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Hume on Free Will

First published Fri Dec 14, 2007
But to proceed in this reconciling project with regard to the question of liberty and necessity; the most contentious question of metaphysics, the most contentious science… —David Hume (EU, 8.23/95)

David Hume is widely recognized as providing the most influential statement of the “compatibilist” position in the free will debate — the view that freedom and moral responsibility can be reconciled with (causal) determinism. The arguments that Hume advances on this subject are found primarily in the sections titled “Of liberty and necessity”, as first presented in A Treatise of Human Nature (2.3.1-2) and, later, in a slightly amended form, in the Enquiry concerning Human Understanding (sec. 8). Although there is considerable overlap in content between these two statements of Hume's position, there are also some significant differences. This includes, for example, some substantial additions in the Enquiry discussion as it relates to problems of religion, such as predestination and divine foreknowledge. While these differences are certainly significant they should not be exaggerated. Hume's basic strategy and compatibilist commitments in both works remain the same in their essentials

It has become common practice to treat the two sections “Of liberty and necessity” as self-standing contributions that can be fully understood more or less in isolation from Hume's philosophical commitments and principles as found outside these sections. (Many anthologies present one or other of these sections as complete statements of Hume's position on this subject.) There is, nevertheless, an intimate and complex relationship between what Hume has to say in the sections “Of liberty and necessity” and his moral psychology and philosophical system as a whole. Neglect of these features has led to some serious misunderstanding concerning the character and content of Hume's compatibilism. Having said this, it is equally important to acknowledge that the established or “classical” interpretation of Hume's views on this subject has served as the foundation for the subsequent development of compatibilist strategy over the past two centuries — especially as found in various prominent representatives of the 20th century empiricist tradition (e.g., Ayer, Schlick, et al).

This article will be arranged around a basic contrast between two alternative interpretations of Hume's compatibilist strategy: the “classical” and “naturalistic” interpretations. According to the classical account, Hume's effort to articulate the conditions of moral responsibility, and the way they relate to the free will problem, should be understood primarily in terms of his views about the logic of our concepts of “liberty” and “necessity”. Free and responsible action, it is said, must be caused by the agent. There is, therefore, no incompatibility between free will and determinism. On the contrary, free and responsible action (logically) requires causal necessity. So interpreted, Hume's arguments involve (a priori) observations about the logical relations that hold between the key concepts involved in this dispute. In contrast with this, the naturalistic approach maintains that what is essential to Hume's account of the nature and conditions of responsible conduct is his description of the role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. That is to say, it is one of Hume's primary objectives to describe the circumstances in which people are felt to be responsible. When we read Hume's arguments in these terms, not only does this alter the way we understand his general theory of responsibility, it also changes the way that we interpret his core arguments relating specifically to the free will debate (i.e. as presented in the two sections titled “Of liberty and necessity”). This contrast between the classical and naturalistic interpretations is of fundamental importance not only for our general understanding of Hume's philosophical system but also for any adequate assessment of the contemporary value and relevance of his views on this subject. In the final section of this article I consider the way in which Hume's discussion of free will relates to his wider and more general irreligious philosophical intentions, as presented throughout his philosophy

1. Two Kinds of “Liberty”: The Basics of the Classical Interpretation

Lying at the heart of Hume's compatibilism are three conclusions that constitute the core of his compatibilst position on this subject as generally understood:

  1. Actions that are subject to moral evaluation are not distinguished from those that are not by an absence of cause but rather by a different type of cause. Responsible or morally free actions are caused by our own willings, whereas unfree actions are brought about by causes external to the agent. Let us call the argument that seeks to establish this conclusion the “spontaneity argument”
  2. A liberty which means “a negation of necessity and causes” (T, has no existence and would make morality impossible. Let us call the argument which seeks to establish this conclusion the “antilibertarian argument”.
  3. Necessity, properly understood, is the constant conjunction of objects and the inference of the mind from one object to the other (T,; EU, 8.5/82). Let us call the argument which seeks to establish this conclusion the “necessity argument”.

Taken together these three arguments serve as the basis of Hume's compatibilist strategy. All three arguments appear in some relevant form in both the Treatise and Enquiry in the sections “Of liberty and necessity”. The spontaneity and antilibertarian arguments serve to distinguish two rival views of moral freedom, providing a defence of one and a refutation of the other. These two arguments may be referred to jointly as the “liberty arguments”. A number of commentators take the view that the “liberty arguments” constitute the main thread of Hume's compatibilist strategy. Let us begin, therefore, with Hume's views on “liberty”.

In the Treatise Hume draws a fundamental distinction between two kinds of liberty.

Few are capable of distinguishing betwixt the liberty of spontaneity, as it is call'd in the schools, and the liberty of indifference; betwixt that which is oppos'd to violence, and that which means a negation of necessity and causes. The first is even the most common sense of the word; and as ‘tis only that species of liberty, which it concerns us to preserve, our thoughts have been principally turn'd towards it, and have almost universally confounded it with the other. (T,

Hume's key point here is that free actions are those that are caused by the agent's willings and desires. We hold an agent responsible because it was his desires or willings that were the determining causes of the action in question. Action caused in this way is voluntary and involuntary when caused in some other way. There is, therefore, no incompatibility between an action being causally necessitated and it being a free action for which the agent is responsible. On the contrary, morally free and responsible action requires that an agent caused his actions through his willings. If an action is the result of “violence” or constraint of some kind, then, although it may be necessitated or caused, it is not the result of the agent's will, and so cannot be attributed to him (T, In these circumstances, the agent is forced or compelled to act, and, therefore, he is not responsible for his actions. In short, the spontaneity argument seeks to establish that free action is to be distinguished from unfree action not by the absence of cause (as is suggested by conceptions of liberty of indifference) but rather by a different type of cause.

Hume's account of liberty is complicated by his related but distinct definition of “liberty” in the Enquiry. In this context he drops his distinction between liberty of “spontaneity” and “indifference” and offers the following in its place:

By liberty, then we can only mean a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will; that is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may. Now this hypothetical liberty is universally allowed to belong to every one who is not a prisoner and in chains. (EU, 8.23 /95)

Although this definition of “hypothetical liberty” also serves Hume's compatibilist purposes, it is not exactly the same as “liberty of spontaneity”. More specifically, a person may enjoy “liberty of spontaneity” but still lack “hypothetical liberty”. (For example, while you may choose to remain in a room rather than leave it, it may still be the case that if you chose to leave you could not because the door is locked.) Clearly, then, liberty of spontaneity does not always secure hypothetical liberty. The particular importance of this distinction for the free will debate is that “hypothetical liberty” provides compatibilism with a (plausible) account of alternate possibilities — something that is generally assumed we need for any acceptable theory of moral freedom and responsibility.

Hume's antilibertarian argument draws on, or develops out of, several of the basic features of the spontaneity argument. The antilibertarian argument purports to have found a fatal flaw in the libertarian position. Liberty of indifference, as we have noted, is “that which means a negation of necessity and causes”. Such a libertarian view holds that it is a necessary condition of moral responsibility that the act was not necessitated or caused. But such a freedom, claims Hume, is nothing on which moral responsibility could rest. If one removes necessity from actions, then one thereby removes causes as well, and this “is the very same thing with chance” (T,; cf. EU, 8.25/96 and T, It seems clear that we cannot hold someone responsible for an action which just happened, an action he contributed nothing to. Where actions “proceed not from some cause in the character and disposition of the person who performed them”, says Hume, “they can neither redound to his honour, if good, nor infamy, if evil” (EU, 8.29/98; cp. T, For the libertarian, therefore, there is a serious difficulty in giving a plausible account of the mechanism or source of responsibility.

According to the classical interpretation, these two arguments (i.e. the liberty arguments) are principally concerned with the logic of our concepts of moral freedom and responsibility. Hume is understood to be claiming that it would be illogical to say that an agent did not cause this action but that it is free and the agent is responsible for it. It is, therefore, illogical to say that either an uncaused action or an action that is caused by factors external to the agent is an action for which the agent may be justly held responsible. Granted that a responsible action must be determined by the will of the agent, it is unreasonable to hold an agent responsible for actions that are due to indifference or external violence. This account of the liberty arguments serves as the foundation of the classical interpretation of Hume's compatibilist strategy.

There are a number of well-known incompatibilist objections to the spontaneity argument. The first and most obvious is that “liberty of spontaneity” is a wholly inadequate conception of moral freedom. Kant, famously, describes this account of moral freedom as a “wretched subterfuge” and suggests that a freedom of this kind belongs to a clock that moves its hands by means of internal causes. If our will is itself determined by antecedent natural causes, then we are no more accountable for our actions than any other mechanical object whose movements are internally conditioned. Individuals who enjoy nothing more than a liberty of this nature are, the incompatibilist claims, little more than “robots” or “puppets” subject to the play of fate. This general line of criticism against the spontaneity argument leads directly to two further important criticisms.

The incompatibilist maintains that if our willings and choices are themselves determined by antecedent causes then we could never choose otherwise than we do. Given the antecedent causal conditions, we must always act as we do. We cannot, therefore, be held responsible for our conduct since, on this account, we have no “genuine alternatives” or “open possibilities” available to us. Moreover, incompatibilists do not accept that Hume's notion of “hypothetical liberty”, as presented in the Enquiry, can deal with this objection. It is true, of course, that hypothetical liberty leaves room for the truth of conditionals that suggest that we could have acted otherwise if we had chosen to do so. However, it still remains the case, the incompatibilist argues, that the agent could not have chosen otherwise given the actual circumstances. Responsibility, they claim, requires categorical freedom to choose otherwise in the same circumstances. Hypothetical freedom alone will not suffice. One way of expressing this point in more general terms is that the incompatibililst holds that for responsibility we need more than freedom of action, we also need freedom of will — understood as a power to choose between open alternatives. Failing this, the agent has no ultimate control over his conduct.

