Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Concepts of Disease and Health

First published Mon Sep 22, 2008; substantive revision Thu Sep 25, 2008

Health and disease are critical concepts in bioethics with far-reaching social and political implications. For instance, any attempt to educate physicians or regulate heath insurance must employ some standards that can be used to assess whether people are ill or not. Concepts of health and disease also connect in interesting ways with issues about function and explanation in philosophy of the biomedical sciences, and theories of well-being in ethics.

1. Introduction.

Doctors are called on to deal with many states of affairs, and not all of them, on any theory, are diseases. A doctor who prescribes contraceptives or performs an abortion is not treating a disease. Although some women cannot risk pregnancy or childbirth for health reasons, women typically use contraception or abortion in the service of autonomy and control over their lives. In addition, it is very difficult to find a philosophically or scientifically interesting cleavage between diseases and other complaints (Reznek 1987, 71–73).

One dominant strand in modern medicine sees a disease as essentially a process that recurs across individuals in slightly different forms: a disease is an abstract kind that is realized in different ways (Carter 2003: Whitbeck 1977). But since a disease is a biological insult, distinguishing it from injury is very difficult. Perhaps injuries are not processes in the relevant sense but events. This essay assumes that the conceptual issues raised by illnesses, injuries and other medical conditions are similar enough to let us put this demarcation problem aside. Disability is another important and neglected topic in health and well-being. It will be addressed here only slightly, since it would take us too far afield.

Health has received less philosophical attention than disease, and this essay will correspondingly have less to say about it. The conceptual terrain in the case of health is a little more complex than that of disease; one way of thinking about health says that it is just the absence of disease, so if disease is biological malfunction or abnormality, it follows that a healthy person is someone whose biological systems are all in order. But another way of looking at health insists that it is not just the absence of disease but the presence of something more; a positive state. The constitution of the World Health Organization (WHO) defines health “a state of complete physical, mental and social well-being and not merely the absence of disease or infirmity” (WHO 1948). According to views like this, we should think in terms not of health and disease alone, but in terms of health, disease and normality. This essay will look at theories of health after first discussing disease.

2. Objectivism and Constructivism

The tendency in recent philosophy has been to see disease concepts as involving empirical judgments about human physiology and normative judgments about human behavior or well-being (Bloomfield 2001, Boorse 1975, Ereshefsky forthcoming, Culver and Gert 1982, Thagard 1999). First, we have beliefs about the natural functioning of humans—both our common sense expectations about the body and scientific theories of human biology. Second, we make judgments about whether some particular condition or way of life is or is not, in some relevant way. This second set of concerns obviously involves normative criteria, to do with the extent to which a life is unnatural, undesirable or failing to flourish in some way. (There is not a clear consensus among writers here.) One important and controversial question is whether the judgments we make concerning our biology are also normative in some way. A further large question concerns the relationship between the two types of judgments, in both medicine and common sense.

Another strain in recent scholarship suggests that our normative judgments alone determine who falls under the concepts of health and disease. This view has been less influential in philosophy, but commands widespread adherence in other areas of the humanities and social sciences (e.g. Kennedy 1983, Brown 1990). Kitcher (1997, 208–9) summarizes the debate as follows:

Some scholars, objectivists about disease, think that there are facts about the human body on which the notion of disease is founded, and that those with a clear grasp of those facts would have no trouble drawing lines, even in the challenging cases. Their opponents, constructivists about disease, maintain that this is an illusion, that the disputed cases reveal how the values of different social groups conflict, rather than exposing any ignorance of facts, and that agreement is sometimes even produced because of universal acceptance of a system of values.

Kitcher's objectivism and constructivism are often called naturalism and normativism. But since both ‘naturalism’ and ‘normativism’ are used in other senses in a variety of debates, this essay will use Kitcher's terminology. After a more elaborate taxonomy of analyses of disease, forms of constructivism and the difficulties they face will be discussed. Then objectivism will be similarly treated, before the discussion moves to health.

Kitcher's claim that an objectivist analysis is “grounded” on facts about the human body is perhaps not as clear as it might be. Before arriving at some qualifications, then, we should have straightforward statements of objectivism and constructivism in hand. (Although, since the qualifications are not yet in place, perhaps no theorist would fully endorse these bald versions of the positions.)

The objectivist conception of disease (perhaps most clearly stated in Boorse 1975,1997) is that the human body comprises many organ systems that have natural functions from which they can depart in many ways. Some of these departures from normal functioning are harmless or beneficial, but others are not. The latter are ‘diseases’. So to call something a disease involves both a claim about the abnormal functioning of some bodily system and a judgment that the resulting abnormality is a bad one. Objectivists contend that the determination of bodily malfunction is an objective matter to be determined by science. They may also argue (Boorse 1997) that determining whether a malfunction is detrimental to human well-being is also an objective matter, but more usually they concede that normative considerations are the basis for that judgment. So the objectivist position is that a disease is a bodily malfunction that causes one's life to deteriorate.This malfunction could take many forms: it is not a necessary part of the objectivist case that diseases constitute a natural kind.

Rather, they could be a set of naturally occurring processes that are held together in virtue of our interest in grouping them as a class. Kinds that work like this include “weed” or “vermin” (Murphy 2006): the existence of the superordinate class depends on human interests but the subordinate members are natural kinds whose natures can be investigated scientifically.

Constructivism, however, argues that human interests do not just define the superordinate class of disease. Human interests, rather than biological malfunctions, also explain the judgments that subordinate members have the relevant biological character. Although constructivists accept that disease categories refer to known or unknown biological processes they deny that these processes can be identified independently of human values by, for example,a science of normal human nature. Constructivist conceptions of disease are normative through and through, although the precise account of the relevant norms will vary between scholars.

