Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Mar 25, 2002; substantive revision Tue Apr 18, 2006

Impartiality is sometimes treated by philosophers as if it were equivalent to moral impartiality. Or, at the very least, the former word is often used, without the qualifying adjective ‘moral’, even when it is the particularly moral concept that is intended. This is misleading, since impartiality in its broadest sense is best understood as a formal notion, while moral impartiality in particular is a substantive concept — and one concerning which there is considerable dispute. This entry will be predominantly concerned with moral impartiality — the sort of impartiality, that is, that commonly features in normative moral and political theories. We begin, however, by addressing the broader, formal concept.

1. The concept of impartiality

The most common mistake made by philosophers in their use of the words ‘impartial’ and ‘impartiality’ is that of assuming that such words denote a positive, unitary concept — presumably a concept closely linked with, if not identical to, morality. This, however, is simply not the case. Rather, there are various sorts of behavior that may be described as ‘impartial,’ and some of these obviously have little or nothing to do with morality. A person who chooses an accountant on the basis of her friends' recommendations may be entirely impartial between the various candidates (members of the pool of local accountants) with respect to their gender, their age, or where they went to school. Yet if her choice is motivated solely by rational self-interested considerations then it is clear that the impartiality she manifests is in no way a form of moral impartiality. To take a more extreme case, consider an insane serial killer who chooses his victims on the basis of their resemblance to that some celebrity. The killer may be impartial with respect to his victims' occupations, religious beliefs, and so forth, but it would be absurd to regard this as a form of moral impartiality (despite the fact that, in certain contexts, morality does require impartiality with respect to such considerations.)

It is also worth noting that some types of impartiality may in themselves be immoral or morally questionable. Suppose that I decide to pass along a treasured family heirloom to one of my two sons, Bill and Phil. Flipping a coin would constitute one type of impartial procedure for choosing between the two. But suppose that I have already promised the heirloom to Phil, on several occasions. In this case it would be quite wrong to allow a coin toss to determine whether he gets it. Deciding by means of a coin toss would be an impartial procedure, but it would be the wrong sort of impartiality here, for it would ignore the moral obligation created by my previous promises.

It is important, then, to recognize that moral impartiality is a particular species of impartiality, and that the latter, unqualified, denotes a much broader concept. In this broad sense, impartiality is probably best characterized in a negative rather than positive manner: an impartial choice is simply one in which a certain sort of consideration (i.e. some property of the individuals being chosen between) has no influence. An analysis along these lines has been proposed by Bernard Gert. Gert's analysis holds that “A is impartial in respect R with regard to group G if and only if A's actions in respect R are not influenced at all by which member(s) of G benefit or are harmed by these actions” (Gert 1995, p.104). Thus, for Gert, impartiality is a property of a set of decisions made by a particular agent, directed toward a particular group.

Gert's analysis captures the important fact that one cannot simply ask of a given agent whether or not she is impartial. Rather, we must also specify with regard to whom she is impartial, and in what respect. Gert's analysis, then, permits and indeed requires that we make fairly fine-grained distinctions between various sorts of impartiality. This is necessary, since one and the same agent might manifest various sorts of partiality and impartiality towards various groups of persons. Consider, for instance, a university professor who is also a mother of five children, and who is currently acting as a member of a hiring committee. Such an agent might be impartial between her children with respect to the care they receive (while preferring her own children over others in this respect), and also impartial between the various job candidates; but it is clear that these two uses of the word ‘impartial’ denote very different practices. In particular, the idea of merit applies in one case but not the other: to be impartial between job candidates is presumably to select between them on the basis of merit, whereas to be impartial between one's children is not to think of merit at all, but rather to provide equal protection and care to all.

Many attempts to characterize impartiality fail to respect the distinction between the broadest, most formalistic sense of the notion, and a more specifically moral impartiality. To say, for instance, that an impartial choice is one that is free of bias or prejudice is to presuppose that we are dealing with a certain sort of impartiality, that which is required or recommended by morality, or at least worthy of moral approbation. ‘Bias’ and ‘prejudice’ are loaded terms, suggesting not only that some consideration is being excluded, but also that the exclusion is appropriate and warranted. Similarly, the idea that impartiality requires that we give equal and/or adequate consideration to the interests of all concerned parties goes well beyond the requirements of the merely formal notion. (In the coin toss case, it is quite clear that Phil's claims to the heirloom are not being given equal or adequate consideration.) As a characterization of moral impartiality, however, this suggestion is considerably more promising.

