Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Dec 5, 1996; substantive revision Mon Jan 5, 2009

Holes are an interesting case-study for ontologists and epistemologists. Naive, untutored descriptions of the world treat holes as objects of reference, on a par with ordinary material objects. (‘There are as many holes in the cheese as there are cookies in the tin.’) And we often appeal to holes to account for causal interactions, or to explain the occurrence of certain events. (‘The water ran out because of the hole in the bucket.’) Hence there is prima facie evidence for the existence of such entities. Yet it might be argued that reference to holes is just a façon de parler, that holes are mere entia representationis, as-if entities, fictions.

1. Problems

‘A hole?’ the rock chewer grunted. ‘No, not a hole,’ said the will-o'-the-wisp despairingly. ‘A hole, after all, is something. This is nothing at all’. (Ende 1974/1985: 24)

Hole representations—no matter whether veridical—appear to be commonplace in human cognition. Not only do people have the impression of seeing holes; they also form a corresponding concept, which is normally lexicalised as a noun in ordinary languages. (Some languages even discriminate different types of hole, distinguishing e.g. between inner cavities and see-through perforations.) Moreover, data from developmental psychology confirm that infants are able to perceive, count, and track holes just as easily as they perceive, count, and track paradigm material objects such as cookies and tins (Giralt & Bloom 2000). These facts do not prove that holes and material objects are on equal psychological footing, let alone on equal metaphysical footing. But they indicate that the concept of a hole is of significant salience in the common-sense picture of the world, specifically of the spatio-temporal world.

If holes are entities of a kind, then, they appear to be spatio-temporal particulars, like cookies and tins and unlike numbers or moral values. They appear to have a determinate shape, a size, and a location. (‘These things have birthplaces and histories. They can change, and things can happen to them’, Hofstadter & Dennett 1981: 6-7.) On the other hand, if holes are particulars, then they are sui generis particulars. For holes appear to be immaterial—they seem to be made of nothing, if anything is. And this gives rise to a number of conundrums. For example:

  1. It is difficult to explain how holes can in fact be perceived. If perception is grounded on causation, as Locke urged (Essay, II-viii-6), and if causality has to do with materiality, then immaterial bodies cannot be the source of any causal flow. So a causal theory of perception would not apply to holes. Our impression of perceiving holes would then be a sort of systematic illusion, on pain of rejecting causal accounts of perception. (On the other hand, if one accepts that absences can be causally efficacious, as urged by Lewis 2004, then a causal account could maintain that we truly perceive holes; see Sorensen 2008.)
  2. It is difficult to specify identity criteria for holes—more difficult than for ordinary material objects. Being immaterial, we cannot account for the identity of a hole via the identity of any constituting stuff. But neither can we rely on the identity conditions of its material “host” (the stuff around the hole), for we can imagine changing the host, partly or wholly, without affecting the hole. And we cannot rely on the identity conditions of its “guest” (the stuff inside it), for it would seem that we can empty a hole of whatever might partially or fully occupy it and leave the hole intact.
  3. It is difficult to assess the explanatory relevance of holes. Arguably, whenever a physical interaction can be explained by appeal to the concept of a hole, a matching explanation can be offered invoking only material objects and their properties. (That water flowed out of the bucket is explained by a number of facts about water fluidity, combined with an accurate account of the physical and geometric conditions of the bucket.) Aren't these latter explanations enough?

Further problems arise from the ambiguous status of holes in figure-ground displays (Bozzi 1975). Thus, for example, though it appears that the shape of holes can be recognized by humans as accurately as the shape of ordinary objects (Rolf & Palmer 2001), the area visually enclosed by a hole typically belongs to the background of the host, and there is evidence to the effect that background regions are not represented as having shapes (Bertamini & Croucher 2003). So what would the shape of a hole be, if any?

2. Theories

These difficulties—along with some form of horror vacui—may lead a philosopher to favor ontological parsimony over naive realism about holes. A number of options are available:

  1. One could hold that holes do not exist at all, arguing that all truths about holes boil down to truths about holed objects (Jackson 1977: 132). This calls for a systematic way of paraphrasing every hole-committing sentence by means of a sentence that does not refer to or quantify over holes. For instance, the phrase ‘There is a hole in...’ can be treated as a mere grammatical variant of the shape predicate ‘... is holed’, or of the predicate ‘... has a hole-surrounding part’. (Challenge: Can a language be envisaged that contains all the necessary predicates? Can every hole-referring noun-phrase be de-nominalized? Compare: ‘The hole in the tooth was smaller than the dentist's finest probe’, Geach 1968: 12.)
  2. One could hold that holes do exist, but they are not the immaterial entities they seem to be: they are, like anything else, material beings, which is to say qualified portions of space-time (Miller 2007). There would be nothing peculiar about such portions as opposed to any others that we would not normally think of as being occupied by ordinary material objects, just as there would be nothing more problematic, in principle, in determining under what conditions a certain portion counts as a hole than there is in determining under what conditions it counts as a dog, a statue, or whatnot. (What if there were truly unqualified portions of space-time, in this or some other possible world? Would there be truly immaterial entities inhabiting such portions, and would holes be among them?)
  3. One could also hold that holes are ordinary material beings: they are neither more nor less than superficial parts of what, on the naive view, are their material hosts (Lewis & Lewis 1970). For every hole there is a hole-surround; for every hole-surround there is a hole. On this conception, the hole-surround is the hole. (Challenge: This calls for an account of the altered meaning of certain predicates or prepositions. What would ‘inside’ and ‘outside’ mean? What would it mean to ‘enlarge’ a hole?)
  4. Alternatively, one could hold that holes are “negative” parts of their material hosts (Hoffman & Richards 1985). On this account, a donut would be a sort of hybrid mereological aggregate—the mereological sum of a positive pie together with the negative bit in the middle. (Again, this calls for an account of the altered meaning of certain modes of speech. For instance, making a hole would amount to adding a part, and changing an object to get rid of a hole would mean to remove a part, contrary to ordinary usage.)
  5. Yet another possibility is to treat holes as “disturbances” of some sort (Karmo 1977). On this view, a hole is to be found in some object (its “medium”) in the same sense in which a knot may be found in a rope or a wrinkle in a carpet. (The metaphysical status of such entities, however, calls for refinements. Simons 1987: 308 has suggested construing them as Husserlian moments that continuously change their fundaments, but this seems to suit knots and wrinkles better than holes.)

On the other hand, the possibility remains of taking holes at face value. Any such effort would have to account, not only for the general features mentioned in section 1—to the effect that holes are sui generis, immaterial particulars—but also for a number of additional peculiarities (Casati & Varzi 1994). Among others:

  1. Holes are localized at—but not identical with—regions of space. (Holes can move, as happens anytime you move a piece of Emmenthal cheese; regions of space cannot.)
  2. Holes are ontologically parasitic: they are always in something else and cannot exist in isolation. (‘There is no such thing as a hole by itself’, Tucholsky 1930.)
  3. Holes are fillable. (You don't destroy a hole by filling it up. You don't create a new hole by removing the filling.)
  4. Holes are mereologically structured. (They have parts and can bear part-whole relations to one another, though not to their hosts.)
  5. Holes are topologically assorted. (Superficial hollows are distinguished from internal cavities; straight perforations are distinguished from knotted tunnels.)

Holes are puzzling creatures. The question of whether they are to be subjected to Ockham's razor, reduced to other entities, or taken at face value is an instance of the general question that philosophers have to address when they scrutinize the ontology inherent in the common-sense picture of the world.


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nothingness | object | Ockham [Occam], William