The key constructivist contention is that there is no natural, objectively definable set of human malfunctions that necessarily cause disease. Rather, constructivists assert that to call a condition a disease is to make a judgment that someone in that condition is undergoing a specific kind of harm that we explain in terms of bodily processes. But the bodily processes are not objectively malfunctioning; rather, they are merely judged by us to be unusual or abnormal because they depart from some shared, usually culturally specific, conception of human nature. The crucial difference between the positions then is that for an objectivist, diseases are objectively malfunctioning biological processes that cause harms. For a constructivist, diseases are harms that we blame on some biological process because it causes the harm, not because it is objectively dysfunctional.

However, constructivism is hard to define satisfactorily, for two reasons. First, its core claim is a denial of the objectivist thesis that disease necessarily involves bodily malfunction. Since there are many views one might hold about the nature of the biological processes involved in disease that are compatible with the denial of malfunction, the positive constructivist claim varies across theories and is often elusive. Reznek (1987) for example, explicitly denies that malfunction is a necessary condition for disease. He does assert (ch 9) that diseases involve “abnormal” bodily processes, but he does not say what that means. Constructivists often, as we will see later, argue that disease judgments appeal to biological processes that are to be understood in terms of human practices rather than membership in some biologically definable class of abnormalities or malfunctions. We have decided that some harmful conditions are the province of the medical profession, and those are diseases.

That brings up the second reason why constructivism can be an elusive target: it has often rested on (perfectly reasonable) claims about the role that value judgments have played in medical practice, or on the prevalence of culturally specific disagreements about abnormal human behavior or physiology. This means, as we shall see, that constructivists, especially in the social sciences, do not tend to offer necessary and sufficient conditions. Rather, they often seek to reconstruct the concept of disease as revealed by our practices. Constructivism, therefore, often looks like a thesis about how inquiry is carried on: first we identify a condition we disvalue, then we look for a biological process that causes it and say that, whatever it is, it is abnormal. This stress on our practices is a common constructivist trope, whereas objectivists more often seek to analyse a concept that will clarify what disease really is, however fumbling and biased our attempts to uncover it may have been.

That both medical practice and lay thought shape disease concepts is undeniable. Because of this, we need to introduce a second distinction. Both objectivism and constructivism can take either a revisionist or a conservative form. A conservative view says that our folk concept of illness should constrain a theoretical picture of health and disease worked out by scientists and clinicians. A revisionist thinks that our existing concepts should be amended in the light of what inquiry uncovers. One could be a conservative or revisionist objectivist, as well as a conservative or revisionist constructivist.

Health and disease, like many other concepts, are neither purely scientific nor exclusively a part of common sense. They have a home in both scientific theories and everyday thought. That raises a problem for any philosophical account: suppose we try to say what health and disease really amount to, from which it follows that the scientific concept should fit the facts about world. If the picture we end up with deviates too far from folk thought, should we worry? You might think that everyday language puts constraints on a concept of health that need to respected, and that if we move too far from ordinary usage we have stopped talking about health and started talking about something else. Furthermore, it is not really possible to argue that scientific and vernacular uses of the concepts are fully independent, since the development of science influences everyday thought, and many scientific concepts begin in pre-scientific contexts and carry the marks of those origins deep into their careers.

Furthermore, the concept of disease that is currently employed in most areas of medicine has undergone a process of development. For much of the modern era there has been a dialectic between two concepts of disease. On the one hand, there has been the idea that a disease is just an observable suite of symptoms with a predictable course unfolding. This notion dates back to Sydenham in the late seventeenth century. Kraepelin applied it to psychiatry as the basis for differential diagnosis, for example between hebephrenia and dementia praecox (schizophrenia) (1899, 173–175). The approach was supplanted as medicine matured by the concept of diseases as destructive processes in bodily organs which “divert part of the substance of the individual from the actions which are natural to the species to another kind of action” (Snow 1853, 155; for discussion see Whitbeck 1977, Carter 2003, Broome 2006). This is perhaps still the core medical conception of disease. It is a strong interpretation of objectivism, which seeks explanations that cite pathological processes in bodily systems. More recent medicine has tended to weaken this slightly by adopting what Green (2007, ch, 2) calls an ‘actuarial’ model of disease. This model takes the presence of elevated risk, for example as indicated by high blood pressure, to be a disease even in the absence of overt symptoms or a clearly destructive pathological process.

Medicine recognizes illnesses like hypertension and Cushing's disease that are the outcome of systems in a poorly regulated state that is stable, albeit suboptimal. The idea of a specific pathogenic process in medicine includes dysregulation, but this may not accord with folk thought.

Modern medicine is objectivist. One question, then, concerns the extent to which common sense and biomedical concepts are related. Perhaps both have objectivist commitments, or perhaps common sense is driven by values and medicine is not, or perhaps physicians are really constructivists who are self-deceived or arguing in bad faith.

There is little reason to expect scientific and common sense concepts to agree in general, so if medicine and everyday thought disagree about disease, we may ask which concept should be adopted. If we wish to distil a concept that can play a role in medical inquiry, we may side with the scientists. But such proposals, which argue for a sharp separation between scientific and folk uses, are not neutral pieces of observation about the language. They are proposals for purging science from commonsense constraints that hinder its development. A revisionist view of this sort, in this case, says that our concepts of health and disease might be a necessary starting point but should not constrain where the inquiry ends up. Other forms of revisionism are possible. A revisionist objectivist argues that we should follow the science where it takes us and come up with concepts that further scientific inquiry, for example, even if that means that we eventually use the language in ways that look bizarre from the standpoint of current common sense. But a revisionist constructivist could argue that our thought, whether medical or lay, should be reformed in the service of other goals, such as emancipation for hitherto oppressed groups. Such revisionist thought was important in overturning the psychiatric view, dominant until the 1970s, that homosexuality is a mental illness. Activists argued that homosexuality was diagnosed for offensive moral reasons and not for medical ones and was changed as a result of lobbying on moral grounds rather than on the basis of any new discovery. Objectivists will respond that this was not an example of using constructivism for emancipatory ends, but of bringing psychiatrists to understand that they were not obeying their own objectivist principles, and showing them that there is no good reason to retain the diagnosis. Much debate between objectivist and constructivists involves competing histories in just this way. Constructivists strive to uncover the role that moral and social values have always played in medical diagnosis and argue that our disease categories are hence not properly objectivist. Objectivists, though they must concede that many diagnoses have been based on moral values that we would now renounce, still insist that the concept of disease, when correctly applied, as it often is, is thoroughly objectivist and not impugned by past failures by the medical profession to live up to its own scientific ambitions.

