Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Harriet Taylor Mill

First published Mon Mar 11, 2002; substantive revision Thu Feb 12, 2009
Were I but capable of interpreting to the world one half the great thoughts and noble feelings which are buried in her grave, I should be the medium of a greater benefit to it, than is ever likely to arise from anything that I can write, unprompted and unassisted by her all but unrivalled wisdom.
—J. S. Mill

Harriet Taylor Mill (1807–1858) had a general interest in social-political philosophy and ethics and a particular interest in the education and rights of women, but there is some question about whether she has sufficient responsibility for a body of work of sufficient extent and caliber to make her more than a minor footnote in the history of philosophy. The few published pieces that we can confidently describe as exclusively hers are philosophically slight. However, we cannot evaluate her as a philosopher without considering her influence on the work of John Stuart Mill, her friend and companion for many years and, eventually, her second husband. He not only lavishes praise on her intellect, emotional depth, and moral character, but also credits her with making major contributions to many of the works published in his name, including some of the most important. Today, scholars debate how much of a difference she really made to “his” corpus, whether whatever effect she had on it was an improving one, and how close she came to living up to his hagiographical accounts of her in passages such as the one from the dedication to On Liberty that is quoted above (J. S. Mill 1977, p. 216).

1. Biographical Sketch

The woman who is today most commonly known as Harriet Taylor or Harriet Taylor Mill (hereafter “Harriet”) was born Harriet Hardy in London in October 1807.[1] She married the pharmaceuticals wholesaler John Taylor on 14 March 1826; she was eighteen, and he was thirty nine. The couple had three children: Herbert, born in 1827; Algernon (“Haji”), born in 1830; and Helen (“Lily”), born in 1831. John Taylor died of rectal cancer in 1849, and in the spring of 1851 Harriet was married again, this time to John Stuart Mill (hereafter “John”). She suffered from various health problems affecting her nervous and respiratory systems. In 1841, for instance, she lost much of the use of her legs for an extended period (J. S. Mill 1963, pp. 486–7). A tuberculosis sufferer, as was John—it is possible that she caught “consumption” from him (see Packe 1954, 360)—she died of a respiratory failure on 3 November 1858.

Harriet and John met for the first time in 1830. Their meeting was arranged by the leader of Harriet's Unitarian congregation, the Reverend W. J. Fox. There is no way to know whether Fox anticipated that passionate feelings would spring up between John and Harriet, but whatever his intention, the two young people did very quickly fall in love. Their conduct during the long period in which Harriet was married to John Taylor would be scandalous by contemporary standards, let alone Victorian ones. Early on, John made almost nightly visits to the Taylors' home, visits that Taylor would facilitate by going to his club. On the whole, Taylor was remarkably tolerant of the fact that his wife was on such intimate terms with another man, but his tolerance did have some limits. In 1833, at his insistence, Harriet established a separate residence, and she lived apart from Taylor for most of the rest of his life, seeing John at her convenience (Helen lived with her, Herbert and Haji with their father). In 1848, Taylor refused to allow John to dedicate The Principles of Political Economy to Harriet, although the dedication was nonetheless inserted into copies of the book that they distributed to friends. In 1849, Taylor began to suffer from the disease that would eventually take his life, and he asked Harriet to return home to care for him. She declined, on the grounds that her first duty was to John, who at the time was suffering himself from an injured hip and temporary near-blindness. While John eventually mended, Taylor's condition only worsened, and at the end Harriet did dedicate herself to caring for her husband. In fact, she rebuked John very sharply for having failed, while visiting her, to ask about Taylor's health. She upbraided him even more severely for having suggested that she might write to him during an “odd time” when she might find a “change of subject of thought a relief”: “Good God, sh[oul]d you think it a relief to think of something else some acquaintance or what not while I was dying?” (H. T. Mill 1998, 360).

After their marriage, the Mills spent most of their time in their Blackheath Park home, with just Haji and Helen Taylor for company. They had already largely withdrawn from society, perhaps due to the gossip that their relationship generated. Real or perceived slights toward Harriet by John's mother and some of his siblings after their wedding resulted in his estrangement from much of his family (on this see Packe 1954, 349ff; Jacobs 2002, 117). The Mills did sometimes interrupt their reclusion to travel, separately or together, to the south of England or to the Continent in pursuit of a more healthful climate. In late 1858, after John's retirement from the East India Company, they set out for Montpellier, but Harriet's fragile health gave out in Avignon. John bought a small house there, next to the cemetery in which she was buried, where he spent a considerable portion of the remainder of his life. (He died and was buried in Avignon in 1873.)