The spontaneity argument also suffers from further difficulties related to this. More specifically, according to the spontaneity argument, the distinction between free and unfree (i.e. compelled) action should be understood in terms of the difference between internal and external causes. Critics of compatibilism argue that this—attractively simple—distinction is impossible to maintain. It seems obvious, for example, that there are cases in which an agent acts according to the determinations of his own will but is nevertheless clearly unfree. There are, in particular, circumstances in which an agent may be subject to, and act on, desires and wants that are themselves compulsive in nature (e.g., as with a drug addict or kleptomaniac). Desires and wants of this kind, it is claimed, limit and undermine an agent's freedom no less than external force and violence. Although it may be true that in these circumstances the agent is acting according to his own desires or willings, it is equally clear that such an agent is neither free nor responsible for his behaviour. It would appear, therefore, that we are required to acknowledge that some causes “internal” to the agent may also be regarded as compelling or constraining. This concession, however, generates serious difficulties for the classical compatibilist strategy. It is no longer evident, given this concession, which “internal” causes should be regarded as “constraining” or “compelling” and which should not. Lying behind this objection is the more fundamental concern that the spontaneity argument presupposes a wholly inadequate understanding of the nature of excusing and mitigating considerations.

The spontaneity argument, as Hume presents it, is generally thought to contain the seeds of an essentially forward-looking and utilitarian account of moral responsibility. That is, Hume, following thinkers like Thomas Hobbes, points out that rewards and punishments serve to cause people to act in some ways and not in others and that this is clearly a matter of considerable social utility (T,; EU, 8.2897–98). Hume's brief remarks on this subject have been further developed by other compatibilists with whom Hume is often closely identified (e.g., Moritz Schlick and J.J.C. Smart) This sort of forward-looking, utilitarian account of responsibility has been subject to telling criticism. The basic problem with this account, it is argued, is that it is entirely blind to matters of desert and thus lacks the required (backward-looking) retributive element demanded in this sphere. Moreover, such a theory of responsibility, critics claim, is at the same time both too wide and too narrow. It is too wide because it would appear to make children and animals responsible; and it is too narrow insofar as it would appear to deny that those who are dead, or beyond the reach of the relevant forms of “treatment”, can be judged responsible for their actions. In short, all efforts to interpret responsibility along these forward-looking, utilitarian lines seem to be plagued with difficulties.

2. Hume's “New Light”: Necessity Without Force

The account of Hume's compatibilist strategy provided so far has been almost entirely concerned with the significance of the liberty arguments. On this view of things, Hume's distinction between two kinds of “liberty” is what is central to his overall strategy. If this is correct, then there is not much that is really new about his general approach, as the liberty arguments are familiar features of earlier compatibilist writings (e.g., those of Hobbes). Contrary to this view, however, Hume makes clear in his Abstract of the Treatise that it is his views about “necessity” that puts “the whole controversy in a new light” (TA, 34/661). For this reason we need to turn to the necessity argument and consider more carefully what role it plays in Hume's compatibilist strategy.

Hume's claim to put the free will controversy “in a new light by giving a new definition of necessity” is certainly consistent with his statement in the Enquiry, “that a few intelligible definitions would immediately… put an end to the whole controversy” (EU, 8.2/81). Although the “verbal” aspect of this dispute is not emphasized in the Treatise in the way that it is in the Enquiry, Hume nevertheless makes clear in the Treatise what he takes the “verbal” aspect of the dispute to be. At the end of Treatise 2.3.1 he states:

I dare be positive no-one will ever endeavour to refute these reasonings otherwise than by altering my definitions… if anyone alters the definitions, I cannot pretend to argue with him, ‘till I know the meaning he assigns to these terms [viz. ‘cause’, ‘effect’, ‘necessity’, ‘liberty’, and ‘chance’] (T,

Hume's subsequent remarks in this section make it clear that it is the term “necessity” that has been the major stumbling block to progress on this subject.

Hume's discussion in both Treatise 3.2.1-2 and Enquiry sec. 8 begin with an account of what he takes “necessity” to be. According to Hume “two circumstances form the whole of that necessity, which we ascribe to matter” (EU, 8.5/82). These two circumstances are the constant conjunction of like objects and the inference of the mind from one object to another. If we allow that “these two circumstances take place in the voluntary actions of men and in the operations of mind” (EU, 8.6/83), then we must accept that the moral realm is governed by necessity. Hume proceeds to show, first, that there is constant conjunction in the moral realm and, second, that given the very nature of society and morality, we must make inferences in the moral realm.

Hume believes that the question of whether or not there is constant conjunction in the moral realm is amenable to empirical resolution. It is just a matter of fact that there is constant conjunction in the moral realm as well as the natural realm. Hume admits that there are apparent irregularities and uncertainties in both the natural and moral realms, but these can be attributed to “imperfect knowledge” and can be accounted for by contrary causes (T,–4; EU, 8.13-5/86–88).

Thus it appears, not only that the conjunction between motives and voluntary actions is as regular and uniform as that between the cause and effect in any part of nature; but also that this regular conjunction has been universally acknowledged among mankind, and has never been the subject of dispute, either in philosophy or common life. (EU, 8.16/88)

In this way, Hume proceeds to try to show that this “regular conjunction” between motive and action allows for inference in the moral realm by “determining us to infer the existence of one from that of another” (T, Hume's arguments here are based on what he claims are two incontestable facts about mankind: “that men always seek society” (T, and that men regard other people as objects of praise or blame—that is, they hold them responsible.

These two arguments establishing that people must make inferences in the moral realm are closely related. For people to live in society, they must be able to infer the actions of others from their character, and—in the opposite direction but parallel to this—for people to regard one another as responsible, they must be able to infer character from actions. Hume proceeds to demonstrate that we draw inferences concerning motives and actions even though “it may seem superfluous to prove” this.

The mutual dependence of men is so great in all societies that scarce any human action is entirely complete in itself, or is performed without some reference to the actions of others, which are requisite to make it answer fully the intention of the agent… . In all those conclusions [expectations concerning the actions of others] they take their measures from past experience, in the same manner as in their reasonings concerning external objects; and firmly believe that men, as well as all the elements, are to continue, in their operations, the same that they have ever found them. (EU, 8.17/89)

Our inferences in the moral realm seem no less certain than those in the natural realm. “Moral evidence is”, Hume says, “nothing but a conclusion concerning the actions of men, deriv'd from the consideration of their motives, temper and situation” (T, This sort of reasoning “runs thro’ politics, war, commerce, economy, and indeed mixes itself so entirely in human life, that ‘tis impossible to act or subsist a moment without recourse to it” (T,

To the extent that the moral realm is subject to liberty of indifference (i.e. the absence of regularity and inference), so to that extent we would find that society would be made impossible. It is still not clear, however, why the two kinds of liberty have been “almost universally confounded” with each other, a confusion that leads many to embrace a mistaken view of liberty as indifference. Hume's successors, adopting the classical strategy, have interpreted the necessity argument as providing an answer to this question. More specifically, Hume's suggestion that causation and necessity seem “to imply something of force, violence, and constraint, of which we are not sensible” (T, is taken to explain this fundamental (incompatibilist) mistake. The idea of necessity seems to imply some sort of compulsion or constraint, Hume suggests, because we erroneously believe that we have some idea of necessity as it exists in matter beyond that of constant conjunction and inference.

I may be mistaken in asserting, that we have no idea of any other connexion in the actions of body… . But sure I am, I ascribe nothing to the actions of the mind, but what must readily be allow'd of. Let no one, therefore, put an invidious construction on my words, by saying simply, that I assert the necessity of human actions, and place them on the same footing with the operations of senseless matter. I do not ascribe to the will that unintelligible necessity, which is suppos'd to lie in matter. But I ascribe to matter, that intelligible quality, call it necessity or not, which the most rigorous orthodoxy does or must allow to belong to the will. I change, therefore, nothing in the receiv'd systems, with regard to the will, but only with regard to material objects. (T,; my emphasis; cf. EU, 8.27/97)

In this way, Hume's remarks suggest that traditional “metaphysical” theories of causation have encouraged a fundamental confusion between the notion of an event being caused and that of an event being compelled. On the basis of such an erroneous conception of causation, many philosophers have arrived at the equally mistaken conclusion that there must be an incompatibility between determinism and freedom. The regularity theory of causation, it is argued, identifies and removes the source of this confusion in the free will dispute by way of challenging the deep-seated assumption that there is something more to causation than mere constant conjunction and the accompanying inference of the mind.

The significance of Hume's necessity argument for the liberty arguments seems clear in light of this. Free, responsible action, it is claimed, must be both caused (i.e. by the agent's willings) and uncompelled. Traditional, metaphysical theories of causation, however, confuse or conflate causation and compulsion and thus generate an ineradicable conflict between the positive and negative requirements of freedom and responsibility. It is, therefore, the great merit of Hume's regularity theory that it shows how the positive and negative requirements of freedom and responsibility can be reconciled and how the (“verbal”) confusion generated by traditional theories of causation can be overcome.

Hume's suggestion that metaphysical or nonregularity conceptions of causation lead us to confuse causation and compulsion has become a salient and established feature of the classical compatibilist strategy as developed throughout the 20th century. What are we to make of this aspect of the classical compatibilist strategy? Considered as an attempt to strengthen the liberty arguments, it must be deemed a failure. The line of reasoning advanced gives credence to the view that if there were some stronger “bond” or “tie” between cause and effect, beyond that of mere regularity, then causes would (somehow) compel or constrain their effects. A close examination of the spontaneity argument, however, reveals that this assumption is itself confused. The distinction that is fundamental to the compatibilist position is that between those actions which have external causes (i.e. compelled or constrained actions) and those which have causes internal to the agent. This crucial distinction between actions that originate from the agent and those that do not is not compromised by “metaphysical” (i.e. nonregularity) views of causation. What is relevant to whether an action was compelled or not is the nature of the cause (i.e. the object), not the nature of the causal relation. Nothing about the metaphysical conception of cause when applied to human action need suggest that we do not act according to our own will and could not act otherwise if we so willed. Clearly, therefore, proponents of the line of reasoning under consideration are mistaken when they suggest that metaphysical theories of causation would pose a threat to the (classical) compatibilist strategy. To concede this point to the incompatibilist is to be confused about the very force or significance of the spontaneity argument itself.

