibn Ayyub (who wrote in Béziers in 1259 his translation of the “middle commentary” on the De caelo), Shem Tov ben Isaac of Tortosa (who wrote around 1255-1260 his translation of the “middle commentary” on the De anima), Zerahyah Hen (who finished in Rome in 1284 his translation of the “middle commentaries” on the Physics and the Metaphysics [critical edition: Zonta 1995b]), Jacob ben Makhir (who finished in Provence in 1289 his translation of the summaries of Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Organon, including Rhetoric and Poetics, and translated in 1302 Averroes' “middle commentary” on Aristotle's De partibus and De generatione animalium), Qalonymos ben Qalonymos (who translated in Arles in the period 1313-1317 the “middle commentaries” on Aristotle's Topics, Sophistical Confutations, Physics, De generatione [critical edition: Averrois Cordubensis 1958], Meteorology, and Metaphysics, as well as the “long commentaries” on the Posterior Analytics, the Physics, and possibly on the Metaphysics too), Samuel of Marseilles (who translated in Beaucaire in 1320-1322 the “middle commentary” on the Nicomachean Ethics [critical edition: Berman 1999], as well as that on Plato's Republic [critical edition: Rosenthal 1956, 1966]), Moses of Salon (who translated around 1320 the “long commentary” on the Metaphysics, possibly employing Qalonymos' previous translation), and Todros Todrosi (who translated in Trinquetaille in 1337 the “middle commentaries” on Rhetoric and Poetics [critical editions: Lasinio 1872, 1875-1877]). Also the first part of Averroes' commentary on the De intellectu ascribed to Alexander of Aphrodisias was translated into Hebrew (critical edition: Davidson 1988). Other philosophical works by Averroes are known through the Arabic-into-Hebrew versions made in the 14th century: they include Averroes' Questions on Logic (some of which were written by some Spanish Arabo-Islamic followers of him) and Questions on Physics and Metaphysics, the De substantia orbis (Fi l-jirm al-samawi) — which is lost in Arabic, but is preserved in an anonymous Medieval Hebrew translation published in a critical edition by Arthur Hyman (Averroes 1986; about another aspect of the Medieval Hebrew tradition of this work, see Rigo 1992) — the Epistle on the Possibility of the Conjunction of the Intellect — which is lost in Arabic, but is preserved in an anonymous Hebrew translation commented on by Moses Narboni (critical edition by Kalman P. Bland in Ibn Rushd 1982) — and the treatise On the First Mover (Fi l-muharrik al-awwal) – which is lost in Arabic, and is preserved in some Medieval Hebrew quotations by Moses ha-Levi (see Wolfson 1950) and Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera (see Zonta 2006b). Moreover, Averroes' defence of Aristotelian (and his own) philosophy against al-Ghazali's attacks, The Incoherence of the Incoherence (Tahafut al-tahafut), was first employed as a major source for Falaquera's Guide to the Guide, and then translated twice into Hebrew in Provence before 1340, by an anonymous author (Moses Narboni?) and by Qalonymos ben David Todrosi (maybe, a Jewish Averroist) – by the former for defending Aristotelianism, and by the latter for showing its internal contradictions (Steinschneider 1893, 332-337). Finally, even a very short work on the intellect by Averroes' son, Abu Muhammad ‘Abdallah Ibn Rushd, was translated into Hebrew and might have had some influence on Late Medieval Judaic thought (Burnett and Zonta 2000).

