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William Whewell

First published Sat Dec 23, 2000; substantive revision Wed Oct 11, 2006

William Whewell (1794–1866) was one of the most important and influential figures in nineteenth-century Britain. Whewell, a polymath, wrote extensively on numerous subjects, including mechanics, mineralogy, geology, astronomy, political economy, theology, educational reform, international law, and architecture, as well as the works that remain the most well-known today in philosophy of science, history of science, and moral philosophy. He was one of the founding members and an early president of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, a fellow of the Royal Society, president of the Geological Society, and longtime Master of Trinity College, Cambridge. In his own time his influence was acknowledged by the major scientists of the day, such as John Herschel, Charles Darwin, Charles Lyell and Michael Faraday, who frequently turned to Whewell for philosophical and scientific advice, and, interestingly, for terminological assistance. Whewell invented the terms “anode,” “cathode,” and “ion” for Faraday. Upon the request of the poet Coleridge in 1833 Whewell invented the English word “scientist;” before this time the only terms in use were “natural philosopher” and “man of science.”

Whewell is most known today for his massive works on the history and philosophy of science. His philosophy of science was attacked by John Stuart Mill in his System of Logic, causing an interesting and fruitful debate between them over the nature of inductive reasoning in science, moral philosophy, and political economy. It is in the context of the debate over philosophy of science that Whewell's philosophy was rediscovered in the 20th century by critics of logical positivism. In this entry I will focus on the most important philosophical aspects of Whewell's works: his philosophy of science, including his views of induction, confirmation, and necessary truth; his view of the relation between scientific practice, history of science, and philosophy of science; and his moral philosophy. I will spend the most time on his view of induction, as this is the most interesting part of his philosophy as well as the most misinterpreted.

1. Biography

Whewell was born in 1794, the eldest child of a master-carpenter in Lancaster. The headmaster of his local grammar school, a parish priest, recognized Whewell's intellectual abilities and persuaded his father to allow him to attend the Heversham Grammar School in Westmorland, some twelve miles to the north, where he would be able to qualify for a closed exhibition to Trinity College, Cambridge. In the 19th century and earlier, these “closed exhibitions” or scholarships were set aside for the children of working class parents, to allow for some social mobility. Whewell studied at Haversham Grammar for two years, and received private coaching in mathematics. Although he did win the exhibition it did not provide full resources for a boy of his family's means to attend Cambridge; so money had to be raised in a public subscription to supplement the scholarship money.

He thus came up to Trinity in 1812 as a “sub-sizar” (scholarship student). In 1814 he won the Chancellor's prize for his epic poem “Boadicea,” in this way following in the footsteps of his mother, who had published poems in the local papers. Yet he did not neglect the mathematical side of his training; in 1816 he proved his mathematical prowess by placing as both second Wrangler and second Smith's Prize man. The following year he won a college fellowship. He was elected to the Royal Society in 1820, and ordained a priest (as required for Trinity Fellows) in 1825. He took up the Chair in Mineralogy in 1828, and resigned it in 1832. In 1838 Whewell became Professor of Moral Philosophy. Almost immediately after his marriage to Cordelia Marshall on 12 October 1841, he was named Master of Trinity College upon the recommendation of the Prime Minister Robert Peel. He was Vice-Chancellor of the University in 1842 and again in 1855. In 1848 he played a large role in establishing the Natural and Moral Sciences Triposes at the University. His first wife died in 1855, and he remarried Lady Affleck, the sister of his friend Robert Ellis; Lady Affleck died in 1865. Whewell left no descendents when he died, after being thrown from his horse, on 6 March 1866.

