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Francis Bacon

First published Mon Dec 29, 2003

Francis Bacon (1561–1626) was one of the leading figures in natural philosophy and in the field of scientific methodology in the period of transition from the Renaissance to the early modern era. As a lawyer, member of Parliament, and Queen's Counsel, Bacon wrote on questions of law, state and religion, as well as on contemporary politics; but he also published texts in which he speculated on possible conceptions of society, and he pondered questions of ethics (Essays) even in his works on natural philosophy (The Advancement of Learning).

After his studies at Trinity College, Cambridge and Gray's Inn, London, Bacon did not take up a post at a university, but instead tried to start a political career. Although his efforts were not crowned with success during the era of Queen Elizabeth, under James I he rose to the highest political office, Lord Chancellor. Bacon's international fame and influence spread during his last years, when he was able to focus his energies exclusively on his philosophical work, and even more so after his death, when English scientists of the Boyle circle (Invisible College) took up his idea of a cooperative research institution in their plans and preparations for establishing the Royal Society.

To the present day Bacon is well known for his treatises on empiricist natural philosophy (The Advancement of Learning, Novum Organum Scientiarum) and for his doctrine of the idols, which he put forward in his early writings, as well as for the idea of a modern research institute, which he described in Nova Atlantis.

1. Biography

Francis Bacon was born January, 22, 1561, the second child of Sir Nicholas Bacon (Lord Keeper of the Seal) and his second wife Lady Anne Coke Bacon, daughter of Sir Anthony Coke, tutor to Edward VI and one of the leading humanists of the age. He was educated at Trinity College, Cambridge (1573–5) and at Gray's Inn in London (1576). From 1577 to 1578 the young Bacon accompanied Sir Amias Paulet, the English ambassador, on his mission in Paris; but he returned when his father died. Bacon's small inheritance brought him into financial difficulties and since his maternal uncle, Lord Burghley, did not help him to get a lucrative post as a government official, he embarked on a political career in the House of Commons. In 1581 he entered the Commons as a member for Cornwall, and he remained a Member of Parliament for thirty-seven years. In 1582 he became a barrister and was installed as a reader at Gray's Inn. His involvement in high politics started in 1584, when he wrote his first political memorandum, A Letter of Advice to Queen Elizabeth. Right from the beginning of his adult life, Bacon aimed at a revision of natural philosophy and – following his father's example – also tried to secure high political office. Very early on he tried to formulate outlines for a new system of the sciences, emphasizing empirical methods and laying the foundation for an applied science (scientia operativa). This twofold task, however, proved to be too ambitious to be realized in practice.

Bacon's ideas concerning a reform of the sciences did not meet with much sympathy from Queen Elizabeth or from Lord Burghley. Small expectations on this front led him to become a successful lawyer and Parliamentarian. From 1584 to 1617 (the year he entered the House of Lords) he was an active member in the Commons. When he lost Elizabeth's favor over the subsidy affair of 1593, Bacon turned to the Earl of Essex as a patron. He served Essex as political advisor, but distanced himself from him when Essex's failure in the Irish campaign became evident and when his rebellion against the Queen finally brought him to the executioner's block.

When in 1603 the Scottish king James VI succeeded the great Queen as James I of England, Bacon's time had come at last. He was knighted in 1603, married a young and rich heiress in 1606, was appointed Solicitor General in 1607 and Attorney General in 1613. He reached the peak of his splendid career from 1616 onwards: he became a member of the Privy Council in 1616, was appointed Lord Keeper of the Great Seal the following year – thus achieving the same position as his father – and was granted the title of Lord Chancellor and created Baron of Verulam in 1618. In the same year, 1621, when Bacon was created Viscount of St. Albans, he was impeached by Parliament for corruption in his office as a judge. His fall was contrived by his adversaries in Parliament and by the court faction, for which he was the suitable scapegoat to save the Duke of Buckingham not only from public anger but also from open aggression (Mathews, 1999). He lost all his offices and his seat in Parliament, but retained his titles and his personal property. Bacon devoted the last five years of his life entirely to his philosophical work. He tried to go ahead with his huge project, the Instauratio Magna Scientiarum; but the task was too big for him to accomplish in just a couple of years. Though he was able to finish important parts of the Instauratio, the proverb, often quoted in his works, proved true for himself: Vita brevis, ars longa. He died in April 1626 of pneumonia after experiments with ice.

2. Natural Philosophy: Struggle with Tradition

Bacon's struggle to overcome intellectual blockades and the dogmatic slumber of his age and of earlier periods had to be fought on many fronts. Very early on he criticized not only Plato, Aristotle and the Aristotelians, but also humanists and Renaissance scholars such as Paracelsus and Bernardino Telesio.

Although Aristotle provided specific axioms for every scientific discipline, what Bacon found lacking in the Greek philosopher's work was a master principle or general theory of science, which could be applied to all branches of natural history and philosophy (Klein, 2003a). For Bacon, Aristotle's cosmology, as well as his theory of science, had become obsolete and consequently so too had many of the medieval thinkers who followed his lead. He does not repudiate Aristotle completely, but he opposes the humanistic interpretation of him, with its emphasis on syllogism and dialectics (scientia operativa versus textual hermeneutics) and the metaphysical treatment of natural philosophy in favor of natural forms (or nature's effects as structured modes of action, not artifacts), the stages of which correspond — in the shape of a pyramid of knowledge — to the structural order of nature itself.

If any “modern” Aristotelians came near to Bacon, it was the Venetian or Paduan branch, represented by Jacopo Zabarella. On the other hand, Bacon criticized Telesio, who — in his view — had only halfway succeeded in overcoming Aristotle's deficiencies. Although we find the debate with Telesio in an unpublished text of his middle period (De Principiis atque Originibus, secundum fabulas Cupidinis et Coelum or On Principles and Origins According to the Fables of Cupid and Coelum, written in 1612 (Bacon, V [1889], 461–500), Bacon began to struggle with tradition as early as 1603. In Valerius Terminus (1603?) he already repudiates any mixture of natural philosophy and divinity; he provides an outline of his new method and determines that the end of knowledge was “a discovery of all operations and possibilities of operations from immortality (if it were possible) to the meanest mechanical practice” (Bacon, III [1887], 222). He opposes Aristotelian anticipatio naturae, which favored the inquiry of causes to satisfy the mind instead of those “as will direct him and give him light to new experiences and inventions” (Bacon, III [1887], 232).

