Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Hume on Religion

First published Tue Oct 4, 2005
There are many questions in philosophy to which no satisfactory answer has yet been given. But the question of the nature of the gods is the darkest and most difficult of all…. So various and so contradictory are the opinions of the most learned men on this matter as to persuade one of the truth of the saying that philosophy is the child of ignorance…
— Cicero, The Nature of the Gods

David Hume's various writings concerning problems of religion are among the most important and influential contributions on this topic. In these writings Hume advances a systematic, sceptical critique of the philosophical foundations of various theological systems. Whatever interpretation one takes of Hume's philosophy as a whole, it is certainly true that one of his most basic philosophical objectives is to unmask and discredit the doctrines and dogmas of orthodox religious belief. There are, however, some significant points of disagreement about the exact nature and extent of Hume’s irreligious intentions. One of the most important of these is whether Hume's sceptical position leads him to a view that can be properly characterized as “atheism”. Although this was a view that was widely accepted by many of Hume's critics during his own lifetime, contemporary accounts have generally argued that this misrepresents his final position on this subject.

The primary aims of this article are: (1) to give an account of Hume's main arguments as they touch on various particular issues relating to religion; and (2) to answer to the question concerning the general character of Hume's commitments on this subject.

1. Religious Philosophers and Speculative Atheists

Interpretations of Hume's philosophy of religion are often made against the background of more general interpretations of his philosophical intentions. From this perspective, it is not unusual to view Hume's views on religion in terms of the skepticism and naturalism that features prominently in his Treatise of Human Nature (1739-40), his first and most ambitious philosophical work. According to the account that is now widely accepted in the scholarly literature, Hume removed almost all the material in the Treatise that was concerned with religion because he was anxious to avoid causing any “offence” among the orthodox. In his later works, beginning with an Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748), Hume began to present his views on this subject in a more substantial and direct manner. This culminates in his Natural History of Religion (1757) and Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1779; published posthumously) – both of which are entirely taken up with philosophical issues in religion. The linkage between these various works, on this account, is that the later writings on religion are simply an extension and application of the sceptical and naturalistic principles that Hume developed in his earlier writings.

While it is certainly true that there is an intimate connection between Hume's scepticism and naturalism and his irreligious objectives and orientation, it is not evident that this relationship should be understood in terms of Hume drawing irreligious consequences in his later work from the sceptical and naturalistic principles that he laid down in his earlier work. There is a more intimate connection between these components of Hume's philosophy than this account suggests. Apart from any thing else, the traditional account seriously underestimates the irreligious content and aims of Hume's earlier work - particularly in the Treatise. Moreover, a view of this kind is liable to overlook the way in which 17th and 18th century theological controversies and debates structure and shape Hume's entire philosophy — not just his philosophy of religion. Put another way, Hume's philosophy of religion is integral to his entire philosophical system. It should not be viewed as an extraneous outgrowth or extension of earlier concerns and commitments that lack any specific irreligious motivation or orientation.

In the opening paragraph of the last section of the first Enquiry (XII) Hume makes the following observation:

There is not a greater number of philosophical reasonings, displayed upon any subject, than those, which prove the existence of a Deity, and refute the fallacies of Atheists; and yet the most religious philosophers still dispute whether any man can be so blinded as to be a speculative atheist. (EU.149/12.1 — Hume's emphasis)

These remarks bring to light an important point. The central debate that shapes Hume's views on the subject of religion is not the empiricist/rationalist controversy, nor its “British”/”continental” correlate, but a more fundamental dispute between philosophical defenders of Christian theology and their “atheistic” opponents. It is this divide over issues of religion that is especially important for understanding the positions and arguments that Hume presents throughout his philosophical writings.

During the 17th and early 18th centuries British philosophy gave rise to two powerful but conflicting philosophical outlooks. On one hand, this era has been described as “the golden period of English theology” because of the emerging alliance between philosophy and theology. It was, in particular, a major concern of a number of divines at this time to show that theology could be provided with a rational defence — one that would ward off all threat of scepticism and atheism. Among the leading representatives of this tradition were Henry More, Ralph Cudworth, John Locke, Samuel Clarke, George Berkeley and Joseph Butler. (More and Cudworth were both Cambridge Platonists.) On the other hand, in opposition to this Christian tradition, there existed a sceptical tradition of which the greatest representative was Thomas Hobbes. Almost all the defenders of the Christian religion during this period had their arguments targeted against the “atheistic” doctrines of Hobbes.

From the perspective of Hobbes's critics the doctrines that lay at the heart of his atheism were materialism, necessitarianism, moral relativism and egoism, and scepticism concerning natural and revealed religion. Any thinker who endorsed doctrines of this kind was liable to be read as a follower of Hobbes and branded an “atheist”. During this period Hobbes was not without his followers. The most important thinker to become closely associated with Hobbes, in the minds of his critics, was Benedict Spinoza. In the Theological-Political Treatise (1670) Spinoza pursued a number of Hobbesean themes, including biblical criticism, scepticism about miracles and strong anti-clericalism. Spinoza's Ethics (1677) was also identified as containing Hobbist doctrines (e.g., materialism and necessitarianism) that led directly to atheism. Given these points of resemblance, Hobbes's critics in England were quick to link the names of Hobbes and Spinoza and they viewed “Spinozism” as simply a variant of the prevalent disease of “Hobbist atheism”.

Another important source of “atheistic” or irreligious thought during this period was the sceptical philosophy of Pyrrho, as presented in the writings of Sextus Empiricus. Pierre Bayle describes the significance of Pyrrhonianism in his influential Historical and Critical Dictionary (1702), a work that we know was read carefully by the young Hume. In his article on “Pyrrho” Bayle argues:

Pyrrhonism is dangerous in relation to this divine science [theology], but it hardly seems so with regard to the natural sciences or to the state… Society has no reason to be afraid of scepticism; for sceptics do not deny that one should conform to the customs of one's country, practice one's moral duties, and act upon matters on the basis of probabilities without waiting for certainty… It is therefore only religion that has anything to fear from Pyrrhonism. Religion ought to be based on certainty. Its aim, its effects, its usages collapse as soon as this firm conviction of its truth is erased from the human mind. (Bayle, Dictionary, art. “Pyrrho”, Note B; p. 195)

Bayle's own view that philosophy and theology should be sharply separated, on the ground that the doctrines of theology could not be defended by reason and were therefore a matter of faith alone, brought his work under the suspicion of atheism. In general, it was common among Hume's immediate predecessors and contemporaries to associate scepticism closely with atheism. (Hume's writings allude to this at various points. See, e.g., Hume's “Early Memoranda”, Sect. II, #40)

A significant development in the late 17th century relating to the war against the atheism of Hobbes and his followers was the establishment of the Boyle Lectures. These lectures were founded by Robert Boyle, the distinguished scientist, for the purpose of “proving the Christian, against notorious Infidels, viz. Atheists, Theists, Pagans…” By the early 18th century the Boyle lectures had become the focus for the debate between the Newtonians (the intellectual heirs of Hobbes's early critics) and the radical freethinkers, who followed in the tradition of Hobbes and Spinoza. The greatest and most influential of the Boyle lecturers was Samuel Clarke, who was a close friend of Newton's and widely recognized as the most able defender of Newtonian philosophy and theology. Clarke's Boyle lectures were published in 1704 as A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. The center-piece of this work is Clarke's version of the cosmological argument or argument a priori. John Locke presented a similar version of this argument in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690). What Locke and Clarke were agreed about was that it is possible to demonstrate the existence of God — just as it is possible to demonstrate truths in mathematics. Clarke's statement of the argument a priori enjoyed considerable prestige throughout the first half of the 18th century and found strong support among several Scottish philosophers of considerable reputation at this time (e.g., Andrew Baxter). There was, nevertheless, another very different approach - well established within latitudinarian and Newtonian theological circles - for proving the existence of God. This was the argument from design or argument a posteriori (also known as teleological arguments). Among the most prominent champions of this form of argument during the early 18th century were the Scottish Newtonians George Cheyne and Colin Maclaurin. It is these two proofs for the existence of God — i.e., the arguments a priori and a posteriori – that Hume's philosophical writings are particularly concerned with and seek to discredit.

Although the British debate between “religious philosophers” and “speculative atheists” is especially important for understanding Hume's own arguments and positions concerning religion it would be a mistake to overlook the contribution of continental thinkers to this debate. One thinker who is of considerable importance in this regard is Rene Descartes. In his Meditations (1641) Descartes, famously, attempts to prove the existence of God by means of two rationalistic arguments, both of which proceed from our innate idea of God. The first argument, presented in his third Meditation, proceeds by way of claiming that the causal origins of this idea must be accounted for in terms of an actually existing perfect being (as no other cause is adequate to produce this effect). In Descartes's fifth Meditation he presents his own version of the ontological argument. Here he argues that God's actual existence is logically implied by our idea of God as a perfect being. According to this argument, it would be as contradictory to say that we have an idea of God but deny that he exists as it would be to say we have an idea of a triangle that does not have three sides. This argument has the same general objective as the cosmological argument that Locke and Clarke advanced: it aims to prove the necessary existence of God.

Finally, it should also be noted that Hume's Scottish contemporaries were heavily involved in the general debate between “religious philosophers” and “speculative atheists”. This includes a number of significant and influential thinkers with whom Hume likely came into contact while he was a student at Edinburgh University in the 1720's (e.g., Colin Maclaurin). Beyond this, it also includes several philosophers who were active in the Borders area of Scotland when Hume was living there as a young man and still in the early stages of his philosophical development (e.g. Andrew Baxter, Henry Home [Lord Kames]). In Hume's own lifetime his philosophy was widely regarded — in both Scotland and England - as being “atheistic” in character and generally hostile to religion. What is particularly significant, however, is that this way of viewing Hume's philosophy was not generated by the Dialogues — since it was published posthumously – but by his earlier philosophical work. This certainly includes the Treatise, which our own contemporaries tend to regard as having little or no relevance for problems of religion.

2. Empiricism, Scepticism and the Very Idea of God

An obvious starting point for understanding Hume's views on the philosophy of religion is his empiricism. The potential for empiricism to produce sceptical conclusions concerning our knowledge of God was already apparent in Hobbes's work, which embraced similar empiricist principles concerning the foundations of human knowledge. The most striking aspect of Hobbes's position on this subject is his claim that we have no idea of God, and so He is incomprehensible to us.

Whatever we imagine is finite. Therefore there is no idea or conception of anything we call infinite. No man can have in his mind an image of infinite magnitude, nor conceive infinite swiftness, infinite time, or infinite force, or infinite power … And therefore the name of God is used, not to make us conceive him (for he is incomprehensible, and his greatness and power are inconceivable), but that we may honour him. Also because whatsoever … we conceive has been perceived first by sense, either all at once or by parts, a man can have no thought representing anything not subject to sense… (Hobbes, Leviathan, 3.12)

Consistent with this view Hobbes provides a minimalist and negative theology. The human situation, with respect to our idea of God, is like that of a blind man trying to frame some idea of fire. It is not possible for this person, says Hobbes, "to have any imagination what kind of thing fire is; yet he cannot but know that somewhat there is that men call fire, because it warmth him.". (Hobbes, Human Nature, 11.2; Leviathan, 15.14) All we can understand by the word God, therefore, is "the cause of the World". (Hobbes, Citizen, 15.14; Leviathan, 31.15) Beyond this, however, we can say only what God is not. Hobbes places particular emphasis on the need to avoid any anthropomorphic conception of God, since any such attributes (i.e., passions, will, senses etc.) are "unworthy" of God. (Hobbes, Human Nature, 11.3; Leviathan, 31.25-28; Citizen, 15.14) Clearly, then, Hobbes employs his empiricist principles to emphasize the “narrow limits of our phantasy”, which puts knowledge of God beyond the scope of human understanding.

