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Aristotelianism in the Renaissance

First published Wed Nov 16, 2005

“Renaissance” is used as a useful short label for the period ca. 1348 to ca. 1648. But the use of the term “Aristotelianism” as applied to texts, contents and contexts of that period is problematic.[1] Some authors did indeed consider themselves as part of a “peripatetic” (i.e., Aristotelian) current or school,[2] but it would be counterintuitive to limit the application of the term “Aristotelianism” only to those authors of whom such statements are known (since it probably would exclude most renaissance commentators on Aristotle). On the other hand, if we use the term “Aristotelianism” to denote everything in Renaissance philosophy that with some high degree of probability makes direct or indirect use of Aristotle's texts would mean that “Aristotelianism in the Renaissance” and “Philosophy in the Renaissance” are equivalent terms (cf. Keßler 1990).

However, there are texts in Renaissance philosophy that are obviously more “Aristotelian” than others, namely, the commentaries on texts by Aristotle. There are more of them than we have from any other period of the history of philosophy. And in many of the Renaissance universities philosophy training was keyed to the interpretation of texts by Aristotle and often involved the use of textbooks derived from works by Aristotle and his commentators. In addition to this, the corpus aristotelicum was used as a matrix for textbooks and encyclopedias and as a starting point for treatises on more or less special philosophical questions.[3]

1. Commentaries on Texts from the Corpus Aristotelicum

In no other period of the history of philosophy, as far as we know, have so many commentaries on works by Aristotle been written (both per year and in total) as in the Renaissance.[4] Even on the incomplete basis of Lohr's first version of his catalogue of Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries[5] Richard Blum has counted 6653 such commentaries for the period 1500 to 1650.[6] The magnitude of this number should be considered significant — especially in comparison to the ca. 750 commentaries listed for the fifteenth century in Lohr's catalogue of “mediaeval” Aristotle commentaries.[7]

The real reasons of this increase of interest are yet unknown. However, the reasons might include:

It is possible to name Renaissance Aristotle commentaries influenced by one or more of each of these. As a whole, the reasons given above contribute to the great variety of what can be found in Renaissance Aristotle commentaries;[10]. It may even be that such delightful variety is what chiefly attracts current scholars to studying this genre of philosophical literature. And yet most of these commentaries have not yet been studied by anyone in post-rinascimental times.[11]

There have been some attempts to sort Renaissance Aristotle commentators into groups according to their use of or degree of adherence to pre-Renaissance Aristotle commentaries (e.g., “averroist”, “alexandrist”, “thomist” schools/groups/traditions). However, it is doubtful that such a sorting contributes to a better understanding of their texts and contexts. This is because many authors of Aristotle commentaries — including some who had a particular preference for one or more of the earlier commentators — used the earlier commentaries on a case by case basis.

As far as we know, most of these commentaries were written for use in a university setting (see below). As a consequence, the choice of texts commented upon and the degree of detail given to a certain passage is often due, at least in part, to its use in a classroom, a universitarian debate or its relevance for exams.

There are no sharp borderlines between commentaries proper, textbooks, encyclopedias, and treatises. And even where the work in question is a commentary in the most narrow sense of the word, the text can be some sort of bibliographie raisonée of the previous literature (e.g., some of Augustinus Niphus's texts), a decent guide to some probable meaning of Aristotle's text (e.g., some of Cesare Cremonini's commentaries on the Parva naturalia), or a text written in order to influence the political world of the day (e.g., Antonio Montecatini's commentary on the third book of Aristotle's politics [Montecatini, 1597]), or anything in-between.

Although most of the commentaries apparently deal with those texts from the corpus aristotelicum that have been the focus of interest from the 13th century to today, the Renaissance is a period where the percentage of commentaries and other texts dealing with the less frequently read works of Aristotle (e.g., the Problemata, the Parva naturalia) is higher than one might expect.

2. Philosophy at Renaissance Universities[12]

Although there seems to be no simple answer to the question of which Renaissance institutions of “higher education” should be considered as “universities”;[13] there is neither doubt nor conflict about the fact, that there were many universities, and that many of them were founded in the Renaissance.[14] And at virtually all of them much of the philosophy taught there was directly or indirectly founded on parts of the corpus aristotelicum.

In general, only some of the fields covered by the corpus aristotelicum were part of any single university curriculum. We do not yet have a survey on what was taught where and when, so we cannot yet give a complete assessment,[15] but permitting some margin of error, we can say:

It seems difficult (or even impossible) to find a single statement on which all known Renaissance “Aristotelians” agree. This may be due, in part, to the specialization of teachers (Melanchthon not agreeing that all knowledge rises from the senses, Cremonini disinterested in moral philosophy and thus not making statements on virtues, …).