When Bacon introduces his new systematic structure of the disciplines in the Advancement of Learning (1605), he continues his struggle with tradition, primarily with classical antiquity, rejecting the book learning of the humanists, on the grounds that they “hunt more after words than matter” (Bacon, III [1887], 283). Accordingly, he criticizes the Cambridge University curriculum for placing too much emphasis on dialectical and sophistical training asked of “minds empty and unfraught with matter” (Bacon, III [1887], 326). He reformulates and functionally transforms Aristotle's conception of science as knowledge of necessary causes. He rejects Aristotle's logic, which is based on his metaphysical theory, whereby the false doctrine is implied that the experience which comes to us by means of our senses (things as they appear) automatically presents to our understanding things as they are. Simultaneously Aristotle favors the application of general and abstract conceptual distinctions, which do not conform to things as they exist. Bacon, however, introduces his new conception of philosophia prima as a meta-level for all scientific disciplines.

From 1606 to 1612 Bacon pursued his work on natural philosophy, still under the auspices of a struggle with tradition. This tendency is exemplified in the unpublished tracts Temporis partus masculus, 1603/1608 (Bacon, III [1887], 521–31), Cogitata et Visa, 1607 (Bacon, III, 591–620), Redargutio Philosophiarum, 1608 (III, 557–85), and De Principiis atque Originibus…, 1612 (Bacon, V [1889], 461–500). Bacon rediscovers the Pre-Socratic philosophers for himself, especially the atomists and among them Democritus as the leading figure. He gives preference to Democritus' natural philosophy in contrast to the scholastic – and thus Aristotelian – focus on deductive logic and belief in authorities. Bacon does not expect any approach based on tradition to start with a direct investigation of nature and then to ascend to empirical and general knowledge. This criticism is extended to Renaissance alchemy, magic, and astrology (Temporis partus masculus), because the “methods” of these “disciplines” are based on occasional insights, but do not command strategies to reproduce the natural effects under investigation. His criticism also concerns contemporary technical literature, in so far as it lacks a new view of nature and an innovative methodological program. Bacon takes to task the ancients, the scholastics and also the moderns. He not only criticizes Plato, Aristotle, and Galen for these failings, but also Jean Fernel, Paracelsus, and Telesio, while praising the Greek atomists and Roger Bacon.

Bacon's manuscripts already mention the doctrine of the idols as a necessary condition for constituting scientia operativa. In Cogitata et Visa he compares deductive logic as used by the scholastics to a spider's web, which is drawn out of its own entrails, whereas the bee is introduced as an image of scientia operativa. Like a bee, the empiricist, by means of his inductive method, collects the natural matter or products and then works them up into knowledge in order to produce honey, which is useful for healthy nutrition.

In Bacon's follow-up paper, Redargutio Philosophiarum, he carries on his empiricist project by referring to the doctrine of twofold truth, while in De Principiis atque Originibus he rejects alchemical theories concerning the transformation of substances in favor of Greek atomism. But in the same text he sharply criticizes his contemporary Telesio for propagating a non-experimental halfway house empiricism. Though Telesio proves to be a moderate “modern”, he clings to the Aristotelian framework by continuing to believe in the quinta essentia and in the doctrine of the two worlds, which presupposes two modes of natural law (one mode for the sublunary and another for the superlunary sphere).

3. Natural Philosophy: Theory of the Idols and the System of Sciences

3.1 The Idols

Bacon's doctrine of the idols not only represents a stage in the history of theories of error (Brandt, 1979) but also functions as an important theoretical element within the rise of modern empiricism. According to Bacon, the human mind is not a tabula rasa. Instead of an ideal plane for receiving an image of the world in toto, it is a crooked mirror, on account of implicit distortions (cf. Bacon, IV [1901], 428–34). He does not sketch a basic epistemology but underlines that the images in our mind right from the beginning do not render an objective picture of the true objects. Consequently, we have to improve our mind, i.e., free it from the idols, before we start any knowledge acquisition.

As early as Temporis partus masculus, Bacon warns the student of empirical science not to tackle the complexities of his subject without purging the mind of its idols: “On waxen tablets you cannot write anything new until you rub out the old. With the mind it is not so; there you cannot rub out the old till you have written in the new” (Farrington, 1964, 72).

In Redargutio Philosophiarum Bacon reflects on his method, but he also criticizes prejudices and false opinions, especially the system of speculation established by theologians, as an obstacle to the progress of science (Farrington, 1964, 107), together with any authoritarian stance in scholarly matters.

Bacon deals with the idols in the Second Book of The Advancement of Learning, where he discusses Arts intellectual (Invention, Judgment, Memory, Tradition). In his paragraph on judgment he refers to proofs and demonstrations, especially to induction and invention. When he comes to Aristotle's treatment of the syllogism, he reflects on the relation between sophistical fallacies (Aristotle, De Sophisticis Elenchis) and the idols (Bacon, III [1887], 392–6). Whereas induction, invention, and judgment presuppose “the same action of the mind”, this is not true for proof in the syllogism. Bacon, therefore, prefers his own interpretatio naturae, repudiating elenches as modes of sophistical “juggling” in order to persuade others in redargutions (“degenerate and corrupt use … for caption and contradiction”). There is no finding without proof and no proof without finding. But this is not true for the syllogism, in which proof (syllogism: judgment of the consequent) and invention (of the “mean” or middle term) are distinct. The caution he suggests in relation to the ambiguities in elenches is also recommended in face of the idols: “there is yet a much more important and profound kind of fallacies in the mind of man, which I find not observed or enquired at all, and think good to place here, as that which of all others appertaineth most to rectify judgment: the force whereof is such, as it doth not dazzle or snare the understanding in some particulars, but doth more generally and inwardly infect and corrupt the state thereof. For the mind of man is far from the nature of a clear and equal glass, wherein the beams of things should reflect according to their true incidence, nay, it is rather like an enchanted glass, full of superstition and imposture, if it be not delivered and reduced. For this purpose, let us consider the false appearances that are imposed upon us by the general nature of the mind …” (Bacon, III [1887], 394–5).