The theists who responded to Hobbes's empiricist scepticism concerning our idea of God had two basic options. One was to reject his empiricist principles concerning the origin of all our ideas and argue that our idea of God is either innate or derived from reason and not the senses. The other alternative is to accept empiricism about the origin of our ideas but deny that this has any sceptical implications for our knowledge of God. This is the route that Locke takes in his Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Locke argues that our idea of God is a complex idea framed from simple ideas we have acquired through reflection on the operations of our own minds. (Locke, Essay, 2.23.33; 3.6.11) The obvious danger in taking this route, however, is that it leads to a highly anthropomorphized conception of God. More specifically, the divine attributes are all conceived in terms that are only different in degree but not in kind from human attributes. This issue concerning our idea of God was fundamental to the whole early 18th century theological debate as it concerned the various schools of “religious philosophers”. During this period freethinking critics (e.g. Toland and Collins) used these difficulties to argue, along the lines of Hobbes, that we have no adequate or clear idea of God. It is evident that Hume's views about the origins and nature of our ideas must be considered with reference to this important controversy.

What is fundamental to Hume's entire empiricist program in the Treatise is his “copy-principle” or the claim that “all our ideas, or weak perceptions, are derived from our impressions, or strong perceptions, and that we can never think of any thing which we have not seen without us, or felt in our minds” (TA, 16-7/ 647). Hume goes on to observe that this “discovery” is of considerable importance “for deciding all controversies concerning ideas”. “Whenever any idea is ambiguous”, he continues, we always have “recourse to the impression, which must render it clear and precise” (TA, 7/648). If we suspect that “any philosophical term has no idea annexed to it”, Hume suggests, we can always ask “from what impression that pretended idea is derived?” (TA, 7/648-9) If no impression can be produced, we must conclude “the term is altogether insignificant” (TA, 7/ 648).

Given the prominence of the copy-principle in Hume's philosophical system, and its obvious relevance to the debate concerning our idea of God, it is surprising to find that in the Treatise Hume barely mentions our idea of God, much less provides any detailed account of the nature and origin of this idea. It would be a mistake, however, to conclude from this that theological problems, as they concern our idea of God, are far from his mind. On the contrary, neglecting this topic, in face of the ongoing debate and its obvious relevance for Hume's philosophy in the Treatise, plainly conveys a (strong) sceptical message.

In reply to this, it may be argued that Hume's presentation of his theory of ideas in Section II of the Enquiry shows that the sceptical reading is not so obvious. In this context Hume actually uses the idea of God to illustrate his copy-principle.

… when we analyse our thoughts or ideas, however compounded or sublime, we always find that they resolve themselves into such simple ideas as were copied from precedent feeling or sentiment. Even those ideas, which at first view, seem the most wide of this origin, are found, upon a nearer scrutiny to be derived from it. The idea of God, as meaning an infinitely intelligent, wise, and good Being, arises from reflecting on the operations of our own mind, and augmenting, without limit, those qualities of goodness and wisdom. (EU, 2.6 / 19; and cp. TA, 26 / 656; EU, 7. 25 /72)

Hume's account of our idea of God, as presented in this passage, plainly follows Locke's specific line of reasoning. Our idea of God is complex and derived from simple ideas based on reflection on the operations of our own minds, which we “augment without limit”. As I have explained, these remarks in the Enquiry about the nature and origin of our idea of God might be taken to show that Hume's theory of ideas, as presented in the Treatise, has no clear sceptical implications (i.e., along Hobbist lines). Contrary to this view, however, there is good reason to conclude that Hume's Lockean account of our idea of God is less than sincere.

In the first place, we need to consider Hume's remarks in a letter written to William Mure in 1743 (i.e., in the period between the publication of the Treatise and Enquiry). In this letter Hume discusses the topic of prayer and our strong (human) passions of admiration for what is excellent and love of what is benevolent and beneficial. Hume tells Mure that the Deity possesses these attributes (excellence, benevolence) “in the highest perfection”

… yet I assert he is not the natural Object of any Passion or Affection, He is no Object either of the Senses or Imagination, & very little of the Understanding, without which it is impossible to excite any Affection… A remote Ancestor… is a great Benefactor, & yet ‘tis impossible to bear him any Affection, because unknown to us; tho in general we know him to be a Man or human Creature, which brings him vastly nearer our Comprehension than an invisible infinite Spirit… (LET, I, 51 /#21 — my emphasis)

Hume goes on to point out that “enthusiasts”, in face of these difficulties, “degrade [God] into a Resemblance with themselves, & by that means render him more comprehensible.” Hume's views concerning our idea of God, as they are presented in this letter, differ little from those of Hobbes. We have, he suggests, little or no idea of God whatsoever, and this limits our capacity to regard God as either an object of belief or passion. Hume's remarks to Mure were written well before he published the Enquiry, which gives us good reason to doubt the sincerity of his (Lockean) remarks in the Enquiry about our idea of God.

What is more important than this, however, is that in Enquiry XI Hume presents a critique of our “conjectures” about God's nature and attributes, as based on evidence of design in this world. In this section Hume emphasizes the point that God's being is “so different, and so much superior” to human nature that we are not able to form any clear or distinct idea of his nature and attributes, much less one based on our own qualities and characteristics.

The Deity is known to us only by his productions, and is a single being in the universe, not comprehended under any species or genus, from whose experienced attributes or qualities, we can, by analogy, infer any attribute or quality in him… (EU, 11.26 / 144)

In a later passage Hume goes on to remark that God is “a Being, so remote and incomprehensible, who bears much less analogy to any other being in the universe than the sun to a waxen taper, and who discovers himself only by some faint traces or outlines, beyond which we have no authority to ascribe to him any attribute or perfection” (EU, 11.27 / 145-6 — my emphasis). It is, evidently, Hume's considered view that in respect of our idea of God we have no relevant impression(s) that can serve as the origin of this idea. Given his theory of meaning, this leaves the term “altogether insignificant”. Clearly, then, there is an intimate connection between the sceptical implications of Hume's empiricist theory of ideas, as based on the copy-principle, and his (subsequent) critique of the argument from design. The fundamental point that emerges is that Hume agrees with Hobbes that in respect of our idea of God our predicament is much the same as that of a blind man trying to form the idea of fire. (Hume's specific criticisms of the argument from design — which are developed in greater detail in the Dialogues — are discussed in more detail in Section IV below.)

3. The Cosmological Argument and God's Necessary-Existence

In Lucretius's The Nature of the Universe – which is the greatest classical statement of a system of atheism – it is argued that it is impossible that matter was created and that it must, therefore, be eternal and uncreated. The basis of this argument is the general causal principle: “Nothing can come from nothing” [Ex nihilo, nihil fit.] In the late 17th and early 18th centuries this principle was turned against the Epicurean atheism of thinkers such as Lucretius and Hobbes. More specifically, the principle “Nothing can come from nothing” was taken to ground two derived principles of causal reasoning. The first is the causal maxim: Whatever exists must have a cause or ground for its existence. The second principle is that of causal adequacy or the order of causes: No cause can produce or give rise to perfections or excellences that it does not itself possess. These two (derived) causal principles were used by a group of influential thinkers - most notably, Cudworth, Locke and Clarke - as the philosophical foundation for their own versions of the cosmological argument. It fell to Hume to show that the causal foundations of this argument were too weak to support the philosophical weight placed upon them.

Hume's most explicit assault on the cosmological argument appears in Part IX of his Dialogues. In this context, he specifically mentions Clarke and condenses his argument into a few sentences:

Whatever exists must have a cause or reason of its existence; it being absolutely impossible for any thing to produce itself, or to be the cause of its own existence. In mounting up, therefore, from effects to causes, we must either go on in tracing an infinite succession, without any ultimate cause at all, or must at last have recourse to some ultimate cause, that is necessarily existent… (D, 90 — Hume's emphasis)

There cannot be an infinite succession of causes and effects without any ultimate cause at all, the argument runs, because this would fail to provide any cause or reason for the whole series or causal chain. That is to say, we need to explain “why this particular succession of causes existed from eternity, and not any other succession, or no succession at all.” Clearly the series cannot be produced by nothing. We may conclude, therefore, that the universe must have arisen from some “necessarily existent Being, who carries the Reason of his existence in himself; and who cannot be supposed not to exist without an express contradiction.” (D, 91). This necessarily existent being is God.

It is also essential to this argument to prove that the necessarily-existent being cannot be (unintelligent, inactive) matter. Clarke's argument, as paraphrased by Hume, is based on the contingency of matter and particular form of the world.

“Any particle of matter”, it is said, “may be conceived to be annihilated; and any form may be conceived to be altered. Such an annihilation or alteration, therefore, is not impossible. (D, 92)

Another argument that Clarke provides (not mentioned by Hume in the Dialogues) to show that it is impossible for matter to be “the final and original being” is that we cannot explain the origin of motion and intelligence in the world if matter is the first, original self-existing being. The basic principle that Clarke relies on to establish this conclusion is, once again, that “nothing can come from nothing”. In this case the principle is interpreted as implying that “in order of causes and effects, the cause must always be more excellent than the effect.” [Clarke, Demonstration, 38] It is impossible, on this account, “that any effect should have any perfection, which was not in the cause”. On the basis of this principle — the causal adequacy principle — Clarke and other like-minded thinkers maintained that it is demonstratively certain that matter and motion cannot produce thought and intelligence. Therefore, the original, self-existent being must be an intelligent, immaterial being. To suppose the contrary, they claim, would be a plain contradiction.

It is evident that the foundations of this argument rest with the related causal principles that everything must have a cause or ground for its existence and that no effect can have any perfection that is not also in its cause. To deny either of these causal principles is, on Clarke's account, to reject the more general principle that “nothing can come from nothing” (a principle that the atheists such as Lucretius have themselves acknowledged). In the Treatise Hume develops an account of causation that directly contradicts these causal principles. Contrary to the causal maxim, Hume maintains, it is entirely possible for us to conceive of something beginning to exist without any cause. To deny this implies no contradiction or absurdity and, therefore, this principle is neither intuitively nor demonstratively certain (T, 1.3.3/78-9). Granted that this is correct, it follows that we cannot show that it is inconceivable or absurd to deny that the whole universe requires some distinct and independent ground or cause of its existence. From this it follows that it is conceivable or logically possible that there exists a causal series that came into existence uncreated or has always existed without any further cause or ground for its existence. This is not to say that the world is created or produced by nothing; nor is it to say that the world was produced by itself — as both these claims would be absurd. All that is claimed is that it is conceivable that the world is not created or produced or the effect of anything. On this view, as far as we can tell a priori, the world may have come into existence without any cause whatsoever. There is no contradiction or absurdity in supposing this.

Just as Hume rejects the claim that it is absurd or contradictory to deny that there must be a cause for everything that comes into existence, he also denies that it is impossible for an effect to have perfections that its cause lacks. Contrary to this view, Hume maintains, “any thing may produce any thing” (T, 173;; EU, 12.29/ 164). All that there is to causation, as we experience and know it, is the constant conjunction or regular succession of resembling objects. In other words, to say X causes Y is to say that in our experience we discover that objects resembling X's are always prior to and contiguous with objects resembling Y's (T, 168-70). Our idea of causation as it exists in the world reaches no further than this. (See the entry on the the metaphysics of causation.) On this basis Hume argues:

Creation, annihilation, motion, reason, volition; all these may arise from one another, or from any other object we can imagine. (T,

In this way, Hume stands Lucretius on his head with a view to refuting those “religious philosophers” who aimed to refute Lucretius's atheism using his own causal principle:

That impious maxim of the ancient philosophy, Ex nihilo, nihil fit, by which the creation of matter was excluded, ceases to be a maxim, according to my philosophy. Not only the will of the supreme Being may create matter; but, for aught we know a priori, the will of any other being might create it, or any other cause, that the most whimsical imagination can assign. (EU, 12.29n/164n)

Clearly, however, under cover of rejecting Lucretius's general causal principle, Hume has established that a priori it is not impossible for matter and motion to produce thought and consciousness. On the contrary, not only is it a priori possible for matter to be as “active” as thought and consciousness, and actually produce thought and consciousness, this is exactly what we discover from experience (T, The clear implication of all this is that there is no basis for the a priori claim that the material world is incapable of activity or producing thought and consciousness. Indeed, experience shows that this claim is actually false. There is, therefore, no basis whatsoever for the a priori claim that there necessarily exists an original, self-existing being that is an immaterial, intelligent being (i.e., God).