There are a few explicit statements of the reasons for basing the teaching of philosophy at universities on the corpus aristotelicum or works derived from it. Augustinus Niphus (died 1538)—who probably gave the fullest treatment of this question—gives the following reasons (Niphus, 1544, f. †††† 2vb): The parts of philosophy are treated by Aristotle one by one in books each of which is dedicated to just one part of philosophy; he proceeds from what is better known to us to that which is less known to us; he finds out about things by discussing views held by others; he treats everything with apt ampleness and conciseness; his style is that of a philosopher and not that of an orator; he is consistent.

Philipp Melanchthon states, in his 1536 oration “On philosophy” (Melanchthon, 1843), that you have to choose a genre of philosophy which is not sophistic, and which adheres to the correct method, and that the one taught by Aristotle is such a philosophy.[17] (He then continues to reject stoic, epicurean and platonic alternatives … .)

Note that neither Niphus nor Melanchthon claim that a reason for using the corpus aristotelicum as the basis of teaching philosophy at universities is the truth of any of Aristotle's statements.[18] Melanchthon goes on to request that, in addition to Aristotle, other authors should be used for some fields, something that is admitted also by Niphus.[19] Philosophy taught at Renaissance universities uses Aristotle as its main starting point and main basis, but (at least in many cases) Aristotle (together with his commentators) is not the only basis of philosophy taught at Renaissance universities.[20]

Interest in Renaissance university philosophy has been rekindled by Ernest Renan who investigated several philosophers teaching at Padua (Renan, 1866), and “Paduan” Renaissance university philosophy is the part of “Renaissance Aristotelianism” that has been most thoroughly studied. But as research progresses and more knowledge is gained about more universities and authors, the image gets more complex and less apt for generalizations. This adds insight into the diversity of the traditions at each university and the diversity of philosophies taught by teachers at each one.[21] These teachers are probably best studied as single philosophers, and not as mere adherents or members of some school.[22]

3. Textbooks and Encyclopedias

Textbooks and encyclopedias are not necessarily contrasting genres, as sometimes encyclopedias were used as textbooks. In spite of being (again) based on Aristotle (and his commentators), some textbooks did provide more “untraditional” views by integrating material found in Aristotle (and his commentators) with material found in other authors.[23] Other textbooks provided untraditional views by their choice of what they retained and what they left out and how they paraphrased what they retained.[24]

Although these textbooks are not proper ‘commentaries’ on the works of Aristotle, in some cases they provide sensible interpretation of statements by Aristotle beyond many commentaries.[25]

Schmitt's “The rise of the philosophical textbook” (1988) remains the definitive text to read on philosophical textbooks in the Renaissance.

4. Treatises etc.

Commentaries and textbooks are not the only types of texts used for interpreting, discussing, defending, adapting and transforming the doctrines of Aristotle (and his commentators) in the Renaissance. Specialized treatises cover a wide range of subjects: on the immortality of the soul, on innate heat, on the agent sense, on the regressus, on vapour, on rhetoric imitation, …. These treatises often treat a certain subject more or less for its own sake, and not just in order to find out what was Aristotle's opinion on it—though the author will often settle for a position that he believes to be the position of Aristotle.

Many printed collections of theses (for doctoral dissertations or other purposes) can also be considered as specialized monographs — though in the form we have them most of them do not provide us with the argumentations that lead to the assumptions made.

Franciscus Patritius's Discussiones peripateticæ (Patritius, 1581), although not a pro-Aristotelian text, is one of the most learned works on the subject of Aristotle and the Aristotelian traditions we have from the Renaissance. And it does not easily fit into any of the sections used here.

5. Some Remarks on the History of the Habit of Sorting Renaissance Philosophy into Schools

The ancient habit of sorting philosophers into schools or groups seems first to have been applied to Aristotelian philosophers by Franciscus Patritius[26] in his Discussiones peripateticæ. It is an approach, that is useful to give order to a text that treats a great number of Renaissance Aristotelians.[27] But in a text not trying to give at least superficial doxographical information concerning the single philosophers and their works, it might (correctly) be interpreted as a pretext not to study these philosophers and their works.[28] And the charming character of Renaissance “Aristotelian” texts is more situated in their (considerable) diversities than in their (limited) similarities.



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Albert of Saxony | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Alyngton, Robert | Aristotle | Aristotle, commentators on | Bacon, Francis | Bessarion, Basil [Cardinal] | Biel, Gabriel | Byzantine philosophy | Case, John | Coimbra: University of | doxography of ancient philosophy | Fonseca, Petrus | Galenism: in the Renaissance | Galileo Galilei | Heytesbury, William | humanism: in the Renaissance | Ignatius of Loyola | Latin Averroism | Lefèvre d'Étaples, Jacques | logic: informal | Marsilius of Inghen | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | Melanchthon, Philip | natural philosophy: in the Renaissance | Neoplatonism: in the Renaissance | Patrizi, Francesco | Paul of Venice | Pomponazzi, Pietro | Zabarella, Giacomo