Almost all these works were quoted and commented on by a number of 14th- and 15th-centuries Jewish philosophers. More or less literal passages taken from the commentaries on Aristotle are found in part one of Judah ben Solomon ha-Cohen's encyclopedia, The Learning of Science (Midrash ha-hokhmah), written in Judaeo-Arabic and then translated into Hebrew in the period 1235-1247 (Fontaine 2000), and in Falaquera's Opinions of the Philosophers (Harvey 2000). However, the influence of this commentaries was widespread in Provence, in the first half of the 14th century, when a number of supercommentaries on them was written down. The famous Jewish philosopher and scientist Levi ben Gershom (Gersonides, 1288-1344), active in Avignon and in other Provençal places from 1319 onwards, wrote a series of supercommentaries on Averroes' commentaries on Aristotle in the period 1320-1324; some of his “students” (S. ha-Levi, Porfash, Solomon of Urgul, Vital), as well as the Provençal Jewish philosopher Yeda‘yah ha-Penini of Béziers (1280-1340 circa), followed his example (see Glasner 1995). Due to his innovative and sometimes critical approach to the study of Averroes' Aristotelianism, Gersonides was surely the most original 14th-century Jewish interpreter of Averroes' philosophy; but he was not the only major one. A more faithful approach to Averroes is found in Moses Narboni, who wrote a number of still unpublished commentaries on his works (not only supercommentaries on his Aristotelian commentaries, but also commentaries on some other philosophical texts by Averroes), and regarded him as the ideal interpreter of Aristotelianism. He affirmed that there was no need to verify Aristotle's teaching, since it was surely true, as confirmed by Averroes' assertion that Aristotle had the first and the last word on everything (see Zonta 1997a, 472).

Jewish Averroism, in the sense of a substantial agreement with Averroes' interpretation of Aristotle's works, continued in 15th-century Spain and Italy. For example, it was found in the philosophical supercommentaries on Averroes' “middle commentaries” on the Posterior Analytics and the Metaphysics written around 1450 by the Aragonese Jew Abraham Bibago, as well as in the works of a member of a family of Spanish Jewish philosophers, the Ibn Shem Tovs: Isaac ben Josef Ibn Shem Tov, active in the period 1470-1490, wrote a series of supercommentaries on Averroes' commentaries on Aristotle's Physics (Wolfson 1929b). Evident traces of it can be found also in Elijah Delmedigo (1460-1493), who praised Averroes as the best philosopher after Aristotle and Alexander of Aphrodisias (Zonta 1997a, 474). However, in some cases it seems that this form of Averroism was curiously influenced by some Latin Scholastic trends, like Thomism and Latin Averroism. This might have happened in the anonymous Hebrew supercommentary on Averroes' “middle commentary” on the Nicomachean Ethics, probably written in Spain (not in Provence, as suggested by Berman) around 1440 (Zonta 2006c, 17-18), as well as in the works written by a 15th-century Italian author: Judah Messer Leon (1425-1498 circa), whose bulk commentary on books one, two and three of Aristotle's Physics was explicitely based upon Averroes' “middle” and “long commentaries” on Aristotle, but employed a lot of direct or indirect Scholastic sources (see Zonta 2006c, 214-217). In other cases, some 15th-century Spanish Jewish philosophers even openly attacked Averroism as an old-fashioned trend: Eli Habillo did this around 1470, in introducing his own translation of Antonius Andreas' questions on Aristotle's Metaphysics.

Finally, it should be noted that even some of Averroes' “religious” works were translated into Hebrew and employed as sources by some Jewish philosophers: the Decisive Treatise (Fasl al-maqal) (a critical edition of the Hebrew translation appeared in Golb 1956-1957), the Appendix (Damima) to it (see Vajda 1954), and the Disclosure of the Proof Methods Concerning the Principles of Religion (Kashf fi manahig al-adilla fi ‘aqa'id al-milla) (see Di Donato 2006). All these works inspired some parts of Falaquera's commentary on Maimonides' Guide, as well as his defence of philosophy in the Epistle of Debate for Explaining the Concordance between Religious Law and Science (Iggeret ha-wikkuah be-ve'ur ha-haskamah asher beyn ha-Torah we-ha-hokhmah; critical edition: Harvey 1987); however, apart from this case, they seems to have had no extensive influence on Late Medieval Jewish philosophy.

10. Fakhr al-din al-Razi and Sihab al-din al-Suhrawardi

Two Islamic authors pertaining to different ways of Islamic Avicennism, Fakhr al-din al-Razi (d. 1210) and Sihab al-din al-Suhrawardi (1155-1191), give evidence of having exerted their influence over some Jewish philosophers, both in Europe and in the Near East.