2. Philosophy of Science: Induction

According to Whewell, all knowledge has both an ideal, or subjective dimension, as well as an objective dimension. He called this the “fundamental antithesis” of knowledge. Whewell explained that “in every act of knowledge … there are two opposite elements, which we may call Ideas and Perceptions” (1860a, 307). He criticized Kant and the German Idealists for their exclusive focus on the ideal or subjective element, and Locke and the “Sensationalist School” for their exclusive focus on the empirical, objective element. Like Francis Bacon, Whewell claimed to be seeking a “middle way” between pure rationalism and ultra-empiricism. Whewell believed that gaining knowledge requires attention to both ideal and empirical elements, to ideas as well as sensations. These ideas, which he called “Fundamental Ideas,” are “supplied by the mind itself”—they are not (as Mill and Herschel protested) merely received from our observations of the world. Whewell explained that the Fundamental Ideas are “not a consequence of experience, but a result of the particular constitution and activity of the mind, which is independent of all experience in its origin, though constantly combined with experience in its exercise” (1858a, I, 91). Consequently, the mind is an active participant in our attempts to gain knowledge of the world, not merely a passive recipient of sense data. Ideas such as Space, Time, Cause, and Resemblance provide a structure or form for the multitude of sensations we experience. The Ideas provide a structure by expressing the general relations that exist between our sensations (1847, I, 25). Thus, the Idea of Space allows us to apprehend objects as having form, magnitude, and position. Whewell held, then, that observation is “idea-laden;” all observation, he noted, involves “unconscious inference” using the Fundamental Ideas (see 1858a, I, 46). Each science has a Particular Fundamental idea which is needed to organize the facts with which that science is concerned; thus, Space is the Fundamental Idea of geometry, Cause the Fundamental Idea of mechanics, and Substance the Fundamental Idea of chemistry. Moreover, Whewell explained that each Fundamental Idea has certain “conceptions” included within it; these conceptions are “special modifications” of the Idea applied to particular types of circumstances (1858b, 187). For example, the conception of force is a modification of the Idea of Cause, applied to the particular case of motion (see 1858a, I, 184–5 and 236).

Thus far, this discussion of the Fundamental Ideas may suggest that they are similar to Kant's forms of intuition, and indeed there are some similarities. Because of this, some commentators argue that Whewell's epistemology is a type of Kantianism (see, e.g., Butts 1973, and Buchdahl 1991). However, this interpretation ignores several crucial differences between the two views. Whewell did not follow Kant in drawing a distinction between “precepts,” or forms of intuition, such as Space and Time, and the categories, or forms of thought, in which Kant included the concepts of Cause and Substance. Moreover, Whewell included as Fundamental Ideas many ideas which function not as conditions of experience but as conditions for having knowledge within their respective sciences: although it is certainly possible to have experience of the world without having a distinct idea of, say, Chemical Affinity, we could not have any knowledge of certain chemical processes without it. Unlike Kant, Whewell did not attempt to give an exhaustive list of these Fundamental Ideas; indeed, he believed that there are others which will emerge in the course of the development of science. Moreover, and perhaps most importantly for his philosophy of science, Whewell rejected Kant's claim that we can only have knowledge of our “categorized experience.” The Fundamental Ideas, on Whewell's view, accurately represent objective features of the world, independent of the processes of the mind, and we can use these Ideas in order to have knowledge of these objective features. Indeed, Whewell criticized Kant for viewing external reality as a “dim and unknown region” (see 1860a, 312). Further, Whewell's justification for the presence of these concepts in our minds takes a very different form than Kant's transcendental argument. For Kant, the categories are justified because they make experience possible. For Whewell, though the categories do make experience (of certain kinds) possible, the Ideas are justified by their origin in the mind of a divine creator (see especially his discussion of this in his 1860a). And finally, the type of necessity which Whewell claimed is derived from the Ideas is very different from Kant's notion of the synthetic a priori (I will return to these last two points in the section on Necessary Truth below).

I turn now to a discussion of the theory of induction Whewell developed with his antithetical epistemology. Whewell's first explicit, lengthy discussion of induction is found in his Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences, founded upon their History, which was originally published in 1840 (a second, enlarged edition appeared in 1847, and the third edition appeared as three separate works published between 1858 and 1860). He called his induction “Discoverers' Induction” and explained that it is used to discover both phenomenal and causal laws. Whewell considered himself to be a follower of Bacon, and claimed to be “renovating” Bacon's inductive method; thus one volume of the third edition of the Philosophy is entitled Novum Organon Renovatum. Whewell followed Bacon in rejecting the standard, overly-narrow notion of induction that holds induction to be merely simple enumeration of instances. Rather, Whewell explained that, in induction, “there is a New Element added to the combination [of instances] by the very act of thought by which they were combined” (1847, II, 48). This “act of thought” is a process Whewell called “colligation.” Colligation, according to Whewell, is the mental operation of bringing together a number of empirical facts by “superinducing” upon them a conception which unites the facts and renders them capable of being expressed by a general law. The conception thus provides the “true bond of Unity by which the phenomena are held together” (1847, II, 46), by providing a property shared by the known members of a class (in the case of causal laws, the colligating property is that of sharing the same cause).