Objectivists tend towards conceptual conservatism. They typically appeal to our intuitions about illness as support for their own emphasis on underlying bodily malfunction. This assumes that our current concept is in good shape and that common sense and medicine share a concept of disease, and that medicine should respect lay intuitions about what is and what is not a disease. Like many philosophers who think about other concepts with both scientific and common sense uses, conservative objectivists about disease think that folk concepts specify what counts as health and disease. The job of medicine is to look at the world and see if anything in nature falls under the concept as revealed by analysis (cf the “Canberra plan” of Jackson 1998) For revisionists, this understanding of common sense's relations to science is needlessly submissive to folk intuitions.

Revisionist objectivists argue that facts about physiological and psychological functioning, like other biological facts, obtain independently of human conceptions of the world. Our intuitions might tell us that a condition is not a disease. But scientific inquiry might conclude that people with the condition are really suffering from a biological malfunction. In that case, a conservative would recommend finessing the analysis to ensure that the concept of disease does not cover this case. A revisionist would say that we must bite the bullet and judge that this case falls under the concept even if that judgment is counterintuitive. A revisionist objectivist regards health and disease as features of the world to be discovered by biomedical investigation, and therefore loosely constrained, at best, by our everyday concepts of health and disease.

Constructivists are usually revisionists. They tend to say that concepts of health and disease medicalize behavior that breaks norms or fails in some way to accord with our values; we don't like pain, so painful states count as diseases: we don't like fat people or drunks, so obesity and alcoholism count as diseases. Constructivists will often make this case with special vigor when it comes to mental disorder.

Constructivists are often social scientists and their interests may not map neatly on to philosophical concerns. They are not usually interested in conceptual analysis so much as in tracing the social processes by which categories are formulated and changed over time. Conrad (2007, 7–8), for example, says he is “not interested in adjudicating whether any particular problem is really a medical problem… I am interested in the social underpinnings of this expansion of medical jurisdiction”.

But constructivists often present their theories as unmasking common sense or medical conceptions of disease, and hence as a kind of revisionism. They may accept that diagnoses of ill-health involve objective facts that people appeal to, or presume that they can appeal to, when they say that somebody is sick. The assumption in a society might be that germs or other medically relevant causal factors are present in a person and have given rise to visible phenomena that indicate ill-health. But a constructivist will claim that the actual, often unacknowledged, judgments driving the initial assertion that someone is unhealthy are derived from social norms. We may discover facts about obesity and its relationship to blood pressure or life expectancy. But the constructivist says that our search for the relevant biological findings is undertaken because we have already decided that fat people are disgusting and we are trying to find a set of medically significant properties in order to make our wish to stigmatize them look like a medical decision rather than a moral or aesthetic one. The crucial constructivist claim is that we look for the biological facts that ground disease judgments selectively, based on prior condemnations of some people and not others. Because they claim that social norms rather than disinterested inquiry drive medicine (and especially, psychiatry), constructivists tend to be revisionists about folk concepts, bringing to light the unacknowledged sources of our concepts of health and disease. But constructivism could be a conservative view, aimed at uncovering our folk theory of health and disease. A constructivist who takes this view says that our folk concept of disease is that of a pattern of behavior or bodily activity that violates social norms.

One could be a constructivist about some diseases, and an objectivist about others. For example, one could be an objectivist about bodily disease but a constructivist about psychiatry. Thomas Szasz (1960, 1973, 1987), for instance, is usually read as a constructivist who denies that mental illness exists. But in fact Szasz has a very strict objectivist concept of disease as no more than damage to bodily structures.

He argues that mental disorders cannot exist because they are not the result of tissue damage. He is an objectivist about disease, which leads him to deny that mental illness is real and to offer a constructivist and revisionist analysis of our psychiatric practices. And indeed claims that we are merely taking conduct we don't like and calling it pathological are more plausible in psychiatry than in other parts of medicine, since there is a long history of psychiatrists who have done just that. Samuel Cartwright argued in 1843 that American slaves who tried to escape were afflicted with “drapetomania” or the “disease causing slaves to run away” (Cartwright 2004, 33); slaves were also found uniquely prone to “dyesthaesia Aethiopica”, which made them neglect the property rights of their masters (Brown 1990). Nineteenth century physicians regularly practiced cliterodectomy to cure women of sexual desire, which everybody knew never afflicted normal females of good family (Reznek 1987, 5–6). More recently, Soviet psychiatrists found that political dissidents suffered from “sluggish schizophrenia”. And Horwitz and Wakefield (2007) have suggested that depression has been severely overdiagnosed by recent generations of American psychiatrists, leading to the pathologizing of ordinary sadness.

Our current taxonomy of illness could involve both objectivist intuitions about some conditions and constructivist rationalizations about others. You could use this depiction of everyday thought as a premise in an argument for revisionism, on the grounds that our folk concepts are too confused to serve as constraints (Murphy 2006 makes this argument with respect to psychiatry).

3. Problems for Constructivism

Constructivism seems correct about some diseases; that is, we have thought that some human activities were pathological because of values rather than scientific evidence. However, it is another task to show that constructivism is correct about our concept of disorder. And this would be true even if there were no diseases; it might still be that case that our concept of disorder is objectivist even if nothing falls under it. There are no unicorns, but an analysis of the concept of unicorn that says that unicorns are giant purple cows that live on human flesh would be a faulty analysis all the same.