2. Contemporaries' Accounts of Harriet Taylor Mill

2.1 Praise from John Stuart Mill

Harriet's contemporaries offer radically different impressions of her. John's view is already fairly clear from the lines from the dedication to On Liberty that were quoted above, but the description of her in his Autobiography is worth quoting in full.

Although it was years after my introduction to Mrs. Taylor before my acquaintance with her became at all intimate or confidential, I very soon felt her to be the most admirable person I had ever known. It is not to be supposed that she was, or that any one, at the age at which I first saw her, could be, all that she afterwards became. Least of all could this be true of her, with whom self-improvement, progress in the highest and in all senses, was a law of her nature; a necessity equally from the ardour with which she sought it, and from the spontaneous tendency of faculties which could not receive an impression or an experience without making it the source or the occasion of an accession of wisdom. Up to the time when I first saw her, her rich and powerful nature had chiefly unfolded itself according to the received type of feminine genius. To her outer circle she was a beauty and a wit, with an air of natural distinction, felt by all who approached her: to the inner, a woman of deep and strong feeling, of penetrating and intuitive intelligence, and of an eminently meditative and poetic nature. Married at a very early age, to a most upright, brave, and honourable man, of liberal opinions and good education, but without the intellectual or artistic tastes which would have made him a companion for her, though a steady and affectionate friend, for whom she had true esteem and the strongest affection through life, and whom she most deeply lamented when dead; shut out by the social disabilities of women from any adequate exercise of her highest faculties in action on the world without; her life was one of inward meditation, varied by familiar intercourse with a small circle of friends, of whom one only (long since deceased) was a person of genius,[2]or of capacities of feeling or intellect kindred with her own, but all had more or less of alliance with her in sentiments and opinions. Into this circle I had the good fortune to be admitted, and I soon perceived that she possessed in combination, the qualities which in all other persons whom I had known I had been only too happy to find singly. In her, complete emancipation from every kind of superstition (including that which attributes a pretended perfection to the order of nature and the universe), and an earnest protest against many things which are still part of the established constitution of society, resulted not from the hard intellect, but from strength of noble and elevated feeling, and co-existed with a highly reverential nature. In general spiritual characteristics, as well as in temperament and organisation, I have often compared her, as she was at this time, to Shelley: but in thought and intellect, Shelley, so far as his powers were developed in his short life, was but a child compared with what she ultimately became. Alike in the highest regions of speculation and in the smaller practical concerns of daily life, her mind was the same perfect instrument, piercing to the very heart and marrow of the matter; always seizing the essential idea or principle. The same exactness and rapidity of operation, pervading as it did her sensitive as well as her mental faculties, would, with her gifts of feeling and imagination, have fitted her to be a consummate artist, as her fiery and tender soul and her vigorous eloquence would certainly have made her a great orator, and her profound knowledge of human nature and discernment and sagacity in practical life, would, in the times when such a carrière was open to women, have made her eminent among the rulers of mankind. Her intellectual gifts did but minister to a moral character at once the noblest and the best balanced which I have ever met with in life. Her unselfishness was not that of a taught system of duties, but of a heart which thoroughly identified itself with the feelings of others, and often went to excess in consideration for them by imaginatively investing their feelings with the intensity of its own. The passion of justice might have been thought to be her strongest feeling, but for her boundless generosity, and a lovingness ever ready to pour itself forth upon any or all human beings who were capable of giving the smallest feeling in return. The rest of her moral characteristics were such as naturally accompany these qualities of mind and heart: the most genuine modesty combined with the loftiest pride; a simplicity and sincerity which were absolute, towards all who were fit to receive them; the utmost scorn of whatever was mean and cowardly, and a burning indignation at everything brutal or tyrannical, faithless or dishonourable in conduct and character, while making the broadest distinction between mala in se and mere mala prohibita—between acts giving evidence of intrinsic badness in feeling and character, and those which are only violations of conventions either good or bad, violations which whether in themselves right or wrong, are capable of being committed by persons in every other respect lovable or admirable. (J. S. Mill 1981, 193ff)