Thus the known points of the Martian orbit were colligated by Kepler using the conception of an elliptical curve. Often new discoveries are made, Whewell pointed out, not when new facts are discovered but when the appropriate conception is applied to the facts. In the case of Kepler's discovery, the observed points of the orbit were known to Tycho Brahe, but only when Kepler applied the ellipse conception was the true path of the orbit discovered. Kepler was the first one to apply this conception to an orbital path in part because he had, in his mind, a very clear notion of the conception of an ellipse. This is important because the fundamental ideas and conceptions are provided by our minds, but they cannot be used in their innate form. Whewell explained that “the Ideas, the germs of them at least, were in the human mind before [experience]; but by the progress of scientific thought they are unfolded into clearness and distinctness” (1860a, 373). Whewell referred to this “unfolding” of ideas and conceptions as the “explication of conceptions.” Explication is a necessary precondition to discovery, and it consists in a partly empirical, partly rational process. Scientists first try to clarify and make explicit a conception in their minds, then attempt to apply it to the facts they have precisely examined, to determine whether the conception can colligate the facts into a law. If not, the scientist uses this experience to attempt a further refinement of the conception. Whewell claimed that a large part of the history of science is the “history of scientific ideas,” that is, the history of their explication and subsequent use as colligating concepts. Thus, in the case of Kepler's use of the ellipse conception, Whewell noted that “to supply this conception, required a special preparation, and a special activity in the mind of the discoverer. … To discover such a connection, the mind must be conversant with certain relations of space, and with certain kinds of figures” (1849, 28–9).

Once conceptions have been explicated, it is possible to choose the appropriate conception with which to colligate phenomena. But how is the appropriate conception chosen? According to Whewell , it is not a matter of guesswork. Nor, importantly, is it merely a matter of observation. Whewell explained that “there is a special process in the mind, in addition to the mere observation of facts, which is necessary” (1849, 40). This “special process in the mind” is a process of inference. “We infer more than we see,” Whewell claimed (1858a, I, 46). Typically, finding the appropriate conception with which to colligate a class of phenomena requires a series of inferences, thus Whewell noted that discoverers's induction is a process involving a “train of researches” (1857/1873, I, 297). He allows any type of inference in the colligation, including enumerative, eliminative and analogical. Thus Kepler in his Astronomia Nova (1609) can be seen as using various forms of inference to reach the ellipse conception (see Snyder 1997a). When Augustus DeMorgan complained, in his 1847 logic text, about certain writers using the term “induction” as including “the use of the whole box of [logical] tools,” he was undoubtedly referring to his teacher and friend Whewell.

After the known members of a class are colligated with the use of a conception, the second step of Whewell's discoverers' induction occurs: namely, the generalization of the shared property over the complete class, including its unknown members. Often, as Whewell admitted, this is a trivially simple procedure. Once Kepler supplied the conception of an ellipse to the observed members of the class of Mars' positions, he generalized it to all members of the class, including those which were unknown (unobserved), to reach the conclusion that “all the points of Mars' orbit lie on an ellipse with the sun at one focus.” He then performed a further generalization to reach his first law of planetary motion: “the orbits of all the planets lie on ellipses with the sun at one focus.”

I mentioned earlier that Whewell thought of himself as renovating Bacon's inductive philosophy. His inductivism does share numerous features with Bacon's method of interpreting nature: for instance the claims that induction must involve more than merely simple enumeration of instances, that science must be proceed by successive steps of generalization, that inductive science can reach unobservables (for Bacon, the “forms,” for Whewell, unobservable entities such as light waves or properties such as elliptical orbits or gravitational forces). (For more on the relation between Whewell and Bacon see Snyder 1999). Yet, surprisingly, the received view of Whewell's methodology in the 20th century has tended to describe Whewell as an anti-inductivist in the Popperian mold (see, for example, Butts 1987, Buchdahl 1991, Laudan 1980, Niiniluoto 1977, and Ruse 1975). That is, it is claimed that Whewell endorses a “conjectures and refutations” view of scientific discovery. However, it is clear from the above discussion that his view of discoverers' induction does not resemble the view asserting that hypotheses can be and are typically arrived at by mere guesswork. Moreover, Whewell explicitly rejects the hypothetico-deductive claim that hypotheses discovered by non-rational guesswork can be confirmed by consequentialist testing. For example, in his review of his friend Herschel's Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy, Whewell argued, against Herschel, that verification is not possible when a hypothesis has been formed non-inductively (1831, 400–1). Nearly thirty years later, in the last edition of the Philosophy, Whewell referred to the belief that “the discovery of laws and causes of phenomena is a loose hap-hazard sort of guessing,” and claimed that this type of view “appears to me to be a misapprehension of the whole nature of science” (1860a, 274). In other mature works he noted that discoveries are made “not by any capricious conjecture of arbitrary selection” (1858a, I, 29) and explained that new hypotheses are properly “collected from the facts” (1849, 17). In fact, Whewell was criticized by David Brewster for not agreeing that discoveries, including Newton's discovery of the universal gravitation law, were typically made by accident.