Closely related to Hume's critique of all efforts to demonstrate the existence of any being by means of a priori reasoning, is his critique of the notion of necessary-existence in general. In the Dialogues Hume explains his position as follows:

… there is an evident absurdity in pretending to demonstrate a matter of fact, or to prove it by arguments a priori. Nothing is demonstrable, unless the contrary is a contradiction. Nothing, that is directly conceivable, implies a contradiction. Whatever we conceive as existent, we can also conceive as non-existent. There is no being, therefore, whose non-existence implies a contradiction. Consequently there is no Being whose contradiction is demonstrable. (D, 91; cp, EU,12.28-34/ 164-5)

As Hume puts the point in the Treatise, when we believe that God exists our “idea of him neither encreases nor diminishes” — we simply conceive of “the idea of such, as he is represented to us” in a more forceful or vivid manner (T,; cp. We join nothing to our idea of his parts or qualities, nor do we have a distinct and separate idea of existence itself (e.g., qua abstract idea). In so far as we have any clear idea of God we can conceive of him existing or not existing. From these observations Hume draws the conclusion that the words “necessary existence, have no meaning; or what is the same thing, none that is consistent” (D, 92).

Hume applies this point directly to the claim that “the material world is not the necessarily existent Being”. If it is possible to conceive of the material world as not existing the same is true of God: we can imagine him “to be non-existent, or his attributes to be altered” (D, 92). If God's non-existence is impossible because of some “unknown inconceivable qualities”, why should we assume that these qualities do not belong to matter? All this puts an end to the efforts of Clarke and other “religious philosophers” to prove that God necessarily-exists. (Clarke offers another argument for God's necessary existence based on absolute space and time. Although Hume does not mention this in the Dialogues, in the Treatise he was careful to present sceptical arguments against the doctrine of absolute space and time — so Clarke and his Newtonian followers could not rest their position on this foundation either.)

Another argument that Hume presents, in criticism of the cosmological argument, concerns the assumption that an infinite series of causes and effects requires some explanation or cause for its existence.

… The WHOLE, you say, wants a cause. I answer, that the uniting of these parts into a whole, like the uniting of several distinct counties into one kingdom, or several distinct members into one body, is performed merely by an arbitrary act of mind, and has no influence on the nature of things. Did I show you the particular cause of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable, should you afterwards ask me, what was the cause of the whole twenty. This is sufficiently explained in explaining the cause of the parts. (D, 92-3)

The step in this argument that seems most questionable is the claim that because each element in the causal chain has been explained, in terms of some earlier member of the chain, we have “sufficiently explained” why there exists any such chain or why this particular chain exists. Critics will argue that this has plainly not been done. One response to this is argue that it is a philosophical mistake to look for an explanation of this kind, on the ground that a cause must be prior to its effect in time and it is evident that nothing can be prior to a series of causes and effects that is without any beginning or exists for eternity (D, 92). Related to this point, it may also be argued, more generally, that it is impossible for us to frame any idea of Creation (i.e., God creating the whole world) because our idea of causation presupposes a framework of ideas that already requires the existence of objects in the world (cp.T, 173-4). That is to say, it is a mistake to conceive of the cosmological question in causal terms because this takes us beyond the scope of human ideas and understanding. Hume's general analysis of the nature of causation, as developed in the Treatise and first Enquiry, makes clear that this is his view of this matter. For human beings, therefore, given our epistemological limits, the existence of this world must be treated as a basic brute fact that is incapable (for us) of further explanation.

Finally, Hume arguments against the notion of necessary existence have obvious relevance for Descartes's effort to prove that God necessarily exists by way of reasoning from our (innate) idea of God. Since a priori any thing may cause any thing, there is no basis for the claim that God must be the source of our idea of a perfect being. (Beyond this, of course, Hume denies that we have any such innate idea.) Similarly, since we have no (abstract) idea of existence, distinct from the conception of particular objects, there is no basis for claiming that the idea of God implies his actual existence. Contrary to the ontological argument, whatever idea of God we are able to frame, it is an idea of something that we can conceive as either existing or not existing. Existence is not some further quality or “perfection” which a being possesses along with its other attributes. There is, therefore, no contradiction or absurdity involved in denying that God exists.

4. The Argument from Design

An obvious limitation of the cosmological and ontological arguments is that they are highly abstract and, while they may convince a few philosophers and theologians, they cannot serve as the basis of religious belief for most ordinary people (D, 93). Things are very different, however, in the case of the argument from design. The defenders of this argument claim that it is so obvious and convincing that even sceptics cannot seriously doubt or deny it (D,56,116). The argument from design is discussed by Hume in Section XI of the first Enquiry and, at greater length, in the Dialogues (Parts II-VIII, XII). There are also several references to the argument from design in The Natural History of Religion (NHR, 134,150,153,183), where Hume presents it as the most plausible and convincing of the various arguments that have been advanced on this topic (cp. LG, 24-6). It is, nevertheless, Hume's plain intention throughout these works to expose the weaknesses and limitations of this argument.

At the beginning of Part II of the Dialogues Philo, who speaks as the “careless sceptic” and is generally identified as representing Hume's views, presents a challenge to the orthodox theist position similar to that which Hobbes had presented.

But surely, where reasonable men treat these subjects, the question can never be concerning the being, but only the nature of the Deity. The former truth, as you well observe, is unquestionable and self-evident. Nothing exists without a cause; and the original cause of this universe (whatever it be) we call GOD; and piously ascribe to him every species of perfection. … But as all perfection is entirely relative, we ought never to imagine, that we comprehend the attributes of this divine Being, or to suppose, that his perfections have any analogy or likeness to the perfections of a human creature. (D, 44)

In this way, it is Philo's position that all we know about God is that he exists (qua cause of the universe) but beyond this we have no idea or understanding of his nature or attributes. “Our ideas”, says Philo, “reach no further than experience: We have no experience of divine attributes and operations: I need not conclude my syllogism: You can draw the inference yourself.” The conclusion is that God's nature is “adorably mysterious and incomprehensible.” (D,45)

Philo's sceptical challenge is met by Cleanthes, who has the role in the Dialogues of presenting and defending the argument from design.

Look around the world: Contemplate the whole and every part of it: You will find it to be nothing but one great machine, subdivided into an infinite number of lesser machines… All these various machines, and even their most minute parts, are adjusted to each other with an accuracy, which ravishes into admiration all men, who have ever contemplated them. The curious adapting of means to ends, exceeds the productions of human contrivance; of human design, thought, wisdom, and intelligence. Since, therefore the effects resemble each other, we are led to infer, by all the rules of analogy, that the causes also resemble; and that the Author of nature is somewhat similar to the mind of man; though possessed of much larger faculties, proportioned to the grandeur of the work, which he has executed. (D, 45 — my emphasis)

The structure of this argument seems clear. (1) There is an analogy or resemblance between the world and man-made machines in respect of their shared features of order, structure, harmony and the evident way that their parts are suited to perform some function or serve certain ends. (2) When we discover an object that has these features (i.e. order, structure, harmony, etc.) we infer that these objects have not just come together by chance. For example, if we discover a watch or a house our experience leads us to believe “that there is an original principle of order in mind, not in matter” (D, 48; cp. EU, 4.4/26; 5.7/45). (3) The principle that guides this inference is that similar effects must arise from similar causes. (4) It follows from these premises that we can (rationally) infer the existence of God and “his similarity to human mind and intelligence” (D, 45).

Philo maintains that this argument, although methodologically sound in so far as it is based on experience and not on a priori reasoning, nevertheless falls well short of what it claims to prove. The first point that Philo draws our attention to is the weakness of the analogy between the world and “human productions”. When there is a close resemblance or “exact similarity” among objects then we may infer a similar cause.

The exact similarity of the cases gives us a perfect assurance of a similar event; and a stronger evidence is never desired nor sought after. But wherever you depart, in the least, from the similarity of the cases, you diminish proportionably the evidence: and may at last bring it to a very weak analogy, which is confessedly liable to error and uncertainty. (D, 46; cp. T,

The importance of this for the argument from design is clear. The gap between human artifacts and the whole universe is “vast” (D, 46,119,129). Any resemblance or similarity of this kind is so remote and slight that all reasoning on this basis is “both uncertain and useless” (EU, 11.23 /142). When we use analogies that are this weak and imperfect then only doubt and uncertainty can result (D, 49,67; T,

In order to bring out the particular difficulties of the argument from design, and the way in which it has only the façade of ordinary experimental reasoning, Hume suggests the analogy of a house. When we see a house we naturally and reasonably conclude (i.e., with moral certainty) that “it had an architect or builder; because this is precisely that species of effect, which we have experienced to proceed from that species of cause” (D, 46). When we consider the universe, however, things are very different. In this case, we have experience of a unique effect: the universe. Moreover, our experience of this effect is limited to small part or a “narrow corner” of it — from which we must make conjectures about the whole. Beyond this, we have no experience at all of its cause. Clearly, then, in a case of this kind we have no experience of “two species of objects” that are constantly conjoined on the basis of which we may draw some (reliable) inference (EU, 11.30/148; D, 51)

The contrast between ordinary cases of inference (e.g., house to human builder) and the design argument may be illustrated this way.

X = causes (builders, architects, etc.)
Y = effects (houses)
1. Y1 ---- X1
2. Y2 ---- X2
3. Y3 ---- X3
*. Yn / [Xn] ?

In this case our experience of the constant conjunction of Xs/Ys enables us to draw the inference to Xn, the unobserved cause of Yn. Our experience is of a series of conjunctions (1,2,3) where there is a close resemblance within each species of objects (i.e., among Xs and among Ys). We have direct experience of both kinds of objects (i.e., both Xs and Ys). In the case of the design argument our inference has this form.

Z = cause (God/creator)
W = effect (world/universe)

* <W> / [Z*] ?

We have experience of only one W (i.e., our experience of W is unique). Our experience of W is partial and incomplete (hence <W>), since we know only a small part of it in both spacial and temporal terms. We have no experience of any Zs at all. In these circumstances the only basis for drawing any conclusion about the nature of Z* from our (unique and partial) experience of W is by supposing that W bears some resemblance to objects such as Ys, broadly conceived to cover all human artifacts and productions. There is, however, a vast difference between these effects. It follows that there is little or no basis for assuming that Z resembles something like Xs (i.e., human mind or intelligence). God's nature, therefore, remains altogether “mysterious and incomprehensible” from the point of view of human understanding.

Cleanthes responds to this set of objections with a counter-example that is meant to discredit these criticisms and doubts. Suppose we heard an articulate voice coming from the clouds and the words uttered contain a message instructing us in a way that is worthy of a great, superior being. It is not possible, Cleanthes argues, that we would hesitate for a moment to ascribe some design and purpose to this voice and conclude that it bears some resemblance to the intelligent source of a human voice (D, 54-5). The situation is not so dissimilar as “when we hear an articulate voice in the dark and thence infer a man” (D, 54; cp. EU, 4.4/27). According to Cleanthes, it is similarly perverse and unnatural to deny that the various parts of the body and the way in which they are suited to our environment (e.g., legs for walking) are “incontestable proof of design and intention” (D, 57; cp. 46-7).