Bacon still presents a similar line of argument to his reader in 1623, namely in De Augmentis (Book V, Chap. 4, see Bacon, IV [1901], 428–34). Judgment by syllogism presupposes – in a mode agreeable to the human mind – mediated proof, which, unlike in induction, does not start from sense in primary objects. In order to control the workings of the mind, syllogistic judgment refers to a fixed frame of reference or principle of knowledge as the basis for “all the variety of disputations” (IV, 491). The reduction of propositions to principles leads to the middle term. Bacon deals here with the art of judgment in order to assign a systematic position to the idols. Within this art he distinguishes the “Analytic” from the detection of fallacies (sophistical syllogisms). Analytic works with “true forms of consequences in argument” (IV, 429), which become faulty by variation and deflection. The complete doctrine of detection of fallacies, according to Bacon, contains three segments: 1. Sophistical fallacies, 2. Fallacies of interpretation, and 3. False appearances or Idols. Concerning (1) Bacon praises Aristotle for his excellent handling of the matter, but he also mentions Plato honorably. Fallacies of interpretation (2) refer to “Adventitious Conditions or Adjuncts of Essences”, similar to the predicaments, open to physical or logical inquiry. He focuses his attention on the logical handling when he relates the detection of fallacies of interpretation to the wrong use of common and general notions, which leads to sophisms. In the last section (3) Bacon finds a place for his idols, when he refers to the detection of false appearances as “the deepest fallacies of the human mind: For they do not deceive in particulars, as the others do, by clouding and snaring the judgment; but by a corrupt and ill-ordered predisposition of mind, which as it were perverts and infects all the anticipations of the intellect” (IV, 431). Idols are productions of the human imagination (caused by the crooked mirror of the human mind) and thus are nothing more than “untested generalities” (Malherbe, 1996, 80).

In his Preface to the Novum Organum Bacon promises the introduction of a new method, which will restore the senses to their former rank (cf. Bacon, IV [1901], 17 f.), begin the whole labor of the mind again, and open two sources and two distributions of learning, consisting of a method of cultivating the sciences and another of discovering them. This new beginning presupposes the discovery of the natural obstacles to efficient scientific analysis, namely seeing through the idols, so that the mind's function as the subject of knowledge acquisition comes into focus (cf. Brandt, 1979, 19).

According to Aphorism XXIII of the First Book, Bacon makes a distinction between the Idols of the human mind and the Ideas of the divine mind: whereas the former are for him nothing more than “certain empty dogmas”, the latter show “the true signatures and marks set upon the works of creation as they are found in nature” (Bacon, IV [1901], 51).

3.1.1 Idols of the Tribe

The Idols of the Tribe have their origin in the production of false concepts due to human nature, because the structure of human understanding is like a crooked mirror, which causes distorted reflections (of things in the external world).

3.1.2 Idols of the Cave

The Idols of the Cave consist of conceptions or doctrines which are dear to the individual who cherishes them, without possessing any evidence of their truth. These idols are due to the preconditioned system of every individual, comprising education, custom, or accidental or contingent experiences.

3.1.3 Idols of the market place

These idols are based on false conceptions which are derived from public human communication. They enter our minds quietly by a combination of words and names, so that it comes to pass that not only does reason govern words, but words react on our understanding.

3.1.4 Idols of the Theatre

According to the insight that the world is a stage, the Idols of the Theatre are prejudices stemming from received or traditional philosophical systems. These systems resemble plays in so far as they render fictional worlds, which were never exposed to an experimental check or to a test by experience. The idols of the theatre thus have their origin in dogmatic philosophy or in wrong laws of demonstration.

Bacon ends his presentation of the idols in Novum Organum, Book I , Aphorism LXVIII, with the remark that men should abjure and renounce the qualities of idols, “and the understanding [must be] thoroughly freed and cleansed” (Bacon, IV [1901], 69). He discusses the idols together with the problem of information gained through the senses, which must be corrected by the use of experiments (Bacon, IV [1901], 27).

3.2 System of Sciences

Within the history of occidental philosophy and science, Bacon identifies only three revolutions or periods of learning: the heyday of the Greeks and that of the Romans and Western Europe in his own time (Bacon, IV [1901], 70 ff.). This meager result stimulated his ambition to establish a new system of the sciences. This tendency can already be seen in his early manuscripts, but is also apparent in his first major book, The Advancement of Learning. In this work Bacon presents a systematic survey of the extant realms of knowledge, combined with meticulous descriptions of deficiencies, leading to his new classification of knowledge. In The Advancement (Bacon, III [1887], 282 f.) a new function is given to philosophia prima, the necessity of which he had indicated in the Novum Organum, I, Aphorisms LXXIX–LXXX (Bacon, IV [1901], 78–9). In both texts this function is attributed to philosophia naturalis, the basis for his concept of the unity of the sciences and thus of materialism.