Why has Whewell been misinterpreted by so many modern commentators? One reason has to do with the error of reading certain terms used by Whewell in the 19th century as if they held the same meaning they have in the 20th and 21st. Thus, since Whewell used the terms “conjectures” and “guesses,” we are told that he shares Popper's methodology. Whewell made mention, for instance, of the “happy guesses” made by scientists (1858b, 64) and claimed that “advances in knowledge” often follow “the previous exercise of some boldness and license in guessing” (1847, II, 55). But Whewell often used these terms in a way which connotes a conclusion which is simply not conclusively confirmed. The Oxford English Dictionary tells us that prior to the 20th century the term “conjecture” was used to connote not a hypothesis reached by non-rational means, but rather one which is “unverified,” or which is “a conclusion as to what is likely or probable” (as opposed to the results of demonstration). The term was used this way by Bacon, Kepler, Newton, and Dugald Stewart, writers whose work was well-known to Whewell. In other places where Whewell used the term “conjecture” he suggests that what appears to be the result of guesswork is actually what we might call an “educated guess,” i.e., a conclusion drawn by (weak) inference. Whewell described Kepler's discovery, which seems so “capricious and fanciful” as actually being “regulated” by his “clear scientific ideas” (1857/1873, I, 291–2). Finally Whewell's use of the terminology of guessing sometimes occurs in the context of a distinction he draws between the generation of a number of possible conceptions, and the selection of one to superinduce upon the facts. Before the appropriate conception is found, the scientist must be able to call up in his mind a number of possible ones (see 1858b, 79). Whewell noted that this calling up of many possibilities “is, in some measure, a process of conjecture.” However, selecting the appropriate conception with which to colligate the data is not conjectural (1858b, 78). Thus Whewell claimed that the selection of the conception is often “preluded by guesses” (1858b, xix); he does not, that is, claim that the selection consists in guesswork. When inference is not used to select the appropriate conception, the resulting theory is not an “induction,” but rather a “hasty and imperfect hypothesis.” He drew such a distinction between Copernicus' heliocentric theory, which he called an induction, and the heliocentric system proposed by Aristarchus in the third century b.c., to which he referred as a hasty and imperfect hypothesis (1857/1873, I, 258).

Thus Whewell's philosophy of science cannot be described as the hypothetico-deductive view. It is an inductive method; yet it clearly differs from the more narrow inductivism of Mill. Whewell's view of induction has the advantage over Mill's of allowing the inference to unobservable properties and entities (for more on this topic see Snyder 1997a and 1997b).

3. Philosophy of Science: Confirmation

On Whewell's view, once a theory is invented by discoverers' induction, it must pass a variety of tests before it can be considered confirmed as an empirical truth. These tests are prediction, consilience, and coherence (see 1858b, 83–96). These are characterized by Whewell as, first, that “our hypotheses ought to fortel [sic] phenomena which have not yet been observed” (1858b, 86); second, that they should “explain and determine cases of a kind different from those which were contemplated in the formation” of those hypotheses (1858b, 88); and third that hypotheses must “become more coherent” over time (1858b, 91).

I start by discussing the criterion of prediction. Our hypotheses ought to foretell phenomena, “at least all phenomena of the same kind,” Whewell explained, because “our assent to the hypothesis implies that it is held to be true of all particular instances. That these cases belong to past or to future times, that they have or have not already occurred, makes no difference in the applicability of the rule to them. Because the rule prevails, it includes all cases” (1858b, 86). Whewell's point here is simply that since our hypotheses are in universal form, a true hypothesis will cover all particular instances of the rule, including past, present, and future cases. But he also makes the stronger claim that successful predictions of unknown facts provide greater confirmatory value than explanations of already-known facts. Thus he held the historical claim that “new evidence” is more valuable than “old evidence.” He believed that “to predict unknown facts found afterwards to be true is … a confirmation of a theory which in impressiveness and value goes beyond any explanation of known facts” (1857/1873, II, 557). Whewell claimed that the agreement of the prediction with what occurs (i.e., the fact that the prediction turns out to be correct), is “nothing strange, if the theory be true, but quite unaccountable, if it be not” (1860a, 273–4). For example, if Newtonian theory were not true, he argued, the fact that from the theory we could correctly predict the existence, location and mass of a new planet, Neptune (as did happen in 1846), would be bewildering, and indeed miraculous.