The chief problem for constructivism is that we routinely make a distinction between the sick and the deviant, or between pathological conditions and those that we just disapprove of. Our disease concepts cannot just be matter of disvaluing certain people or their properties. It must involve a reason for disvaluing them in a medical way rather than some other way. Illness has never been the only way to be deviant. So Szasz is just wrong to claim that “when a person does something bad, like shoot the president, it is immediately assumed that he might be mad” (1974, 91). Most of the time when people do bad things nobody doubts their sanity, just their morals. Physically or mentally ill people, even if they are seen as norm-breakers, are seen as a distinctive class of norm-breakers. What's distinctive about them?

But the problem is that we routinely judge that people are worse off without thinking they are ill in any way—for example, the ugly, the poor, people with no sense of humor or lousy taste or a propensity for destructive relationships. We don't treat these judgments of comparative disadvantage as a prelude to medical inquiry, so why do we do so in some other cases?

Notice that the problem is not just one of establishing that someone is badly off or is in some other disvalued state. Rather, the trouble is caused by the requirement that someone is badly off in a specific, health-related or medically significant way. Rachel Cooper, for example (2002, 272–74), analyzes the concept of disease as a bad thing to have that is judged to require medical attention. She deals with the objection that specifying when someone is badly off is very difficult. Cooper admits that it is a hard problem, but replies that it is a widespread problem, one which crops up in many areas of moral philosophy.

This response is correct as a general point but does not touch the present objection. The objection is not that it is hard to say when someone is badly off, but that it is hard to isolate the specific class of ways of being badly off that we regard as medically relevant without relying on a notion of natural malfunction.

John Harris, for example, posits an “ER test” (2007, 91) according to which we can think of a disorder as a condition that makes someone worse off and is such that emergency room personnel would be negligent if they did not remedy it if they could. But as it stands the ER test is much too broad. Taken literally the ER tests requires medical personnel to teach the local language to immigrants whose lives are worsened by a lack of competence in it. A general theory of ill-being would be as desirable as a theory of well-being. But without further elaboration it would not discriminate between medical and non-medical forms of ill-being. Cooper and Harris face the difficulty of specifying what is distinctively medical about the conditions that we expect medical personnel to treat: of course, a thesis about what counts as a medical intervention that was put in terms of combating disease or pathology would be circular. Reznek (1987, 163) argues that we can delimit a purely medical sphere “enumeratively without reference to the concept of disease—in terms of pharmacological and surgical interventions.” However, as we saw at the start of this essay, a lot of medical attention is directed at conditions which we do not call diseases. Prescribing contraceptive pills is a pharmacological intervention, but it is not directed against a disease; going on the pill is not like beginning a course of anti-malarial tablets.

The objectivist has an answer to the problem of specifying what makes some medical interventions directed against disease, viz. that conditions which doctors treat are diseases in so far as they involve natural malfunctions. The constructivist view is that the class of what we call malfunctions is picked out by its involvement in medical practice, and not the other way round. Cooper and Harris try to base their analysis on our practices, but they are unable to distinguish medical practices from non-medical ones.

The constructivist needs to explain why the value judgments that we direct at putative sick people form a special class of value judgments. And that explanation has to show, in addition, why we think the conditions that we single out as diseases with those special value judgments are candidates for a particular set of causal explanations. It's all very well to point out, as Reznek does (p.88) that an etiology only explains a pathology if we have already decided that it is a pathology. This is correct, but it dodges the conceptual question of why we first decide that only some people or conditions are pathological. The objectivist says this: we think some people are worse off because of special kind of causal process, namely a disturbance of normal physical or psychological processes. It is that causal judgment that has conceptual priority, even if, as a matter of timing, the violation of a norm is what is detected first. Note that it does not refute objectivism to point out that the concept of disease is sometimes misapplied, so that we think people are sick but discover that they are not. In such cases (e.g. homosexuality) the explanation for why it happened may be that our values caused the initial judgment, but that does not show that the concept of disease is constructivist, rather than objectivist. No concept is correctly applied every time.

Reznek, for instance, argues that to judge “that homosexuality is a disease we first have to make a value-judgment. We have first to judge that we would be worse off being homosexual” (1987, 212). Reznek then says that we could discover that homosexuality is not a disease if we find out that it develops by a normal psychological process. Reznek calls this is a form of constructivism (or normativism, as in his terms) because value judgments have conceptual priority: but in fact in the case he describes it seem that value judgments are actually only heuristics, drawing our attention to whether something might be wrong with someone. If the initial judgment can be overturned by a biological discovery, then it seems that biological facts are necessary for a final judgment, which is to say that our concept of disease necessarily involves both biological and evaluative judgments. That is a version of objectivism, since the biological facts are the ultimate foundation for the judgment. Indeed, objectivism seems to explain why constructivist interpretations are sometimes correct. We say now that homosexuality was never a disease, and was just diagnosed on moral grounds, because it was not caused by malfunctions according to any even moderately correct theory of human biology or psychology. Values stopped people from getting the science right, but homosexuality was correctly understood, and no longer seen as a disease, when the science was done in a properly disinterested way.

Objectivism embodies the important insight that we do in fact think that disease involves a causal process that includes biological abnormalities. It does not mean, however, that all diseases have to receive the same biological explanation. The class of diseases will include a variety of different conditions that receive different causal explanations. That is, even if diseases are natural kinds, the superordinate category of disease may not be. Not just any sort of story about the causes of abnormal behavior will do, and it is difficult to reach a satisfactory specification of the sorts of causes that common sense might recognize. We also distinguish, based on our common sense understanding of human biology, between pathological and non-pathological versions of the same outward phenomena. Because aging is normal we acknowledge that an elderly person will differ from a young adult, so our assumptions about normality are sensitive to background conditions. But when aging is abnormal, we call it a disease. Hutchinson-Gilford progeria syndrome, for instance, causes children to undergo all the stages of human aging at a bizarrely accelerated rate. They nearly always die by seventeen, far gone in senescence. Even though we don't know much about it, we think of Hutchinson-Gilford as a disease not just because we don't like being old but because we think it is different from getting old in a way that must be caused by some underlying pathology. The concept of disease necessarily requires, just as objectivism insists, that a condition have a causal history involving abnormal biological systems. So let's turn to objectivism, and see whether it should be a conservative or revisionist position.