The fundamental difficulty with Cleanthes's example is, however, that it suggests an anthropomorphic conception of God's nature that is both arbitrary and unjustified. Given the nature of the analogy, how are we to understand the nature of God's mind? Does it have successive, distinct thoughts? If so, what sense can we make of God's simplicity and immutability? (D, 61) Why should we not assume that God has other human features such as passions and sentiments, or physical features such as a mouth or eyes? (D, 58,70) In all cases that we have experience of, human intelligence is embodied, so why not also assume that God has a body? (D, 73) The general difficulty here is that we are using the operations of one tiny part of nature that we are familiar with — our own human minds — to serve as “the model for the whole universe” (D, 50; cp. EU, 11.29/146). What this plainly manifests is that the anthropomorphic conception of God, as defended by Cleanthes, reflects an egocentric outlook and delusions about the significance of human life in the universe.

Any experimental reasoning of the kind that the argument from design employs must ensure that the cause is proportioned to the effect. That is to say, we cannot “ascribe to the cause any qualities, but what are exactly sufficient to produce them” (EU, 11.12-3/136; D, 70) If we follow this principle, however, we are no longer in a position to assign several fundamental attributes to God. We cannot, for example, attribute any thing infinite to God based on our observation and experience of finite effects. Nor can we attribute unity to the original cause of the universe on the basis of any analogy to human artifacts such as houses; as they are often built by a number of people working together. Perhaps, therefore, there is more than one God involved in the creation of the universe? More importantly, we are in no position to attribute perfection to God unless we observe perfection in his creation. Since there are evidently “many inexplicable difficulties in the works of nature” we are not justified in making any inference of this kind. (D, 68-9)

The mistake that Hume particularly warns against, in respect of the issue of God's perfection, is that we cannot begin from the assumption that God is perfect, then assume that his creation is worthy of him, and then argue, on this basis, that we have evidence that God is perfect.

You find certain phenomena in nature. You seek a cause or author. You imagine that you have found him. You afterwards become so enamored of this offspring of your brain, that you imagine it impossible, but he must produce something greater and more perfect than the present scene of things, which is so full of ill and disorder. You forget, that this superlative intelligence and benevolence are entirely imaginary, or, at least, without any foundation in reason; and that you have no ground to ascribe to him any qualities, but what you see he has actually exerted and displayed in his productions. (EU, 11.15/ 137-8)

This problem is, of course, most acute when it comes to the “reality of evil” that we observe in the world. How do vindicate God's “infinite power and goodness” when we are faced with overwhelming evidence of (unnecessary and inexplicable) evil in the world? What we cannot do, Hume argues, is explain away all evidence of this kind by way of assuming that this world is the perfect creation of a perfect being. It is this assumption that needs to be established, so we must not assume it in our reasoning.

Hume's aim, in this context, is not to argue that it is impossible that God is perfect but only that we are in no position to infer this unless our experience of this world, which is the sole source of our evidence concerning this issue, is both sufficiently comprehensive and uniformly consistent with the hypothesis. Plainly, however, it is neither. It follows from this that many other hypotheses and conjectures, consistent with the evidence presented, may be considered as no less plausible. Philo puts this point to Cleanthes:

In a word, Cleanthes, a man who follows your hypothesis is able, perhaps, to assert, or conjecture, that the universe, sometime, arose from something like design: But beyond that position he cannot ascertain one single circumstance, and is left afterwards to fix every point of his theology, by the utmost license of fancy and hypothesis. (D, 71 — my emphasis)

Philo goes on to suggest that, for all we know, this world “is very faulty and imperfect, compared to a superior standard”. Given this, we may also conjecture that this world was created by “some infant Deity, who afterwards abandoned it, ashamed of his lame performance” or it is “the production of old age and dotage in some superannuated Deity”, and so on (D, 71). The general point being made is that in the absence of clear evidence of perfection in this world we must “proportion the cause to the effect” and resist the temptation of “exaggeration and flattery to supply the defects of argument and reasoning” (EU, 11.14/137).

Hume's line of reasoning criticizing the argument from design presents theists with a basic and seemingly intractable dilemma in respect of their idea of God. On the one hand, theists such as Cleanthes want to insist that the analogy between this world and human productions is not so slight and maintains, on this basis, that God in some significant degree resembles human intelligence (D, 56-7). The difficulty with this view, as we have seen, is that it leads to “a degradation of the supreme being” by way of an arbitrary anthropomorphism that involves idolatry that is no better than atheism (D,58,61-2). On the other hand, if we follow mystics, such as Demea, we end up no better off than sceptics and atheists who claim that we know nothing of God's nature and attributes and that everything about him is “unknown and unintelligible” (D, 60). Hume's sceptical technique in the Dialogues, therefore, is to play one group of theists off against the other, showing that both their positions end up as nothing better or different from the atheism that they both claim to abhor.

On the interpretation provided, it is clear that Hume's critique of the argument from design is deep and radical. There are, however, several passages in the final Part of the Dialogues (XII) that suggest that Philo (Hume) reverses or at least moderates his position — making some significant concessions to Cleanthes's position. The most important evidence of this appears in a passage at the beginning of Part XII where Philo says that no one can be so stupid as to reject the view that there are signs of intention and design in this world and that it is evident, as Cleanthes has argued, “that the works of nature bear a great analogy to the productions of art” (D, 119 — my emphasis). Immediately after this, however, Philo proceeds to reverse his reversal (i.e., he performs a double-reversal). He insists, in particular, on the verbal or trivial nature of the whole dispute about whether we should call God a “mind” or “intelligence” and emphasizes, once again, “the vast difference, which may reasonably be supposed between him and human minds” (D, 119 — my emphasis). In an especially important passage, which was inserted into the Dialogues shortly before Hume died, Philo elaborates on his view. The truly pious, he argues, will acknowledge “that there is a great and immeasurable, because incomprehensible, difference between the human and the divine mind.” (D, 120 — my emphasis) On the other hand, the atheist may allow that there is some “remote analogy” among the various operations of nature, including “the rotting of a turnip, the generation of an animal, and the structure of human thought” (D, 120). In other words, the atheist can concede that there is some remote analogy between the first principle of the universe and several other parts of nature – only one of which is human thought and mind (D, 120; and cp. 78f). Hume's point is that there are other analogies that are no less plausible than that which Cleanthes has suggested. These other analogies do not suggest that the cause of this world is something like mind or human intelligence. Clearly, then, the atheist may concede that there is some remote analogy between God and human minds and still insist that there remain other analogies and hypotheses that are no less plausible. The conclusion to be drawn from this is that all such analogies are so weak and “remote” that God's nature remains an “inexplicable mystery” well beyond the scope of human understanding (D, 129).

Hume never retreats from the view stated in the first Enquiry that God (i.e., the cause of the world) is “a Being, so remote and incomprehensible, who bears much less analogy to any other being in the universe than the sun to a waxen taper, and who discovers himself only by some faint traces or outlines, beyond which we have no authority to ascribe to him any attribute or perfection” (EU, 11.27/146). This position is indistinguishable from the scepticism that was advanced by Hobbes — a view that Hume's own contemporaries regarded as paradigmatic atheism.

5. The Problem of Evil

The arguments of Hume's that we have considered so far may all be described as sceptical arguments that are critical of efforts by (orthodox) theists to prove the existence of God. No argument considered so far aims to prove that God does not or cannot exist. However, in the Dialogues Hume considers an ancient argument based on the existence of evil that is intended to establish this (negative) conclusion. It comes in the form of “Epicurus's old questions” which remain “unanswered” (D, 100). The questions are these: Is God willing to prevent evil but unable to do so? Then he is not omnipotent. Is God able to prevent evil but unwilling to do so? Then he is malevolent (or at least less than perfectly good). If God is both willing and able to prevent evil then why is there evil in the world? (See the entry on the problem of evil.) What is at stake here is the possibility of vindicating God's moral attributes in face of the existence of evil in this world. It is clear, as Cleanthes acknowledges, that if this cannot be done then the case for theism in any orthodox form will collapse (D, 101).

Several different strategies are available to the theist to defuse this problem — that is, theodicies of various kinds. One strategy is to deny the reality of evil and insist that the evils we experience or observe in the world are really “goods to the universe” which are essential for a perfectly good whole. In other words, these are only evils relative to our individual, narrow, human perspective. From the divine perspective, viewing the universe as one system, the removal of such ills or afflictions would produce greater ill or diminish the total amount of good in the world. This strategy may be interpreted as arguing either that there are no real evils in the world (i.e., only apparent evils) or that there are real evils in the world but they are all necessary evils — without which the whole system of nature would not be so perfect (Cp. D, 96; EU, 8.34/101).

In respect of the first view, that there is no real evil, Hume takes the view that it is plainly contrary to human experience. The reality of the distinction between good and evil — whether physical or moral — depends on “the natural sentiments of the human mind”. These distinctions, based on feeling, cannot be altered or amended “by any philosophical theory or speculation whatsoever” (EU, 8.34-5/101-03). In the Dialogues Hume opens his discussion of the problem of evil by having Philo (the sceptic) run through a long catalogue of the variety and extent of misery and suffering in this world. He begins with animal suffering of various kinds (the strong preying on the weak etc.) and moves on to human suffering in its numerous forms (illness, emotional torments, war etc.). Even religion (i.e., “superstition”) is a source of fear and anxiety. Despite this catalogue of human suffering and grief, we find ourselves too afraid of death to put an end to our miserable existence. “We are terrified, not bribed to the continuance of our existence.” (D, 99) The conclusion that Philo draws from all this is that “the course of nature tends not to human or animal felicity” –which brings us back to “Epicurus's old questions” (D, 100).

The first line of reply to this comes from Demea (the mystic) who argues that “the present evil phenomena … are rectified in other regions, and in some future period of existence” (D, 101). This is a view that is immediately corrected by Cleanthes along similar lines to those that Hume also presents in the first Enquiry. The problem here is that if we grant, with Demea, the reality of evil in this world then in so far as our understanding of God's attributes is based on the evidence of his creation in this world, we are in no position to infer the “perfect goodness of the Deity”.

Now without some such license of supposition, it is impossible for us to argue from the cause, or infer any alteration in the effect, beyond what has immediately fallen under our observation. Greater good produced by this Being must still prove a greater degree of goodness: a more impartial distribution of rewards and punishments must proceed from a greater regard to justice and equity. Every supposed addition to the works of nature makes an addition to the attributes of the Author of nature; and consequently, being entirely unsupported by any reason or argument, can never be admitted but as a mere conjecture and hypothesis. (EU, 11.26/ 145)

Hume's point is not that the reality of evil proves that God cannot be both omnipotent and perfectly good but that we are in no position to claim that we know that God will “rectify” the evil of this world (e.g., its unjust distribution of good and evil) in a future state, since the evidence of this world does not support such a conjecture. Our predicament is like that of a person who stands in the porch that leads into a very different building or structure and must conjecture what the complete or whole plan is like. We may hope or imagine that something better awaits us but the present phenomena do not license a conjecture or hypothesis of this kind (EU, 11.21,24/ 141,143).

Faced with this difficulty, Cleanthes insists that contrary to all that Philo and Demea have claimed, we must allow that there is more happiness than misery, more pleasure than pain, in this world. Failing this, “there is an end at once of all religion” (D, 101-02). Philo's response is that this is a fatal concession. Not only will it be hard to prove that there is more happiness than misery in the world, much more than this is needed to vindicate God's moral attributes. Unless all evil is essential or necessary the religious position will collapse. Any degree or kind of unnecessary evil — however small — would tell against the existence of God as an infinitely powerful and perfectly good being. The usual reply to this (echoing God's answer to Job) is that we humans are in no position to tell whether there is any unnecessary evil in this world –for all we know, all the evil in this world is indeed necessary evil. It is arrogance to question God's existence and goodness when we lack understanding of the infinite complexities of his creation.

