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Greek Sources in Arabic and Islamic Philosophy

First published Mon Feb 23, 2009

To some extent, scholars disagree about the role of the Greek sources in Arabic and Islamic philosophy (henceforth falsafa, the Arabic loan word for φιλοσοφία).[1] While acknowledging the existence of a Greek heritage, those who consider the Qur’an and the Islamic tradition as the main source of inspiration for falsafa claim that the latter did not arise from the encounter of learned Muslims with the Greek philosophical heritage: instead, according to them falsafa stemmed from the Qur’anic hikma (“wisdom”). As a consequence, the Greek texts in translation are conceived of as instruments for the philosophers to perform the task of seeking for such wisdom.[2] However, most frequently scholars side with the opinion that what gave rise to the intellectual tradition of falsafa was the so-called movement of translation from Greek.[3] This entry will not discuss the issue, let alone try to settle it: it will limit itself to present the philosophical Greek sources made available from the beginnings of the translations into Arabic to the end of the 10th century. The reason for focusing on the various stages of the assimilation of the Greek heritage, instead of taking into account one by one all the works by Plato, Aristotle etc. known to Arabic readers,[4] is that it is useful to get an idea of what was translated at different times. As a matter of fact, a living interplay took place, especially in the formative period of falsafa, between the doctrines of the philosophers and the Greek sources made available. Of momentous importance for the development of falsafa was the simultaneous translation of Aristotle's Metaphysics, Plotinus' Enneads IV-VI and the Elements of Theology by Proclus. Al-Kindi, the first faylasuf, instigated the intermingling of the Aristotelian and Neoplatonic doctrines; at one and the same time, he reproduced it in his philosophical works. Later on, the knowledge of the complete Aristotelian corpus provided by another generation of translators, without altering substantially this picture, produced a different approach. The Aristotelian science as a systematic whole ruled by demonstration, made available together with Euclid, Ptolemy, Hippocrates and Galen, paved the way for al-Farabi to build up the project of a curriculum of higher education, which was meant to subsume the native Islamic sciences in the broader system of the liberal and philosophical sciences. Both the cross-pollination of the Aristotelian and Neoplatonic traditions of the Kindian age, and the rise of a complete system of rational sciences in the light of Farabi's educational syllabus of the philosopher-king, lie in the background of Avicenna's program to provide the summa of demonstrative science—from logic to philosophical theology—as a necessary step for soul to return to its origin, the intelligible realm (Endress 2006). When Averroes, two centuries after the end of the age of the translations, resumed the project of building up the demonstrative science as a systematic whole, he had recourse to the Greek sources in Arabic translation which were available in the Muslim West, mostly Aristotle and his commentators.[5]

1. The Syriac Background

Before the rise of Islam, a multisecular tradition of learning (Brock 1977, 1994; Bettiolo 2005) had already accomplished in Syria the transition “from antagonism to assimilation” (Brock 1982) of the Greek philosophical culture,[6] especially but not exclusively Aristotelian.[7] Within the theological schools of Edessa and Nisibi, during the and centuries, not only the exegetical works were translated from Greek into Syriac (e.g. those of Theodorus of Mopsuestia), but also some philosophical works (in particular, Aristotle's logical writings and Porphyry's Isagoge). The continuity between the Neoplatonic schools of late Antiquity, with their typical approach to the Aristotelian corpus (Hadot 1991), is best exemplified by Sergius of Resh‘ayna (d. 536), a physician who held a prominent position in the Syriac Church (Hugonnard-Roche 2001, 2004). A former student of Ammonius in the Neoplatonic school of Alexandria, Sergius translated into Syriac some thirty treatises by Galen, the pseudo-Aristotelian De Mundo,[8] a treatise by Alexander of Aphrodisias On the Principles of the All (lost in Greek),[9] the writings of Dionysius the Pseudo-Areopagite and Evagrius Ponticus; he is also the author of a treatise on Aristotle's Categories and another one on the scope of Aristotle's writings.[10] After the Arab conquest of Damascus (635) and the whole of Syria (636), the Christian intellectual communities living under the Umayyad Caliphate (661-750) continued to assimilate Greek philosophy and science,[11] focusing in particular on the Aristotelian logical corpus together with its Neoplatonic introduction, namely, Porphyry's Isagoge. This tradition of learning (Gutas 1983; Brock 1993; Hugonnard-Roche 2004) lies in the background of so many of the Christians of Syria who took part in the translation movement fostered by the early ‘Abbasid Caliphate (Gutas 1988). Albeit superseded in number and importance by the translations into Arabic, those into Syriac continued even within the growing process of the translations into Arabic, in the ‘Abbasid capital Baghdad.