4. Objectivism

4.1. Forms of Objectivism

When we have decided that someone's biological systems do not function properly, we still face the question, how should we think about that person's condition? Objectivists usually admit that there is more to the concept of disease than biological malfunction even if they think that biological malfunction is a necessary condition for disease. This involves the two-stage picture (Murphy 2006, ch 2) which inverts the constructivist picture of our practice. An objectivist who buys the two stage picture thinks that, first, we agree on the biological facts about malfunction. At the second stage we make the normative judgment that the person with the malfunction is suffering in some way. (This is the order of conceptual priority, not the chronological sequence in which judgments are made.) Spitzer and Endicott (1978, 18) for example, say that disease categories are “calls to action”; assertions that something has gone wrong within a person's body in a way that produces consequences we think we need to remedy (see also Papineau 1994).

Normative considerations, on this account, inform our judgments about disease but do not have the conceptual priority accorded them by constructivists. We make judgments that someone is suffering in ways we associate with inner malfunction. We also see people who are suffering but who we don't think are ill or injured, because we do not regard their bodily dysfunction as symptoms of disease: vaccination, surgical incisions, ear-piercing or childbirth are examples. Or imagine a skin condition that in some cultures causes the sufferer to be worshiped as a god, or become a sought-after sexual partner. The two-stage picture is designed to distinguish between the physical abnormality and the difference it makes to the life of the person who has it. The idea is that whether someone's body is not functioning correctly is a separate question from whether it is bad to be like that.

The second stage, the question about whether life is worsened by a malfunction, is omitted by simple objectivism. Simple objectivists say that all there is to disease is the failure of someone's physiology (or psychology) to work normally. The view has few adherents, but as noted above, Szasz (1987) uses simple objectivism about disease to justify his claims that mental disorder is a myth.

4.2. Specifying Causes

We have arrived at a generic objectivism that says judgments of illness are sensitive to causal antecedents of the right sort, as well as to value judgments about the effects of those causes. What are the right causal antecedents? Culver and Gert's (1982) requirement that the antecedents be a “nondistinct sustaining cause” is a biologically noncommittal criterion. Culver and Gert analyze the concept of a malady, which involves suffering evils, or increased risk of evil, due to “a condition not sustained by something distinct” from oneself (1982, 72). The cause can be physical or mental, (p.87), provided it is a sustaining cause that is not distinct from the sufferer (p.88). A wrestler's hammerlock, because its effects come and go with the presence or absence of the cause itself, is an example of a sustaining cause. But because the wrestler is a distinct entity from the sufferer, someone in a hammerlock does not have a malady. If the cause is inside the body it is nondistinct just in case it is difficult to remove (e.g. a surgical implement left in the body) or it is biologically integrated in the body (e.g. a retrovirus). This is an attractively simple solution but it is too inclusive. Culver and Gert (p.71) say that loss of freedom, opportunity or pleasure count as evils. But if that is so, then black citizens of South Africa and Mississippi used to suffer from maladies, since they were unfree, unhappy and oppressed. And they suffered these evils because of black skin, which was a nondistinct sustaining aspect of their nature. But it wasn't a disease.

This counterexample is instructive however, since there are two ways of amending the proposal in the light of it. First, perhaps the principle of nondistinct sustaining causes fails to capture our intuitions about causes of disease. A second possibility is that the principle is a good causal condition, but that the account of evils is too broad, and needs to be restricted to a more intuitively medical set of evils, rather than the broader class of impediments to well-being. The section on health will go over the terrain that's relevant for the second option; the current discussion is about the causal condition. Boorse (1975, 1976, 1977, 1997) and his followers have opted for a more restrictive view of the causes of disease. They contend that disease necessarily involves biological malfunction. Boorse distinguished “disease” from “illness”. The former is the failure to conform to the “species-typical design” of humans, and the latter is a matter of judgments that a disease is undesirable, entitles one to special treatment, or excuses bad behavior. An account of malfunction must be parasitic on a theory of function. Boorse thinks a function is a ‘species-typical’ contribution to survival and reproduction (1976, 62–63). Disease is failure to function according to a species design that is a product of natural selection (1977, 550; 1997, 32). Boorse understands this as functioning “more than a certain distance below the population mean” (1977, 559) for the relevant set of humans. (Since not all members of a species have the same design in every respect, we need to specify reference classes according to biologically relevant subgroups.) This cutoff point, he thinks, can only be specified as a matter of convention, but this conventional element does not threaten the objectivity of diagnoses.

Boorse's position has been very influential. In psychiatry, for instance, Wakefield (1992, 1997a, 1997b), follows Boorse (1976) in assuming that humans have a species-typical design produced by natural selection, and adds the rider that individual functions within the overall system are to be analysed in terms of natural selection too. Wakefield applies the picture to both mental and physical illness: first, we judge that a psychological mechanism is not performing the function for which natural selection designed it; second, we judge that the malfunction is harmful. An appeal to natural function, by adding extra commitments to the idea of a cause of illness, rules out skin pigment as a cause of evil. But the Boorsian view also faces difficulties.

Cooper (2002, 265) suggests that Boorse's straightforward appeal to dysfunction must be qualified in light of some apparent counterexamples. A woman taking contraceptive pills, for example, may be interfering with typical functioning, but ingesting contraceptives is not a disease. (Boorse would have to call it a self-inflicted disease that does not make the woman ill.) Cooper also raises the problem of individuals with chronic conditions that are controlled by drugs. She argues that these are cases of diseased subjects who nonetheless function normally and suggests that the analysis must be amended to talk of a disposition to malfunction. But, as Cooper sees, the big problem faced by Boorsian accounts is that of coming up with an acceptable conception of normal function in the first place.