Natural science is split up by Bacon into physics and metaphysics. The former investigates variable and particular causes, the latter reflects on general and constant ones, for which the term form is used. Forms are more general than the four Aristotelian causes and that is why Bacon's discussion of the forms of substances as the most general properties of matter is the last step for the human mind when investigating nature. Metaphysics is distinct from philosophia prima. The latter marks the position in the system where general categories of a general theory of science are treated as (1) universal categories of thought, (2) relevant for all disciplines. Final causes are discredited, since they lead to difficulties in science and tempt us to amalgamate theological and teleological points of doctrine. At the summit of Bacon's pyramid of knowledge are the laws of nature (the most general principles). At its base the pyramid starts with observations, moves on to invariant relations and then to more inclusive correlations until it reaches the stage of forms. The process of generalization ascends from natural history via physics towards metaphysics, whereas accidental correlations and relations are eliminated by the method of exclusion. It must be emphasized that metaphysics has a special meaning for Bacon. This concept (1) excludes the infinity of individual experience by generalization with a teleological focus and (2) opens our mind to generate more possibilities for the efficient application of general laws.

3.3 Matter Theory and Cosmology

According to Bacon, man would be able to explain all the processes in nature if he could acquire full insight into the hidden structure and the secret workings of matter (cf. Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 101). Bacon's conception of structures in nature, functioning according to its own working method, concentrates on the question of how natural order is produced, namely by the interplay of matter and motion. In De Principiis atque Originibus, his materialistic stance with regard to his conception of natural law becomes evident. The Summary Law of Nature is a virtus (matter-cum-motion) or power in accordance with matter theory, or “the force implanted by God in these first particles, form the multiplication thereof of all the variety of things proceeds and is made up” (Bacon, V [1889], 463). Similarly, in De Sapientia Veterum he attributes to this force an “appetite or instinct of primal matter; or to speak more plainly, the natural motion of the atom; which is indeed the original and unique force that constitutes and fashions all things out of matter” (Bacon, VI [1890], 729). Suffice it to say here that Bacon, who did not reject mathematics in science, was influenced by the early mathematical version of chemistry developed in the 16th century, so that the term “instinct” must be seen as a keyword for his theory of nature. The natural philosopher is urged to inquire into the “appetites and inclination of things by which all that variety of effects and changes which we see in the works of nature and art is brought about” (Bacon, III [1887], 17–22; V [1889], 422–6 and 510 ff. (Descriptio Globi Intellectualis); cf. IV [1901], 349). Bacon's theory of active or even vivid force in matter accounts for what he calls Cupid in De Principiis atque Originibus (cf. Bacon, V [1889], 463–5). Since his theory of matter aims at an explanation of the reality which is the substratum of appearances, he digs deeper than did the mechanistic physics of the 17th century (cf. Gaukroger, 2001, 132–7). Bacon's ideas concerning the quid facti of reality presuppose the distinction “between understanding how things are made up and of what they consist, …. and by what force and in what manner they come together, and how they are transformed” (Gaukroger, 2001, 137). This is the point in his work where it becomes obvious that he tries to develop an explanatory pattern in which his theory of matter, and thus his atomism, are related to his cosmology, magic, and alchemy.

In De Augmentis, Bacon not only refers to Pan and his nymphs in order to illustrate the permanent atomic movement in matter but in addition revives the idea of magic in a “honourable meaning” as “the knowledge of the universal consents of things … . I … understand [magic] as the science which applies the knowledge of hidden forms to the production of wonderful operations; and by uniting (as they say) actives with passives, displays the wonderful works of nature” (De Augm. III. 5; Bacon, IV [1901], 366–7).

Bacon's notion of form is made possible by integration into his matter theory, which (ideally) reduces the world of appearances to some minimal parts accessible and open to manipulation by the knower/maker. In contrast to Aristotle, Bacon's knowing-why type of definition points towards the formulation of an efficient knowing-how type (cf. Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 119). In this sense a convergence between the scope of definition and that of causation takes place according to a “constructivist epistemology”. The fundamental research of G. Rees has shown that Bacon's special mode of cosmology is deeply influenced by magic and semi-Paracelsian doctrine. For Bacon, matter theory is the basic doctrine, not classical mechanics as it is with Galileo. Consequently, Bacon's purified and modified versions of chemistry, alchemy, and physiology remain primary disciplines for his explanation of the world.

According to Rees, the Instauratio Magna comprises two branches: (1) Bacon's famous scientific method, and (2) his semi-Paracelsian world system as “a vast, comprehensive system of speculative physics” (Rees, 1986, 418). For (2) Bacon conjoins his specific version of Paracelsian cosmic chemistry to Islamic celestial kinematics (especially in Alpetragius [al-Biruni or al-Bitruji, al-Quanun al-mas'udi]; cf. E. Zinner, Entstehung und Ausbreitung der copernicanischen Lehre, Munich 1988, 71). The chemical world system is used to support Bacon's explanation of celestial motion in the face of contemporary astronomical problems (cf. Rees, 1975b, 161 f.). There are thus two sections in Bacon's Instauratio, which imply the modes of their own explanation.

Bacon's speculative cosmology and matter theory had been planned to constitute Part 5 of Instauratio Magna. The theory put forward refers in an eclectic vein to atomism, criticizes Aristotelians and Copernicans, but also touches on Galileo, Paracelsus, William Gilbert, Telesio, and Arabic astronomy.

For Bacon, “magic” is classified as applied science, while he generally subsumes under “science” pure science and technology. It is never identified with black magic, since it represents the “ultimate legitimate power over nature” (Rees, 2000, 66). Whereas magia was connected to crafts in the 16th and 17th centuries, Bacon's science remains the knowledge of forms in order to transform them into operations. Knowledge in this context, however, is no longer exclusively based on formal proof.

Bacon's cosmological system — a result of thought experiments and speculation, but not proven in accordance with the inductive method — presupposes a finite universe, a geocentric plenum, which means that the earth is passive and consists of tangible matter. The remaining universe is composed of active or pneumatic matter. Whereas the interior and tangible matter of the earth is covered by a crust which separates it from the pneumatic heaven, the zone between earth and the “middle region of the air” allows a mixture of pneumatic and tangible matter, which is the origin of organic and non-organic phenomena. Bacon speaks here of “attached spirit” (cf. Rees, 1986, 418–20), while otherwise he assumes four kinds of free spirit: air and terrestrial fire, which refer to the sublunary realm; ether and sidereal fire, which are relevant to the celestial realm. Ether is explained as the medium in which planets move around the central earth. Air and ether, as well as watery non-inflammable bodies, belong to Bacon's first group of substance or to the Mercury Quaternion.