2. Early translations into Arabic

Already in Damascus, under the Umayyads, some philosophical writings had been translated into Arabic. Salim Abu l-‘Ala’, secretary to the caliph Hisham ibn ‘Abd al-Malik (r. 724-743), instigated the translation of the pseudo-Aristotelian letters on government to Alexander the Great.[12] This collection forms the nucleus of the most famous among the “mirrors for princes”, the Sirr al-asrar (Grignaschi 1967, 1976; Manzalaoui 1974), known in the Latin Middle Ages and early modern times as the Secretum secretorum.[13] One of the Arabic translations of the pseudo-Aristotelian De Mundo also traces back to this period (Grignaschi 1965-66). However, it was under the ‘Abbasids (750-1258), and in particular in the first two centuries of their caliphate, that the translations blossomed.

Apparently, the first translations of the ‘Abbasid era were produced under the caliphate of al-Mansur (r. 754-775): his secretary Ibn al-Muqaffa‘ (d. 756)[14] is credited with the translation (or production) of a compendium of Porphyry's Isagoge, plus the Categories, De Intepretatione and Prior Analytics.[15] It has been contended (Gabrieli 1932, Kraus 1934) that this authorship rests on a mistake and that this work should be attributed to the son, Muhammad ibn ‘Abdallah al-Muqaffa‘ (fl. under the reign of al-Ma’mun, see below); however, other scholars accept the father's authorship,[16] with the result that a companion of Aristotelian logic was already available in the first decades of the ‘Abbasid caliphate, under the ruler who founded Baghdad (762). His son and successor al-Mahdi (r. 775-785) had the Topics translated for him by the Nestorian Patriarch Timothy.[17] It has been advanced that the ancient Arabic translation of the Rhetoric, “edited” by Ibn al-Samh (d. 1027),[18] traces back to the century (Aouad 1989c, 456-7). Under the reign of Harun al-Rashid (r. 786-809) a translation of Aristotle's Physics was made by a certain Sallam al-Abrash.[19] Neither translation has come down to us.

3. The translations of the “circle of al-Kindi”: Aristotle, the Neoplatonic tradition and the rise of falsafa.

A great deal of translations made under the reign of al-Ma’mun (r. 813-833) and his successors are extant. The new interpretation of Islam and of the role of the caliph promoted by al-Ma’mun,[20] as well as the increasing interest in the secular sciences of the elites of Islamic society,[21] created the context for the development of the translations into Arabic. Even though the court library (Bayt al-hikma,“House of Wisdom”)[22] cannot be viewed as an institutional center for the translations of Greek works into Arabic,[23] a close relationship existed between the activities of the first group of translators and the court. The leader of this group, the encyclopaedic scientist and first faylasuf Abu Ya‘qub ibn Ishaq al-Kindi,[24] was appointed as the preceptor of the son of the successor of al-Ma’mun, al-Mu‘tasim (r. 833-842): one of Kindi's works is addressed to al-Ma’mun, whereas his major metaphysical writing, On First Philosophy,[25] is addressed to al-Mu‘tasim. How do we know that there was a group of translators and that al-Kindi was its leader? The ancient sources give a hint to this, in so far as they mention, for instance, that the earliest translation of Aristotle's Metaphysics was made for him.[26] Also, the incipit of the well-known Theology of Aristotle claims that he acted as the revisor of this work, in fact an adapted translation of parts of Plotinus' Enneads IV-VI. Since it has been established (Endress 1973) that the same lexical and syntactical features of the two translations just mentioned are shared by other translations from Greek, one can be reasonably sure that several translators exchanged among themselves and with al-Kindi: the latter has been described as the spiritus rector of this group (Endress 1997a; 2007). The translations of this circle include works by Plato, Aristotle, Nicomachus of Gerasa, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Plotinus, Proclus, John Philoponus and Olympiodorus. It is worth noting that the texts of Plotinus, and in part those of Proclus and Philoponus, did not circulate under the names of their authors: Plotinus (Rosenthal 1974) and Proclus circulated under the name of Aristotle, and Philoponus under the name of Alexander of Aphrodisias (see below).