When we examine Hume's effort to reinterpret the causal relation and explain its relevance to the free will dispute, it becomes apparent that there is a deep ambivalence in the classical compatibilist strategy in respect of this issue. That is, the compatibilist, on the one hand, seems to argue that were we to remove “causal necessity” from the from the relation that holds between agent and action then we will thereby remove the basis on which attributions of responsibility are founded. In these circumstances there would be nothing to connect any agent with any action. On the other hand, compatibilists also argue (in light of Hume's remarks) that we must remove “metaphysical” necessity from our conception of the causal relation so as to rid it of all suggestion of compulsion and constraint. In this way, we find that the compatibilist strategy has sought to find an account of the causal relation that has to be “weak” enough to avoid implying compulsion and “strong” (robust) enough to connect agent and action. The regularity theory of causation, evidently, is thought to allow the (classical) compatibilist to travel this middle path. However, it may be argued, against this view, that the regularity theory in fact constitutes something of an Achilles' heel for the compatibilist position. That is, the regularity theory, we may argue, not only fails to strengthen the compatibilist position, as I have already suggested, but—what is even more disconcerting — it eats away at the metaphysical underpinnings of the compatibilist position. In order to understand these difficulties, we must consider, again, the relations between the liberty arguments and the necessity argument.

The liberty arguments presuppose that any adequate theory of responsibility must establish that agents produce or determine their actions and are, thereby, connected with their deeds. The necessity argument suggests that there exist only constant conjunctions between these objects (i.e. willings and actions). These “objects” — like all objects that we have any experience of — remain “entirely loose and separate” (EU, 7.26/73-4). Insofar as we may suppose that these causes do possess some power or agency and are, thereby, connected with their effects, this is only because the mind fails to distinguish between an (acquired) association of ideas and a perceived power or connexion in the objects themselves. In general, on Hume's account, in so far as we have any knowledge of “causal connections” they are always subjective (i.e. in the mind of the observer) and never objective (i.e. discovered in the objects themselves). The fact that we suppose that the objects themselves, qua cause, possess a power or efficacy by which they are connected with their effects is entirely due to the influence of experience or “custom” on the human mind; there are no (known) corresponding features in these objects (see, e.g., T,; cp. EU, 8.26-30/74-9). Given this, Hume's account of liberty of spontaneity seems vulnerable to the very same objections that the antilibertarian argument raised against the libertarian position. That is, given the necessity argument, we still have no reason to believe that such agents are (really) connected with their actions, although our subjective experience may make us feel that they are.

We may conclude that Hume's account of necessity not only fails to strengthen the liberty arguments, it weakens them both. Since we never discover any (real) causal connections between any objects both the antilibertarian argument and the spontaneity argument rest on a demand that can never be met — the demand that agent's can somehow be “connected” to their actions in some relevant (i.e. robust and objective) sense. While metaphysical conceptions of causation serve these purposes very well, Hume's (sceptical) views about (objective) causal connections undermine all such demands. In light of these difficulties, one of two things must be true of Hume's “reconciling project”. Either what he took to be its greatest source of strength, the necessity argument, generates awkward and serious difficulties for this “reconciling project”, or his liberty arguments have been misunderstood. I will show that it is indeed the case that Hume's liberty arguments have been misunderstood in important respects.

3. The Naturalism of Hume's “Reconciling Project”

As I have noted, Hume maintains that for men to live in society they must be able to infer the actions of others from their character. Without inferences of this kind, based on perceived regularities, all reasonings and practices concerning politics, war, commerce, and so on would be impossible. In the opposite direction but parallel to this, Hume also maintains that for people to regard one another as responsible they must be able to infer character from action. Why should inference to character have any importance or significance for morality? The following three points must be kept in mind:

  1. Only a person can be the object of love and hate.
  2. Approval and disapproval are calm forms of love and hatred.
  3. To hold someone responsible is to regard him as an object of approval or disapproval.

Hume says:

The constant and universal object of hatred or anger is a person or creature endowed with thought and consciousness; and when any criminal or injurious actions excite that passion, it is only by their relation to the person or connection with him.

He continues:

… and where they [sc. actions] proceed not from some cause in the character and disposition of the person, who performed them …it is impossible he can, upon its account, become the object of punishment and vengeance (T,

Evidently it is only a person, a character or a thinking being who is an object of hatred and anger. Holding an agent responsible is, for Hume, a matter of simply regarding him as an object of the moral sentiments of approval or disapproval. These sentiments are calm forms of the indirect passions of love or hatred. In his discussion of the indirect passions of love and hatred Hume says:

One of these supposition, viz. that the cause of love and hatred must be related to a person or thinking being in order to produce these passions, is not only provable, but too evident to be contested. Virtue and vice, when considered in the abstract … excite no degree of love and hatred, esteem or contempt towards those who have no relation to them (T,

Once it is appreciated that in Hume's view approbation and blame are “nothing but a fainter and more imperceptible love or hatred” (T, it is clear why “they must be related to a person or thinking being”.

Hume notes that the causes of the indirect passions vary greatly in number and kind (T, Different and varied as they may be, however, they must be “either parts of ourselves, or something nearly related to us” (T, Hume distinguishes four broad categories of objects or features of ourselves which give rise to the indirect passions: our wealth, external goods, or property; our immediate relatives or those people who are closely related to us on another basis; our bodily qualities or attributes; and, most important, our qualities of mind, or character traits (T,;, 294f; DP, 146–53). Those character traits or mental qualities that produce an independent pleasure in ourselves or others also, in consequence of this, give rise to pride or love. Character traits or qualities of mind of this nature are virtues. Similarly, those mental qualities or character traits which produce pain, also, in consequence of this, produce humility or hate, and, as such, they are deemed to be vices (see, e.g., T,–75; cf. T,; DP, 146–47, 155–56) Clearly, then, virtue and vice, by means of the general mechanism of the indirect passions, give rise to that “faint and imperceptible” form of love and hatred which constitutes the moral sentiments. It is, in other words, this “regular mechanism” which is, on Hume's account, essential to all ascriptions of responsibility.

In order to know anyone's character we require inference — from their actions to their character. Without knowledge of anyone's character no sentiment of approbation or blame would be aroused in us. Therefore, without inference no one would be an object of praise or blame — that is to say, no one would be regarded as responsible for their actions. Accordingly, praising and blaming would be psychologically impossible if there were no inferences from action to character. Without this necessity morality would become a psychological impossibility. It is also clear that external violence, like liberty of indifference, makes it impossible to regard someone as an object of praise or blame. For in such circumstances we could not make any inference from the action to the agent's character. As the action is caused by external forces we are led away from the agent's character.

… liberty [sc. of spontaneity] … is also essential to morality, and … no human actions, where it is wanting, are susceptible of any moral qualities, or can be the objects either of approbation or dislike. For as actions are objects of our moral sentiment, so far only as they are indications of the internal character, passions, and affections; it is impossible that they can give rise either to praise or blame, where they proceed not from these principles, but are derived altogether from external violence (EU, 8.31/99).

Only when an action is, or is believed to be, determined by the will of an agent is that agent regarded as an object of praise or blame — this is a matter of psychological fact for Hume. Actions that are either uncaused or caused by external factors cannot render the agent responsible not because it would be unreasonable to hold him responsible, but rather because it would be psychologically impossible to hold him responsible.

The salient features of Hume's naturalistic compatibilism can be summarized under the following points:

  1. Approval and disapproval are essential to morality.
  2. Only character traits or mental qualities arouse our moral sentiments of approval or disapproval.
  3. Knowledge of a person's character traits or mental qualities requires inference.
  4. A person or thinking being is held responsible if we regard her as an object of a moral sentiment.
  5. Regarding an agent as responsible is, therefore, a matter of feeling not judgment.
  6. Without inference to character (i.e. necessity), no such feeling could, as a matter of psychological fact, be aroused in us, and therefore no one could be regarded as responsible.
  7. Therefore, it is an (empirical) psychological fact that without necessity, morality would be impossible.

Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity can be shown, on this reinterpretation, to be closely connected with his discussions of the passions and moral evaluations. These connexions are not apparent in the Enquiries, where no lengthy or detailed discussion of the passions appears. This may in part account for misinterpretations of Hume's argument. However, as has been argued above, the necessity argument is also of great importance to any adequate understanding of what Hume has to say about liberty and necessity. The presentation in the Treatise rather obscures these connexions in Hume's argument—there being a gap of over two hundred pages between his discussion of the idea of necessary connexion and that of liberty and necessity. This quite serious flaw is remedied by the first Enquiry but only at the cost of leaving the reader somewhat puzzled as to why Hume put his discussion of “liberty and necessity” in Book II of the Treatise in the first place. The naturalistic interpretation, however, shows that Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity is intimately connected with his discussion of the passions in Book II of the Treatise and cannot be fully understood without reference to it.