2.2 Harriet's Detractors

No one else who knew Harriet personally spoke of her in anything like these terms, as far as we know, and indeed several of her acquaintances held her in low estimation. The Carlyles were admirers initially, but they soon had changes of heart. Jane says that Harriet was “a peculiarly affected body” who “was not easy unless she startled you with unexpected sayings,” and was in fact “somewhat of a humbug” (quoted in Packe 1954, 325f). Thomas comments that “She was full of unwise intellect, asking and re-asking stupid questions” (quoted in Packe 1954, 315). Harold Laski relates that “Morley told me that Louis Blanc told him that he once sat for an hour with her and that she repeated to him what afterwards turned out to be an article that Mill had just finished for the Edinburgh…. If she was what he thought, someone at least should have given us indications” (quoted in Stillinger 1961, 24f).

2.3 A More Balanced Assessment

There is a vast middle territory between these extremes, and more likely than not the truth about Harriet lies somewhere within it. We certainly do not want to make the mistake of uncritically accepting the views of Carlyles, of whom Rupert Christiansen writes that “however enraged they were with each other there was always the prospect of laughing together at somebody else later” (2002). But at the same time, we can hardly accept John's descriptions at face value, either. A loving spouse's objectivity must always be in question, and especially so in this case, considering how much his characterizations of her strain credulity and the absence of any corroborating reports.

Harriet was not often described in judicious or balanced terms, but John's brother George, who knew her reasonably well, did relate to John's friend and biographer Alexander Bain that “Mrs. Taylor was a clever and remarkable woman, but nothing like what John took her to be” (Bain 1882, 166). Of course, because John's praise for Harriet is so hyperbolic, to suggest that she was less gifted, noble, or generally admirable than he took her to be is not necessarily to denigrate her. It is perfectly consistent with her having been a singular person in every respect.

3. Philosophical Contributions

Had Harriet produced a substantial body of philosophical work that was clearly her own, then the previous section would probably not have been needed. Because our assessment of her contributions to philosophy will depend so heavily upon speculation about her contributions to her collaboration with John, however, a discussion of the range of views about her ability was necessary.

There are few published pieces that we can definitively declare to have been written by Harriet, and their content is not especially philosophical. The longest, for example, is an essay on William Caxton and the history of printing that was part of a collection published in 1833 by the Society for the Diffusion of Useful Knowledge (H. T. Mill 1998, 238ff). Some poems, book reviews, and an essay on the aesthetic appreciation of the seasons were published in the Monthly Repository in the early 1830s, when Fox was its editor. The Complete Works of Harriet Taylor Mill (1998) includes a number of unpublished pieces. The manuscripts of many of these are entirely in Harriet's handwriting, although some also contain passages in John's hand. (See H. T. Mill 1998, 27ff, for a description of some of the manuscripts in question). Their themes include toleration, the sociology of religion, and various aspects of the subject of gender equality. (Some of the ideas contained in them appear in “The Enfranchisement of Women,” about which more below.) Most of these writings are quite short, though, and many are mere fragments. Any consequential philosophical contributions that Harriet made are therefore to be found in works that were either published without attribution or that appeared in John's name alone. This means that we are faced with the question of how much responsibility she bears either for the composition of these works and/or for the arguments that they advance. The evidence that we can draw upon is very limited; it mainly consists of John's account of their collaboration in his Autobiography, an annotated bibliography of his work that he maintained, and some correspondence between John and Harriet (although most of the letters we have were written by John, since at her request he destroyed many of Harriet's letters upon her death, and Jack Stillinger remarks on “how seldom ideas are touched on” in the correspondence between them that we do have (1961, 26)). That so much of the available evidence ultimately derives from John's reports is worrisome, because we have already seen that where Harriet is concerned his objectivity cannot be relied upon. If intellectuals usually tend to undervalue their collaborators' input, we have to be wary of John's departing from the truth in the opposite direction.

3.1 John Stuart Mill's Account of the Mills' Collaboration

John himself speaks to the difficulty of separating his and Harriet's contributions to their collaboration in his Autobiography.