2. Morality and impartiality

2.1 The impartial point of view

It is generally agreed that some sort of close connection obtains between morality and impartiality. Indeed, the phrases ‘moral point of view’ and ‘impartial (or ‘impersonal’) point of view’ are sometimes used interchangeably to refer to the imagined impersonal perspective from which, it is supposed, moral judgments are to be made (Baier 1958, chapter 8; Harsanyi 1982; Scheffler 1982, 1985; Smith 1976 [1759]; Wolf 1992; see also Blum 1980, Chapter 3). As noted above, however, the word ‘impartial’ is a general term with many particular species; it follows from this that the phrase ‘impartial point of view’ is itself ambiguous. At most, it might be that the moral point of view constitutes one sort of impartial point of view.

Even this claim, however, faces difficulties. While impartiality may play a significant role in moral behavior, it is not clear that it is sufficient to exhaust the demands of morality. Treating a person appropriately and respectfully may well require certain sorts of emotional and/or cognitive responses: sensitivity to her needs and values, empathy for her suffering, and the like. But if these responses are pictured as the results of positive traits or attributes (and not simply as, say, the result of a lack of bias or prejudice), then it is not clear that merely being impartial between persons is sufficient to guarantee that one will possess and display the necessary sensitivities. Indeed, characterizations of impartial agents which proceed in negative terms (that is, by defining various preferences, emotions or bits of information that she does not possess or that do not move her) often risk picturing the impartial agent as impersonal and even indifferent (Henberg 1978; Brandt 1954).

A second problem for the claim that the moral point of view is identical with (some version of) the impartial point of view — or indeed, for any view which identifies morality and impartiality — is that it seems plausible to regard some forms of moral partiality as morally admirable, and perhaps even morally required (Blum 1980; Cottingham 1983, 1986, 1996; Jeske & Fumerton 1997; Jollimore 2001; Kapur 1991; Kekes 1981; MacIntyre 1984; Oldenquist 1982). Loyalty to one's family, community or country, for instance, is commonly regarded as a virtue. Yet such an attitude is a clear and indeed paradigmatic example of partiality, requiring that an agent feel and act differently toward one set of persons than she does toward humanity in general. Similarly, certain specific moral duties arising from certain particular relationships seem to involve partiality in an irreducible manner. Parents, for example, are thought to be morally obliged to take special care of their own children; to regard one's child as merely one among millions would be regarded as highly eccentric if not monstrous. Of course, some moral duties do require that an agent be impartial in performing them. But on common sense moral views at least, impartiality seems mostly to be required in the context of specific roles — such as when a person is acting as a judge, an umpire, a journalist, or a representative of some public institution (Baron 1991; Blum 1980; Cottingham 1983). The idea that impartiality is a pervasive and universal moral requirement seems to contradict our ordinary moral intuitions.

Whether there exists such a thing as morally admirable partiality is the main issue that separates the so-called partialists from the impartialists. Partialists, in general, tend to claim that morally admirable partiality does exist, that it cannot be reduced to any form of impartiality at a more fundamental level, and that these facts pose a serious problem for those who claim that morality and (some form of) impartiality are identical, or even closely related. Impartialists, by contrast, either deny the existence of morally admirable partiality altogether, or hold that any apparent cases are in fact ultimately reducible to impartial standards (see section 6). Thus impartialists hold that — contrary, perhaps, to appearances — impartiality is, indeed, a pervasive and universal requirement of morality.

2.2 The ideal observer theory

Rather than being put in terms of an impartial point of view, the relation between morality and impartiality is sometimes made out in terms of an impartial agent or observer — a person who makes moral judgments without being influenced by the sort of contaminating biases or prejudices that tend to arise from the occupation of some particular point of view. (Smith 1976 [1759]; Hume 1978 [1740]; Firth 1952; Brandt 1954; Hare 1989.) (We should note that this idea is not always clearly distinguished from the conception based on the impartial point of view; Smith 1976 [1759], for instance, seems to advance them both at once, in claiming that the ideal observer simply is the observer who occupies the impartial point of view.)

The observer may also be defined as ‘ideal’ in various other ways. It is generally stipulated that she is in possession of all the nonmoral facts that are relevant to the judgments she has to make (Firth 1952). It is also fairly common to assume that she is an ideal reasoner, and thus immune to logical fallacy or mistaken inference, etc. (Indeed, Hare goes so far as to state that his ‘archangel’ possesses “superhuman powers of thought, superhuman knowledge and no human weaknesses” (Hare 1989, p. 44).) The ‘ideal observer theory’ of morality, in its most straightforward form, states that moral judgments simply are the judgments an ideal observer of this sort will make.