An even more valuable confirmation criterion, according to Whewell, is that of “consilience.” Whewell explained that “the evidence in favour of our induction is of a much higher and more forcible character when it enables us to explain and determine [i.e., predict] cases of a kind different from those which were contemplated in the formation of our hypothesis. The instances in which this have occurred, indeed, impress us with a conviction that the truth of our hypothesis is certain” (1858b, 87–8). Whewell called this type of evidence a “jumping together” or “consilience” of inductions. An induction, which results from the colligation of one class of facts, is found also to colligate successfully facts belonging to another class. Whewell's notion of consilience is thus related to his view of natural classes of objects or events.

To understand this confirmation criterion, it may be helpful to schematize the “jumping together” that occurred in the case of Newton's law of universal gravitation, Whewell's exemplary case of consilience. On Whewell's view, Newton used the form of inference Whewell characterized as “discoverers' induction” in order to reach his universal gravitation law, the inverse-square law of attraction. Part of this process is portrayed in book III of the Principia, where Newton listed a number of “propositions.” These propositions are empirical laws that are inferred from certain “phenomena” (which are described in the preceding section of book III). The first such proposition or law is that “the forces by which the circumjovial planets are continually drawn off from rectilinear motions, and retained in their proper orbits, tend to Jupiter's centre; and are inversely as the squares of the distances of the places of those planets from that centre.” The result of another, separate induction from the phenomena of “planetary motion” is that “the forces by which the primary planets are continually drawn off from rectilinear motions, and retained in their proper orbits, tend to the sun; and are inversely as the squares of the distances of the places of those planets from the sun's centre.” Newton saw that these laws, as well as other results of a number of different inductions, coincided in postulating the existence of an inverse-square attractive force as the cause of various classes of phenomena. According to Whewell, Newton saw that these inductions “leap to the same point;” i.e., to the same law. Newton was then able to bring together inductively (or “colligate”) these laws, and facts of other kinds of events (e.g., the class of events known as “falling bodies”), into a new, more general law, namely the universal gravitation law: “All bodies attract each other with a force of gravity which is inverse as the squares of the distances.” By seeing that an inverse-square attractive force provided a cause for different classes of events—for satellite motion, planetary motion, and falling bodies—Newton was able to perform a more general induction, to his universal law.

What Newton found was that these different kinds of phenomena—including circumjovial orbits, planetary orbits, as well as falling bodies—share an essential property, namely the same cause. What Newton did, in effect, was to subsume these individual “event kinds” into a more general natural kind comprised of sub-kinds sharing a kind essence, namely being caused by an inverse-square attractive force. Consilience of event kinds therefore results in causal unification. More specifically, it results in unification of natural kind categories based on a shared cause. Phenomena that constitute different event kinds, such as “planetary motion,” “tidal activity,” and “falling bodies,” were found by Newton to be members of a unified, more general kind, “phenomena caused to occur by an inverse-square attractive force of gravity” (or, “gravitational phenomena”). In such cases, according to Whewell, we learn that we have found a “vera causa,” or a “true cause,” i.e., a cause that really exists in nature, and whose effects are members of the same natural kind (see 1860a, p. 191). Moreover, by finding a cause shared by phenomena in different sub-kinds, we are able to colligate all the facts about these kinds into a more general causal law. Whewell claimed that “when the theory, by the concurrences of two indications … has included a new range of phenomena, we have, in fact, a new induction of a more general kind, to which the inductions formerly obtained are subordinate, as particular cases to a general population” (1858b, 96). He noted that consilience is the means by which we effect the successive generalization that constitutes the advancement of science (1847, II, 74).