Terrestrial fire is presented as the weak variant of sidereal fire; it joins with oily substances and sulfur, for all of which Bacon introduces the Sulphur Quaternion. These quaternions comprise antithetical qualities: air and ether versus fire and sidereal fire. The struggle between these qualities is determined by the distance from the earth as the absolute center of the world system. Air and ether become progressively weaker as the terrestrial and sidereal fire grow stronger. The quaternion theory functions in Bacon's thought as a constructive element for constituting his own theory of planetary movement and a general theory of physics. This theory differs from all other contemporary approaches, even though Bacon states that “many theories of the heavens may be supposed which agree well enough with the phenomena and yet differ with each other” (Bacon, IV [1901], 104).

The diurnal motion of the world system (9th sphere) is driven by sympathy; it carries the heavens westward around the earth. The sidereal fire is powerful and, accordingly, sidereal motion is swift (the stars complete their revolution in 24 hours). Since the sidereal fire becomes weaker if it burns nearer to the earth, the lower planets move more slowly and unevenly than the higher ones (in this way Bacon, like Alpetragius, accounts for irregular planetary movement without reference to Ptolemy's epicycle theory). He applies his theory of consensual motion to physics generally (e.g., wind and tides) and thus comes into conflict with Gilbert's doctrine of interstellar vacuum and Galileo's theory of the tides (for Bacon, the cycle of tides depends on the diurnal motion of the heavens, but for Galileo, on the earth's motion).

Bacon's bi-quaternion theory necessarily refers to the sublunary as well as to the superlunary world. Although the quaternion theory is first mentioned in Thema Coeli (1612; cf. Bacon, V [1889], 547–59), he provides a summary in his Novum Organum (II, 50): “it has not been ill observed by the chemists in their triad of first principles, that sulfur and mercury run through the whole universe … in these two one of the most general consents in nature does seem to be observable. For there is consent between sulfur, oil and greasy exhalation, flame, and perhaps the body of a star. So is there between mercury, water and watery vapors, air, and perhaps the pure and intersiderial ether. Yet these two quaternions or great tribes of things (each within it s own limits) differ immensely in quantity of matter and density, but agree very well in configuration” (Bacon, IV [1901], 242–3; cf. V [1889], 205–6; for tables of the two quaternions and Bacon's theory of matter see Rees,1996, 126, 137; Rees, 2000, 68–9). Bacon regarded his cosmological worldview as a system of anticipations, which was open to revision on the grounds of further scientific results based on the inductive method (cf. Rees, 1975b, 171). It was primarily a qualitative system holding the field against both mathematical astronomers and Paracelsian chemists. It thus emphasized the priority which he gave to physics over mathematics in his general system of the sciences.

4. Scientific Method: The Project of the Instauratio Magna

The Great Instauration, Bacon's main work, was published in 1620 as Franciscus de Verulamio Summi Angliae Cancellaris Instauratio magna. This great work remained a fragment, since Bacon was only able to finish parts of the planned outline. The volume was introduced by a Prooemium, which gives a general statement of the purpose, followed by a Dedication to the King (James I) and a Preface, which is a summary of all “directions, motifs, and significance of his life-work” (Sessions, 1996, 71). After that, Bacon printed the plan of the Instauratio, before he turned to the strategy of his research program, which is known as Novum Organum Scientiarum. Altogether the 1620 book constitutes the second part of Part II of the Instauratio, the first part of which is represented by De Augmentis and Book I of The Advancement of Learning. When Bacon organized his Instauratio, he divided it into six parts, which reminded contemporary readers of God's work of the six days (the creation), already used by writers like Guillaume Du Bartas (La Sepmaine, ou Création du Monde, 1579, transl. by Joshua Sylvester, Bartas His Devine Weekes & Workes, 1605) and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (Heptaplus, 1489).

Bacon sees nature as a labyrinth, whose workings cannot be exclusively explained by reference to “excellence of wit” and “repetition of chance experiments”: “Our steps must be guided by a clue, and see what way from the first perception of the sense must be laid out upon a sure plan” (Bacon IV [1901], 18).

Bacon's Plan of the Work runs as follows (Bacon, IV [1901], 22):

  1. The Divisions of the Sciences.
  2. The New Organon; or Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature.
  3. The Phenomena of the Universe; or a Natural and Experimental History for the foundation of Philosophy.
  4. The Ladder of Intellect.
  5. The Forerunners; or Anticipations of the New Philosophy.
  6. The New Philosophy; or Active Science.

Part 1 contains the general description of the sciences including their divisions as they presented themselves in Bacon's time. Here he aimed at a distinction between what was already invented and known in contrast to “things omitted which ought be there” (Bacon, IV [1901], 23). This part could be taken from The Advancement of Learning (1605) and from the revised and enlarged version De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (1623).

Part 2 develops Bacon's new method for scientific investigation, the Novum Organum, equipping the intellect to pass beyond ancient arts and thus producing a radical revision of the methods of knowledge; but it also introduces a new epistemology and a new ontology. Bacon calls his new art Interpretatio Naturae, which is a logic of research going beyond ordinary logic, since his science aims at three inventions: of arts (not arguments), of principles (not of things in accordance to principles), and of designations and directions for works (not of probable reasons). The effect Bacon looks for is to command nature in action, not to overcome an opponent in argument. The Novum Organum is the only part of the Instauratio Magna which was brought near to completion.