Plato. An early translation of the Timaeus is mentioned in the bio-bibliographical sources,[27] but it has not come down to us. The circulation of at least parts of the Symposium,[28] Phaedo (Aouad 1989a), and Republic[29] should be acknowledged in the age of al-Kindi.

Aristotle. The early translation of the Metaphysics made for al-Kindi has come down to us;[30] the translator is the otherwise unknown Ustath.[31] Other Aristotelian works translated within the Kindi's circle are the Prior Analytics,[32] Sophistici Elenchi,[33] De Caelo,[34] Meteorologica,[35] De Generatione animalium and De Partibus animalium,[36] Parva Naturalia,[37] plus a Neoplatonic paraphrasis of the De Anima (Arnzen 1998; 2003). In addition to the genuine Aristotelian works, some pseudepigrapha were also either translated in this period, or produced within the circle of al-Kindi: these are of pivotal importance for the rise and development of falsafa. It has been established on firm grounds (Endress 1973) that the circle of al-Kindi produced the translation and reworking of significant parts of the Enneads IV-VI (known as the Theology of Aristotle)[38] as well as the translation and reworking of Proclus' Elements of Theology (known as the Book by Aristotle on the Pure Good). The Theology[39] was the most influential of the two in the Arabic-speaking world, whereas the Book by Aristotle on the Pure Good[40] was bound to become immensely famous in the Latin world, under the title Liber de Causis. Other pseudo-Aristotelian writings trace back to this period: the K. al-tuffaha (Liber de Pomo), namely, a reworking of the Phaedo with Aristotle replacing the dying Socrates (Aouad 1989a), and a Physiognomic (Thomann 2003).

Nicomachus of Gerasa. The Introduction to Arithmetic was translated within the circle of al-Kindi (Altmann-Stern 1958, 35; Endress 1997a, 55).

Alexander of Aphrodisias. (i) Commentaries. The first book of Alexander's commentary on the De Gen. corr., lost in Greek, is said to have been translated by Qusta ibn Luqa,[41] a physician and translator who came from Baalbek to Baghdad in the first decades of the 9th century and had exchanges on medical and philosophical matters with al-Kindi.[42] (ii) Personal works. Of prominent importance are two writings lost in Greek: On Providence (Fazzo-Wiesner 1993) and a cosmological treatise known in Arabic as On the First Cause, the effect and its movements (ed. Endress 2002). From the circle of al-Kindi comes also the translation of a series of Alexander's genuine Quaestiones, intermingled in the manuscript sources with propositions of Proclus' Elements of Theology (Endress 1973).

Plotinus. Around AD 840 parts of Enneads IV-VI (devoted in the Porphyrian edition of Plotinus' writings to soul, the intelligible world and the One) were translated into Arabic.[43] The problems about this translation, and in particular about the transformation of parts of it into the Theology of Aristotle, will be dealt with in a separate entry.[44] For the present purposes, it will suffice to mention the fact that a Prologue is added to the Theology of Aristotle, in which an author, speaking as if he were Aristotle, proclaims to have devoted this treatise to the First Cause, Intellect and Soul, after having dealt with matter, form, the efficient and final causes in his Metaphysics.