The central thrust of Hume's discussion of evil in the Dialogues is to show that this kind of theodicy fails.

I will allow, that pain or misery in man is compatible with infinite power and goodness in the Deity, even in your sense of these attributes: What have you advanced by all these concessions? A mere possible compatibility is not sufficient. You must prove these pure unmixed, and uncontrollable attributes from the present mixed and confused phenomena, and from these alone. (D,103)

Philo goes on to point out that even if the phenomena of nature were “pure and unmixed” (i.e., entirely good) they are still finite and so insufficient to prove God's infinite perfection and goodness. The phenomena of nature are, in any case, not only finite, they are a mixture of good and evil, so any effort to prove God's “infinite power and goodness” on this basis is a hopeless task. Here Philo claims to “triumph” (D, 202). Further on, Philo returns to this point.

… as this goodness is not antecedently established, but must be inferred from the phenomena, there can be no grounds for such an inference, while there are so many ills in the universe, and while these ills might so easily have been remedied, as far as human understanding can be allowed to judge on such a subject. I am sceptic enough to allow, that the bad appearances, notwithstanding all my reasonings, may be compatible with such attributes as you suppose: But surely they can never prove these attributes. (D, 113)

Clearly, then, the task required of orthodox theism cannot be to establish merely the possibility that the existence of evil is consistent with God's existence, it is to explain how we can infer God's infinite power and goodness on the basis of our experience of finite phenomena that presents us with a mixture of good and evil in this world. It is this task, Philo maintains, that Cleanthes has failed to perform.

The subtlety of Hume's argument is now clear. There is no need for the sceptic to launch a strong argument that aims to prove that God cannot exist on the basis of the real existence of evil in this world. All that the sceptic needs to do is to show that the theist is unable to prove or establish God's attributes of infinite power and goodness given the evidence of creation as we observe it. What the theist must do, in order to meet this challenge, is to show that all the evil that exists in this world (i.e., every last degree and measure of it) is necessary and unavoidable. It is clear that the theist is in no position to support this claim. The mere possibility that this is the case will not suffice to justify the inference to God's infinite power and goodness. We cannot, therefore, establish God's moral attributes along the lines that Cleanthes has suggested.

Hume's “concession” that evil and God's existence are compatible may have the appearance of (another) “retreat” from a stronger sceptical position. The significance of this concession should not be exaggerated. While the sceptic cannot prove that there does indeed exist some unnecessary evil in the world, it is nevertheless possible to show that this view of things is in no way unreasonable. Hume describes a fourfold catalogue of causes of evil in this world none of which “appear to human reason, in the least degree, necessary or unavoidable” (D, 107). He asks, for example, why animal creation is not animated entirely by pleasure, as it appears “plainly possible to carry on the business of life without any pain” (D, 108). Similarly, why could God not have been more generous in providing his creatures with better endowments for their survival and happiness (i.e., why is God not more of an “indulgent parent”)? (D, 109-10) Again, why does nature run into such extremes in relation to heat and cold, rains, winds, and so on? Surely things could have been arranged so that these extremes and their destructive consequences could be avoided? Finally, Hume asks why God does not act through particular volitions to prevent specific catastrophes and disasters (e.g., why not ensure there is no storm blowing when a fleet is out at sea)? (D,108) In all these cases, Hume grants, there may “be good reasons, why providence interposes not in this manner; but they are unknown to us” (D, 109). The implication of all this is not just that we have no reason to infer the existence of an infinitely powerful and good God but that we have considerable reason for doubting it.

Given these considerations regarding the causes of evil, and the limits of human understanding, what is the most reasonable hypothesis concerning the first cause of the universe? Philo dismisses the suggestion that the first cause is either perfectly good or perfectly malevolent on the ground that “mixed phenomena” can never prove either of the unmixed principles as the first cause. This leaves only two other possibilities. Either the first cause has both goodness and malice or it has neither. Philo argues that the steady and orderly nature of the world suggests that no such (Manichean) “combat” between good and evil is going on. So the most plausible hypothesis is that “the original source of all things” is just as indifferent about “good above ill” as it is about heat above cold (D, 113-4). Nature is blind and uncaring regarding such matters and there is no basis for the supposition that the world has been created with human or animal happiness or comfort in mind. Any supposition of this kind is nothing better than an anthropomorphic prejudice (EU, 11.27/146; cp. D, 100).

The tendency of Hume's discussion of evil, in both the Enquiry and Dialogues, is to insist on the reality of evil and the doubts that this casts on any claim that the beauty, harmony and order of this world provides us with clear evidence that an infinitely powerful and good being created and governs it. As we have noted, Hume's argument falls short of categorically denying that God exists on the ground that there is unnecessary evil in this world. What Hume's arguments do show, however, is that while it is possible that the reality of evil is consistent with the existence of God this leaves theism with a large and significant problem that remains unanswered. The enormous degree of evil in this world, and the vast range of forms that it takes, are impossible to explain or justify from our human perspective (i.e., given the limits of human understanding). There is, therefore, no basis for inferring the existence of an infinitely powerful and good God in face of contrary evidence of this kind — evidence that provides us with considerable grounds for doubting this conjecture or hypothesis.

6. Miracles

Miracles are an essential and fundamental element of the major monotheistic religions (i.e., Judaism, Christianity, Islam). The accounts of miracles, as presented in scripture and elsewhere, are supposed to confirm the authenticity and authority of scripture and the prophets and, more importantly, establish that God has revealed himself to human beings through these special acts or events. From the point of view of Christianity, one miracle of particular significance is the resurrection of Jesus Christ. To doubt or question the truth of this event is to doubt the core and distinct meaning and doctrine of the Christian religion. It would be to cast doubt on the claim that Christ is God and the saviour of human kind. A major concern of Hume’s, especially as presented in Section X of the first Enquiry, was to discredit miracle claims of this kind.

According to Hume's account, “a miracle is a violation of a law of nature” (EU, 11.12/114). More specifically, it is “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity, or by the interposition of some invisible agent” (EU, 11.12n/115n). As defined, a miracle may occur without any person observing it (i.e., it may be completely unknown). Hume's additional proviso that a miracle is not only a violation of a law of nature but also requires the direct activity of God (or some “invisible agent”) is a significant qualification. It follows from this that we cannot establish that a miracle has occurred by showing only that the laws of nature have been violated, as this may only be a chance or capricious event (EU, 8.25/96; cp. T, Nevertheless, the key issue, for Hume's critique of miracles, is whether or not we ever have reason to believe on the basis of testimony that a law of nature has been violated. Hume's arguments lead to the conclusion that we never have reason to believe miracle reports as passed on to us.

A law of nature, as Hume interprets it, involves a uniform regularity of events. We discover laws of nature on the basis of our experience of constant conjunctions of events or objects. An obvious example of this, provided by Hume, is that “all men must die” (EU, 11.12/114). It would, therefore, be “a miracle, that a dead man should come to life” because we have “uniform experience” that tells against such a claim (EU, 11.12/ 115). When we have uniform experience that confirms the existence of regularities of this kind we have, says Hume, “a direct and full proof, from the nature of the fact, against the existence of the miracle” (EU, 11.12/115). The point that Hume is concerned to make here is that the “ultimate standard” by which we must judge whether a miracle has occurred is (much) higher than it is in the case of other reports claiming to establish some unusual or unexpected event. It is, for example, no miracle that a man in good health should suddenly die. Although an event of this kind may be improbable, it does sometimes occur. In the case of miracles, however, we are asked to believe something that is contrary to all other experience and observation (e.g., resurrection from the dead). Miracles must be unique (or nearly unique) events otherwise they fall within the “common course of nature”, no matter how rare and unusual the event may be.

Given this account of miracles, understood as violations of laws of nature, how should we evaluate claims that miracles have occurred? The principle that Hume relies on, for this purpose, is that a reasonable person “proportions his belief to the evidence” (EU, 11.4/110). In the case of miracles, the relevant evidence that we need to weigh comes from two distinct sources that must be balanced against each other. On one side, there is the question of the credibility of the witnesses to the event. That is to say, we need to ask if we can rely on the truthfulness and judgment of the individual(s) who report that the relevant event took place. On the other side, there is the question of the credibility of the fact itself (i.e., that a violation of a law of nature occurred). Clearly, in circumstances where there is some opposition between these two sets of considerations, the reasonable person will believe that which has the superior evidence in its support.

If we follow this procedure, Hume claims, we must conclude that “no testimony for any kind of a miracle has ever amounted to a probability, much less to a proof; and that, even supposing it amounted to a proof, it would be opposed by another proof….” (EU, 11.35/ 127). Hume establishes this general point in two related moves. The evidence telling against the occurrence of a miracle must always constitute a full proof — since we have uniform human experience in support of the laws of nature (EU, 11.12/115). It follows from this:

That no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavours to establish; and even in that case there is a mutual destruction of arguments… (EU, 11.13 / 116)

The only basis for giving any credibility to miracle reports – since by their nature they are wholly unbelievable — is to give weight and credibility to the character and authority of the witnesses to the event(s). However, even in the optimal case, where the credibility of the witnesses and their reports are judged to be beyond doubt and wholly reliable, we are faced with evidence that is equally opposed — “proof against proof”.

Hume's argument, up to this point, supposes that the testimony in support of a miracle “amounts to an entire proof” and is wholly reliable. However, the fact is, Hume argues, that this concession is “a great deal too liberal”. If we consider the specific circumstances and conditions in which miracle reports generally occur, and the sources they come from, we will have to conclude that testimony in support of actual historical miracles, of the kind that the major religions rely on, are far from reliable. The relevant standards by which we judge the reliability of testimony (i.e. in ordinary life — including law and history, as well as religion) involve several different considerations. Hume mentions four categories of consideration about the reliability of testimony. Each of them is such that the credibility of the testimony may be diminished when we give due weight to these factors.

The first category concerns the witnesses to the event. Obviously the credibility of an event increases when more witnesses attest to it. We also need to know about the character and competence of the witness(es). If they are educated, sensible and critical we will more readily believe them than if they are ignorant and gullible. A second category of consideration that Hume mentions is that there is a general psychological weakness in human nature whereby we want to believe in events that produce feelings of surprise and wonder because these are “agreeable emotions” (EU, 11.16/117).

As belief is almost absolutely requisite to the exciting our passions, so the passions in their turn are very favourable to belief… Admiration and surprise have the same effect as the other passions; and accordingly we may observe, that among the vulgar, quacks and projectors meet with a more easy faith upon account of their magnificent pretensions, than if they kept themselves within the bounds of moderation. The first astonishment, which naturally attends their miraculous relations, spreads itself over the whole soul, and so vivifies and enlivens the idea that it resembles the inferences we draw from experience. (T, / 120)

This natural disposition leads to credulity and “subdues the understanding” (EU, 11.17/ 117-8; T, / 113). “Love of wonder” is often joined with “the spirit of religion” whereby the religionist, “with the best intentions in the world, for the sake of promoting so holy a cause”, is more powerfully drawn to belief (EU, 11.17 / 117-8). Hume also notes that lies have been told in all ages and that the frequent repetition of lies promotes belief (T, / 117; cp. T, / 86). More generally, custom and education influence belief and in many cases “take such deep root that ‘tis impossible for us, by all the powers of reason and experience to eradicate them” (T, / 116). The third range of factors Hume mentions are the variable historical and social conditions that affect credulity. Although there is a universal propensity to credulity, Hume notes that miraculous and supernatural events “are observed chiefly to abound among ignorant and barbarous nations” (EU, 11.20 / 119). Finally, the authority of miracle reports is diminished by the consideration that the miracle reports coming from rival religions tend to diminish the authority and credibility of all of them (EU, 11.24 / 121-2). The result of giving weight to these various considerations is that the credulity of actual historical miracle claims is radically diminished. There is no probability left in support of them.