When two persons have their thoughts and speculations completely in common; when all subjects of intellectual or moral interest are discussed between them in daily life, and probed to much greater depths than are usually or conveniently sounded in writings intended for general readers; when they set out from the same principles, and arrive at their conclusions by processes pursued jointly, it is of little consequence in respect to the question of originality, which of them holds the pen; the one who contributes least to the composition may contribute most to the thought; the writings which result are the joint product of both, and it must often be impossible to disentangle their respective parts, and affirm that this belongs to one and that to the other. (J. S. Mill 1981, 251)

Here John implicitly acknowledges that his hand most often held the pen, but he also suggests that Harriet contributed her share of ideas to works that he was solely or primarily responsible for composing. “In this wide sense,” he continues, “not only during the years of our married life, but during many of the years of confidential friendship which preceded it, all my published writings were as much my wife's work as mine; her share in them constantly increasing as years advanced” (1981, 251).

John does give some indication, though, of his and Harriet's relative strengths.

With those who, like all the best and wisest of mankind, are dissatisfied with human life as it is, and whose feelings are wholly identified with its radical amendment, there are two main regions of thought. One is the region of ultimate aims; the constituent elements of the highest realizable ideal of human life. The other is that of the immediately useful and practically attainable. In both these departments, I have acquired more from her teaching, than from all other sources taken together. (1981, 197)[3]

In contrast, John says that his own greatest powers to lie in “the uncertain and slippery intermediate region, that of theory, or moral and political science,” including “political economy, analytic psychology, logic, philosophy of history,” etc. John stresses both the reciprocity of their collaborative efforts and their different manners of reaching conclusions.

The benefit I received was far greater than any which I could hope to give; though to her, who had at first reached her opinions by the moral intuition of a character of strong feeling, there was doubtless help as well as encouragement to be derived from one who had arrived at many of the same results by study and reasoning: and in the rapidity of her intellectual growth, her mental activity, which converted everything into knowledge, doubtless drew from me, as it did from other sources, many of its materials. (1981, 197)

John acknowledges that Harriet had very little to do with his first major work, A System of Logic (first published in 1843), or with his discussions of the more technical aspects of political economy. Her contributions, clearly, came in the areas of ethics and social-political philosophy. Within these areas, though, John almost seems to suggest that his entire project is that of systematizing Harriet's insights and incorporating them with a utilitarian framework.

During the greater part of my literary life I have performed the office in relation to her, which from a rather early period I had considered as the most useful part that I was qualified to take in the domain of thought, that of an interpreter of original thinkers, and mediator between them and the public; for I had always a humble opinion of my own powers as an original thinker, except in abstract science … but thought myself much superior to most of my contemporaries in willingness and ability to learn from everybody…. I had, in consequence, marked out this as a sphere of usefulness in which I was under a special obligation to make myself active: the more so, as the acquaintance I had formed with the ideas of the Coleridgians, of the German thinkers, and of Carlyle, all of them fiercely opposed to the mode of thought in which I had been brought up, had convinced me that along with much error they possessed much truth…. Thus prepared, it will easily be believed that when I came into close intellectual communion with a person of the most eminent faculties, whose genius, as it grew and unfolded itself in thought, continually struck out truths far in advance of me, but in which I could not, as I had done in those others, detect any mixture of error, the greatest part of my mental growth consisted in the assimilation of those truths, and the most valuable part of my intellectual work was in building the bridges and clearing the paths which connected them with my general system of thought. (1981, pp. 251, 253).

3.2 The Principles of Political Economy, “The Enfranchisement of Women,” and On Liberty

From these general remarks on the nature of the Mills' collaboration, we will now move to the more specific question of Harriet's involvement in the production of three particular books and essays, the three major works for which John credits her with the greatest level of responsibility. The earliest is the Principles of Political Economy. The Principles' subtitle is With Some of their Applications to Social Philosophy. At least a third of the volume is concerned with topics that belong more to philosophy than economics, including the portion of the work that Harriet did the most to shape, a chapter titled “On the Probable Futurity of the Working Classes” (J. S. Mill 1965, 758ff). This chapter argues that when the laboring class has made sufficient moral and intellectual progress, its members will refuse to settle for mere wages any longer. They will instead insist first on profit-sharing and later on employee ownership of firms. They will even experiment with Socialist and Communist communities of the sorts depicted by Saint-Simon, Fourier, Blanc, and Owen. John's Autobiography states that