Part 3 was going to contain natural and experimental history or the record of the phenomena of the universe. According to De Augmentis Scientarum (Bacon, IV [1901], 275), natural history is split up into narrative and inductive, the latter of which is supposed “to minister and be in order to the building up of Philosophy”. These functional histories support human memory and provide the material for research, or the factual knowledge of nature, which must be certain and reliable. Natural history starts from and emphasizes the subtlety of nature or her structural intricacy, but not the complexity of philosophical systems, since they have been produced by the human mind. Bacon sees this part of Instauratio Magna as a foundation for the reconstruction of the sciences in order to produce physical and metaphysical knowledge. Nature in this context is studied under experimental conditions, not only in the sense of the history of bodies, but also as a history of virtues or original passions, which refer to the desires of matter (Rees, 1975a). This knowledge was regarded by Bacon as a preparation for Part 6, the Second Philosophy or Active Science, for which he gave only the one example of Historia Ventorum (1622); but – following his plan to compose six prototypical natural histories – he also wrote Historia vitae et mortis(1623) and the Historia densi, which was left in manuscript. The text, which develops the idea of Part 3, is called Parasceve ad Historiam Naturalem et Experimentalem.

Part 4, which Bacon called The Ladder of Intellect or Scala Intellectus, was intended to function as a link between the method of natural history and that of Second Philosophy/Active Science. It consists not only of the fragment Filum labyrinthi(Bacon, III [1887], 493–504), but also includes the Abecedarium nouum naturae (cf. OFB XIII, xxi), which was planned as a preface to all of section 4 “[to] demonstrate the whole process of the mind” (OFB XIII, xxii). Filum labyrinthi is similar to, but not identical with, Cogitata et Visa. Speaking of himself in an authorial voice, Bacon reflects on the state of science and derives his construction of a research program from the gaps and deficiencies within the system of disciplines: sciences of the future should be examined and further ones should be discovered. Emphasis must be laid on new matter (not on controversies). It is necessary to repudiate superstition, zealous religion, and false authorities. Just as the Fall was not caused by knowledge of nature, but rather by moral knowledge of good and evil, so knowledge of natural philosophy is for Bacon a contribution to the magnifying of God's glory, and, in this way, his plea for the growth of scientific knowledge becomes evident.

Part 5 deals with the forerunners or anticipations of the new philosophy, and Bacon emphasizes that the “big machinery” of the Instauratio Magna needs a good deal of time to be completed. Anticipations are ways to come to scientific inferences without recourse to the method presented in the Novum Organum. Meanwhile, he has worked on his speculative system, so that portions of his Second Philosophy are treated and finished: De Fluxu et Refluxu Maris and Thema Coeli. For this part of the Great Instauration, texts are planned that draw philosophical conclusions from collections of facts which are not yet sufficient for the use or application of Bacon's inductive method.

Part 6 was scheduled to contain Bacon's description of the new philosophy, as the last part of his Great Instauration; but nothing came of this plan, so that there is no extant text at all from this part of the project.

5. Scientific Method: Novum Organum and the Theory of Induction

Already in his early text Cogitata et Visa (1607) Bacon dealt with his scientific method, which became famous under the name of induction. He repudiates the syllogistic method and defines his alternative procedure as one “which by slow and faithful toil gathers information from things and brings it into understanding” (Farrington, 1964, 89). When later on he developed his method in detail, namely in his Novum Organum (1620), he still noted that “[of] induction the logicians seem hardly to have taken any serious thought, but they pass it by with a slight notice, and hasten to the formulae of disputation. I on the contrary reject demonstration by syllogism …” (Bacon, IV [1901], 24).

Bacon's method appears as his conceptual plot, “applied to all stages of knowledge, and at every phase the whole process has to be kept in mind” (Malherbe, 1996, 76). Induction implies ascending to axioms, as well as a descending to works, so that from axioms new particulars are gained and from these new axioms. The inductive method starts from sensible experience and moves via natural history (providing sense-data as guarantees) to lower axioms or propositions, which are derived from the tables of presentation or from the abstraction of notions. Bacon does not identify experience with everyday experience, but presupposes that method corrects and extends sense-data into facts, which go together with his setting up of tables (tables of presence and of absence and tables of comparison or of degrees, i.e., degrees of absence or presence).The last type can be supplemented by tables of counter-instances, which may suggest experiments: “To move from the sensible to the real requires the correction of the senses, the tables of natural history, the abstraction of propositions and the induction of notions. In other words, the full carrying out of the inductive method is needed” (Malherbe, 1996, 85).

The sequence of methodical steps does not, however, end here, because Bacon assumes that from lower axioms more general ones can be derived (by induction). The complete process must be understood as the joining of the parts into a systematic chain. From the more general axioms Bacon strives to reach more fundamental laws of nature (knowledge of forms), which lead to practical deductions as new experiments or works (IV, 24–5). The decisive instruments in this process are the middle or “living axioms,” which mediate between particulars and general axioms. For Bacon, induction can only be efficient if it is eliminative by exclusion, which goes beyond the remit of induction by simple enumeration. The inductive method helps the human mind to find a way to ascertain truthful knowledge.

Novum Organum, I, Aphorism CXV (Bacon, IV (1901), 103) ends the “pulling down” of “the signs and causes of the errors” within the sciences, achieved by means of three refutations, which constituted the condition for a rational introduction of method: refutation of “natural human reason”( idols); refutation of “demonstrations” (syllogisms) and refutation of “theories” (traditional philosophical systems).

The Second Part of the Novum Organum deals with Bacon's rule for interpreting nature, even if he provides no complete or universal theory. He contributes to the new philosophy by introducing his tables of discovery (Inst. Magna, IV), by presenting an example of particulars (Inst. Magna, II), and by observations on history (Inst. Magna, III). It is well known that he worked hard in the last five years of his life to make progress on his natural history, knowing that he could not always come up to the standards of legitimate interpretation.

Bacon's method presupposes a double empirical and rational starting-point. True knowledge is acquired if we proceed from lower certainty to higher liberty and from lower liberty to higher certainty. The rule of certainty and liberty in Bacon converges with his repudiation of Aristotle's old logic, which determined true propositions by the criteria of generality, essentiality, and universality. For Bacon, making is knowing and knowing is making (cf. Bacon IV [1901], 109–10). Following the maxim “command nature … by obeying her” (Sessions, 1999, 136; cf. Gaukroger, 2001, 139 ff.), the exclusion of superstition, imposture, error, and confusion are obligatory. Bacon introduces variations into “the maker's knowledge tradition” when the discovery of the forms of a given nature provide him with the task of developing his method for acquiring factual and proven knowledge.