It has been claimed that Hume denies the very possibility of miracles occurring. As it stands, this misrepresents his view. According to Hume, miracles are entirely possible in the sense that there is no absurdity or contradiction involved in suggesting that the laws of nature are violated — this is at least conceivable. Nor does Hume deny that rare, unusual, surprising and wonderous events do actually occur. There may even be circumstances when extraordinary events of this kind may be justifiably believed on the basis of testimony (EU, 11.36 /127-8). Moreover, Hume also recognizes that events frequently occur that are unexpected and which we do not know the cause(s) of (EU, 8.12-4 / 86-7). None of these considerations, however, show that the laws of nature have actually been violated. On the contrary, our experience shows that when “irregular and extraordinary” events do occur a closer examination and investigation generally uncovers the relevant “hidden” or “concealed” causes that were at work. Only the ignorant and vulgar conclude, in circumstances of this kind, that the laws of nature have been violated or that a miracle has occurred. It is in this sense that Hume maintains that miracles do not occur. In this way, the evidence of experience shows us, Hume suggests, that nature is uniform and regular. When this appears not to be so, subsequent experience and closer investigation reveals that this is a sign only of human ignorance and credulity, not of any (incomprehensible) divine activity.

What really matters for assessing Hume's critique of miracles is to keep in mind that his primary aim is to discredit the actual historical miracle claims that are supposed to provide authority and credibility for the major established religions — most obviously, Christianity. From this perspective, the central issue is not whether Hume is right in claiming that it is impossible for any miracle claim to be established as morally certain (i.e., “proved”), but if he is right in claiming that the historical miracle claims supporting the major religions such as Christianity pass this standard. It is Hume's judgment that when we weigh the relevant evidence, and proportion our belief accordingly, we will find that these claims are wholly unbelievable.

7. Immortality and a Future State

According to Joseph Butler, an influential contemporary of Hume’s, the most important question that can possibly be asked is whether we are to live in a future state. It was Butler's view that the doctrine of future rewards and punishments is fundamental to religion and essential for its practical influence over human life and conduct. This view of the importance of the doctrine of future rewards and punishments was accepted by almost all the leading theologians at this time (and is, of course, still widely accepted among religious thinkers today). It is evident that the immortality of the soul is an essential part of this doctrine. For Hume's contemporaries, proofs of the immortality of the soul generally depended upon showing that the soul is immaterial.

There are two “metaphysical” arguments that aim to establish the immateriality of the soul that Hume is especially concerned with. The first argument, which is Platonic in origin, maintains that whereas mind is simple, unitary and indivisible, matter is compounded and infinitely divisible. It follows from this, according to this argument, that mind is distinct from matter and that only an immaterial being or substance is capable of thought and consciousness. Moreover, since immaterial minds are simple and indivisible they are incapable of destruction and continue to exist eternally (unless annihilated by divine power). A second and related argument is that it is impossible for matter and motion to produce thought and consciousness. For this to be possible we must suppose that a cause can produce effects that possess perfections that it lacks. Once again, this would be to suppose that something could be produced by nothing, which is absurd and contradictory.

Hume rejects both these metaphysical arguments for the immateriality and immortality of the soul. His refutations are presented, first, in the Treatise 1.4.5-6 and, later and more briefly, in his essay “Of the Immortality of the Soul”. (It is possible that this essay contains material that was originally intended for publication in the Treatise but was withdrawn.) Regarding the suggestion that thought and consciousness must belong to or inhere in an immaterial substance, Hume objects that we have no idea of either immaterial or material substance.

But just as metaphysics teach us, that the notion of substance is wholly confused and imperfect, and that we have no other idea of any substance than as an aggregate of particular qualities, inhering in an unknown something. Matter, therefore, and spirit are at bottom equally unknown; and we cannot determine what qualities may inhere in the one or in the other. (ESY, 591)

The important and intelligible issue, according to Hume, is not the question of the substance of thought but that concerning the cause of our perceptions (T, 246f). In respect of this issue, Hume invokes his general causal maxim that “any thing may produce any thing” in order to establish that a priori it is possible that matter may be the cause of thought (T, / 247). Furthermore, experience shows us, Hume maintains, that there do exist constant conjunctions between matter and motion, on one side, and thought and consciousness on the other. Clearly, then, in so far as we have any idea of causation as it exists in the world, we must conclude that thought and consciousness can indeed arise from matter and motion (as the materialists maintain). In his essay on “Immortality” Hume expands on these points to argue that the evidence of experience shows us that thought and consciousness depends on our bodily existence and, therefore, bodily death must imply death of the mind as well (ESY, 596; cp. D, 73).

Apart from Hume's sceptical arguments directed against the immateriality and immortality of the soul, he also advances sceptical arguments concerning the doctrine of future rewards and punishments. In the context of Section XI of the first Enquiry, as we have already noted, Hume argues that we have no adequate evidence, “derived from the present phenomena” of this world, that a future state will correct the injustices of this world. Hume presents the “religionist” with the following difficulty:

Are there any marks of a distributive justice in this world? If you answer in the affirmative, I conclude that, since justice here exerts itself, it is satisfied. If you reply in the negative, I conclude, that you have then no reason to ascribe justice, in our sense of it, to the gods. If you hold a medium between affirmation and negation, by saying, that the justice of the gods, at present, exerts itself in part but not to its full extent; I answer, that you have no reason to give it any particular extent, but only so far as you see it, at present, exert itself. (EU, 11.22 / 141-2 — Hume's emphasis)

In the Treatise Hume advanced another set of arguments against the doctrine of a future state. In this context he argues that any idea or belief in life in a future state is too faint and weak to have any practical influence over our passions and conduct.

A future state is so far remov’d from our comprehension, and we have so obscure an idea of the manner, in which we shall exist after the dissolution of the body, that all the reasons we can invent, however strong in themselves, and however much assisted by education, are never able with slow imaginations to surmount this difficulty, or bestow a sufficient authority and force on the idea. (T, / 114)

In general, says Hume, the lack of resemblance between this life and a future state destroys belief and, consequently, has little influence on our passions and conduct. Hume claims “there scare are any, who believe the immortality of the soul with a true and established judgment” (T, / 114-5). The evidence for this is that our conduct is usually guided with a view to the pleasures and pains, rewards and punishments, of this life and not a future state (T, / 115; cp. D, 122f).

Hume adds a further set of objections relating to the morally pernicious aspects of the doctrine of a future state of rewards and punishments. Among the several arguments that he puts forward on this score, four points are especially important. In the first place, Hume asks, what is the point or purpose of punishment in a future state? In this life we assume that punishment must not only be deserved, it must also achieve some relevant social end or value (e.g., contribute to the stability and peace of society). When we are removed from this world these goals are taken away and punishment becomes pointlessly retributive (ESY, 594). The implication of this is that punishment without any further point or purpose is mere vengeance that lacks any proper justification. Second, Hume asks on what basis God determines the extent of our merit and demerit. Among human beings the standard of merit and demerit depends on our moral sentiments and our sense of pleasure and pain. Are we to suppose that God also has human passions and feelings of this kind? (ESY, 594,595; cp. LET, I, 40 [#16]; D, 58) Third, the doctrine of eternal damnation clearly involves excessive punishment — even for the worst of crimes. Finally, the split between Heaven and Hell supposes “two distinct species of men, the good and the bad. But the greatest part of mankind float between vice and virtue.” (ESY, 594)

Hume's position on the doctrine of a future state is clear. From every point of view this doctrine is unsound. It depends on metaphysical assumptions about the nature of mind (soul) that are philosophically unconvincing, involving obscure ideas that are plainly at odds with our everyday experience and observations concerning the relationship between mind and body. It also depends on assumptions about God's goodness and justice that lack any adequate philosophical justification. Moreover, because the ideas and arguments involved in this doctrine are both obscure and unconvincing, we find, in practice, that the doctrine has little or no influence in directing human conduct. Finally, not only is this doctrine philosophically flawed and psychologically feeble, it depends on moral principles that are both unjust and corrupting.

8. Hume's Genealogy of Religion: Causes and Dynamics of Religious Belief

In 1757 Hume published “The Natural History of Religion”, a work that proposes to identify and explain the origins and evolution of religious belief. This project follows lines of investigation and criticism that had already been laid down by a number of other thinkers, including Lucretius, Hobbes and Spinoza. Hume's primary objective in this work is to show that the origins and foundations of religious belief do not rest with reason or philosophical arguments of any kind but with aspects of human nature that reflect our weaknesses, vulnerabilities and limitations (i.e., fear and ignorance). Related to this point, Hume also wants to show that the basic forces in human nature and psychology that shape and structure religious belief are in conflict with each other and that, as a result of this, religious belief is inherently unstable and variable. In arguing for these points, Hume is directly challenging an opposing view, one that was widely held among his own orthodox contemporaries. According to this view (e.g., as presented by Cleanthes), the evidence of God's existence is so obvious that no one sincerely and honestly doubts it. Belief in an intelligent, invisible creator and governor of the world is a universal belief rooted in and supported by reason. From this perspective, no person sincerely accepts “speculative atheism”. Hume's “naturalistic” approach to religion aims to discredit these claims and assumptions of theism.

According to Hume, all that the various religions in the world have in common is belief that there is an invisible, intelligent power in the world (NHR, 134,144-5). Although there is a “universal propensity to believe in invisible, intelligent power” (NHR, 184), even religious belief of this limited kind is not entirely universal or any sort of “original instinct”. Hume also points out that religion of this most general kind is not to be confused with “genuine theism”. Genuine theism involves a more specific set of beliefs: that there is only one god and that god is the invisible, intelligent creator and governor of the world (NHR, 144f). In several different contexts in The Natural History of Religion Hume suggests that the argument from design — based on our observation of beauty and order in the world — is a convincing and plausible basis for genuine theism (NHR, 134,153,183). However, despite this veil of orthodoxy, his objective throughout this work is to show that the actual foundation of genuine theism, as we find it in the world, does not rest with reasoning or arguments of any kind. The true roots of genuine theism can be discovered in the psychological dynamics that first give rise to polytheism. The same (irrational) forces that shape polytheism serve to explain the rise of theism and the instability and variations that we discover within it.

According to Hume, “polytheism or idolatry was, and must have been, the first and most ancient religion of mankind” (NHR, 135). Not only does the evidence of history make this clear, we know as well that if theism, based on the (obvious and convincing) argument of design, were the original religion then it would be impossible to explain how polytheism could have ever arisen out of it. That is to say, the argument from design would continue to have the same force and so we should not expect any deviation from it. What, then, is the origin of polytheism? The basis of polytheism is not the beauty and order we discover in the works of nature, as that leads us to genuine theism, it is rather “the various and contrary events of human life”. These are events (e.g., weather, illness, wars, etc.) that are unpredictable but important to us because they directly influence human happiness and misery. In respect of these events, which engage our deepest hopes and fears, we are generally ignorant of the causes that are involved in producing them — especially when human beings are in a more primitive and backward state of society. In these circumstances, the “ignorant multitude” conceives of these unknown causes as depending on invisible, intelligent agents who they may influence by means of prayers and sacrifice. By this means, human beings hope to control what they do not understand and are afraid of. As a result of this process, as shaped by human fears and ignorance, the world becomes populated with human-like invisible, intelligent powers that are objects of worship.

The religion of polytheism is very different from genuine theism in so far as it does not concern itself with the (abstract and speculative) question concerning the origin or supreme government of the universe. These are questions that primitive people who are struggling for their daily survival do not have time to speculate about. To this extent, therefore, polytheists and idolaters may be regarded as “superstitious atheists”, as they plainly have no idea of a being that corresponds to our idea of God (NHR, 145). From their perspective, however, genuine theists are guilty of atheism, since they deny the existence of the “subordinate deities” that polytheists worship (NHR, 148). The clear implication of these observations is that the notion of “atheism” — along with its negative connotations - is entirely relative to a particular religion and its particular conception of god or gods.