What must be pointed out about such a conception of morality, for our purposes, is that any advantage it has over the conception of morality as an impartial point of view presumably arises from the fact that the ideal observer is not completely defined in terms of impartiality. (If she were, the two conceptions would simply coincide.) Yet many ideal observer theorists seem to accept a characterization of the ideal observer which concentrates on her impartiality and impersonality. Firth, for example, suggests that the ideal observer is both ‘distinterested,’ in the strong sense of being ‘entirely lacking in particular interests,’ and ‘dispassionate,’ in that she is ‘incapable of experiencing any emotions at all.’ (Firth, 1952) Defined in this way, however, the ideal observer sounds not only impersonal but deeply indifferent; and the idea that the moral judgments of a person who had neither emotional responses nor particular interests could be trusted, let alone that they might be considered definitive of morality, strikes some critics as highly implausible (Brandt 1979).

Suppose, then, that the ideal observer theorist decides that the definition of the ideal observer must include more than the bare idea of impartiality — that in addition the observer must be, say, compassionate (and thus not indifferent); and that she must possess a considerable facility for proper moral judgments — practical wisdom, in the Aristotelian sense. Such a theorist will now face a different problem: the more we build into the definition of our ideal observer, the less useful it becomes as a heuristic device. Stipulating that the ideal observer is very wise, for example, is not very helpful if we ourselves are not wise, and so have no idea what an ideally wise observer would choose. Indeed, ideal observer analyses that go too far in this direction seem to become circular — the ‘ideal’ observer is ideal because she always makes proper judgments, those being defined as just those judgments the ideal observer would make (Broad 1959, p. 263). A circularity of this sort seems to be present in John Stuart Mill's claim:

Impartiality, in short, as an obligation of justice, may be said to mean, being exclusively influenced by the considerations which it is supposed ought to influence the particular case in hand; and resisting the solicitation of any motives which prompt to conduct different from what those considerations would dictate. (Mill 1861/1992, p. 154; see also Firth 1952, p. 336)

The ideal observer, then, to be useful, must be given some independent definition, and not simply defined as ‘an agent who always gets it right.’ The challenge, of course, is to find such a definition. Here, as with the conception of morality as defined by an impartial point of view, the phenomenon of morally admirable partiality proves a particularly difficult issue. Should we define the ideal observer as being loyal to her country, or as being above loyalty? If the former, can she serve as an adequate moral example to people who do not share her allegiances? If the latter, how can she serve as an adequate example to anyone? The persistent problem that faces the ideal observer approach to moral impartiality seems to be that any process of idealization of the sort required to make such a conception work seems likely to result in an individual so removed from the concrete lives and concerns of actual human moral agents, that her moral judgments will turn out to be in large part irrelevant to the question of how such agents ought to live (see Walker 1991).

2.3 Moral impartiality and equality

The moral importance of the impartial point of view is that from it, every moral agent counts equally: no one, including the person occupying that point of view, is considered to be intrinsically more significant than anyone else, or to have more powerful claims to attention simply by virtue of who they are. Similarly, one of the primary virtues of the ideal observer seems to be that she also regards persons in this way. Whatever these conceptions may get wrong, then, one thing they seem to get right is the idea that there is a close and important connection between moral impartiality and equality (see especially Nagel 1991, Chapter 7).

Some clarification, however, is required. To say that from the impartial point of view, no one is seen as intrinsically more significant than anyone else, is not to say that there is no reason whatsoever for which a person might count as more significant than others, or for which a person might legitimately demand disproportionate moral attention in some circumstances. Many moral theorists, after all, will suppose that from the impartial point of view, properly conceived, some individuals will count as more significant, at least in certain ways. William Godwin (Godwin 1793) provides an influential, and rather infamous, example. Fenelon, the archbishop of Cambrai, Godwin writes, may be supposed to be more significant than a mere chambermaid, and it follows — at least according to Godwin — that in the case of a fire, the archbishop ought to be rescued first. The reason, however, is not simply that the archbishop happens to be himself — that is, his greater significance is not supposed to be intrinsic; rather, the claim is grounded on the fact that the archbishop makes greater contributions to society:

We are not connected with one or two percipient beings, but with a society, a nation, and in some sense with the whole family of mankind. Of consequence that life ought to be preferred which will be most conducive to the general good. In saving the life of Fenelon, suppose at the moment when he was conceiving the project of his immortal Telemachus, I should be promoting the benefit of thousands who have been cured by the perusal of it of some error, vice and consequent unhappiness. Nay, my benefit would extend further than this, for every individual thus cured has become a better member of society and has contributed in his turn to the happiness, the information and improvement of mankind. (Godwin 1793, 41-42)

The claim that the archbishop is more significant, then, is grounded on what are essentially universal properties: if the chambermaid also had it in her to write Telemachus, her claim to be rescued would be just as great. Fenelon's claim to priority is not based on his intrinsic significance. In Godwin's mind, the fact that one individual has a greater claim to rescue than the other is not only not in conflict with impartiality, but indeed is implied by impartiality, for it is based on the (alleged) fact that an impartial judgment of their worth attributes more to one than to the other.