Proclus. As we saw before, the Elements of Theology were translated into Arabic within the circle of al-Kindi (Endress 1973); some propositions were attributed to Alexander of Aphrodisias under various titles -- On the First Cause, On the Existence of Spiritual Forms with no matter, On the Difference between eternity and time, On Coming-to-be, On the Body (van Ess 1966; Endress 1973; Zimmermann 1994). This collection of Proclus' propositions is sometimes labelled as Account of what Alexander has extracted from Aristotle's book called Theology (Endress 1973, 53; Zimmermann 1986, 189-90; Goulet-Aouad 1989a, 133; Fazzo 2003, 64-5). Another writing by Proclus, extant in Greek only through the quotations by John Philoponus in his De Aeternitate mundi contra Proclum, was translated into Arabic in this period: the Eighteen arguments on the Eternity of the Cosmos against the Christians (Endress 1973, 15-16; Gutas 1975, 47).

John Philoponus. The bio-bibliographical sources mention his commentary on the Physics, translated partly by Ibn Na‘ima al-Himsi and partly by Qusta ibn Luqa.[45] Also, fragments of an adapted translation of parts of the De Aeternitate mundi contra Proclum were known[46] under the name of Alexander of Aphrodisias (Hasnaoui 1994; Giannakis 2002-3).

Olympiodorus. A commentary on the De Gen. corr., lost in Greek, is said to have been translated by Ustath.[47]

In addition to these works, translated within the circle of al-Kindi, two doxographies were translated into Arabic in this period: the Placita of the pseudo-Plutarch, accounting for Greek cosmologies from the Presocratics to the Stoics,[48] and the Refutation of all the Heresies by Hyppolitus of Rome; the latter was reworked in the light of the theological discussions of the 9th century Baghdad and attributed to Ammonius, the Alexandrian commentator of Aristotle.[49]

Thanks to this first set of translations, learned Muslims became acquainted with Plato's Demiurge and immortal soul; with Aristotle's search for science and knowledge of the causes of all the phenomena on earth and in the heavens, culminating in the doctrine of the Unmoved Mover; with Alexander's cosmology and explanation of providence; with Plotinus' hierarchy of the principles One, Intellect and Soul; with Proclus' systematic account of how the One—irrestistibly identified with Aristotle's Unmoved Mover—gives rise to the multiplicity of our universe; finally, with John Philoponus' philosophical arguments for creation. The translation of Proclus' arguments in favour of the eternity of the cosmos against the Christians, as well as of John Philoponus' reply to them, also made learned Muslims acquainted with the fact that the Greek philosophers were at odds on some crucial issues. The adaptations which appear in the reworking both of Plotinus' Enneads (D’Ancona 2006) and of Hyppolitus doxography attributed to Ammonius (Rudolph 1998) show the strategy to deal with this problem typical of the circle of al-Kindi: a strategy which will be successful in the long run. The idea of the basic unity of the Greek philosophical tradition and the twin claim of its intrinsic harmony with the Qur’anic doctrine of the tawhid (divine oneness) will be established by the endorsing, apparent in Kindi's own works, of the Aristotelian model of the accumulation of knowledge by trial and error (Metaphysics, A).

His [Kindi's] treatise On the First Philosophy demonstrates in an elaborate deduction, dependent directly or indirectly on the Platonic Theology of Proclus, the absolute unity of the First Cause. Philosophy is engaged to defend the tawhid, the fundamental tenet of Islamic monotheism, against the temptation of dualism. Concepts provided by the Christian Neoplatonism of Johannes Philoponus and by Arabic excerpts from Plotinus and Proclus (available to him under the name of Aristotle) are used to describe the First Cause as the Creator of the world, the efficient cause of a creatio ex nihilo (ibda‘). The perennial hikma of the ancient philosophy is thus shown to give guidance towards unequivocal and irrefutable knowledge, ‘even though they may have fallen short slightly of some of the truth’. (…) Al-Kindi's creed will be echoed for centuries later by Ibn Rushd in his Decisive Word in defense of philosophy: ‘The truth will not contradict the truth’. (Endress 1990, 6-7)

4. The translations of Hunayn ibn Ishaq, his son Ishaq and their associates: the complete Aristotelian corpus and Alexander of Aphrodisias's universe

Another group of translators takes the floor a bit later: the one of the Nestorian physician and scientist Hunayn ibn Ishaq (d. 873) (Bergsträsser 1913, 1925; Gabrieli 1924; Meyerhof 1926a, 1926b; Haddad 1974; Strohmaier 1990) his son Ishaq ibn Hunayn (d. 911) and their associates. In addition to the medical corpus of Galen,[50] this group of translators made available in Syriac and/or in Arabic other works by Plato, Aristotle, Theophrastus, Galen, Alexander of Aphrodisias, Porphyry, perhaps Iamblichus, Themistius, Proclus and John Philoponus.

