Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Teleological Notions in Biology

First published Wed Mar 20, 1996; substantive revision Sun May 18, 2003

Teleological terms such as "function" and "design" appear frequently in the biological sciences. Examples of teleological claims include:

Teleological notions were commonly associated with the pre-Darwinian view that the biological realm provides evidence of conscious design by a supernatural creator. Even after creationist viewpoints were rejected by most biologists there remained various grounds for concern about the role of teleology in biology, including whether such terms are:

  1. vitalistic (positing some special "life-force");
  2. requiring backwards causation (because future outcomes explain present traits);
  3. incompatible with mechanistic explanation (because of 1 and 2);
  4. mentalistic (attributing the action of mind where there is none);
  5. empirically untestable (for all the above reasons).

Opinions divide over whether Darwin's theory of evolution provides a means of eliminating teleology from biology, or whether it provides a naturalistic account of the role of teleological notions in the science. Many contemporary biologists and philosophers of biology believe that teleological notions are a distinctive and ineliminable feature of biological explanations but that it is possible to provide a naturalistic account of their role that avoids the concerns above. Terminological issues sometimes serve to obscure some widely-accepted distinctions.


Teleomentalists regard the teleology of psychological intentions, goals, and purposes as the primary model for understanding teleology in biology. Aside from creationism, the most common form of teleomentalist view is that teleological claims in biology are mere metaphor — describing and explaining biological phenomena on the basis of more or less loose comparisons to psychological teleology. Those who hold teleology in biology to be metaphorical in nature typically regard it as eliminable; i.e., they believe that the science of biology would not be essentially altered if all references to teleology were eschewed.


Those who reject teleomentalism typically seek naturalistic truth conditions for teleological claims in biology that do not refer to the intentions, goals, or purposes of psychological agents. Some teleonaturalists seek to reduce teleological language to forms of description and explanation that are found in other parts of science. One class of such views defines teleological notions cybernetically and maintains that teleology in biology is appropriate insofar as biological systems are cybernetic systems. Another, more widely-accepted approach treats functional claims in biology as part of the analysis of the capacities of a complex system into various component capacities.

Other forms of teleonaturalism regard the teleological aspects of biology as unique and ineliminable. One class of such views maintains that teleological claims in biology depend on natural values that apply to biological entities (such as what is good for an organism or species). A different approach, that avoids normative notions, is to define biological teleology explicitly in terms of natural selection and the theory of evolution.

Several theorists have argued for the pluralistic idea that biology may incorporate two notions of function, one to explain the presence of traits and the other to explain how those traits contribute to the complex capacities of organisms. Others have argued that these two apparently distinct notions of function can be unified by regarding the target of explanation as the biological fitness of a whole organism. Nonetheless, the mainstream view among philosophers of biology is that natural selection accounts best explain the majority of uses of teleological notions in biology.

Natural Selection Analyses of Function

Accounts of biological function which refer to natural selection typically have the form that a trait's function or functions causally explain the existence or maintenance of that trait in a given population via the mechanism of natural selection. Three components of this view can be usefully separated:

  1. Functional claims in biology are intended to explain the existence or maintenance of a trait in a given population;
  2. Biological functions are causally relevant to the existence or maintenance of traits via the mechanism of natural selection;
  3. Functional claims in biology are fully grounded in natural selection and are not derivative of psychological uses of notions such as design, intention, and purpose.

Variations on this account mostly center on the first two points.

  1. Some theorists maintain a distinction between the initial spread of a new phenotypic trait in a population from the maintenance of traits in populations.
  2. Some theorists adopt an etiological or backward-looking approach that analyzes the function of a trait only in terms of those effects of the trait which have in the past contributed to the selection of organisms with that trait. Others adopt a dispositional or forward-looking approach that analyzes function in terms of those effects it is disposed to produce that tend to contribute to the present or future maintenance of the trait in a population of organisms.

Function and Design

In the debate about biological teleology, relatively little attention has been paid to the notion of natural design. It is common for authors to slide between claims about function and design as if they accept this principle:

A trait T is naturally designed for X if and only if X is a biological function of T.

Collapsing the notions of design and function in this manner has the advantage that if the notion of biological function is successfully naturalized then so is the notion of natural design.

The biological notion of design seems, however, to imply more than mere usefulness. Female turtles use their flippers to dig nests in sand, and doing so surely accounts for the maintenance of the trait in the population. So, on an etiological account, digging in sand is a function of the flippers. Yet it seems wrong to say that they are designed for that purpose. This suggests that function and design should be analyzed separately. One way to do this is as follows:

Trait T is naturally designed to do X means that
  1. X is a biological function of T and
  2. T is the result of a process of change of (anatomical or behavioral) structure due to natural selection that has resulted in T being more optimal (or better adapted) for X than ancestral versions of T.

With respect to this analysis, to say that an eagle's wings are designed for soaring is to claim, first, that the ability to soar (as opposed to other kinds of flying) explains why some ancestral eagles had higher reproductive fitness than others and, second, that eagles' wings are better adapted for soaring than were ancestral versions of the wings. This second part is an historical claim that might be checked against the fossil record.

Adaptation, Exaptation and Co-opted Use

The notion of adaptation is controversial among biologists because it suggests the Panglossian belief that this is the best of all possible worlds. However comparative judgments about traits of organisms, e.g., that the traits of present organisms are better at producing some effect than the corresponding traits of ancestral organisms, do not require the Panglossian assumption. This is because the claim that A is more optimal or better adapted than B with respect to some function does not entail that A is optimal or even good with respect to that function.

Gould & Vrba (1982) would deny that sand-digging is a function of turtle flippers and prefer instead to label it an "exaptation". They recommend the use of "function" only when natural selection has "shaped" a trait for some use — i.e. the trait has undergone some modification in form that makes it more suited to the use. This recommendation, however, seeks to change ordinary biological usage rather than to elucidate it. Because it conflates the notions of design and function, it becomes necessary to mark the distinction between cases of selection with modification (function/design) and cases where a trait of an organism is coopted for a use for which it is not modified (exaptation). Even if the flippers of turtles are not specially modified for burying eggs in sand, the fact that they were so used helps to explain why turtles with flippers were selected over those without. Whether one prefers to call this a function or an exaptation is a terminological issue perhaps to be settled by one's taste for neologisms.


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biology: philosophy of | function | mental content: teleological theories of | natural selection