4.3 Functions

The Boorsian analysis is of a commonsense concept of disease which bottoms out in a notion of malfunction as the cause of illness. The view is that conceptual analysis determines the empirical commitments of our disease concepts and then hands over to the biomedical sciences the problem of biological finding functions and malfunctions. There are three problems with this general project, which affect different scholars in different ways. First, Wakefield's stress on a distinctively evolutionary account of function is unattractive, since the biomedical sciences employ a different conception of function. Second, a reliance on scientifically, functional decomposition as the ultimate justification of judgments of health and disease requires a revisionist, rather than a conservative, account. Third, it may not always be possible to settle contested cases by an appeal to a notion of normal human nature, because that notion is itself contested.

First, why suppose that the relevant concept of function is an adaptive one, and that dysfunction is a failure of a biological system to fulfill its adaptive function? Wakefield's harmful dysfunction analysis has been developed with little attempt to argue that medicine does in fact use an evolutionary, teleological account of function. In opposition, Schaffner (1993) has argued very convincingly that although medicine might use teleological talk in its attempts to develop a mechanistic picture of how humans work, the teleology is just heuristic. It can be completely dispensed with when the mechanistic explanation of a given organ or process is complete. Schaffner argues that as we learn more about the causal role a structure plays in the overall functioning of the organism, the need for teleological talk of any kind drops out and is superseded by the vocabulary of mechanistic explanation, and that evolutionary functional ascriptions are merely heuristic; they focus our attention on “entities that satisfy the secondary [i.e. mechanistic] sense of function and that it is important for us to know more about” (1993, 390).

In effect, Schaffner is arguing that the biomedical sciences employ a causal, rather than a teleological, concept of function. This is in the spirit of Cummins's (1975) analysis of function as the causal contribution a structure makes to the overall operation of the system that includes it. Cummins's concept of function is not a historical or evolutionary concept. According to Cummins, a component may have a function even it was not designed or selected for and, therefore, parts with no selection history can be ascribed a function. Boorse and his followers have tied disease conceptually to an evolutionary concept of function as a naturally selected capacity. It is doubtful if this connection can be found in either science or common sense about disease. Perhaps in some areas of biology functional ascription is indeed teleological. However, most theorists who have attended to biomedical contexts agree with Schaffner that the function of an organ or structure can be understood without thinking of it as an adaptation. Medical understanding requires that functional structures can be identified and analyzed in terms of their contribution to the overall maintenance of the organism as a living system. Explanation in medicine takes a model of the normal realization of a biological process and uses the model to show how abnormalities stem from the failure of normal relations to apply between components of the model. This requires a non-historical function concept, one that is at home in casual-mechanistic, rather than evolutionary, explanation.

Functional attributions in medicine appear to get their sense from the role they play in showing how the overall performance of a biological system depends on the contributions of its component systems, without further tying the systems to an overall goal. The Boorsian approach faces problems in specifying such an overall goal and showing how functions contribute to it. First, it is very difficult to assess the relevant evidence that a given biological systems is — as in Wakefield's treatment — the product of natural selection (Davies 2001, Chapter 5). Since many ailments do not prevent one from living and having children, it is even harder to show that a disease is necessarily the product of a malfunction that lowers fitness or — as in Boorse — interferes with survival and reproduction. A second problem for Wakefield is that if you regard evolutionary dysfunction as partly constitutive of disease then if an illness depends on structures that have no evolved function, it cannot really be an illness. A biological structure might be a spandrel or a by-product, or have some other non-selective history. Such a structure cannot malfunction in Wakefield's sense, and so it cannot be diseased.

Objections to an evolutionary notion of medical malfunction do not show that there is anything wrong with the general idea of basing judgments of health and disease on a scientifically established picture of the normal functional decomposition of human beings. However, on this account, it becomes harder to retain the conservative project that looks for the natural phenomena that fall under, and are therefore constrained by, our folk concepts of health and disease. Both sides of Kitcher's objectivist/constructivist divide usually assume that there is a lay concept of disorder that should constrain the scientific understanding of what is or is not a medical disorder. Wakefield, for instance, thinks some psychiatric diagnoses flout our intuitions by attributing disorder on the basis of behavior alone without looking for malfunctioning mental mechanisms (1997a). He appeals to intuitions to derive necessary and sufficient conditions for the folk concept of mental disorder, and assumes that science should search for the psychological processes that fit the concept thus defined. But it is one thing to take intuitions as a starting point, and another to say that they are hegemonic. Boorse, too, adduces everyday linguistic usage and commonsense intuitions as evidence, even though he claims to be discussing the clinical concepts of health and disease.

A revisionist can say that a condition we currently disvalue but do not regard as a disease may turn out to involve malfunction and hence to be a disease, whatever our intuitions say. Conversely, we may think something is a disease but we might be wrong, just as we were wrong about drapetomania or masturbation, which do not causally depend on any biological malfunction. Conservatives resist this possibility. Wakefield claims that we have intuitions about human nature that make it “obvious from surface features” whether underlying mechanisms are functional or dysfunctional (Wakefield 1997b, 256). But it is an empirical issue whether one's physiology or psychology is functioning properly, not a conceptual one to be decided from the armchair.

Once we hand over the task of uncovering malfunction to the sciences we can no longer make common sense the ultimate arbiter, unless we wish to explicitly import, into the concept of disease, considerations derived from folk theories of what normal human nature amounts to.

The normative and scientific components of the analysis are in tension. The analysis of disease as depending on malfunctioning biological components requires a functional decomposition of human biology. If that decomposition is to be independent of what we think people should be like, it should not be regulated by common sense theories of human nature, but discovered by science. We must be able to ascertain, within acceptable limits of variation, the biological standards that nature has imposed on humans. The goal of finding out how a biological system works is fixed by our interests in health and well-being, but the objectivist assumption is that the goal is met by discovering empirical facts about human biology, not our own, culturally defined, norms. So, we diagnose someone as suffering from mesenteric adenitis not just because they are in discomfort due to fever, abdominal pain and diarrhea, but because the lower right quadrant of the mesenteric lymphatic system displays abnormal inflammation. This thickening of the nodes is not just the objective cause of the discomfort, it is an objective failure of the lymphatic system to make its normal contribution to the overall system. For the objectivist program to work, the biological roles of human organs must be natural facts just as empirically discoverable as the atomic weights of chemical elements. That may result in the overturning of common sense.