Plato. The Arabic translation of the Timaeus made by Ibn al-Bitriq within the circle of al-Kindi was either corrected by Hunayn ibn Ishaq, or superseded by the latter's translation.[51] Also the Laws were translated by Hunayn,[52] but neither translation has come down to us. Hunayn ibn Ishaq is credited also with an exegesis of the Republic.[53] To his son Ishaq is attributed the translation of a dialogue which might be the Sophist, together with a commentary, possibly by Olympiodorus.[54]

Aristotle. The K. al-Fihrist credits Hunayn ibn Ishaq with the translation of the Categories.[55] Hunayn also translated the De Interpretatione into Syriac and Ishaq made the Arabic translation of it.[56] The Prior Analytics were translated into Syriac partly by Hunayn and partly by Ishaq, and into Arabic by a certain Tayadurus.[57] The Posterior Analytics were translated into Syriac, partly by Hunayn and in their entirety by Ishaq.[58] The latter made a Syriac translation also of the Topics,[59] but the translation which has come down to us is the Arabic one, made by Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi[60] (books I-VII) and by Ibrahim ibn ‘Abdallah (book VIII).[61] The K. al-Fihrist tentatively attributes to Ishaq a translation of the Rhetoric,[62] but the extant anonymous Arabic version does not bear the features of the translations of this period and has been ascribed to an earlier stage.[63] Ishaq also translated the Physics into Arabic.[64] As for the De Caelo, the K. al-Fihrist mentions a revision made by Hunayn on Ibn al-Bitriq's version.[65] Hunayn is also the author of a compendium of the Meteorologica (Daiber 1975). The De Generatione et corruptione was translated into Syriac by Hunayn and into Arabic by Ishaq; two other translations are mentioned, by Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi and Ibn Bakkus.[66] All the translations mentioned are lost, although not without having left some traces.[67] As for the De Anima, in the K. al-Fihrist we are told that Hunayn translated it into Syriac in its entirety, that Ishaq made another partial translation, and eventually a complete translation into Arabic.[68] Ishaq ibn Hunayn also retranslated (or revised) the Metaphysics.[69] He is also credited with the translation into Arabic of the Nicomachean Ethics.[70] In addition to the genuine Aristotelian works, some spuria were also translated by Hunayn and his associates: Hunayn himself possibly translated the Problemata Physica (Filius 2003, 593-98); also the compilation of the so-called De Lapidibus has been ascribed to him (Zonta 2003, 652-54). Ishaq ibn Hunayn made the Arabic version of the De Plantis (Drossart Lulofs-Poortman 1989; Hugonnard-Roche 2003b, 499-505), and Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi is credited with the translation of the De Virtutibus et vitiis.[71]

Theophrastus. The De Causis plantarum and in part the De Sensu et sensato were translated by Ibn Bakkus, one of the translators associated with Hunayn's circle.[72]

Nicolaus Damascenus. His compilation On the Philosophy of Aristotle was translated into Syriac by Hunayn ibn Ishaq: the extant fragments from the first five books are extant and edited.[73] The commentary on the De Plantis too was translated by Hunayn ibn Ishaq (Drossart-Lulofs 1965, 16).