Whewell discussed a further, related test of a theory's truth: namely, “coherence.” In the case of true theories, Whewell claimed, “the system becomes more coherent as it is further extended. The elements which we require for explaining a new class of facts are already contained in our system….In false theories, the contrary is the case” (1858b, 91). Coherence occurs when we are able to extend our hypothesis to colligate a new class of phenomena without ad hoc modification of the hypothesis. When Newton extended his theory regarding an inverse-square attractive force, which colligated facts of planetary motion and lunar motion, to the class of “tidal activity,” he did not need to add any new suppositions to the theory in order to colligate correctly the facts about particular tides. On the other hand, Whewell explained, when phlogiston theory, which colligated facts about the class of phenomena “chemical combination,” was extended to colligate the class of phenomena “weight of bodies,” it was unable to do so without an ad hoc and implausible modification (namely, the assumption that phlogiston has “negative weight”) (see 1858b, 92–3). Thus coherence can be seen as a type of consilience that happens over time; indeed, Whewell remarked that these two criteria—consilience and coherence—“are, in fact, hardly different” (1858b, 95).

4. Philosophy of Science: Necessary Truth

A particularly intriguing aspect of Whewell's philosophy of science is his claim that empirical science can reach necessary truths. Explaining this apparently contradictory claim was considered by Whewell to be the “ultimate problem” of philosophy (see Morrison 1997). Whewell explained it by reference to his antithetical epistemology. Necessary truths are truths which can be known a priori; they can be known in this way because they are necessary consequences of ideas which are a priori. They are necessary consequences in the sense of being analytic consequences. Whewell explicitly rejected Kant's claim that necessary truths are synthetic. Using the example “7 + 8 = 15,” Whewell claimed that “we refer to our conceptions of seven, of eight, and of addition, and as soon as we possess the conceptions distinctly, we see that the sum must be 15.” That is, merely by knowing the meanings of “seven,” and “eight,” and “addition,” we see that it follows necessarily that “7 + 8 = 15” (1848, 471).

Once the Ideas and conceptions are explicated, so that we understand their meanings, the necessary truths which follow from them are seen as being necessarily true. Thus, once the Idea of Space is explicated, it is seen to be necessarily true that “two straight lines cannot enclose a space.” Whewell suggested that the first law of motion is also a necessary truth, which was knowable a priori once the Idea of Cause and the associated conception of force were explicated. This is why empirical science is needed to see necessary truths: because, as we saw above, empirical science is needed in order to explicate the Ideas. Thus Whewell also claimed that, in the course of science, truths which at first required experiment to be known are seen to be capable of being known independently of experiment. That is, once the relevant Idea is clarified, the necessary connection between the Idea and an empirical truth becomes apparent. Whewell explained that “though the discovery of the First Law of Motion was made, historically speaking, by means of experiment, we have now attained a point of view in which we see that it might have been certainly known to be true independently of experience” (1847, I, 221). Science, then, consists in the “idealization of facts,” the transferring of truths from the empirical to the ideal side of the fundamental antithesis. He described this process as the “progressive intuition of necessary truths.”

Although they follow analytically from the meanings of ideas our minds supply, necessary truths are nevertheless informative statements about the physical world outside us; they have empirical content. Whewell's justification for this claim is a theological one. Whewell noted that God created the universe in accordance with certain “Divine Ideas.” That is, all objects and events in the world were created by God to conform to certain of his ideas. For example, God made the world such that it corresponds to the idea of Cause partially expressed by the axiom “every event has a cause.” Hence in the universe every event conforms to this idea, not only by having a cause but by being such that it could not occur without a cause. On Whewell's view, we are able to have knowledge of the world because the Fundamental Ideas which are used to organize our sciences resemble the ideas used by God in his creation of the physical world. The fact that this is so is no coincidence: God has created our minds such that they contain these same ideas. That is, God has given us our ideas (or, rather, the “germs” of the ideas) so that “they can and must agree with the world” (1860a, 359). God intends that we can have knowledge of the physical world, and this is possible only through the use of ideas which resemble those that were used in creating the world. Hence with our ideas—once they are properly “unfolded” and explicated—we can colligate correctly the facts of the world and form true theories. And when these ideas are distinct, we can know a priori the axioms which express their meaning.

An interesting consequence of this interpretation of Whewell's view of necessity is that every law of nature is a necessary truth, in virtue of following analytically from some idea used by God in creating the world. Whewell drew no distinction between truths which can be idealized and those which cannot; thus, potentially, any empirical truth can be seen to be a necessary truth, once the ideas and conceptions are explicated sufficiently. For example, Whewell suggests that experiential truths such as “salt is soluble” may be necessary truths, even if we do not recognize this necessity (i.e., even if it is not yet knowable a priori) (1860b, 483). Whewell's view thus destroys the line traditionally drawn between laws of nature and the axiomatic propositions of the pure sciences of mathematics; mathematical truth is granted no special status.