This raises a further issue. It is widely believed that function concepts are intrinsically normative, since they are teleological. Therefore, the objection continues, claims about natural functional and malfunction introduce normative considerations into the foundations of medicine, which are supposed to be purely scientific.

The view that the correct functional decomposition of humans can be discovered in nature is very strong. It's the view that natural functional standards for human nature exist independently of what people think. The idea is that in cases where we can ascribe function to a physiological mechanism the standards of good performance are supplied by nature and not by human values. If that can be done, then malfunction can be understood as a failure of the system to function as it is naturally supposed to. Whether or not this should be seen as normative, it is not the socially relative normativity appealed to by constructivists. The crucial point is that in the life sciences, some biological system can fail to behave as a theory predicts without impugning the prediction: we can say that the system is malfunctioning. This contrasts with other sciences, in which, if a system fails to behave as predicted, the fault lies with the science, not the system.

But where is an account of malfunction to be found? Supporters of a selectionist account of function advertise the ease with which an account of malfunction follows from the theory as one of its virtues. Their idea is that we can say when a system is malfunctioning by observing that it is not carrying out the job which natural selection designed it to perform. In contrast, it is widely believed that systemic accounts of function cannot deal with malfunction at all. The argument goes that what a system is taken to do is relative to our explanatory interests, and that a putative malfunction can just be understood as a contribution to a different property of the system. Davies (2001) argues that the first of these claims can be defeated by restricting functional ascriptions to hierarchically organized systems in which lower level capacities realize upper level ones. That gives us a characterization of function independent of our explanatory interests.

Godfrey-Smith (1993) argues that systemic concepts of function do permit attributions of malfunction. He argues that a token component in a system is malfunctioning when it cannot play the role that lets other tokens of the same type feature in the explanation of the larger system. Davies (2003, 212) denies this. He says that functional types are defined in terms of what they can do and that if a component cannot carry out its normal contribution to the overall system then it ceases to be a member of a type. However, Davies' objection appears to fail, at least in medical contexts, if we can identify components apart from their functional roles. Suppose we can identify biological components in terms of their anatomical position and relationships to other organs. If so, we can say that an organ in the position characteristic of its type remains a member of that type even though it has lost some capacity characteristic of that type, and hence is malfunctioning. Reasoning like this permits doctors to identify organs as normal or abnormal during autopsies, even though every system in a corpse no longer possesses its normal function in Davies's sense.

This leaves unaddressed the issue of how we determine what normal function is. Wachbroit (1994) argues that when we say that an organ is normal, we employ a biomedical concept of normality that is an idealized description of a component of a biological system in an unperturbed state that may never be attained in actual systems. Boorse (1977, 1997) insists that the notion of normality in biomedical concepts is statistical — how things usually are in a reference class, but this view faces the problem of specifying the reference classes in an informative way. But given the amount of variation within a species, it will always be hard to find reference classes which share a design. As Ereshefsky (forthcoming) puts it, Boorse assumes that statistical normality coincides with the kind of normality that medicine cares about, but this looks wrong. Wachbroit (1994, 588) argues convincingly that the role of normality in physiology is like the role that pure states or ideal entities play in physical theories.

4.4. Normality and Variation

Statistically, a textbook heart, for example, may be very rare indeed. But it is the account of the organ that gets into the physiology textbook. The textbook tells you what a healthy organ is like by reference to an abstraction—an idealized organ. This concept of normality is not justified by appeal to a conceptual analysis that aims to capture intuitions about what's normal. It draws all its authority from its predictive and explanatory utility: against the background of assuming normal heart function, for example, we account for variation in actual hearts (a particular rhythm, say), by citing the textbook rhythmic pattern (which may be very unusual statistically) and identifying other patterns as arrhythmic. The point of textbook depictions of human physiology is to identify an ideal system that enables us to answer “what if things had been different questions” (Woodward 2003, Murphy 2006). The role of an idealization, in this system, is to let us classify real systems according to their departure from the ideal. So normal human biological nature, in this sense, is an idealization designed to let us impose order on variation.

Variation in biological traits is ubiquitous, and so establishing whether a mechanism is functioning normally is difficult: nonetheless, biologists do it all the time. But not all diagnoses can be tied to a break between normal and abnormal functioning of an underlying mechanism, such as a failure of the kidneys to conserve electrolytes. Nor can we always discover some other abnormality, such as the elevated levels of helicobacter pylori bacteria that have been found to be causally implicated in stomach ulcers (discussed in detail by Thagard 1999). Some conditions involve cutting between normal and pathological parts of a continuous variation, even in the absence of clear underlying malfunctions that separate the populations.

The more of this we have to do, the more we will have to complicate the analysis by appeal to risk factors and behavioral difficulties rather than natural standards of underlying function. And that raises the worry that the behavioral factors we cite will reflect contested conceptions of human flourishing. Distinguishing failures to flourish from functional abnormalities will always be a special problem for psychiatry. For example, judgments of irrationality are central to many psychiatric diagnoses, and our standards of rational thought reflect not biological findings but standards derived from normative reflection. The possibility of psychiatric explanation employing the methods and models of physical medicine, then, depends on how much of our psychology is like the visual system—i.e. decomposable into structures to which we can ascribe a natural function (Murphy 2006). Within medicine more generally, the prospects for a general objectivism about disease depend on our ability to understand human biology as a set of structures whose functions we can discover empirically, and our capacity to understand disease causally as the product of failures of those structures to perform their natural functions.