I have referred to this interpretation of Hume's compatibilist strategy as being “naturalistic”. In what sense are Hume's arguments “naturalistic”? There are, I think, two quite different senses of “naturalism” which can appropriately be applied to Hume's discussion of liberty and necessity. The first and most important sense is that it involves applying the experimental method of reasoning to this “long disputed question”. As we have seen, Hume is concerned to describe the circumstances under which people are felt to be responsible (i.e. describe the “regular mechanism” which generates the moral sentiments). In this way, Hume's compatibilist strategy must be understood within the general context of his effort to “introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects”. This aspect of Hume's “general strategy” goes completely unnoticed on the classical interpretation (which presents Hume's discussion as involving pure conceptual enquiry antecedent to any application of the “experimental method”).

The second sense in which Hume's reconciling project may be said to be naturalistic is that it stresses the role of feeling, as opposed to reason, in resolving this dispute. An appreciation of this sort of naturalism in Hume's philosophy is, as a number of distinguished commentators have argued, of great importance if we are to get a balanced and complete picture of Hume's philosophy. On the one hand, Hume is clearly anxious to show the limitations of human reason and is, in particular, anxious to show that reason alone is incapable of resolving the various philosophical problems that he comes to consider in the course of the Treatise. There is, on the other hand, a “positive”, non-sceptical aspect to Hume's teaching that argues for the important role of feeling in human life, and that it this is essential for solving some the basic philosophical problems that we are presented with — including the free will problem.

The naturalistic interpretation, clearly, pursues very different avenues of thought. Necessity is psychologically essential to ascriptions of responsibility, because in the absence of the relevant regularities and inferences, the regular mechanism which produces our moral sentiments would simply fail to function. Similarly, liberty of spontaneity is (psychologically) essential to responsibility for action because it is only in these circumstances (i.e. in which we discover constant conjunctions between motives and actions) that it is possible for us to draw the specific kinds of inferences required to generate the moral sentiments. If conduct is produced by external violence, no moral sentiment is aroused and, thus, we do not (as a matter of fact) hold the person responsible. On the naturalistic interpretation, Hume's concern with the nature and significance of moral freedom and how it relates to ascriptions of responsibility must be understood primarily in terms of what he has to say about the role of moral sentiment in this sphere. Any account of Hume's position that ignores these features of his discussion fundamentally misrepresents not only his general account of responsibility but also his overall effort to resolve the “free will dispute” by means of his alternative definition of necessity.

4. Hume's Naturalism and Strawson's “Reconciling Project”

If asked to pass quick judgment on Hume's “reconciling project”, as interpreted along the naturalistic lines outlined in the previous section, many contemporary philosophers would probably be inclined to say that it appears to be, quite simply, anachronistic, eighteenth-century psychology. So considered, it is of little or no relevance to contemporary issues. Indeed, some philosophers may take the view that the philosophical interest—if not the philosophical substance—of Hume's compatibilism has been entirely removed. Surely, any attempt to describe the circumstances in which certain sentiments are aroused in us is hopelessly irrelevant to our present-day concerns and based wholly on assumptions that have long since been rejected. In particular, we can hardly take seriously an enterprise that asks us to understand the complex issue of moral responsibility in terms of feelings.

The first thing to be said in reply to this assessment of the contemporary relevance of the naturalistic interpretation is that it overlooks the limitations of the classical interpretation. More specifically, insofar as Hume continues to be read as holding to the classical compatibilist position, it may be argued that his views on this subject are now somewhat dated and passé. Contemporary compatibilist thinking has now advanced well beyond the confines of the (familiar and basic) distinctions drawn by Hume's liberty arguments and is now much more sensitive to the difficulties posed by incompatibilist criticism. Moreover, few, if any, contemporary compatibilists would accept the suggestion, as suggested by the classical reading of Hume's necessity argument, that incompatibilism is simply a product of conceptual confusion between causation and compulsion.

True as these observations may be, however, none of this serves to show that Hume's naturalistic commitments are themselves of any greater interest or relevance from a contemporary perspective — much less that the moral psychology and (empiricial) methodology of Hume's naturalism is an advance on the classical strategy. In this section I show that the best way to respond to these doubts about the value of the naturalistic interpretation for the contemporary debate is by way of highlighting the striking affinities between Hume's approach and P.F. Strawson's views on this subject.

Strawson's “Freedom and Resentment” (hereafter FR) is arguably the most important and influential paper on free will written in the second half of the twentieth century. The argument of this paper is presented as a bold effort to “reconcile” the traditional disputants in the free will problem (FR, 59–60). Strawson labels the principal opponents “optimists” and “pessimists”. Optimists take what is essentially the classical compatibilist position. They hold that the concept of moral responsibility, and associated practices such as punishing and blaming, “in no way lose their raison d'etre if the thesis of determinism is true”—indeed, they may even require the truth of this thesis (FR, 59). The optimist, Strawson says, typically draws attention to “the efficacy of the practices of punishment, and of moral condemnation and approval, in regulating behaviour in socially desirable ways” (FR, 60; cf. FR, 76). In other words, the optimist embraces and defends an essentially forward-looking, utilitarian conception of responsibility (FR, 79). (The only optimist Strawson cites is Patrick Nowell-Smith, but the general position described is shared by many prominent 20th-century, empiricist-minded compatibilists—most notably, Schlick.)

The pessimist takes a libertarian position and finds the optimist's account of freedom and responsibility wholly inadequate. Whereas the optimist construes moral freedom as simply the absence of constraint or compulsion (i.e. “negative freedom” or liberty of spontaneity), the pessimist insists that we require the sort of freedom that implies the falsity of determinism. We require, that is, some kind of “contra-causal” or “metaphysical” freedom (FR, 79; cf. FR, 60). Without this (metaphysical) freedom, the pessimist claims, there is no adequate foundation for moral responsibility (FR, 76–77). Justified punishment, blame, and condemnation require that the person who is the object of these practices or judgments really deserves it (FR, 61). The optimist's narrow concern with matters of social utility, therefore, “leaves out something that is vital” to our conception of moral responsibility and the justification of the practices associated with it. This gap is to be filled, according to the pessimist, with the general metaphysical thesis of indeterminism.

Strawson rejects both optimist and pessimist accounts, but he hopes to bring them together through “a formal withdrawal on one side in return for a substantial concession on the other” (FR, 60). Strawson agrees with the pessimist that something is missing in the optimist's account. It is a mistake, however, to think that this gap can be filled by “the obscure and panicky metaphysics of libertarianism” (FR, 80). On the contrary, optimist and pessimist alike are missing or overlooking what is really essential to moral responsibility; a proper recognition of the role that “reactive attitudes and feelings” play in this sphere. It is, says Strawson, “a pity that talk of the moral sentiments has fallen out of favour. The phrase would be quite a good name for that network of human attitudes in acknowledging the character and place of which we find, I suggest, the only possibility of reconciling these disputants to each other and the facts” (FR, 79). Strawson proposes, therefore, that we fill the “lacuna” in the optimist's account by making appropriate reference to the essential role that the moral sentiments play in the sphere of responsibility. In return, however, we require that the pessimist “surrender his metaphysics” (FR, 78).

Strawson argues that both optimist and pessimist make a similar mistake:

Both seek, in different ways, to over-intellectualize the facts. Inside the general structure or web of human attitudes and feelings of which I have been speaking, there is endless room for modification, redirection, criticism, and justification. But questions of justification are internal to the structure or relate to modifications internal to it. The existence of the general framework of attitudes itself is something we are given with the fact of human society. As a whole, it neither calls for, nor permits, an external ‘rational’ justification. Pessimist and optimist alike show themselves, in different ways, unable to accept this. (FR, 78–79)

Strawson expands on these points in his more recent work Skepticism and Naturalism (hereafter SN). In this context, he draws explicitly on Hume's naturalism. He observes that all efforts to supply a justifying ground for our moral attitudes and judgments by way of “defending the reality of some special condition of freedom or spontaneity or self-determination” have not been “notably successful” (SN, 32). All such attempts, he maintains, are misguided.

They are misguided also for the reasons for which counter-arguments to other forms of scepticism have been to be misguided; i.e. because the arguments they are directed against are totally inefficacious. We can no more be reasoned out of our proneness to personal and moral reactive attitudes in general than we can be reasoned out of our belief in the existence of body… . What we have, in our inescapable commitment to these attitudes and feelings, is a natural fact, something as deeply rooted in our natures as our existence as social beings. (SN, 32–33)

Earlier in Skepticism and Naturalism, in a passage concerned with our “natural disposition to belief”, Strawson suggests that we might “speak of two Humes: Hume the sceptic and Hume the naturalist; where Hume's naturalism … appears as something like a refuge from his skepticism” (SN, 12). He continues,

According to Hume the naturalist, skeptical doubts are not to be met by argument. They are simply to be neglected (except, perhaps, insofar as they supply a harmless amusement, a mild diversion to the intellect). They are to be neglected because they are idle; powerless against the force of nature, of our naturally implanted disposition to belief. This does not mean that Reason has no part to play in relation to our beliefs concerning matters of fact and existence. It has a part to play, though a subordinate one: as Nature's lieutenant rather than Nature's commander. (SN, 13–14)

Although Strawson plainly has Hume prominently in mind when discussing the relationship between scepticism and naturalism, nowhere does he give us any indication of the exact place or role of naturalism in Hume's writings on the subject of free will. It is left unclear, therefore, where, according to Strawson, Hume stands in relation to the naturalistic arguments that Strawson has advanced on the issue of freedom and responsibility. More specifically, it is not clear whether Strawson views Hume as one of the “optimists” whom he seeks to refute or as a naturalistic ally from whom he is drawing his own arguments and strategy.