In this way Whewell suggested a view of scientific understanding which is, perhaps not surprisingly, grounded in his conception of natural theology. Since our ideas are “shadows” of the Divine Ideas, to see a law as a necessary consequence of our ideas is to see it as a consequence of the Divine Ideas exemplified in the world. Understanding involves seeing a law as being not an arbitrary “accident on the cosmic scale,” but as a necessary consequence of the ideas God used in creating the universe. Hence the more we idealize the facts, the more difficult it will be to deny God's existence. We will come to see more and more truths as the intelligible result of intentional design. This view is related to the claim Whewell had earlier made in his Bridgewater Treatise (1833), that the more we study the laws of nature the more convinced we will be in the existence of a Divine Law-giver

5. The Relation Between Scientific Practice, History of Science, and Philosophy of Science

An issue of interest to philosophers of science today is the relation between knowledge of the actual practice and history of science and writing a philosophy of science. Whewell is interesting to examine in relation to this issue because he claimed to be inferring his philosophy of science from his study of the history and practice of science. His large-scale History of the Inductive Sciences (first edition published 1837) was a survey of science from ancient to modern times. He insisted upon completing this work before writing his Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences, founded upon their history. Moreover, Whewell sent proof-sheets of the History to his many scientist-friends to ensure the accuracy of his accounts. Besides knowing about the history of science, Whewell had first-hand knowledge of scientific practice: he was actively involved in science in several important ways. In 1825 he traveled to Berlin and Vienna to study mineralogy and crystallography with Mohs and other acknowledged masters of the field. He published numerous papers in the field, as well as a monograph, and is still credited with making important contributions to giving a mathematical foundation to crystallography. He also made contributions to the science of tidal research, pushing for a large-scale world-wide project of tidal observations; he won a Royal Society gold medal for this accomplishment. (For more on Whewell's contributions to science, see Snyder 2002, Ruse 1991, and Becher 1986). Whewell acted as a terminological consultant for Faraday and other scientists, who wrote to him asking for new words. Whewell only provided terminology when he believed he was fully knowledgeable about the science involved. In his section on the “Language of Science” in the Philosophy, Whewell makes clear this position (see 1858b, p. 293). Another interesting aspect of his intercourse with scientists becomes clear in reading his correspondence with them: namely, that Whewell constantly pushed Faraday, Forbes, Lubbock and others to perform certain experiments, make specific observations, and to try to connect their findings in ways of interest to Whewell (see Snyder 2002). In all these ways, Whewell indicated that he had a deep understanding of the activity of science.

So how is this important for his work on the philosophy of science? Some commentators have claimed that Whewell developed an a priori philosophy of science and then shaped his History to conform to his own view (see Stoll 1929 and Strong 1955). It is true that he started out, from his undergraduate days, with the project of reforming the inductive philosophy of Bacon; indeed this early inductivism led him to the view that learning about scientific method must be inductive (i.e., that it requires the study of the history of science). Yet it is clear that he believed his study of the history of science and his own work in science were needed in order to flesh out the details of his inductive position. Thus, as in his epistemology, both a priori and empirical elements combined in the development of his scientific methodology. Ultimately, Whewell criticized Mill's view of induction developed in the System of Logic not because Mill had not inferred it from a study of the history of science, but rather on the grounds that Mill had not been able to find a large number of appropriate examples illustrating the use of his “Methods of Experimental Inquiry.” As Whewell noted, Bacon too had been unable to show that his inductive method had been exemplified throughout the history of science. Thus it appears that what was important to Whewell was not whether a philosophy of science had been, in fact, inferred from a study of the history of science, but rather, whether a philosophy of science was inferable from it. That is, regardless of how a philosopher came to invent her theory, she must be able to show it to be exemplified in the actual scientific practice used throughout history. Whewell believed that he was able to do this for his discoverers' induction.