Fakhr al-din al-Razi, a faithful follower and commentator of Avicenna and his works as an interpreter of Aristotle, was explicitely mentioned and employed as a source by three 14th-century “Jewish Avicennist” authors (see above, 5). Judah ben Solomon Natan mentioned al-Razi's Oriental Researches (al-Mabahit al-mashriqiyya) as one of his reference points in the introduction to his translation of al-Ghazali's Intentions of the Philosophers (see Zonta 1997a, 459). Todros Todrosi put some passages of the same work, which he personally translated from Arabic into Hebrew, in the margin of his own translation of pseudo-Farabi's work, The Sources of Questions: they are al-Razi's definition of the concept of “notification” or “definition”, and a metaphysical passage about his “Avicennian” explanation of the chain of the emanations of the intellects from the First Intellect, which Todros compares with a similar passage taken from Avicenna's The Salvation. Moreover, in his philosophical anthology Todros mentions other passages about logic allegedly taken from al-Razi, which have not yet been identified (see Zonta 1997b, 567-573). Finally, Joseph Ibn Waqqar explicitely quotes two passages of al-Razi's commentary on Avicenna's Remarks and Admonitions, the Core of the Remarks (Lubab al-isharat) (see Vajda 1962, 125-126).

As for Suhrawardi, one of the “mystical” Islamic interpreters of Avicenna, he might have been inspired by some of the philosophical ideas of Abu l-Barakat's Book About the Point of View, in particular his idea about the angels (see Pines 1979, 254-255), and was explicitely quoted by David ben Joshua Maimonides (see Fenton 1984, 36-37).

11. Christian Arabic Authors

Some Christian Arabic philosophers working in the 9th and 10th centuries give evidence of having exerted their influence upon Medieval Judaic thought. The first of them was Abd al-Masih Ibn Na‘ima al-Himsi, a collaborator of al-Kindi: his famous Arabic philosophical work, the “shorter version” of the Theology of Aristotle (a reworking of parts of books four, five, and six of Plotinus' Enneads), as well as other Arabic texts connected to it (the Sayings of the Greek Sage, the De causis and pseudo-Empedocles' Book of the Five Substances), might have exerted their direct influence over Solomon Ibn Gabirol, as suggested by Jacques Schlanger (see Schlanger 1968, 52-109). Moreover, a “longer version” of the Theology of Aristotle might have been written by a Judaeo-Arabic scholar in 10th- or 11th-century Egypt: it was apparently quoted by Shem Tov Ibn Falaquera (Langermann 1999), who in any case knew and employed also the “shorter version” of it (Fenton 1992), and was translated into Hebrew in the 16th century by MosesArovas (about this translation, now lost, see Fenton 1986). Falaquera wrote also a summary of the Book of the Five Substances (edited in Kaufmann 1899, 17-37), which proves to be useful for reconstructing the contents of the lost original text (see the French translation by Győngy Hegedüs in De Smet 1998, 208-231). The main role in influencing Jewish philosophy was played by the De causis, an Arabic work mixing up some aspects of Plotinus' and Proclus' theology and probably written in the 9th century in al-Kindi's circle by a still unidentified author (a Christian-Arabic one?): it was translated into Hebrew four times in the period 1260-1480, and exerted its influence over a number of Jewish philosophers (see Rothschild 1985, 1994).

Also a minor philosophical work by a 9th-century Christian Arabic author, the Book On the Difference between Spirit and Soul (Kitab al-fasl bayna l-ruh wa-l-nafs), was translated into Hebrew in the Middle Ages (Steinschneider 1893, 289): it was quoted by some Medieval Jewish authors, for example by Abraham Ibn Daud, as recently discovered by Hagar Kahana-Smilansky (personal communication). Finally, in the first half of the 10th century (around 933), in the circle of al-Farabi's followers there was an “exchange of opinions” about some metaphysical doctrines: it involved the Christian Arabic philosopher Yahya Ibn ‘Adi and two minor Jewish scholars, Ibn Abi Sa‘id al-Mawsili and Bishr ibn Sam‘an ibn ‘Irs, as shown by Shlomo Pines (Pines 1955).


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Abner of Burgos | Al-Farabi | Al-Ghazali | Al-Kindi | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, special topics in: Ikhwan al-Safa | Avicebron (Ibn Gabirol) | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Crescas, Hasdai | Delmedigo, Elijah | Falaquera, Shem Tov Ibn | Gersonides | Halevi, Judah | Ibn Bajja | Ibn Daud, Abraham | Ibn Ezra, Abraham | Ibn Rushd | Israeli, Isaac | Maimonides | Maimonides: the influence of Islamic thought on | Theology of Aristotle | Tibbon, Samuel Ibn