If we read Hume along the lines of the classical interpretation, then his position on these issues looks as if it accords very closely with the typical “optimist” strategy associated with such thinkers as Schlick. The classical interpretation, however, entirely overlooks the role of moral sentiment in Hume's reconciling strategy. It emphasizes the relevance of the (supposed) confusion between causation and compulsion in order to explain the more fundamental confusion about the nature of liberty (i.e. why philosophers tend to confuse liberty of spontaneity with liberty of indifference). With these features of Hume's position established, the classical interpretation points to Hume's remarks concerning the social utility of rewards and punishments and the way in which they depend on the principles of necessity. From this perspective, Hume's discussion of freedom and necessity clearly constitutes a paradigmatic and influential statement of the “optimist's” position. So interpreted, Hume must be read as thinker, like Schlick, who has “over-intellectualized the facts” on the basis of a “one-eyed-utilitarianism”; one who has ignored “that complicated web of attitudes and feelings” which Strawson seeks to draw our attention to. In this way, we are encouraged to view Hume as a prime target of Strawson's attack on the “optimist” position.

The naturalistic interpretation, by contrast, makes it plain that any such view of Hume's approach and general strategy is deeply mistaken. Hume, no less than Strawson, is especially concerned to draw our attention to the facts about human nature that are relevant to a proper understanding of the nature and conditions of moral responsibility. More specifically, Hume argues that we cannot properly account for moral responsibility unless we acknowledge and describe the role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. Indeed, unlike Strawson, Hume is much more concerned with the detailed mechanism whereby our moral sentiments are aroused, and thus he is particularly concerned to explain the relevance of spontaneity, indifference, and necessity to the functioning of moral sentiment. To this extent, therefore, Hume's naturalistic approach is more tightly woven into his account of the nature of necessity and moral freedom. In sum, when we compare Hume's arguments with Strawson's important and influential discussion, it becomes immediately apparent that there is considerable contemporary significance to the contrast between the classical and naturalistic interpretations of Hume's reconciling strategy.

The overall resemblance between Hume's and Strawson's strategy in dealing with issues of freedom and responsibility is quite striking. The fundamental point that they agree about is that we cannot understand the nature and conditions of moral responsibility without reference to the crucial role that moral sentiment plays in this sphere. This naturalistic approach places Hume and Strawson in similar positions when considered in relation to the views of the pessimist and the optimist. The naturalistic approach shows that, in different ways, both sides of the traditional debate fail to properly acknowledge the facts about moral sentiment. Where Hume most noticeably differs from Strawson, however, is on the question of the “general causes” of moral sentiment. Strawson largely bypasses this problem. For Hume, this is a crucial issue that must be settled to understand why necessity is essential to responsibility and why indifference is entirely incompatible with the effective operation of the mechanism that responsibility depends on.

5. Action, Character and Voluntariness: Hume's Unorthodox Side

It is, generally speaking, a commonplace to find that philosophers analyse the concept of responsibility directly in terms of freedom. This is certainly true of the classical compatibilist strategy and the way that Hume's arguments have been presented by those in this tradition who see Hume as the most distinguished and influential representative of their views. As we have noted, according to this account, the central feature of Hume's theory of responsibility is his account of freedom, in particular his (conceptual) distinction between “liberty of spontaneity” and “liberty of indifference”. Hume, it is claimed, takes the view that responsibility is, fundamentally, a matter of acting freely, under some relevant interpretation of what this involves (i.e. liberty of spontaneity). The only difficulty for Hume, therefore, is to advance a convincing defence of his account of free action.

The naturalistic interpretation makes plain that Hume's position is more complex than this. From the perspective of the naturalistic approach, any effort to simply reduce the problem of responsibility to the problem of free will confuses these issues and obscures the relationship that holds between freedom and responsibility. More specifically, problems of freedom arise within the framework of Hume's description of the workings of moral sentiment. Hume's arguments concerning the relevance of the distinction between the two kinds of “liberty” and the indispensability of “necessity” to ascriptions of responsibility are intimately tied to his descriptive account of the mechanism that generates the moral sentiments. The relevance of his “definitions” of “liberty” and “necessity” must be understood in these terms (T, On Hume's account, therefore, an adequate understanding of the sort of freedom (“liberty”) that is required for responsibility depends on a prior description of the workings of moral sentiment (i.e. in terms of the mechanism of the indirect passions etc.).

It is, as I have indicated, a fundamental insight of Hume's discussion of these matters that issues of responsibility are not reducible to the problem of free will. This is a point needs some further elaboration and discussion. We should begin by noting that Hume explicitly rejects the view that responsibility is simply a matter of voluntary or free action (let us call this the thesis of “voluntarism”). To overlook or ignore this aspect of Hume's position is to miss some of his most striking and unorthodox claims on this subject. There are three related but distinct claims that are especially important in this regard. According to Hume:

  1. People are responsible for action only insofar as it reflects some character trait or durable quality of mind.
  2. A person may be held responsible for feelings and desires, even though they are not manifest in his will or intentions (i.e. they are wholly involuntary).
  3. Responsibility for our character traits does not depend on them being chosen or voluntarily acquired.

Although these claims are related, any one of them may be accepted while the others are rejected. For this reason each one needs its own independent rationale within Hume's system.

Let us begin with the first claim concerning action and character. This claim first appears in the important passage in the Treatise near the end of his discussion of liberty and necessity.

Actions are by their very nature temporary and perishing; and where they proceed not from some cause in the character and disposition of the person, who perform'd them, they infix not themselves upon him, and can neither redound to his honour, if good, nor infamy, if evil. The action itself may be blameable… . But the person is not responsible for it; and as it proceeded from nothing in him, that is durable or constant, and leaves nothing of that nature behind it, ‘tis impossible he can, upon its account, become the object of punishment or vengeance. (T,; my emphasis; cf. EU, 8.29/98. See also T, “If any action…”)

In another passage Hume gives these observations a slightly different twist.

'Tis evident, that when we praise any actions, we regard only the motives that produced them, and consider the actions as signs or indications of certain principles in the mind and temper. The external performance has no merit. We must look within to find the moral quality. This we cannot do directly; and therefore fix our attention on actions, as on external signs. But these actions are still considered as signs; and the ultimate object of our praise and approbation is the motive, that produc'd them. (T,; my emphasis; cf. T,; EU, 8.31/99)

In both these passages, Hume is making two distinct, although related, points. First, he is concerned to argue that the “action”, considered as an “external performance” without reference to the motive or intention that produced and guided it, is not, as such, of moral concern. It is, rather, the “internal” cause of the action which arouses our moral sentiment. It is these aspects of action which inform us about the mind and moral character of the agent. Second, the moral qualities of an agent which arouse our moral sentiments must be “durable or constant”— they cannot be “temporary and perishing” in nature in the way that actions are. Hume, evidently, regards these points as linked, but he does not distinguish them as sharply as he should do.

The linkage for Hume is to be explained in part by the fact that he holds that intentional action always reveals or manifests some durable principle of mind—i.e. a character trait of some kind (T, It is important to note, however, that this claim is distinct from the claim that only durable principles of mind give rise to moral sentiments. Although there is little or no support offered for the thesis that intentional action is always indicative of durable principles of mind, Hume does provide some rationale for the claim that only durable principles of mind give rise to the moral sentiments.

According to Hume it is a matter of “the utmost importance” for moral philosophy that action be indicative of durable qualities of mind if a person is to be held accountable for it (T, Many of his critics have found this claim, not only implausible in itself, but also hard to account for in terms of Hume's compatibilist commitments. The classical view attempts to account for this claim in terms of Hume's concerns about the utility and efficaciousness of rewards and punishments. If an action is not in character, or reveals no durable principle of mind, then we have no reason to expect that the agent will repeat the action in the future. To blame or punish the agent in these circumstances, it is said, is unnecessary and pointless if our aim is only to prevent the agent from acting in these ways in the future. One obvious defect with this argument is that punishment in circumstances of this kind may nevertheless serve to deter other agents from actions of this kind in the future. Apart from this, however, the interpretation suggested depends on reading Hume's compatibilism along classical lines that presuppose a forward-looking, utilitarian theory of responsibility (i.e. as we find in Hobbes and Schlick). The naturalistic interpretation suggests a very different account of the basis of Hume's claim concerning the relationship between action and (persisting) character traits.

In his discussion of the causes and mechanism governing the production of the indirect passions Hume argues that the relationship between the quality or feature that gives rise to the passions and the person who is the object of the passion must not be “casual or inconstant” (T, If the relationship between them is of “short duration”, then the transition or association of ideas required to generate the sentiment will be weakened or may even entirely fail its effect (T,; cf. DP, 146). Elsewhere Hume points out what happens when the relationship between the cause and object of the passion is brief and temporary (in this context he is concerned specifically with pride):

What is casual and inconstant gives but little joy, and less pride. We are not much satisfy'd with the thing itself; and are still less apt to feel any new degrees of self-satisfaction upon its account. We foresee and anticipate its change by the imagination; which makes us little satisfy'd with the thing: We compare it to ourselves, whose existence is more durable; by which means its inconstancy appears still greater. It seems ridiculous to infer an excellency in ourselves from an object, which is of so much shorter duration, and attends us during so small a part of our existence. (T,; cf. DP, 146, 153–54)

The language here is closely in accord with the language Hume employs when he is arguing that a person is responsible for an action only when it reveals durable principles of mind (e.g., T,;;, 411, 575). The reason for this is that the latter claim is simply a particular application of the general claim that Hume makes in respect of the indirect passions: any object or quality which bears only a casual or inconstant relation to us will be unable to generate an indirect passion. Actions are by their very nature “temporary and perishing”. In order to generate a moral sentiment, they must proceed from something that stands in the required close and lasting relation to the agent. Only constant and enduring principles of mind satisfy this demand, and, hence, only they will serve to arouse moral sentiment. However implausible we may find this claim, taken by itself, it is certainly (more) intelligible when understood within the framework of Hume's naturalistic approach.