The question that Hume now turns to is how theism arose from polytheism. In respect of this issue, Hume observes that there are two conflicting tendencies in human nature.

And thus, however strong men's propensity to believe invisible, intelligent power in nature, their propensity is equally strong to rest their attention on sensible, visible objects; and in order to reconcile these opposite inclinations, they are led to unite the invisible power with some visible object. (NHR, 150)

These conflicting demands are best satisfied by representing the various gods as something like ourselves and attributing particular qualities and attributes to them that are relevant to their specific sphere of influence (e.g., the god of war is cruel and ferocious etc.). Over time, among the vulgar, one of these gods will gradually emerge as a particular object of veneration and worship. In their anxiety to please and praise this god, worshippers will continually try to outdo their predecessors by attributing greater and greater powers and perfections to him. At last they will reach a point where they represent this god as infinite and entirely perfect, whereby they render his nature inexplicable and mysterious. The irony about this, Hume wryly observes, is that the vulgar arrive at a more “philosophical” conception of God way of a process that is shaped by principles that are entirely unguided by reason.

At this stage, Hume's genealogy of religion presents us with an account of the same general conflict that he portrays in Dialogues between Cleanthes's anthropomorphism and Demea's mysticism. This conflict, as Hume explains it, has deep roots in the dynamics of human nature and our conflicting propensities. The result of this process is an inherent instability in theism itself. On the one side, there is a tendency, originally present in polytheism, to anthropomorphize the gods in the hope of placating and controlling them. On the other side, our “exaggerated praise and compliments” produce a refined and abstract idea of god that no longer satisfies the vulgar imagination. The result of this situation is that there is “a kind of flux and reflux in the human mind, and that men have a natural tendency to rise from idolatry to theism, and to sink again from theism into idolatry” (NHR, 158-9).

The feeble apprehensions of men cannot be satisfied with conceiving their deity as a pure spirit and perfect intelligence; and yet their natural terrors keep them from imputing to him the least shadow of limitation and imperfection. They fluctuate between these opposite sentiments. (NHR, 160)

This influence of the human passions and propensities affects the stability of our idea of God in another way. Our natural fear of future events encourages a conception of God that is severe and cruel. At the same time, “the spirit of praise and eulogy” promotes an entirely contrary view (NHR, 176). Clearly, the general point that Hume aims to establish by means of these observations is that the natural sources of religion are in conflict with one another and generate a continual cycle of opposition and instability in our religious beliefs and idea of god.

Hume's primary aim in The Natural History of Religion, as we have noted, is to show that the origin and foundations of religious belief does not rest with reason or philosophical argument. The origins of religious belief rest with human fear and ignorance, which gives rise, in the first place, to polytheism. The same psychological forces that give rise to polytheism gradually transform it into a system of theism. This system of theism is, however, itself a product of conflicting tendencies in human nature that result in an unstable oscillation between anthropomorphic and mystical ideas of god. As a result of this instability, there is a natural tendency for theism to slide back into some form of polytheism that postulates “demi-gods”, in order to satisfy the human need to have some image or impression of God (NHR, 159-60,184). Hume's remarks on this tendency allude, clearly enough, to the case of Jesus Christ understood as the (human) incarnation of God.

The conclusion that Hume draws from all this is that religion generally rests on human weaknesses and vulnerabilities and that reason has little influence over its evolution or stability. While “genuine theism” presents a view of God that is sublime and magnificent, most religion degrades and disfigures the idea of god.

Survey most nations and most ages. Examine the religious principles, which have, in fact, prevailed in the world. You will scarcely be persuaded, that they are any thing but sick men's dreams. Or perhaps will regard them more as the playsome whimsies of monkeys in human shape, than the serious, positive, dogmatical assertions of a being who dignifies himself with the name of rational. (NHR, 184)

9. Religion and Morality

Richard Bentley, the first Boyle lecturer, neatly states the view that many theists hold concerning the relationship between religion and morality:

And if Atheism should be supposed to become universal in this nation… farewell all ties of friendship and principles of honor; all love for our country and loyalty to our prince; nay, farewell all government and society itself, all professions and arts, and conveniences of life, all that is laudable or valuable in the world. [Bentley, Folly of Atheism, in Works, III, 25]

The general view defended by Bentley, and many other apologists for religion, is that without religious principles and institutions to guide and motivate us, the moral world will collapse into nihilism, egoism and the arbitrary rule of power. This view of things was further confirmed, as Hume's near contemporaries saw it, by the philosophy of Hobbes. Hobbes's basic philosophical project was to advance a secular, scientific account of moral and political life. The foundation of this, however, rests with egoism and moral scepticism. That is to say, according to Hobbes, human nature is driven by psychological egoism and there is no real distinction between good and evil, right and wrong, just or unjust. It was a major task of Hume's philosophy — particularly as presented in the Treatise — to reconstruct Hobbes's secular, scientific account of morality while at the same time avoiding the extreme (undiluted) elements of moral scepticism and egoism present in it. Another way of stating these aims, is to say that Hume wanted to show that “speculative atheism” did not imply “practical atheism” or moral licentiousness.

As already noted, Hume's Treatise was modelled after the same plan as Hobbes's project of a “science of man” as presented in The Elements of Law and Leviathan. On the basis of a naturalistic and necessitarian conception of human nature, Hume aims to show how moral motivation and practice is possible (i.e., to describe the possibility and reality of “virtuous atheism”). There are several key elements in Hume's system of secular ethics. One important element is the role of the indirect passions in accounting for the sanctions and support provided to moral life. On Hume's theory the virtues and vices are understood as simply pleasurable or painful qualities of mind (cp. T, 3.1.2). A vicious character, he argues, produces hate and humility (dishonour and shame) that makes us unhappy. In contrast with this, virtue produces love and pride, which makes us happy. This is the fundamental mechanism by which virtue is rewarded and vice is punished. This mechanism operates no less effectively among atheists, who have no belief in God or a future state, as it does among those with orthodox religious beliefs.

Another key element in Hume's system of secular ethics is the role of sympathy. We are naturally constituted, Hume maintains, to share the emotions of our fellow human beings. The closer our relationship, and the more we resemble each other, the stronger the communication of emotion will be (T, 2.1.11; By means of this principle of sympathy, human beings naturally take an interest in the happiness and welfare of others — especially our family, friends and neighbours. Hume denies, therefore, that human nature is wholly selfish or without any benevolent concerns or dispositions. At the same time, Hume also emphasizes the point that our sympathetic and benevolent tendencies are limited and highly partial — both of which pose serious obstacles for social peace and cooperation. Hume denies, in particular, that there is any “such passion in human minds, as love of mankind, merely as such, independent of personal qualities, of services, or of relation to oneself” (T, 481). In this way, while Hume plainly rejects Hobbist egoism and allows that we are naturally social beings in a number of significant respects (i.e., family, friends etc.), he also insists that our human nature is such that self-love and partiality are extremely strong and can and do lead to competition and conflict. This is something that we must find a solution to if we are to be able to live together in groups larger than families and small clans.

Our human nature, combining both passions and reason, provides a remedy for this problem. In the first place, Hume denies that we lack any real standard of right and wrong or good and evil. The relevant standard depends on our sentiments of pleasure and uneasiness (T, / 469). More specifically, our moral sentiments, understood as calm forms of love and hate, enable us to draw the relevant distinctions in this sphere. Hume also claims that in forming these judgments we place ourselves in “a steady and general point of view”, which prevents partiality and variation in our circumstances from prejudicing or distorting our moral evaluations (T, / 581-3).

It is evident that Hume aims to describe a standard of merit and demerit that, although it depends on our given human nature, is in no way arbitrary or without rational constraints. At the same time, Hume's account of justice and the artificial virtues does point to the importance of human conventions, which create or invent the institutions and practices associated with property and promising. There are no obligations that we have in respect of these institutions and practices that are prior to or independent of these conventions. The general basis of our commitment to these conventions is that they serve our individual and collective interest. Failing this, we would have no relevant motive to obey these rules of justice. Clearly, then, with respect to property, there are no natural rights or claims of justice outside our created, conventional practices. It is in this sense that Hume's views on justice and the artificial virtues follow the same general lines of thought already laid down by Hobbes and his followers.

The details and specifics of Hume's system of secular ethics are not our particular concern in this context. What is our concern, however, is to make clear that what Hume aims at, in both the Treatise and the second Enquiry, is to defend the “autonomy” of morality in relation to religion. On this view of things, God and a future state are wholly unnecessary for moral life and human society. The relevant foundation for moral life and conduct rests with the key elements of human nature that we have mentioned — pride, sympathy, moral sense, and conventions. Moreover, the psychological mechanisms involved are strong and steady enough in their influence to ensure that there exists a reliable correlation between virtue and happiness and vice and misery. By these means, we find that human beings are constituted in such a way that they are capable of moral conduct and able to sustain social cooperation and harmony. In so far as religion plays any role here, Hume maintains, it is more likely to corrupt and disturb, than to contribute, to morality or social stability.

Hume's account of the autonomy of morals and its foundations in human nature constitutes the constructive aspect of his views on the religion/morality relationship. In developing this account, Hume draws heavily from earlier work by other freethinking and irreligious philosophers, such as Hobbes, Spinoza, Bayle, and (especially) Shaftesbury. There is, however, a much more critical aspect to Hume's views on the religion/morality relationship. While it is evident that Hume believes that religion is not necessary for morality, he stops short of claiming that religion is always destructive of morality — even though this is a view that would be no more extreme than the contrary view frequently advanced by religious apologists (i.e., that atheists are incapable of moral conduct etc.). Nevertheless, in a variety of contexts, Hume does maintain that religion — especially monotheism — has pernicious and corrupting tendencies.

One of the most sustained discussions of this general theme is in The Natural History of Religion, where Hume compares the effects of polytheism and theism on their believers (Sects. IX-XIV). In this context., Hume points out that while theism may avoid some of the absurdities and barbarisms of polytheism, it is by no means free of these problems. On the contrary, it is Hume's view that theism is prone to intolerance and persecution of its opponents; that it encourages its followers to abase themselves and pursue useless forms of self-denial; that it corrupts and perverts philosophy; that although it is plagued with doubts, it presents a dogmatic attitude to the world; and, finally, that it breeds serious moral vices, including hypocrisy, fraud and cruelty. The tendencies of theism that most concern Hume, however, are its intolerance and opposition to liberty, its distorted moral standard, and its willingness to sanction the “greatest crimes” in the name of piety and devotion (NHR, 182). Hume leaves his readers with the clear view that religion, far from being a source of support for moral practice, is in fact a major source of moral sickness in the world.

Hume returns to these same general themes in the closing passages of the Dialogues. In this context Philo emphasizes the point that the doctrine of a future state has little practical influence over human conduct (D, 122f).

This is well understood in the world; and none but fools ever repose less trust in a man, because they hear, that from study and philosophy, he has entertained some speculative doubts with regard to theological subjects. And when we have to do with a man, who makes a great profession of religion and devotion; has this any other effect upon several, who pass for prudent, than to put them on their guard, lest they be cheated and deceived by him. (D, 123)

Hume makes the further observation that even if religion does not put itself “in direct opposition to morality”, it nevertheless puts forward a “frivolous species of merit” that suggests “a preposterous distribution” of praise and blame based upon a perverted moral standard that is disconnected from any real human needs and interests (D, 124; cp. EM, 3.38 199; 9.3/ 270; 9.15 / 279). Beyond all this, he also points out the particular dangers to society of the clergy when they gain too much power and influence (D, 125). This is a theme that Hume also touches on throughout many of his other writings, including The Natural History of Religion, several of his essays, and his History of England. (See, e.g., NHR, 162-3; “Of National Characters, ESY, 199n3; and HE, III,135f.)