5. Health

5.1 Health and Biology

As noted above, conceptions of health, like conceptions of disease, tend to go beyond the simple condition that one is biologically in some state. In the case of health, one view is that a healthy individual is just someone whose biology works as our theories say it should. This is the counterpart, in theories of health, to simple objectivism about disease. As with disease, however, most scholars who write about health and add further conditions having to do with quality of life. On this view, we need a threefold distinction between disease, normality and health, where health involves some properties of a person's life that enable us to evaluate how well it is going for them. Carel (2007, 2008), for example, thinks that the important thing about health is one's lived experience of one's own body, and in particular, that one should not feel estranged or alienated from one's body. Carel argues that health should be understood phenomenologically as the experience of being at home in one's lived body, rather than merely the normal functioning of the body seen as a biological unit.

From the objectivist perspective, one problem with this proposal is that it ignores that one can feel perfectly at ease with one's lived body even if one harbors, unaware, a diseased system. Indeed, Carel argues that someone who is ill can be, in her sense, healthy, if they are adapted to their bodily predicament; from her perspective, objections like the one just mentioned miss the point, since they privilege a biological perspective rather than a phenomenological one. Her project is avowedly revisionist: she wishes to replace existing concepts of health with views that aim to capture the experience of being healthy (or unwell). It may well be that perspectives like Carel's are neglected in contemporary medicine, and especially important in disability studies. however, it does not follow that the concepts of health and disease, rather than aspects of our practices that employ those concepts, should be reformed along the lines she suggests.

Carel's stress on experience is directly challenged by views like Gadamer's. He insists (1996, 113) that it is absurd to ask someone if they feel healthy, since health is “not a condition that one introspectively feels in oneself. Rather, it is a condition of being involved, of being in the world, of being together with one's fellow human beings, of active and rewarding engagement in one's everyday tasks”. Gadamer's healthy person is someone is in harmony with the social and natural environment, and disease is a disturbance of this harmony.

5.2 Embedded Instrumentalism

Gadamer's view is reminiscent of what Richman (2003) calls “embedded instrumentalist” theories, which claim that health is indexed to goals: how healthy you are depend on how well you can fulfill your goals. Such theories are very popular. Nordenfelt (1995) considered two versions of this approach. One version defines the goals relevant to health as needs, which are understood as having a biological basis. Another view defines goals in terms of the ambitions and desires of the individual. Nordenfelt (1995, 90) argues that a healthy person is one who can satisfy her “vital goals”, which are those that are necessary and sufficient for her to be minimally happy.

Embedded instrumentalist theories of health have an obvious appeal. Once we argue that health involves judgments about how well a person's life is going, we need a way to evaluate that, and an immediately attractive idea is that someone's life goes well if they can achieve their ambitions or satisfy their goals. An apparent difficulty, however, is that much the same terrain is covered by theories of well-being, and while people think that being healthy is important to their well-being (Eid and Larsen 2007), they do not identify the two. Rather, they think of health as a component of well-being.

Some embedded instrumentalist theories, though, appear to be in danger of defining health in such a way that it is synonymous with well-being. Richman (2003), for example, develops his view, (the “Richman-Budson view”) to deal with objections that Nordenfelt raises against goal-based views, such as the worry that someone with very low ambitions will count as healthy just because she is easily satisfied. Richman (2003, 56–57) supposes that someone is healthy if she can strive for a consistent set of goals that would be chosen by an idealized version of herself if she were fully aware of her “objectified subjective interest” (p.45). That is, they are the goals she would choose if she had complete knowledge of herself and her environment and perfect rationality.

In this case it seems that a theory of health is in danger of becoming a general theory of well-being, and Richman does not discuss the relation between the two. A further complication is the relationship between medical interventions designed to cure diseases, and other medical interventions which are “enhancement technologies” (Elliott 2003). The line between enhancement and therapy is very hard to draw: Harris (2007, 21) for example, uses the example of vaccination, which is both a therapeutic protection against infection and an enhancement of our natural immune system. Perhaps, too, many of us would benefit from a boost to our powers of concentration, or a lift in our mood, which pharmaceuticals might supply. But neurological enhancements, unlike vaccines, can help us to meet our goals without guarding against disease. Perhaps what is needed is a weaker view of the relation between health and goal-directedness, such as that offered by Whitbeck (1981, 620). Whitbeck defines health in terms of the psychophysiological capacities of an individual that support her “goals, projects and aspirations in a wide variety of situations”. This view loosens the tight Richman-Budson connection between health and goal-directed action, and suggests a view on which we can see biological capacities as at the core of health in so far as they help people's lives to go better.

6. Conclusions

Objectivism and constructivism have been distinguished for analytic purposes in this essay but they are not always easy to tell apart in practice. The difficulty comes from the fact that there is widespread agreement that our thinking about disease pays attention to both human values and biological phenomena, and it is not always easy to tell how a theorist explains the interactions of these factors, nor whether a given analysis is descriptive or prescriptive. For an objectivist the relevant biological processes are departures from good human functioning, to be determined by the relevant science. These biological problems result in what we judge to be difficulties in living. For a constructivist, it is the problems people face in their lives that take priority. Their biological underpinnings are ones we count as abnormal because we have judged them to be both relevant to the conditions we disvalue and also the subject matter of a specific, medical, class of interventions, therapies and other practices. The obstacle to a successful development of objectivism is the problem of establishing a satisfactory, science-based, distinction between normal and abnormal human functioning. Overcoming this difficulty will require a closer engagement by theorists of disease with the relevant debates in the philosophy of biology.

For constructivists, the big problem is to say why we judge of some things that they are symptoms of disease whereas other human phenomena are taken as evidence that someone is criminal or ugly or possessed by demons or something else we do not admire. It is not generally true that we think that if someone's life goes badly it is because he or she is unhealthy, so constructivists owe us an account of what makes a certain class of judgments distinctively medicalized. Many theorists have traced the changes in medicalization over time, but a satisfactory constructivist concept of disease requires an analysis of how medical thinking comes to play a role in human societies to begin with.


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Related Entries

causation: and manipulability | disability | feminist (interventions): bioethics | mental illness | social norms | teleology: teleological notions in biology | well-being


The editors would like to thank Patrick S. O'Donnell for bringing several typographical errors in this entry to our attention.