We may now turn to the second claim on our list: that a person may be held responsible for aspects of character such as feelings and desires that may be manifest involuntarily and unintentionally. Clearly for Hume it is primarily through intentional action (i.e. as guided by forethought and design: T, that we express or manifest our qualities of mind and character. The interpretation and evaluation of action must, therefore, take careful note of the relevant intention with which the action is undertaken. If we fail to do this we are liable to misrepresent the agent's character and, thereby, entertain unjust sentiments towards him. Considerations of this kind explain why a person may be excused for conduct that is caused by wholly external causes, since conduct of this kind is not in any way indicative of the agent's motivation and character (so no action can be attributed to him). It is important to note, however, that what matters here is not simply that the behaviour in question is involuntary, but rather that it does not reflect on the person's qualities of character.

According to Hume, virtuous and vicious dispositions are manifest not only through our (voluntary, intentional) actions but also in the kinds of feelings and desires that we are prone to. That is to say, a virtuous and vicious character can be distinguished by reference to its “wishes and sentiments”, as well as by the structure of a person's will (T, Bodily signs of mental features or episodes of this nature appear in the manner and style of our “countenance and conversation” (T,, our deportment, our “carriage” (EU, 8.15/88) and “gesture” (EU, 8.9/85), and, in general terms, simply by our mere look and expression. To a limited extent, of course, we are able to control the expression or public manifestation of such sentiments and desires, and, similarly, we are able to feign or pretend that we have sentiments and desires that we do not have. In large measure, however, we find that sentiments and desires arise in us spontaneously, without our exercising any immediate control or direction over them. Furthermore, we may well exhibit or manifest these psychological states and attitudes involuntarily. Nevertheless, considered as aspects or qualities of mind, our emotional states and attitudes, no less than our actions, may serve as a basis for moral evaluation — since these features of mind may also be found to be pleasant or painful, both to ourselves and others.

In light of these observations it is clear that Hume rejects the view that a person can be held responsible only for intentional actions. From one point of view Hume holds that this account of responsibility misrepresents our true object of moral evaluation or concern insofar as it fails to pay adequate attention to the relevance of character in moral evaluation. From another point of view it incorrectly suggests that we may not direct our moral sentiments towards people simply on the basis of their “wishes and sentiments”, whether they engage the will or not. Our dispositions of feeling and desire, Hume argues, manifest pleasant or painful qualities of mind (i.e. that we find agreeable or disagreeable) and, as such, they naturally arouse moral sentiments in us, even when these dispositions are not under voluntary control. To this extent, the scope of moral concern, on Hume's account, is not limited to the sphere of voluntary action. People may be held responsible for qualities of mind or character that are not only unchosen but may be manifest against their will. The general significance of this is that for Hume voluntariness, understood in terms of “liberty of spontaneity”, is not required for responsibility (moral evaluation) in all cases.

The two claims that we have considered so far, although they are both key features of Hume's general theory of responsibility, are plainly unorthodox in respect of compatibilist commitments as we usually find them. Not only are they at odds with classical compatibilism as it is generally understood, they are also at odds with the naturalistic compatibilism that Strawson presents in “Freedom and Resentment”. More specifically, whatever their differences, most compatibilists would reject Hume's suggestion that we are responsible for action only insofar as it is indicative of (persisting) character traits, and would also reject his suggestion that a person may be held responsible for feelings and desires, or other mental episodes of this kind, even when they do not reflect on the structure the agent's will or direct and shape her intentions. These features of Hume's compatibilism place a significant gap between him and other (more orthodox) compatibilists who accept the general assumption of voluntarism (i.e. that responsibility is always a matter of free agency).

Hume's third claim is much more in line with mainstream compatibilist thinking, although here too some further qualifications must be noted. Hume holds, as we have noted, that we are responsible for character in the sense that it is (beliefs about) character that generate moral sentiment. He does not take the view, however, that responsibility, so interpreted, presupposes that we somehow chose or shaped our own character. Our character is not, Hume maintains, acquired through our own choices and decisions. The most substantial discussion of this matter appears at Treatise 3.3.4, in the context of his account of natural abilities and the way that they generate moral sentiments (cf. EM, App.4/312–23). Also relevant to this issue are those passages in which Hume emphasizes the influence of various external conditions — beyond the reach of the will — that condition and determine moral character.

In the passages entitled “Of liberty and necessity”, Hume argues that not only do we observe how certain characters will act in specific circumstances but we also observe how circumstances condition character. Among the factors that Hume claims determine character are bodily condition, age, sex, occupation and social station, climate, religion, government, and education (T,–3; EU, 8.7-14/83–87; see esp. EU, 8.11/85–86: “Are the manners … ”). Hume observes that although “mankind are so much the same, in all times and places, that history informs us of nothing new or strange in this particular” (EU, 8.7/83), we must, nevertheless, be alive to the varied and complex influences at work in this sphere. There are, he claims, “characters peculiar to different nations and particular persons, as well as common to mankind” (T, Any accurate moral philosophy, it is argued, must acknowledge and take note of the forces that “mould the human mind from its infancy” and which account for “the gradual change in our sentiments and inclinations” through time (EU, 8.11/86).

As noted, in the Treatise Hume takes up the issue of the involuntariness of moral character primarily in the context of discussing accountability for natural virtues. In this context, he rejects the suggestion that the distinction between natural abilities, such as intelligence and imagination, and moral virtues, such as courage and honesty, is to be accounted for in terms of the voluntary/involuntary distinction. For the most part, both the moral virtues and the natural abilities are acquired involuntarily. It is, Hume says, “almost impossible for the mind to change its character in any considerable article, or cure itself of a passionate or splenetic temper, when they are natural to it” (T, Our will has little influence over such matters. In this sense, natural abilities and moral virtues are on “the same footing with bodily endowments” (T, The fundamental distinctions in this sphere, as with beauty and deformity, depend on “the natural distinctions of pain and pleasure” (T, Just as bodily qualities produce a different sort of love or hate (i.e. in respect of feeling), so too, Hume allows, natural abilities can generate their own peculiar form of moral sentiment. However, each of the virtues, he claims, “even benevolence, justice, gratitude, integrity, excites a different sentiment or feeling in the spectator” (T,; cf. T, “On the other hand … ”).

The point that Hume emphasizes is the extent to which moral virtues (narrowly conceived) and natural abilities are “on the same footing”. He makes two particular observations in this regard: moral virtues and natural abilities are “equally mental qualities”; and both of them “equally produce pleasure” and thus have “an equal tendency to produce the love and esteem of mankind” (T,–7). Natural abilities are valued primarily because of “the importance and weight, which they bestow on the person possess'd of them” (T, Such an individual, Hume says, acquires great influence, and his conduct and character affect the lives of many. All of this, naturally, engages our sympathy and hence arouses our moral sentiment. In short, in common life, people “naturally praise or blame whatever pleases or displeases them” and thus regard prudence and penetration as no less virtues than benevolence and justice (T,

Hume claims that the voluntary/involuntary distinction does allow us to explain “why moralists have invented” the distinction between natural abilities and moral virtues. Natural abilities, unlike moral qualities, “are almost invariable by any art or industry” (T, By contrast, moral qualities, “or at least, the actions, that proceed from them, may be chang'd by the motives of rewards and punishments, praise and blame” (T, We cannot, in other words, make people intelligent, imaginative, and so on, by the application of rewards and punishments, but we can (in some measure) regulate their voluntary actions and thus direct their conduct with respect to moral virtues, such as justice. In this way, according to Hume, the significance of the voluntary/involuntary distinction is largely limited to our concern with the regulation of conduct in society. Nevertheless, to confine morality to these frontiers is, Hume maintains, to distort its very nature and foundation. It is, therefore, a mistake to view the voluntary/involuntary distinction as constituting the boundary of moral concern (cf. T, and EM, App.4.21/322).

The upshot of this analysis of Hume's specific commitments with respect to character and voluntariness should now be clear. Hume's general theory of responsibility diverges in important respects, not only from libertarianism but also from mainstream compatibilism, insofar as it shares the assumption of voluntarism. Moreover, in respect of this issue Hume diverges not only from classical comaptibilisms (i.e. of the Hobbes-Schlick variety) but also from the naturalist views of Strawson. Although Hume and Strawson share a naturalistic approach to issues of freedom and responsibility, Strawson does not endorse Hume's unorthodox views concerning the relationship between action and character as it concerns responsibility, nor his particular understanding of the significance of the voluntary/involuntary distinction in this sphere. The important point for our purposes, however, is that, whatever difficulties and criticisms may be directed at Hume's theory in respect of these claims, his discussion provides a bold challenge to the way that most philosophers conceive of the relationship between freedom and responsibility, and provides us with significant insights that suggest we may misunderstand and exaggerate the importance of voluntariness and control viewed as the relevant basis for moral evaluation. Considered from any point of view, these are unorthodox and challenging features of Hume's views on this subject that should not be overlooked or casually dismissed as being peripheral or incidental to his fundamental commitments.

6. Free Will and Hume's Philosophy of Irreligion

In the Treatise, Hume argues that one of the reasons “why the doctrine of liberty [of indifference] has generally been better receiv'd in the world, than its antagonist [the doctrine of necessity], proceeds from religion, which has been very unnecessarily interested in this question” (T, He goes on to argue “that the doctrine of necessity, according to my explication of it, is not only innocent, but even advantageous to religion and morality”. When Hume came to present his views afresh in the Enquiry (Sec. 8), he was less circumspect about his hostile intentions with regard to “religion”. In the parallel passage (EU, 8.26/96–97), he again objects to any effort to refute a hypothesis “by a pretence to its dangerous consequences to religion and morality” (my emphasis). He goes on to say that his account of the doctrines of liberty and necessity “are not only consistent with morality, but are absolutely essential to its support” (E, 8.26/97; my emphasis). By this means, he makes it clear that he is not claiming that his position is “consistent” with religion. In the final passages of the Enquiry discussion of liberty and necessity (EU, 8.32-6/99–103)—passages which do not appear in the original Treatise discussion—Hume makes it plain exactly how his necessitarian principles have “dangerous consequences for religion”.