In the first draft of the book, that chapter did not exist. She pointed out the need of such a chapter, and the extreme imperfection of the book without it: she was the cause of my writing it; and the more general part of the chapter, the statement and discussion of the two opposite theories respecting the proper condition of the labouring classes, was wholly an exposition of her thoughts, often in words taken from her own lips. The purely scientific part of the Political Economy I did not learn from her; but it was chiefly her influence that gave to the book that general tone by which it is distinguished from all previous expositions of Political Economy that had any pretension to being scientific, and which has made it so useful in conciliating minds which those previous expositions had repelled…. The economic generalizations which depend, not on necessities of nature but on those combined with the existing arrangements of society, it deals with only as provisional, and as liable to be much altered by the progress of social improvement. I had indeed partially learnt this view of things from the thoughts awakened in me by the speculations of the St. Simonians; but it was made a living principle pervading and animating the book by my wife's promptings. (1981, 255ff)

As Jo Ellen Jacobs reads this passage, John is declaring the chapter “to be written primarily by Harriet” (2002, 207f). This gloss, though, seems to overlook his statement that “she was the cause of my writing it.” Moreover, the aforementioned “forbidden dedication” of the volume refers without qualification to John as the author.

To Mrs. John Taylor, as the most eminently qualified of all persons known to the author either to originate or appreciate speculations on social improvement, this attempt to explain and diffuse ideas many of which were first learned from herself, is with the highest respect and regard, dedicated. (J. S. Mill 1965, 1027n)

Even if the decision to put only John's name on the cover of the Principles could be explained as an expedient to win greater acceptance for the ideas in the book, there would have been little harm in describing her as its co-author in this dedication if she were such, especially once the decision was made only to paste it inside copies of the Principles given to personal friends. On the other hand, though, his annotated bibliography does describe the Principles as a “joint production with my wife” (MacMinn et al. 1945, 69).[4] And Harriet was actively involved in revising portions of the later editions of the Principles. For example, the second (1849) edition is considerably more favorable to Socialism and even Communism, and the impetus for this shift seems to have been a change in Harriet's thinking. In a letter written to Harriet early in 1849, John points out that she now “had marked dissent” from a passage in the first edition raising an objection to Communism that “was inserted on your proposition & very nearly in your own words.” He continues, though, that

This is probably only the progress we have always been making, & by thinking sufficiently I should probably come to think the same—as is almost always the case, I believe always when we think long enough. (J. S. Mill 1972, 8f)

While it si quite likely that this important chapter of the Principles would not exist if not for Harriet, then, we cannot be certain of exactly what role she played in its composition. It is unclear whether this role was substantial enough to merit calling her the volume's co-author. It is not even entirely clear whether John thought of her as such, and if he did, whether this was true from the start or a retrospective judgment that he came to hold years later.[5]

“The Enfranchisement of Women,” published in The Westminster Review in 1851, is the best candidate for a significant philosophical work authored primarily or even solely by Harriet (H. T. Mill 1998, 51ff). Occasioned by a series of feminist conventions in the United States, it makes a case not merely for giving women the ballot but for “equality in all rights, political, civil, and social, with the male citizens of the community” (H. T. Mill 1998, 51). This essay contains many of the same lines of argument as The Subjection of Women, written by John and published in 1869, although it expresses a somewhat more radical view of gender roles than the later essay (see Rossi 1970, 41ff). It maintains that the denial of political rights to women tends to restrict their interests to matters that directly impact the family, with the result that the influence of wives on their husbands tends to diminish the latter's willingness to act from public-spirited motives. Further, it contends that when women do not enjoy equal educational rights with men then wives will impede rather than encourage their husbands' moral and intellectual development. And it insists that competition for jobs will prevent most of the problems that admitting women into the workforce would putatively cause from materializing. All of these points are common to “The Enfranchisement” and The Subjection. The major point of difference between the two is that while the Subjection rather notoriously suggests that the best arrangement for most married couples will be for the wife to concentrate on the care of the house and the children, a position that John also takes in an early essay on marriage written for Harriet (J. S. Mill 1984b, 43), the “Enfranchisement” instead argues for the desirability of married women's working outside the home.