Galen. The compendium of Plato's Timaeus has been translated into Syriac by Hunayn ibn Ishaq and from Syriac into Arabic by Hunayn's pupil ‘Isa ibn Yahya ibn Ibrahim: the Arabic text has come down to us and forms volume I of the Plato Arabus.[74]

Alexander of Aphrodisias. (i) Commentaries. The commentary by Alexander on Book Lambda of the Metaphysics, lost in Greek together with the rest of Alexander's commentary beyond book Delta, is said to have been translated into Syriac by Hunayn ibn Ishaq.[75] The Arabic translation, based in all likelihood on this Syriac version, is lost, but several extracts of it survive in Averroes' commentary on the Metaphysics (Freudenthal 1885; Bouyges 1952, clxxviii-clxxix). (ii) Personal works. Hunayn ibn Ishaq translated Qu. III 3 on sense-perception (Ruland 1978), and his son Ishaq in all likelihood is the translator of Alexander's De Anima.[76] Two Arabic translations of the treatise On the Principles of the All[77] have come down to us: one by Ishaq ibn Hunayn[78] and the other by Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi (Genequand 2001; 31-9). Even more important for the subsequent developments of falsafa was Ishaq's Arabic translation of the short treatise On Intellect (see Finnegan 1956; Badawi 1971, 31-42; Goulet-Aouad 1989, 134; Geoffroy 2002).

Porphyry. The Isagoge, already available through the compendium of Ibn al-Muqaffa‘, has been translated by Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi.[79] Among Porphyry's works, the bio-bibliographical sources also mention an Introduction to the Categorical Syllogisms translated by Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi.[80] A commentary on the Categories is recorded in the K. al-Fihrist[81] and served as a source for Ibn Suwar's[82] “edition” of Hunayn's translation of the Categories (Elamrani Jamal 1989, 511). A commentary on the Physics, lost in Greek, is also mentioned.[83] Ishaq ibn Hunayn also translated into Arabic the commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, lost in Greek.[84]

Iamblichus. The anonymous translation of a commentary on Pythagoras' Golden Verses attributed to Iamblichus possibly belongs to this period.[85]

Themistius. Ishaq's Arabic translation of the paraphrasis of the De Anima, mentioned in the sources,[86] is extant and edited (Lyons 1973; Elamrani Jamal 2003, 352-53). The Arabic translation of a Letter by Themistius On Government is attributed to Abu ‘Uthman al-Dimashqi (Gutas 1975, 47).

Proclus. Ishaq translated again also the Eighteen Arguments on the Eternity of the Cosmos against the Christians.[87]

John Philoponus. Even though there are no compelling reasons to ascribe it to the milieu of Hunayn, the translation of Philoponus' treatise Against Aristotle on the Eternity of the World[88] might trace back to this period.[89]

Olympiodorus. A paraphrasis of the Meteorologica translated by Hunayn ibn Ishaq and corrected by his son Ishaq[90] has been discovered and edited by ‘A. Badawi (Badawi 1971, 95-190). The text, however, is very different from the one preserved in Greek (Schoonheim 2003, 326).

Together with the translations of the Galenic corpus, Hunayn, Ishaq and the other translators associated with them put at the disposal of learned Muslims the Aristotelian corpus in its entirety. This enterprise paved the way to the understanding of Aristotle's thought as a systematic whole based on the theory of demonstrative science and crowned by the Metaphysics, an understanding which is apparent both in al-Farabi and in Avicenna (Endress 1997b; Reisman 2005; Gutas 2005; Bertolacci 2006). The translation of Alexander's treatises On the Principles of the All and On Intellect helped to shape the metaphysical cosmology and noetics of Medieval Arabic philosophy. A hierarchy of separate, intellectual substances is seen as striving towards Aristotle's Unmoved Mover, also called the “True One” by both al-Farabi and Avicenna, in a purely Neoplatonic and Kindian vein. In doing so, they imitate the motionless causality of the First Principle by their eternal circular movement (Pines 1986; Martini Bonadeo 2004). This warrants for the regularity of the laws of nature in the sublunar world. The Agent Intellect also belongs to this hierarchy of separate substances: the “light” shed by the Agent Intellect is seen as the condition for the human potential intellect to actually know the intelligibles (Walzer 1970).