Hume considers the following objection:

It may be said, for instance, that, if voluntary actions be subjected to the same laws of necessity with the operations of matter, there is a continued chain of necessary causes, pre-ordained and pre-determined, reaching from the original cause of all to every single volition of every human creature… . The ultimate Author of all our volitions is the Creator of the world, who first bestowed motion on this immense machine, and placed all beings in that particular position, whence every subsequent event, by an inevitable necessity, must result. Human action, therefore, either can have no moral turpitude at all, as proceeding from so good a cause; or if they have any turpitude, they must involve our Creator in the same guilt, while he is acknowledged to be their ultimate cause and author. (EU, 8.32/99–100)

In other words, the doctrine of necessity produces an awkward dilemma for the theological position: Either the distinction between (moral) good and evil collapses, because everything is produced by a perfect being who intends “nothing but what is altogether good and laudable” (EU, 8.33/101), or we must “retract the attribute of perfection, which we ascribe to the Deity” on the ground that he is the ultimate author of moral evil in the world.

Hume treats the first horn of this dilemma at greatest length. He draws on his naturalistic principles to show that the conclusion reached (i.e. that no human actions are evil or criminal in nature) is absurd. There are, he claims, both physical and moral evils in this world that the human mind finds naturally painful, and this affects our sentiments accordingly. Whether we are the victim of gout or of robbery, we naturally feel the pain of such evils (EU, 8.34/101–2). No “remote speculations” or “philosophical theories” concerning the good or perfection of the whole universe will alter these natural reactions and responses to the particular ills and evils we encounter. Hence, even if we were to grant that this is indeed the best of all possible worlds—and Hume clearly takes the view that we have no reason to suppose that it is (D, 113-4; EU, 11.15-22/137–42)—this would do nothing to undermine the reality of the distinction we draw between good and evil (i.e. as experienced on the basis of “the natural sentiments of the human mind”: EU, 8.35/103).

What, then, of the alternative view, that God is “the ultimate author of guilt and moral turpitude in all his creatures”? Hume offers two rather different accounts of this alternative—although he does not distinguish them properly. He begins by noting that if some human actions “have any turpitude, they must involve our Creator in the same guilt, while he is acknowledged to be their ultimate cause and author” (EU, 8.32/100; my emphasis). This passage suggests that God is also blameworthy for criminal actions in this world, since he is their “ultimate author”. At this point, however, there is no suggestion that the particular human agents who commit these crimes (as preordained by God) are not accountable for them. In the passage that follows this is the position taken.

For as a man, who fired a mine, is answerable for all the consequences whether the train he employed be long or short; so wherever a continued chain of necessary causes is fixed, that Being, either finite or infinite, who produces the first, is likewise the author of all the rest, and must both bear the blame and acquire the praise which belong to them. (EU, 8.32/100)

Hume goes on to argue that this rule of morality has even “greater force” when applied to God, since he is neither ignorant nor impotent and must, therefore, have intended to produce those criminal actions which are manifest in the world. Granted that such actions are indeed criminal, it follows, says Hume, “that the Deity, not man, is accountable for them” (EU, 8.32/100; cf. EU, 8.33/101).

It is evident that Hume is arguing two points. First, if God is the creator of the world and preordained and predetermined everything that happens in it, then the (obvious) existence of moral evil is attributable to him, and thus “we must retract the attribute of perfection” which we ascribe to him. Second, if God is indeed the ultimate author of moral evil, then no individual human being is accountable for the criminal actions he performs. The second claim does not follow from the first. Moreover, it is clearly inconsistent with Hume's general position on this subject. As has been noted, in this same context, Hume has also argued that no speculative philosophical theory can alter the natural workings of our moral sentiments. The supposition that God is the “ultimate author” of all that takes place in the world will not, on this view of things, change our natural disposition to praise or blame our fellow human beings. Whatever the ultimate causes of a person's character and conduct, it will (inevitably) arouse a sentiment of praise or blame in other humans who contemplate it. This remains the case even if we suppose that God also deserves blame for the “moral turpitude” we find in the world. In general, then, Hume's first formulation of the second alternative (i.e. that God must share the blame for those crimes that occur in the world) is more consistent with his naturalistic principles.

What is crucial to Hume's polemical purpose in these passages is not the thesis that if God is the author of crimes then his human creations are not accountable for them. Rather, the point Hume is concerned to make (since he does not, in fact, doubt the inescapability of our moral accountability to our fellow human beings) is that the religious hypothesis leads to the “absurd consequence” that God is the ultimate author of sin in this world and that he is, accordingly, liable to some appropriate measure of blame. Hume, in other words, takes the (deeply impious) step of showing that if God exists, and is the creator of the universe, then he is no more free of sin than human beings are. According to Hume, we must judge God as we judge human beings, on the basis of his effects in the world, and we must then adjust our sentiments accordingly. Indeed, there is no other natural or reasonable basis on which to found our sentiments toward God. In certain respects, therefore, we can make better sense of how we (humans) can hold God accountable than we can make sense of how God is supposed to hold humans accountable (i.e. since we have no knowledge of his sentiments, or even if he has any; cf. D, 58,114,128-9; ESY, 594; but see also LET, I/51). It is, of course, Hume's considered view that it is an egregious error of speculative theology and philosophy to suppose that the universe has been created by a being that bears some (close) resemblance to humankind. The question of the origin of the universe is one that Hume plainly regards as beyond the scope of human reason (see, e.g., EU, 1.11-2;11.15-23;11.26-7;12.2634/11–13, 137–42, 144–47, 165; D, 36-8,88-9,107). Nevertheless, Hume's point is plain: On the basis of the (limited) evidence that is available to us, we must suppose that if there is a God, who is creator of this world and who orders all that takes place in it, then this being is indeed accountable for all the (unnecessary and avoidable; D, 107) evil that we discover in it.

The above discussion makes clear that Hume's views on free will are of obvious relevance for his critique of the doctrines and dogmas of the Christian religion, as presented in the first Enquiry. However, while connection between these issues are clear enough in the case of the first Enquiry, it is nevertheless widely held that Hume's earlier discussion “Of liberty and necessity”, in the Treatise, carries none of this irreligious content or significance. This view of things is given further credence and support by a more general understanding of the relationship between the Treatise and the first Enquiry. According to this view, whereas the Treatise lacks any significant irreligious content (because Hume “castrated” his work and removed most passages of this kind), substantial irreligious themes were later introduced in the first Enquiry. The additional (irreligious) passages in the Enquiry version “Of liberty and necessity” is generally taken as particularly strong evidence in support of the more general hypothesis. However, what this view of things presupposes is that the elements of Hume's discussion that are common to both Treatise 2.3.1-2 and Enquiry Sec.8 are themselves without any particular religious or irreligious significance. A careful examination of Hume's arguments in their historical context, as well as a (critical) rethinking of his wider intentions throughout the Treatise, reveals that this view of things is seriously mistaken.

Let us begin with the background debate as it relates to Hume's specific arguments in the Treatise. In so far as commentators make any observation about Hume's predecessors and debts on this subject, the most common is that his compatibilist position is very similar to the position that was defended by Hobbes in the previous century. (Hume's title “Of liberty and necessity” seems to have been taken from the essay of the same title by Hobbes.) The close relationship between Hobbes and Hume on this subject is generally regarded as an exception, in so far as Hume's major debts are supposed to lie elsewhere. On any reading, however, given the particular relationship between Hobbes and Hume on this subject, it is important to understand the significance and reputation of Hobbes's necessitarianism in the context of the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries.

In the context of early 18th century British philosophy, Hobbes's necessitarianism, along with its associated denial of (libertarian) free will, was widely regarded as a key element of his “atheistic” philosophy. At this time, by far the most important and influential response to Hobbes's “atheistic” philosophy in general, and his necessitarianism in particular, came from Samuel Clarke. Clarke's reputation among his own contemporaries was established primarily on the basis of his A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God: More Particularly in Answer to Mr. Hobbs, Spinoza and their Followers (1704-05). The sub-title of this work states: “Wherein the Notion of Liberty is stated, and the Possibility and Certainty of it Proved, in Opposition to Necessity and Fate.” As the title-page indicates, Clarke identifies Hobbes's necessitarianism as one of several doctrines that were particularly “dangerous” or “destructive” of religion and morality (Clarke, Demonstration, 55, 63-4,77).

Clarke's arguments against the necessitarianism of Hobbes (and Spinoza) were developed in further detail when he entered into an extended controversy with Anthony Collins (during 1707-1717). These exchanges between Clarke and Collins on the subject of free will came to dominate the 18th century debate concerning this topic, a point that is especially important for understanding the significance of Hume's arguments as presented in the Treatise. Whereas Clarke was the most distinguished representative of the Newtonian philosophy and its theology, Collins was the significant and influential member of a circle of radical freethinkers who were all active and hostile critics of the Newtonian philosophy in general, and particularly critical of Clarke. Clarke and other prominent Newtonians viewed Collins and the radical freethinkers in his circle as nothing more than “atheistic” followers of Hobbes and Spinoza — a judgment that was, on the whole, well justified. Clearly, then, not only was the Clarke-Collins debate on free will of central importance in the context of that Hume was writing the Treatise, this debate was laden with theological significance, and any contribution that obviously endorsed one position rather than the other would be interpreted with this in mind.