Even if every woman, as matters now stand, had a claim on some man for support, how infinitely preferable is it that part of the income should be of the woman's earning, even if the aggregate sum were but little increased by it…. Even under the present laws respecting the property of women, a woman who contributes materially to the support of the family, cannot be treated in the same contemptuously tyrannical manner as one who, however she may toil as a domestic drudge, is a dependent on the man for subsistence (H. T. Mill 1998, 60f).

This difference is an important piece of evidence in favor of attributing the essay to Harriet (although Richard Krouse points out that the essay leaves unanswered the question it raises about who is to care for the home and the children (1982, 169)). Still, not all of the evidence is on this side. In 1849, John urges Harriet to finish a pamphlet that she was writing on the subject of women (1972, 13). Yet soon thereafter, in correspondence with the Westminster's editor about the “Enfranchisement,” he speaks of the article as if he is its author, writing for instance that “If you are inclined for an article on the Emancipation of Women, … I have one nearly ready… ” (1972, 55f, 65f). In an 1854 letter, John rather ambiguously reminds Harriet that when the “Enfranchisement” is published in a projected collection of his work it will be “preceded by a preface which will show that much of all my later articles, and all the best of that one, were, as they were, my Darling's” (1972, 190). If we can draw any implication from this, it is that while the core arguments in the article are due to Harriet, John was still the actual author. But the preface that actually appeared, in the collection of John's writings published in his lifetime (Dissertations and Discussions), suggests (albeit vaguely) that his contribution was somewhat smaller than this; there he describes the essay as “hers in a particular sense, my share in it being little more than that of an editor and amanuensis” (J. S. Mill 1882, 93f). (He adds that the article's authorship was “known at the time, and publicly attributed to her.”) Today there seems to be a general consensus that Harriet is the article's author, and it was excluded from the University of Toronto's Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, but some commentators dissent from this view (for example Himmelfarb, 183ff).

This brings us to On Liberty, the celebrated defense of individual freedom, which was published in the year after Harriet's death. The dedication of this essay, a portion of which has already been quoted, says that “Like all that I have written for many years, it belongs as much to her as to me,” and in the Autobiography John elaborates on Harriet's role in the essay's production.

The “Liberty” was more directly and literally our joint production than anything else which bears my name, for there was not a sentence of it that was not several times gone through by us together, turned over in many ways, and carefully weeded of any faults, either in thought or expression, that we detected in it…. With regard to the thoughts, it is difficult to identify any particular part or element as being more hers than all the rest. The whole mode of thinking of which the book was the expression, was emphatically hers…. The “Liberty” is likely to survive longer than anything else that I have written (with the possible exception of the “Logic”), because the conjunction of her mind with mine has rendered it a kind of philosophic text-book of a single truth…. (1981, 257ff)

The entry for On Liberty in John's bibliography, though, makes no mention of Harriet (MacMinn et al. 1945, 92). Since he used the term “joint product” in the bibliography for the Principles, it is somewhat curious that he does not use it there for On Liberty as well. John's letters to Harriet and others also speak equivocally to the question of On Liberty's production. In January of 1855, John writes to Harriet from Rome that he has decided that a volume on liberty would be “the best thing to write & publish at present” (J. S. Mill 1972, 294). He asks her to look at an essay on the subject that he had written in the preceding year to see if it could serve as the basis for one part of this volume, and says that if her answer is yes and if his health allows “I will try to write & publish it in 1856.” In this letter, he clearly suggests that he will be the one doing the writing. (On Liberty in fact appeared in 1859.) In a reference to this projected volume in a letter of the next month, though, he says that “We must cram into it as much as possible of what we wish not to leave unsaid” (J. S. Mill 1972, 332). In letters to others, he refers to the essay as his and to himself as the one writing it (J. S. Mill 1972, 539, 581).