In texts in which al-Farabi lays down his program for philosophical education, such as the Enumeration of the Sciences, he explains that metaphysics has three parts. The first one studies beings qua beings; the second studies the principles of the theoretical sciences, such as logic and mathematics; the third studies beings that are neither bodies nor in bodies and discovers that they form a hierarchy leading to the First or One, which gives existence, unity, and truth to all other beings. It also shows how all other beings proceed from the One. (…) The presentation of the third part shows that al-Farabi has abandoned al-Kindi's view of the One as beyond being and intellect, and that he equates some features of Aristotle's Prime Mover who is an Intellect with those of the Neoplatonic One. He also distinguishes the First or God from the agent intellect. As the First knows only itself, emanation is necessary and eternally gives rise to the world. Al-Farabi intends to tidy up all the unresolved questions of Aristotle's Metaphysics and to develop a theological teaching. (Druart 2005, 334)

5. The translations of Abu Bishr Matta ibn Yunus, Yahya ibn ‘Adi and the Baghdad Aristotelians: the “Humanism” of the Buyid Age

Towards the middle of the 10th century, another set of translations into Arabic has been produced by the Nestorian Christian Abu Bishr Matta ibn Yunus (d. 940) (Endress 1991a) and his pupils. Abu Bishr Matta received his Aristotelian education at the monastery of Mar Mari and came to Baghdad, where in the first decades of the 10th century he had al-Farabi, a Muslim, and Yahya ibn ‘Adi, a Jacobite Christian, among his pupils.[91] He had no Greek and his translations were made on the basis of the Syriac translations already extant.[92]

Plato. Another translation of the Laws is attributed to Yahya ibn ‘Adi by the ancient sources.[93]

Aristotle. Abu Bishr Matta translated into Arabic the Syriac version of the Posterior Analytics made by Ishaq ibn Hunayn[94] and the Syriac translation of the Poetics.[95] Even though he had no Greek, the ancient sources mention also a translation by him into Syriac (hence, from Greek) of the Sophistici Elenchi.[96] The sources mention also a partial translation of the De Caelo by him,[97] as well as a translation of the De Generatione et corruptione.[98] Abu Bishr Matta also translated the De Sensu et sensato[99] and Book Lambda of the Metaphysics, together with Alexander of Aphrodisias' commentary.[100] To his pupil Yahya ibn ‘Adi—who was also a Christian theologian and the author of philosophical treatises[101]—is attributed the Arabic version of the Syriac translation of the Topics made in the previous century by Ishaq ibn Hunayn.[102] Yahya ibn ‘Adi is credited also with the Arabic translation of the Sophistici Elenchi from the Syriac version of Theophilus of Edessa,[103] as well as of the Poetics.[104] One of the Christian pupils of Yahya ibn ‘Adi, Abu ‘Ali ibn al-Samh, was the “editor” of the ancient translation of the Rhetoric: it is this text which has come down to us.[105] Abu ‘Ali ibn Zur‘a, another Christian of this milieu, might have translated an Alexandrian compendium of the Nicomachean Ethics known as Ikhtisar al-Iskandaraniyyin (Summa Alexandrinorum) (Dunlop 1982; Zonta 2003, 197). The Xth century Baghdad Aristotelian Abu l-Faraj ibn al-Tayyib[106] translated the pseudo-Aristotelian De Virtutibus et vitiis and Divisiones (Ferrari 2006, 30), and might be also the translator of the pseudo-Aristotelian Economics (Zonta 2003, 549).

Theophrastus. His Metaphysics is said to have been translated by Yahya ibn ‘Adi.[107]

Nicolaus of Damascus. Abu ‘Ali ibn Zur‘a, a Christian philosopher of the circle of Yahya ibn ‘Adi, translated into Arabic (in all likelihood from the Syriac version made in the previous century by Hunayn ibn Ishaq[108]) the Compendium of Aristotle's Philosophy.[109] The same Abu ‘Ali ibn Zur‘a began to translate Nicolaus' compendium of the De Animalibus.[110]

Alexander of Aphrodisias. (i) Commentaries. Abu Bishr Matta translated Alexander's commentary on the De Generatione et corruptione, lost in Greek but partially preserved in Arabic,[111] as well as the commentary on the Meteorologica.[112] He made also a partial translation of the commentary on the De Caelo.[113] (ii) Personal works. Abu Bishr Matta translated Alexander's treatise On Providence[114] (which was known also to the circle of al-Kindi [Fazzo-Wiesner 1993]).