Form is for Bacon a structural constituent of a natural entity or a key to truth and operation, so that it comes near to natural law without being reducible to causality. This appears all the more important, since Bacon – who aims exclusively at causes necessary and sufficient for their effects – rejects Aristotle's four causes (his four kinds of explanations for a complete understanding of a phenomenon) on the grounds that they are not well distributed into material, formal, efficient, and final, and that they fail to advance the sciences (especially final, efficient, and material causes): “There are and can be only two ways of searching into and discovering truth. The one flies from the senses and particulars to the most general axioms, and from these principles, the truth of which it takes for settled and immovable, proceeds to judgment and to the discovery of middle axioms. And this way is now in fashion. The other derives axioms from the senses and particulars, rising by a gradual and unbroken ascent, so that it arrives at the most general axioms at last. This is the true way, but as yet untried” (Novum Organum, I, Aph. XIX, Bacon, IV [1901], 50).

Since for Bacon the formal necessity of the syllogism does not suffice to set up first principles, his method comprises two basic tasks: (1) the discovery of forms, and (2) the transformation of concrete bodies. The discovery from every case of generation and motion refers to a latent process according to which efficient and material causes lead to forms, but there is also the discovery of latent configurations of bodies at rest and not in motion (IV,119–20).

Bacon's new mode of using human understanding implies a parallelism between striving towards human power and constituting human knowledge. Technical know-how leads to successful operations, which converge with the discovery of forms (cf. Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 108); Bacon, IV (1901), 121). At this point the idea of scientia operativa comes in again, since the direction for a true and perfect rule of operation is parallel to the discovery of a true form. Bacon's specific non-Aristotelian Aristotelianism (cf. Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 113, 115) is one of the main features of his theory. Other indispensable influences on Bacon, apart from a modified version of Aristotle, are Hermeticism, rhetoric (Vickers) and alchemy (Rees).

Two kinds of axioms correspond to the following division of philosophy and the sciences: the investigation of forms or metaphysics; and the investigation of efficient cause and matter, which leads to the latent process and configuration in physics. Physics itself is split up by Bacon into Mechanics, i.e., the practical, and Magic, i.e., the metaphysical.

Nowadays the view that Bacon “made little first-hand contribution to science” (Hesse, 1964, 152) no longer coincides with the opinion that we have to assume an underestimation of the “place of hypothesis and mathematics” in his work (Sessions, 1999, 139; Rees, 1986). But there were few doubts in the past that Bacon “encouraged detailed and methodical experimentation” (Hesse, loc. cit.); and he did this on account of his new inductive method, which implied the need for negative instances and refuting experiments. Bacon saw that confirming instances could not suffice to analyze the structure of scientific laws, since this task presupposed a hypothetical-deductive system, which, according to L. Jardine, is closely connected to “the logical and linguistic backgrounds from which Bacon's New Logic proceeds …” (Sessions, 1999, 140; cf. Jardine, 1974, 69ff.).

Bacon's interpretation of nature uses “Tables and Arrangements of Instances” concerning the natural phenomena under investigation, which function as a necessary condition for cracking the code of efficient causation. His prerogative instances are not examples or phenomena simply taken from nature but rather imply information with inductive potential which show priority conducive to knowledge or to methodological relevance when inserted into tables. The instances do not represent the order of sensible things, but instead express the order of qualities (natures). These qualities provide the working basis for the order of abstract natures. Bacon's tables have a double function: they are important for natural history, collecting the data on bodies and virtues in nature; and they are also indispensable for induction, which makes use of these data.

Already in Temporis Partus Masculus (1603) Bacon had displayed a “facility of shrewd observation” (Sessions, 1999, 60) concerning his ideas on induction. In his Novum Organum the nature of all human science and knowledge was seen by him as proceeding most safely by negation and exclusion, as opposed to affirmation and inclusion. Even in his early tracts it was clear to Bacon that he had to seek a method of discovering the right forms, the most well known of which was heat (Novum Organum II, Aph. XI–XII) or “the famous trial investigation of the form of heat” (Rees, 2000, 66; cf. Bacon, IV [1901], 154–5).

In his “[m]ethod of analysis by exclusion” (Sessions, 1999, 141), negation proved to be “one of Bacon's strongest contributions to modern scientific method” (cf. G. H. von Wright, A Treatise of Induction and Probability, London 1951, 152). Most important were his tables of degrees and of exclusion. They were needed for the discovery of causes, especially for supreme causes, which were called forms. The method of induction works in two stages:

  1. Learned experience from the known to the unknown has to be acquired, and the tables (of presence, absence, degrees) have to be set up before their interpretation can take place according to the principle of exclusion. After the three tables of the first presentation have been judged and analyzed, Bacon declares the First Vintage or the first version of the interpretation of nature to be concluded.
  2. The second phase of the method concentrates on the process of exclusion. The aim of this procedure is the reduction of the empirical character of experience, so that the analysis converges with an anatomy of things. Here, too, tables of presence and of absence are set up. The research work proper consists of finding the relationship of the two natures of qualities. Here exclusion functions as the process of determination. Bacon's method starts from material determination in order to establish the formal determination of real causes, but does not stop there, because it aims at the progressive generalization of causes. Here, again, the central element of the inductive method is the procedure of exclusion.