3.3 Skepticism About Harriet Taylor Mill's Influence on John Stuart Mill

The available evidence underdetermines judgments about the value to John of his collaboration with Harriet. Very different hypotheses are consistent with the facts at hand, and just as the people who knew Harriet formed wildly divergent conclusions about her as a person, so too have different interpreters reached wildly different conclusions about the scope and significance of her influence on John and hence her philosophical contributions. Some of John's interpreters are skeptical that Harriet really made much difference to his writings. H. O. Pappe, for example, concludes his monograph John Stuart Mill and the Harriet Taylor Myth by questioning whether Harriet introduced any substantial alterations whatsoever into the pattern of John's thought.

[Harriet's] early writings evince her dependence on Mill. For the later period of their partnership we have no valid evidence to show that Harriet turned Mill's mind toward new horizons or gave an unexpected significance to his thought…. Mill without Harriet would still have been Mill. Mill married to George Eliot (or to Mary Wollstonecraft—permitting the anachronism) might have been transformed. Mary Ann Evans might have given him something new by way of independent thought and deeper feeling. Yet, considering her equality of stature, there would have been no need for him in masochistic guilt to magnify her contribution. (1960, 47f)

Similarly, Francis Mineka says that “Neither he [John] nor his recent biographers have convinced us that she was the originating mind behind his work …” (1963, 306). While this may never have been made entirely explicit, the following line of reasoning may underlie this skepticism. We can be confident that John was possessed of a first-rate philosophical mind. His System of Logic alone is proof enough of this. We have to decide, then, whether there were two first-rate minds in their marriage or only one, and in the absence of decisive evidence for the former possibility, one might argue, parsimony favors the latter. Someone who reasons in this way might conclude that even if Harriet were responsible for putting some important insights in writing, insights that later appeared in work bearing John's name, it is still more likely that those ideas originated with John than with her.

Those who argue that Harriet was something less than what John took her to be, and that he was even mistaken about her role in their intellectual partnership, must explain how he was so misled. There is a tradition of thinking that, in essence, he was psychologically unable to resist her charms. It was commonly held among their contemporaries that, as Bain observes, “she imbibed all his views, and gave them back in her own form, by which he was flattered and pleased” (1882, 173). Ruth Borchard says that “Accustomed by training and experience to the acceptance of ascetic, masculine values, he was completely overpowered by her intensely feminine atmosphere” (1957, 46). And Laski speculates: “I should guess that she was a comfortable and sympathetic person and that Mill, brought up to fight Austin, Praed, Macaulay and Grote, had never met a really soft cushion before.” (op. cit.). Some writers have even advanced the idea that after the death of his domineering father James Mill, John felt a need to invent another parental authority in order that he might submit to it (e.g., Trilling 1952, 118; Mazlish 1975, 286ff).

3.4 The Countervailing Assessment

Against this “minimalist” view about the value of Harriet's input into the Mills' collaboration, other commentators have inclined toward a “maximalist” stance. Chief among these is Jacobs. Jacobs' basic interpretative approach is to take John's characterizations of Harriet and their collaboration at face value, although she departs from this practice when she believes that there is evidence that John may not have given Harriet the full credit she was due. For example, in an unpublished essay Harriet writes that

There seems to be this great distinction between physical and moral science; That while the degree of perfection the first has attained is marked by the progressive completeness and exactness of its rules, that of the latter is in the state most favourable to, and most showing healthfulness as it advances beyond all classification except on the widest and most universal principles. The science of morals should rather be called an art…. (H. T. Mill 1998, 141)

Jacobs takes this comment to establish that Harriet is the originator of John's distinction between the logics of arts and sciences at the end of the System of Logic, and she accuses John of having in this case understated Harriet's contribution to one of his works (Jacobs 2002, 203n; J. S. Mill 1973, 943ff).[6] And while John states that Harriet learned almost as much from him as he from her, Jacobs appears to think otherwise. In toting up the advantages of the collaboration to each of them, she notes that “Harriet administered John's daily life, nursed his ego, and provided him with ideas.” In return, Harriet merely “acquired the freedom to write provocative articles … and to be heard as a man, with seriousness and consideration” (129f). While this freedom was surely an acquisition of the first importance for a female thinker of the time, Jacobs implausibly implies that John gave Harriet little more than Mary Ann Evans got for herself by becoming George Eliot, i.e., that John was no source of ideas for her and that their collaboration made no material difference to what she wrote.