6. Moral Philosophy

Whewell's moral philosophy was criticized by Mill as being “intuitionist” (see Mill 1852). Whewell's morality is intuitionist in the sense of claiming that humans possess a faculty (“conscience”) which enables them to discern directly what is morally right or wrong. His view differs from that of earlier philosophers such as Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, who claimed that this faculty is akin to our sense organs and thus spoke of conscience as a “moral sense.” Whewell's position is more similar to that of intuitionists such as Cudworth and Clarke, who claimed that our moral faculty is reason. Whewell maintained that there is no separate moral faculty, but rather that conscience is just “reason exercised on moral subjects.” For this reason, Whewell referred to moral rules as “principles of reason” and described the discovery of these rules as an activity of reason (see 1864, 23–4). These moral rules “are primary principles, and are established in our minds simply by a contemplation of our moral nature and condition; or, what expresses the same thing, by intuition” (1846, 11). Yet, what he meant by “intuition” was not a non-rational mental process, as Mill suggested. On Whewell's view, the contemplation of the moral principles is conceived as a rational process. Whewell noted that “Certain moral principles being, as I have said, thus seen to be true by intuition, under due conditions of reflection and thought, are unfolded into their application by further reflection and thought”(1864, 12–13). Morality requires rules because reason is our distinctive property, and “Reason directs us to Rules” (1864, 45). Whewell's morality, then, does not have one problem associated with the moral sense intuitionists. For the moral sense intuitionist, the process of decision-making is non-rational; just as we feel the rain on our skin by a non-rational process, we just feel what the right action is. This is often considered the major difficulty with the intuitionist view: if the decision is merely a matter of intuition, it seems that there can be no way to settle disputes over how we ought to act. However, Whewell never suggested that decision-making in morality is a non-rational process. On the contrary, he believed that reason leads to common decisions about the right way to act (although our desires/affections may get in the way): he explained “So far as men decide comformably to Reason, they decide alike” (see 1864, 43). Thus the decision on how we ought to act should be made by reason, and so disputes can be settled rationally on Whewell's view.

Mill also criticized Whewell's claim that moral rules are necessary truths which are self-evident. Mill took this to mean that there can be no progress in morality—what is self-evident must always remain so—and thus to the further conclusion that the intuitionist considers the current rules of society to be necessary truths. Such a view would tend to support the status quo, as Mill rightly complained. (Thus he accused Whewell of justifying evil practices such as slavery, forced marriages, and cruelty to animals.) But Mill was wrong to attribute such a view to Whewell. Whewell did claim that moral rules are necessary truths, and invested them with the epistemological status of self-evident “axioms” (see 1864, 58). However, as noted above, Whewell's view of necessary truth is a progressive one. This is as much so in morality as in science. The realm of morality, like the realm of physical science, is structured by certain Fundamental Ideas: Benevolence, Justice, Truth, Purity, and Order (see 1852, xxiii). These moral ideas are conditions of our moral experience; they enable us to perceive actions as being in accordance with the demands of morality. Like the ideas of the physical sciences, the ideas of morality must be explicated before the moral rules can be derived from them (see 1860a, 388). There is a progressive intuition of necessary truth in morality as well as in science. Hence it does not follow that because the moral truths are axiomatic and self-evident that we currently know them (see 1846, 38–9). Indeed, Whewell claimed that “to test self-evidence by the casual opinion of individual men, is a self-contradiction” (1846, 35). Nevertheless, Whewell did believe that we can look to the dictates of positive law of the most morally advanced societies as a starting point in our explication of the moral ideas. But he was not therefore suggesting that these laws are the standard of morality. Just as we examine the phenomena of the physical world in order to explicate our scientific conceptions, we can examine the facts of positive law and the history of moral philosophy in order to explicate our moral conceptions. Only when these conceptions are explicated can we see what axioms or necessary truths of morality truly follow from them. Mill was therefore wrong to interpret Whewell's moral philosophy as a justification of the status quo or as constituting a “vicious circle.” Rather, Whewell's view shares some features of Rawls's later use of the notion of “reflective equilibrium.”


Whewell's letters and papers, mostly unpublished, are found in the Whewell Collection, Trinity College Library, Cambridge. A selection of letters was published by I. Todhunter in William Whewell, An account of his Writings, Vol. II (London, 1876) and by J. Stair-Douglas in The Life, and Selections from the Correspondence of William Whewell (London, 1882).

During his lifetime Whewell published approximately 150 books, articles, scientific papers, society reports, reviews, and translations. In the list which follows I mention only his most important philosophical works relevant to the discussion above. More complete bibliographies can be found in Yeo (1993) and Fisch and Schaffer (1991).

Major Philosophical Works by Whewell

Selected Works on Whewell

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Bacon, Francis | confirmation | induction: problem of | Kant, Immanuel | Mill, John Stuart | Popper, Karl