Themistius. Themistius' paraphrasis of the Physics[115] was known in the circle of Abu Bishr Matta (Endress 1977, 35) and some notes which trace back to it are reproduced in a MS housed in Leiden, which contains the text of the Physics as it was studied in the Baghdad school.[116] In this milieu his paraphrasis of the De Caelo, lost in Greek, was also translated.[117] Abu Bishr Matta translated the paraphrasis of Book Lambda of the Metaphysics.[118]

Proclus. The De Decem dubitationibus circa providentiam was known to Yahya ibn ‘Adi (Endress 1973, 30).

Simplicius. The commentary on the Categories is mentioned in the bio-bibliographical sources[119] and was known to Ibn Suwar, the “editor” of the so-called “Organon of Baghdad” (see Hugonnard-Roche 1993).

Olympiodorus. Abu Bishr Matta translated into Arabic his commentary on the Meteorologica, in all likelihood from the Syriac version made by Hunayn ibn Ishaq.[120] The commentary on the De Gen. corr., translated also by Ustath at the beginnnings of the translation movement, was translated by Abu Bishr Matta and revised by Yahya ibn ‘Adi.[121] A commentary on the De Anima, unknown in Greek, is also mentioned as extant in Syriac.[122] Finally, the “Allinus” who wrote a commentary on the Categories[123] might be Elias, the pupil of Olympiodorus; however, other names have been advanced for the identity of this translator (Elamrani Jamal 1989, 151-2).

Typical of this period was the detailed exegesis of Aristotle's ipsissima verba made possible by the translations into Arabic of the old versions (often Syriac), as well as of the commentaries. Far away from Baghdad, Avicenna will argue time and again against the interpretations of Aristotle advanced within the context of the Baghdad school of philosophy (Pines 1952; Gutas 2000). Nevertheless, he will continue to rely on the corpus of the Greek sources made available in the previous centuries, not only in the trivial sense of the access they provided to the Greek thought for an Arabic readership, but also in the less evident sense of the philosophical agenda set by the thinkers who assimilated the Greek heritage. Together with the meticulous exegesis of the text of Aristotle, the ideal of carrying on the search for the lore and science of the Ancients, taken as a whole, is a prominent feature of the philosophical circles of this era, apparent both in the production of collections like the Siwan al-hikma (The Repository of Wisdom)[124] and in the ideal of the attainment of happiness through philosophy.

The overriding objective of the Islamic humanists was to revive the ancient philosophic legacy as formative of mind and character. (…) The philosophers considered the ultimate aim of man to be happiness (eudaimonia/sa‘ada). Happiness, they thought, is achieved through the perfection of virtue, preeminently by the exercise of reason. Attainment of this happiness, or perfection, was said to be something divine, as Aristotle had stated in the Nicomachean Ethics. They depicted this attainment in noetic terms, as the conjoining of man's (particular) intellect with the divine (universal) intellect. The end of man was conceived as being his self-realization as a god-like being—we may say his ‘deification’. By rising above the perturbations of sense and the disquiet of the emotions to the serene realm of the intellect and the divine, the philosophical man escapes worldly anxiety (qalaq) and reaches tranquillity (sakina). (Kraemer 1992, 6 and 19)

The attitude to search for happiness in the intellectual life and to rely on the heritage of the Ancients as a guidance in search of the “science of the things in their truth, ‘ilm al-ashya’i bi-haqa’iqiha” and personal achievement bridges the gap between the beginnings of falsafa in the age of al-Kindi and the developments of the Muslim West, when Averroes will conceive his project of commenting upon the Aristotelian corpus (Endress 1998; 2004).


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Al-Farabi | Al-Kindi | Alexander of Aphrodisias | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, disciplines in: natural philosophy and natural science | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, disciplines in: philosophy of language and logic | Aristotle | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Ibn Rushd | Olympiodorus | Philoponus | Plato | Plotinus | Proclus | Theology of Aristotle


My warmest thanks go to Deborah L. Black for her help with the English of this entry.