Conservative historian Gertrude Himmelfarb also credits Harriet with having made a very significant difference to John's philosophical output, at least during one stage of his life, but, in contrast to Jacobs, she maintains that this influence was for the worse. She decries in particular Harriet's effect on John's views on liberty, arguing that it was only when Harriet's influence on him was at its peak that John embraced a simplistic liberalism grounded on his sweeping and absolute liberty principle instead of a more nuanced political theory that treats liberty as an important value but one that can be limited by other values (Himmelfarb 1974, 208ff).

3.5 The Middle Ground

As with the descriptions of Harriet's character and ability discussed above, there is a wide middle ground between these minimalist and maximalist assessments of her influence on John and her importance as a philosopher. An intermediate view of their collaboratory activity is that of Bain, who suggests that just as John's friend John Sterling “overflowed in suggestive talk, which Mill took up and improved in his own way,” so Harriet might have done as well (1882, 173ff). It is possible, at least, that Harriet's major contribution to the Mills' collaboration was to turn John's attention to the defense of a set progressive ideals and causes to which she was passionately attached: Socialism, women's rights, individual liberty, and above all a “utopian” view of humanity's improvability. John Robson, the editor of JSM's Collected Works and author of a book on JSM titled The Improvement of Mankind, comments that “[I]n what we have of her writings, Harriet constantly has her eye on the future, even when criticizing the present; she was a woman of dreams and aspirations, and she must constantly have breathed into Mill a hopeful and expansive view of human possibilities” (1966, 178).[7] John had famously been raised to be a champion of radical causes, but Harriet's agenda differed in many respects from James Mill's, and her firm convictions may have been one of the forces that caused John to take stock of what could be said in favor of the positions she held. We should certainly not imagine that Harriet merely declared herself in favor of feminism, Socialism, etc., and John obediently sat down and churned out defenses of them. But perhaps she could only give the sorts of reasons for these positions that intelligent people without philosophical training can typically give for their fundamental normative views. With Harriet's having done this much, John may then have asked himself whether fuller and more satisfying arguments could be given for her stances, and found to his satisfaction that they could. By his lights, at least, this would mean arguments that rest ultimately on the principle of utility and on a conception of human nature that incorporates both his father's associationist psychology and additional insights gleaned from Harriet, other thinkers, and his own experience (including his well-known “mental crisis”). This hypothesis explains the sense in which his task was that of “building the bridges and clearing the paths that connected” Harriet's “truths,” which she had first arrived at “by the moral intuition of a character of strong feeling,” with his “general system of thought.” This is not necessarily to say that he held these positions just because she did, which he explicitly tells us was not the case with women's rights (1981, 253n), but rather that her strong attachment to them might have been an important part of his motivation for thinking arguments for them through in detail and setting them on paper.

John's reputation as a moral theorist and social-political philosopher rests on the depth and rigor of the argumentation that is presented for the positions he advocates.[8] The view of the Mills' collaboration being mooted here may give Harriet less credit for those arguments than her more ardent partisans think she deserves. But even if Harriet's largest contribution to their partnership was to inspire John to see what could be done by way of make a case for the views that she had adopted, she must have been able to talk sensibly about her positions and to play an active role in help John to articulate his arguments in writing. Bain knew John extremely well, and even though he says that his friend was under “an extraordinary hallucination as to the personal qualities of his wife,” and “outraged all reasonable credibility in describing her matchless genius,” he is also adamant not only that John “was not such an egoist as to be captivated by the echo of his own opinions” but also that he would only have been stimulated by someone with “independent resources” who had a “good mutual understanding as to the proper conditions of the problem at issue” (1882, 173f).

This general picture of how the Mills might have worked together provides no answer to the question of how much of any particular work might be Harriet's. It does not tell us, for instance, whether the “Enfranchisement” was an essay written by Harriet and lightly edited by John, an essay written by John but incorporating ideas of Harriet's, or an essay woven together by John out of fragmentary false starts of Harriet's that would not gel into a coherent article for her. Barring the discovery of additional textual evidence, however, a conclusive answer to this question may be out of reach.


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liberalism | Mill, John Stuart | Mill, John Stuart: moral and political philosophy | socialism


I gratefully acknowledge the assitance that I received from Ashley Acosta in preparing the updated version of this entry.