The relationship between religion and morality on Hume's account seems clear. At best, religion has little practical influence in guiding or supporting moral conduct. The most effective and reliable levers for this purpose rest with various elements of human nature that operate independently from our religious beliefs (i.e., pride, sympathy, moral sense etc.). At its worst, which is how we commonly find it, religious principles and institutions disturb and pervert that natural and reasonable moral standards that human nature has provided us with. The most ethical stance we can take in response to religion is to expose its frauds and corruptions and to resist and oppose its influence over human kind. (If Hume had lived to see the influence of religion in the 21st century, there is no reason to believe that his views, in this regard, would change or be modified in any degree.)

10. Was Hume an Atheist?

Having reviewed the central arguments relating to Hume's critique of religion, we may now turn to the question concerning how Hume's views on this subject should be characterized. As noted in the introduction, although many of Hume's own contemporaries were happy to label Hume an “atheist”, our own contemporaries are more divided on this issue. (See the entry on atheism and agnoticism.) It is important to clarify the basis of this disagreement and consider the extent to which this situation reflects ambiguities and ambivalence in Hume's views.

In The Natural History of Religion Hume is careful to point out that “genuine theism” involves more than just a belief that there exists invisible, intelligent power in the world. Hume suggests that those who believe in fairies, goblins, elves and beings of this kind are more like “superstitious atheists” than “genuine theists”. The genuine theist, he maintains, believes, at a minimum, that there exists some “supreme intelligence” that is the origin, creator and governor of this world (NHR, 145). So described, “genuine theism” involves what we may call a “thin” conception of God. There is, on this account no commitment to some further, more specific, set of attributes.

In contrast with thin theism, “thick” theism presupposes a richer set of attributes, such as infinity, omniscience, omnipotence, and moral perfection. From the perspective of thick theism, the believer in thin theism may be viewed as an atheist on the ground that God's essential attributes are either denied or put in doubt. In fact, whether we are judged an atheist or not, may depend, not only on whether the standard of theism is thick or thin, it may also depend on what particular set of “thick” attributes are considered as essential for belief in God.

It is evident that orthodox religious doctrine (e.g., Christianity) requires a thick conception of God (i.e., of some relevant kind). From this perspective, thin theism is no more acceptable as an account of “true religion” than belief in fairies and goblins. It may also be argued, from the orthodox perspective of thick theism, that thin theism is more or less indistinguishable from plain theological scepticism. Although a loose and vague commitment to the existence of an intelligent creator and governor of the universe is allowed, the content of this is so thin and obscure that it is theoretically empty and of little or no practical importance (D, 129; EU, 11.23 / 142). That is to say, thin theism fails to qualify as having any real religious significance for how we live or understand our own existence. This is, indeed, one important point that Hume has Cleanthes and Philo establish in criticism of Demea's brand of (abstract) theological “mysticism” (D, 61-2). When religious belief becomes this diluted, the theist and the sceptic cease to have any significant point of disagreement to divide them. Both are agreed that God's nature and attributes are incomprehensible and well beyond the scope of human understanding.

With these distinctions in hand, it is evident where Hume stands on the issues of substance (i.e., as opposed to verbal disputes about what label we should use to describe Hume's commitments). Clearly Hume is sharply critical of thick theism in all its forms. The claims of theism to establish God's particular attributes – especially when conceived in anthropomorphic terms — are entirely groundless. None of the arguments advanced by thick theists succeed in proving, or even making probable, the existence of a being with the rich set of attributes that orthodoxy generally requires. In respect of the moral attributes, Hume goes further than this and suggests that there are strong grounds for doubting that a being of this kind (i.e. omnipotent and morally perfect) can be the creator and governor of the universe. We may conclude, therefore, that in respect of thick theism Hume is not just a sceptic, he may be legitimately described as an atheist (i.e., he strongly doubts the existence of any such being).

Hume's views in relation to thin theism are not so sharply drawn or well defined. When we turn to the Dialogues, for example, Philo's remarks appear to allow that a reasonable person (e.g., Cleanthes) may conclude “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (D, 129). This seems to be the most that Hume is willing to “concede” to the general position of theism. It is, however, important to stress two points in relation to this. First, Hume makes clear that this mode of (thin) theism leaves us still in a state of “profound ignorance” and that it provides us with “no inference that affects human life” (D, 129-30). In other words, this is a hypothesis that is so “thin” that it is, more or less, both theoretically empty and practically useless. Second, even though Hume may grant thin theism of this kind has some basis in the “remote analogy” between human intelligence and the cause(s) of order in the universe, he also points out that there are other analogies that provide (similar) support for different hypotheses and conjectures. Thin theism, therefore, has no particular claim on us and Hume has little or no interest in it as an instructive or informative hypothesis. The point that he insists on is that all such conjectures and hypotheses are equally arbitrary and groundless and lack any firm foundation in human reason. The only sensible conclusion that we ought to reach on this subject, Hume maintains, is that “the whole is a riddle, an enigma, an inexplicable mystery” (NHR, 185). Clearly, then, it is inappropriate to present Hume as any kind of theist — thick or thin.

In response to this, critics may argue that it does not follow from the fact that Hume was no theist that he was an atheist. While it is true that he rejects thick theism as philosophically groundless, if not incredible, his attitude to thin theism falls well short of this degree of doubt and scepticism. More specifically, even if Hume does not endorse thin theism, he does not deny it either. Consistent with his general sceptical principles, Hume simply “suspends” judgment about all such matters (NHR, 185; cp. 167; EU, 12.25/ 162; D, 36-8). From this perspective, labeling Hume as an “atheist” is misleading because it fails to distinguish properly between his attitude to thick and thin theism. His sceptical attitude to the latter is much more circumspect and qualified than it is to the former. Given these considerations, therefore, we are better advised to describe Hume as a “sceptic” or “agnostic” as concerns his fundamental views on religion.

Although there is some basis for this alternative suggestion, the labels “sceptic” or “agnostic” are themselves, in important respects, highly misleading. In particular, these labels fail to identify properly and highlight the wholly hostile and critical character of Hume's general attitude towards religious doctrine and dogma. More specifically, they incorrectly suggest that on this issue Hume's position is one of intellectual “neutrality” — taking no stand for or against religion. This clearly gets Hume's fundamental commitments and intentions wrong. There is, however, another label that is available to us that avoids all these difficulties. The most accurate and informative label for describing Hume's views on this subject, I suggest, is irreligion. This is a term that both Hume's contemporaries and our own would understand and can apply to Hume's arguments and outlook without any serious misrepresentation. Calling Hume's views on this subject irreligious avoids, on one side, attributing any form of unqualified or dogmatic atheism to him, while, on the other, it also makes clear that his fundamental attitude towards religion is one of systematic hostility and criticism (i.e., he believes that we are better off without religion and religious hypotheses and speculations).

The term irreligion has several other specific advantages. In the first place, as we have noted, it captures the full strength and scope of Hume's sceptical stance concerning the metaphysical claims of orthodox religion. This covers not just his views about the being and attributes of God but also his views about the soul and a future state, miracles and the foundations of morality. Hume's core arguments are intended to leave religious doctrine without any solid philosophical grounds or significant content — much less any practical value or influence. The label of irreligion serves effectively to identify these wider concerns and places appropriate emphasis on Hume's destructive intent in respect of religious systems. Related to this point, by widening our scope of interest in relation to Hume's views on religion, and avoiding a narrow focus on his argument concerning the existence of God, we are encouraged to consider works other than the Dialogues when assessing the nature and character of Hume's views on this subject. It is, for example, especially important that proper weight be given to Hume's effort in the Treatise to discredit the metaphysical and moral paraphernalia of orthodox religious systems and to redirect human investigations to the study of the “science of man”, whereby we may develop a secular, scientific account of the foundations of moral and social life. In so far as we consider Hume's views as advancing a “philosophy of irreligion” (rather than simple atheism) we are more likely to appreciate and capture these more complex and subtle aspects of his thinking on this subject.

When we consider Hume's philosophy from the perspective of his fundamental irreligious aims and objectives it is entirely understandable why his own contemporaries did not hesitate to label him an “atheist”. What they recognized, throughout Hume's philosophical writings, was his effort to show that religion, in almost all forms that his own contemporaries would be familiar with (i.e. Judeo-Christianity), was permeated with philosophical absurdity and corrupt and confused practices. What Hume aimed at, in other words, was to “unmask” religious doctrine and institutions. It was his general ambition to expose the groundlessness of their doctrines as well as the destructive nature of their influence on human life. In pursuing this end — i.e., to free humanity from the yoke of religion, - Hume follows in a tradition that can be traced, before him, to Lucretius, Hobbes and Spinoza and, after him, to thinkers such as D’Holbach, Marx and Nietzsche. Whatever label we place on this tradition (i.e., “atheist”, “irreligious”, “anti-Christian” etc.), there is no doubt that Hume's contributions stand among its greatest achievements and, for the most part, represent it in a particularly humane and measured voice.


Hume's Works

In the entry above, we Follow the convention given in the Nortons' Treatise and Beauchamp's Enquiries: we cite Book . Part . Section . Paragraph; followed by page references to the Selby-Bigge/Nidditch editions. Thus T, 34: will indicate Treatise Bk.1, Pt.2, Sec.3, Para.4/ Selby-Bigge pg.34. References to the Abstract [TA] are to the two editions of the Treatise mentioned above (paragraph/page). In the case of the Enquiries I cite Section and Paragraph; followed by page reference to the Selby-Bigge edition. Thus EU, 12.1/ 149 refers to Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, Sect.12, Para. 1 / Selby-Bigge pg. 149.

T A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd ed. revised by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
MEM “Hume's Early Memoranda, 1729-1740”, edited with a forward by E.C. Mossner, Journal of the History of Ideas, 9 (1948), 492f-518.
LG A Letter from a Gentleman to his friend in Edinburgh, ed. by E.C. Mossner and J.V. Price (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1967).
EU Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, in Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
EM Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1998
ESY Essays: Moral, Political, and Literary, rev. ed. by E.F. Miller (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics,1985).
NHR The Natural History of Religion (1757) in: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, ed. by J.A.C. Gaskin (Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993). Page references are to this edition.
The Natural History of Religion, edited with an introduction by James Fieser (New York: Macmillan, 1992).
D Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (1779) in: Dialogues and Natural History of Religion, ed. by J.A.C. Gaskin (Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press, 1993). Page references are to this edition.
Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and the Posthumous Essays, edited and introduced by R.H. Popkin (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1980).
Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, edited and introduced by Martin Bell (London: Penguin, 1990).
David Hume Writings on Religion, edited and introduced by A. Flew (La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 1992). [This collection contains the complete Dialogues along with a number of other works by Hume concerned with religion.]
LET The Letters of David Hume, 2 Vols., ed. by J.Y.T. Greig (Oxford: Clarendon, 1932).
HE The History of England, 6 Vols., edited by William B. Todd, Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1983.

Primary Works


Early Responses to Hume's Philosophy of Religion

Secondary Works:



Among the many fine articles concerned with Hume's philosophy of religion the following is a small selection, chosen primarily with a view to their introductory value as a good place to begin for further reading on this topic:

For a more complete bibliography relating to Hume's philosophy in general, see the entry on David Hume, by William Morris in this Encyclopedia.

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

afterlife | atheism and agnosticism | Bayle, Pierre | Berkeley, George | Boyle, Robert | Butler, Joseph: moral philosophy | Cambridge Platonists | Clarke, Samuel | Collins, Anthony | cosmological argument | Descartes, René: ontological argument | evil, problem of | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David | Hume, David: on free will | Lucretius | miracles | naturalism | ontological arguments | rationalism vs. empiricism | religion: and morality | Spinoza, Baruch | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence


I am grateful to Doug Jesseph for his comments and suggestions.