The question that needs to be asked, in light of these observations, is where Hume stood in relation to the Clarke-Collins debate as it concerns free will? The resemblance between Hume's views and Collins' (Hobbist) necessitarianism is very evident and requires little in the way of comment. On every one of the basic issues in dispute between Clarke and Collins Hume comes down firmly and unambiguously on Collins's side. Hume's account of liberty of spontaneity is the same as that which Collins contends for, while he rejects any notion of liberty of indifference of the kind that Clarke advocates. Whereas Clarke maintains that experience proves that we have a liberty that involves the absence of necessitating (efficient) causes, Hume contends that experience shows us that the very opposite is true — all our actions are governed by necessity in the same way as the operations of external (material) bodies. According to Hume, the distinction between moral and physical necessity, which lies at the heart of Clarke's position on this subject, is “without any foundation in nature” (T, Similarly, Hume denies that there is any evidence that “thought is more active than matter” (T,, and he undercuts the whole ontology of immaterial souls on which Clarke's account of free agency rests (T, 1.4.5-6 /232-263). Hume maintains, as Collins does, that both the justice and efficacy of the system of rewards and punishments depends on our conduct being causally necessitated (T, Clearly, then, Hume is systematically opposed to the free will position of Clarke and those who followed him. Given the circumstances that the Treatise was written and published in, it is only reasonable to suppose that Hume and his contemporaries were entirely aware of the irreligious significance of the necessitarian position that he took up and defended in the Treatise. (Several of Hume's earliest and most hostile critics took exactly this view of his necessitarian position).

With these observations concerning the irreligious significance of Hume's (Hobbist) views concerning “liberty and necessity”, considered in their historical context, we may now turn to the closely related question of how Hume's irreligious commitments on this subject relate to wider and more general intentions throughout the Treatise. As we have noted, it is a widely accepted view of the Treatise that it has little or nothing to say about problems of religion and that it should be interpreted in terms of the fundamental dichotomy between its sceptical and naturalistic themes. In his later works, it is said, Hume applied these two themes to issues of religion, but this task was not undertaken in the Treatise itself. From this perspective, Hume's views about free will, as presented in the Treatise, should be interpreted in terms of him being simply a “sceptic” about (metaphysical) free will, or a “naturalist” who aims to describe human thought and action within the fabric of causes and effects that govern all of nature, including all aspects of human life. While there is some truth in both these claims, they rest on a scepticism/naturalism dichotomy that fails to capture what is really fundamental to the Treatise.

Contrary to the orthodox account, it is problems of religion, broadly conceived, that hold the contents of the Treatise together. More specifically, it is irreligious aims and objectives that primarily structure and direct Hume's central arguments in the Treatise — covering both their sceptical and naturalistic aspects. The constructive or “positive” side of Hume's thought in the Treatise — his “science of man” — must be interpreted in terms of his concern to establish a secular, scientific account of moral and social life. Hume models this project on the same plan as Hobbes, who pursued a very similar project in The Elements of Law and the first two parts of Leviathan. The structural parallels that hold between Hobbes's work and Hume's Treatise are indicative of the fundamental similarity of their projects. That is to say, both Hobbes and Hume agree that moral and political philosophy must proceed upon the same scientific methodology that is appropriate to the natural sciences (although they disagree about the nature of that methodology), and they agree that this scientific investigation of morals and must begin with an examination of human understanding and the passions. The metaphysical basis of this project is their shared naturalistic and necessitarian conception of human beings.

The destructive or critical side of the philosophy of the Treatise is simply the other side of the same irreligious, anti-Christian coin. That is to say, in order to clear the ground to build the edifice of a secular, scientific account of moral life, Hume had to undertake a sceptical attack on the theological doctrines and principles that threatened such a project. The varied and apparently disparate sceptical arguments that he advances in the Treatise are in fact largely held together by his overarching concern to discredit and refute Christian metaphysics and morals. An especially prominent target of these sceptical arguments is the philosophy of Clarke (the best known and most influential critic of Hobbes's “atheism”). Among the various specific doctrines Hume was especially concerned to refute was that of (libertarian) free will — a doctrine that most prominent Christian moralists (e.g., Clarke, Butler, and many of Hume's early critics, including William Warburton, Thomas Reid and James Beattie) maintained was essential to both religion and morality.

The irreligious account of Hume's fundamental intentions in the Treatise puts his discussion of free will in a new light. Hume's necessitarianism is both metaphysically and methodologically a core part of his entire (Hobbist) project in this work. Beyond this, one of the central lessons of Hume's discussion “Of liberty and necerssity” in the Treatise, along with his more extended views about the nature and conditions of moral responsibility, is that these are issues that we can make sense of only within the fabric of human nature and human society. The metaphysics required by religious doctrine, Hume suggests, obscures and misrepresents the real character of human freedom and moral responsibility, and the way that they are grounded and structured in human motivation and passions. It is precisely this secular perspective and the extension of scientific naturalism to the study of (human) moral life that Clarke and other Christian critics of Hobbes found to be especially “dangerous” for religion and morality.

Hume's views on the subject of “liberty and necessity”, as presented in the Treatise, are indicative of the metaphysics and morals of a godless man. In his later writings, as we have noted, Hume continued and elaborated on his critique of the Christian religion in an even more open and direct manner. Nevertheless, throughout his writings, Hume's philosophical interests and concerns were very largely dominated and directed by his fundamental irreligious aims and objectives. A basic theme in Hume's philosophy, so considered, is his effort to demystify moral and social life and release it from the metaphysical trappings of “superstition”. The core thesis of Hume's Treatise—indeed, of his overall (irreligious or “atheistic”) philosophical outlook — is that moral and social life neither rests upon nor requires the dogmas of Christian metaphysics. Hume's naturalistic framework for understanding moral and social life excludes not only the metaphysics of libertarianism (e.g., modes of “moral” causation by immaterial agents) but also all further theologically inspired metaphysics that generally accompanies it (i.e. God, the immortal soul, a future state, and so on). The metaphysics of religion, Hume suggests, serves only to confuse and obscure our understanding of these matters and to hide their true foundation in human nature. Hume's views on the subject of free will and moral responsibility, as presented in the sections “Of liberty and necessity” and elsewhere in his writings, are the very pivot on which this fundamental thesis turns.


References to Hume's Works

In the entry above, we follow the convention given in the Nortons' Treatise and Beauchamp's Enquiries: we cite Book. Part. Section. Paragraph; followed by references to the Selby-Bigge/Nidditch editions. Thus T, 34: will indicate Treatise Bk.1, Pt.2, Sec.3, Para.4/ Selby-Bigge pg.34. References to Abstract [TA] are to the two editions of the Treatise mentioned above (paragraph/page). In the case of the Enquiries I cite Section and Paragraph; followed by page reference to the Selby-Bigge edition. Thus EU, 12.1/ 149 refers to Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Sect.12, Para. 1 / Selby-Bigge pg. 149.

T A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed. revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
EU Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
EM Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998
ESY Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, rev. ed. by E.F. Miller (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1985).
DP “A Dissertation on the Passions” [1757], reprinted in Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, 2 vols., edited by T.H. Green and T.H. Grose. London: Longmans, Green, 1885. Vol. 2, 137-66.
D Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779) in: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, ed. by J.A.C. Gaskin (Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).

Secondary Literature

A Brief Guide to Further Reading

The above citations may be used as the basis for further reading on this subject in the following way. Influential statements of the classical interpretation of Hume's intentions can be found in Flew (1962), Penelhum (1975) and Stroud (1977). Prominent statements of 20th century classical compatibilism that are generally taken to follow in Hume's tracks include Schlick (1939), Ayer (1954) and Smart (1961). Davidson (1963) provides an important statement of the causal theory of action based on broadly Humean principles. A complete statement of the naturalistic interpretation is provided in Russell (1995b), esp. Part I. For a critical response to this study see Penelhum (1998; 2000a), and also the earlier exchange between Russell (1983, 1985) and Flew (1984). The contributions by Botterill (2002) and Pitson (2002, 2006) follow up on some the issues that are at stake here. For an account of Hume's views on punishment – a topic that is closely connected with the problem of free will – see Russell (1992) and Russell (1995b – Chp. 10). For a general account of the 18th century debate that Hume was involved in see Harris (2005). See also O'Higgins introduction [in Collins (1717)] for further background. The works by Hobbes, Locke, Clarke and Collins, as cited above, are essential reading for an understanding of the general free will debate that Hume was involved in. Smith (1759) is a valuable point of contrast in relation to Hume's views, insofar as Smith develops a naturalistic theory of responsibility based on moral sentiment (which Strawson follows up on). However, Smith does not discuss the free will issue directly (which is itself a point of some significance). In contrast with this, Reid (1788) is perhaps Hume's most effective and distinguished critic on this subject and his contribution remains of considerable contemporary value. With respect to Hume's views on free will as they relate to his more general irreligious intentions see Russell (2007 – esp. Chp. 16). Similar material is covered in Russell (forthcoming). The relevance of Hume's views on free will to his “Hobbist” project in the Treatise is discussed in Russell (1985) and, in further detail, in Russell (2007 – esp. Chps. 6,16,18). Garrett (1997) provides a lucid overview and careful analysis of Hume's views on liberty and necessity, which includes discussion of the theological side of Hume's arguments and concerns. Helpful introductions discussing recent developments in compatibilist thinking, which are of obvious relevance for an assessment of the contemporary value of Hume's views on this subject, can be found in McKenna (2004) and Kane (2005). Among the various points of contrast not discussed in this article, Frankfurt (1971) is an influential and important paper that aims to advance the classical compatibilist strategy beyond the bounds of accounts of freedom of action. However, as noted in the main text of this article, the work of P.F. Strawson (1962, 1985) is of particular importance in respect of the contemporary significance and relevance of Hume's naturalistic strategy. Various recent responses to Strawson's naturalism can be found in McKenna and Russell (2008).

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

compatibilism | determinism: causal | free will | Hume, David | Hume, David: moral philosophy | Hume, David: on religion | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | incompatibilism: arguments for | luck: moral | moral responsibility | punishment | punishment, legal


I am grateful to Joe Campbell for his comments and suggestions.