Forms, as the final result of the methodical procedure, are “nothing more than those laws and determinations of absolute actuality which govern and constitute any simple nature, as heat, light, weight, in every kind of matter and subject that is susceptible of them” (Bacon IV [1901], 145–6); they are not identical with natural law, but with definitions of simple natures (elements) or ultimate ingredients of things from which the basic material structure has been built (cf. Gaukroger, 2001, 140). Forms are the structures constituted by the elements in nature (microphysics). This evokes a cross-reference to Bacon's atomism, which has been called the “constructivist component” (Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 116) of his system, including an alchemical theory about basic kinds of matter. He aims at “understanding the basic structures of things … as a means to transforming nature for human purposes” (Gaukroger, loc.cit.; cf. A. Clericuzio, Elements, Principles and Corpuscles, Dordrecht 2000, 78 ff.); and thus he “ends” the unfinished Novum Organum with a list of things which still have to be achieved or with a catalogue of phenomena which are important and indispensable for a future natural history.

Historians of science, with their predilection for mathematical physics, used to criticize Bacon's approach, stating that “the Baconian concept of science, as an inductive science, has nothing to do with and even contradicts today's form of science” (Malherbe, 1996, 75). In reaching this verdict, however, they overlooked the fact that a natural philosophy based on a theory of matter cannot be assessed on the grounds of a natural philosophy or science based on mechanics as the fundamental discipline. One can account for this chronic mode of misunderstanding as a specimen of the paradigmatic fallacy (cf. Gaukroger, 2001, 134 ff.; see Rees, 1986).

Bacon came to the fundamental insight that facts cannot be collected from nature, but must be constituted by methodical procedures, which have to be put into practice by scientists in order to ascertain the empirical basis for inductive generalizations. His induction, founded on collection, comparison, and exclusion of factual qualities in things and their interior structure, proved to be a revolutionary achievement within natural philosophy, for which no example in classical antiquity existed. His scala intellectus has two contrary movements “upwards and downwards: from axiomata to experimenta and opera and back again” (Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 236). Bacon's induction was construed and conceived as an instrument or method of discovery. Above all, his emphasis on negative instances for the procedure of induction itself can claim a high importance with regard to knowledge acquisition and has been acclaimed as an innovation by scholars of our time. Some have detected in Bacon a forerunner of Karl Popper in respect of the method of falsification. Finally, it cannot be denied that Bacon's methodological program of induction includes aspects of deduction and abstraction on the basis of negation and exclusion. Contemporary scholars have praised his inauguration of the theory of induction. This theory has been held in higher esteem since the 1970s than it was for a long period before, at least since the heyday of positivism (cf. Cohen, 1970, 124–34; I. B. Cohen, Revolution in Science, Cambridge, Mass. and London 1985, 58 ff.; Pérez-Ramos, 1988, 201–85. On the general problem of induction see, e.g., C. G. Hempel, Philosophy of Natural Science, Englewood Cliffs, 1966; R. Swinburne (ed.), The Justification of Induction, Oxford 1974; K. Lambert and G. G. Brittan, An Introduction to the Philosophy of Science, New York 1987).

6. Science and Social Philosophy

In Bacon's thought we encounter a relation between science and social philosophy, since his ideas concerning a utopian transformation of society presuppose an integration into the social framework of his program concerning natural philosophy and technology as the two forms of the maker's knowledge. From his point of view, which was influenced by Puritan conceptions, early modern society has to make sure that losses caused by the Fall are compensated for, primarily by man's enlargement of knowledge, providing the preconditions for a new form of society which combines scientia nova and the millennium, according to the prophecy of Daniel 12:4 (cf. C. Hill, 1971, 85–130). Science as a social endeavor is seen as a collective project for the improvement of social structures. On the other hand, a strong collective spirit in society may function as a conditio sine qua non for reforming natural philosophy. Bacon's famous argument that it is wise not to confound the Book of Nature with the Book of God comes into focus, since the latter deals with God's will (inscrutable for man) and the former with God's work, the scientific explanation or appreciation of which is a form of Christian divine service. Successful operations in natural philosophy and technology help to improve the human lot in a way which makes the hardships of life after the Fall obsolete. It is important to note that Bacon's idea of a – to a certain extent – Christian society by no means conveys Christian pessimism in the vein of patristic thinkers but rather displays a clear optimism as the result of compounding the problem of truth with the scope of human freedom and sovereignty (cf. Brandt, 1979, 21).

7. The Ethical Dimension in Bacon's Thought

Since Bacon's philosophy of science tries to answer the question of how man can overcome the deficiencies of earthly life resulting from the Fall, he enters the realm of ethical reflection. The improvement of mankind's lot by means of philosophy and science does not start from a narrow utilitarian point of view, involving sheer striving for profit and supporting the power or influence of select groups of men, but instead emphasizes the construction of a better world for mankind, which might come into existence through the ascertaining of truths about nature's workings (cf. Bacon, III [1887], 242). Thus, the perspective of the universal in Bacon's ethical thought is given predominance. The range of science and technology in their ethical meaning transcends the realm of the application of tools and/or instruments, in so far as the aim is the transformation of whole systems. Since causality and finality can interact on the basis of human will and knowledge, a plurality of worlds becomes feasible (cf. Bacon, V [1889], 506–7).

Thus, for Bacon, the acquisition of knowledge does not simply coincide with the possibility of exerting power. His scientific knowledge is a condition for the expansion and differentiation of civilization as a process. Therefore, knowledge and charity cannot be kept separate:

“I humbly pray … that knowledge being now discharged of that venom which the serpent infused into it, and which makes the mind of man to swell, we may not be wise above measure and sobriety, but cultivate truth in charity… Lastly, I would address one general admonition to all; that they consider what are the true ends of knowledge, and that they seek it not either for pleasure of the mind, or for contention, or for superiority to others, or for profit, or fame, or power, or any of these inferior things; but for the benefit and use of life; and that they perfect and govern it in charity. For it was from the lust of power that the angels fell, from lust of knowledge that man fell; but of charity there can be no excess, neither did angel or man ever come in danger by it.” (Preface, Inst. Magna: Bacon, IV [1901], 20 f.).

Finally, the view that Bacon's Nova Atlantis “concerns a utopian society that is carefully organized for the purposes of scientific research and virtuous living” (Urbach, 1988, 10) holds true for his entire life's work.


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