Thus, viewing persons from an impartial point of view need not imply that we view them equally, in every sense of the word; and it certainly does not imply that everyone must receive equal treatment. (In Godwin's Archbishop Fenelon, if we assume that only one person can be saved, the only way to give the archbishop and the chambermaid equal treatment would be to let them both perish in the flames.) What impartiality seems to require is not that everyone receive equal treatment, but rather that everyone be treated as an equal (Dworkin 1977, p. 227). While the distinction between equal treatment and treatment as equals is difficult to make out with precision, the main idea is fairly clear: treatment as equals requires that persons are not treated equally, but rather treated in accordance with what rights they possess, what legitimate claims they put forward, and, in general, with what they deserve. Thus, to inflict a one year jail sentence on all accused persons, regardless of whether they are guilty or innocent, is to provide equal treatment to members of that group; but it is not to treat them as equals.

Whether or not moral impartiality obliges us to see the archbishop as having a greater claim to be rescued is, of course, controversial. Moreover, Godwin asserts two even more controversial claims in connection with the Archbishop Fenelon example. The first is that the chambermaid herself ought to have perceived the greater significance of the archbishop, and so should have sacrificed her own life for his, were that necessary. The second is that any other person — even the child or husband of the chambermaid — ought to have been willing to make the same sacrifice:

Supposing the chambermaid had been my wife, my mother or my benefactor. That would not alter the truth of the proposition. The life of Fenelon would still be more valuable than that of the chambermaid; and justice — pure, unadulterated justice — would still have preferred that which was most valuable. Justice would have taught me to save the life of Fenelon at the expense of the other. What magic is there, in the pronoun ‘my’ to overturn the decisions of everlasting truth? My wife or my mother may be a fool or a prostitute, malicious, lying or dishonest. If they be, what consequence is it that they are mine? (Godwin 1793, pp. 41-42)

Whether this extreme position really is required, either by moral impartiality or by the demand that we treat people as equals, is a matter of great dispute, not only between partialists and impartialists but within the impartialist camp itself. If nothing else, Godwin's position is quite clearly incompatible with the apparent existence of morally admirable partiality. ((Williams 1981) holds that even to consider sacrificing one's wife for the sake of impersonal justice constitutes a kind of moral error in its own right.) Moreover, despite the fact that the ultimate evaluation is made on the grounds of perfectly general properties, it is not entirely clear that the objects of the evaluation really are being treated as equals, in the relevant sense — the fact that the chambermaid's life is to be sacrificed for the overall good at least suggests that her standing as a moral being is not really being taken into account, and that the suggested understanding of moral impartiality is therefore deficient.

Indeed, John Taurek (1977) has famously argued that the various goods of individual persons cannot be added up to a total ‘overall’ good in any meaningful sense, and that the traditional consequentialist conception of right action as maximizing the overall good is incoherent; indeed, Taurek claims, such decision-making actually fail to show equal respect for all persons concerned. (Taurek's denial that one can aggregate various individual goods can be regarded as a strong version of the Rawlsian claim that morality must respect a ‘distinction between persons.’) Suppose a lifeguard must choose between saving one drowning person or saving five; whomever she chooses not to save will drown, and she cannot save both groups. Most consequentialists (and many others) would take it as obvious that, at least in the absence of very special circumstances (the solitary drowner's being the potential author of Telemachus, for instance) the five should be saved rather than the one. But to assume this, Taurek argues, would be to fail to show the one the same respect one shows the five: after all, this response leaves the single victim no chance at all of being rescued. Taurek's controversial suggestion is that the lifeguard would show equal respect by flipping a coin, as this would every person involved an equal chance (fifty percent) of being rescued. Not surprisingly, Taurek's (in)famous argument has engendered a substantial amount of discussion and criticism (see for instance Kamm 1993 Chapters 5 & 6, Kavka 1979, Otsuka 2000, Parfit 1978.)

3. Moral impartiality (1): Consequentialist moral theories

3.1 The nature of consequentialist impartiality

Consequentialist moral theories hold that moral evaluations and justifications must ultimately be grounded in the value of the consequences of the actions, rules, policies, strategies, character traits, etc. that are being evaluated (Hooker 1994). That is, the ultimate question to be asked of any action, rule, or character trait under evaluation is, “Does it [the action, rule, or trait in question] promote the good?” For the purposes of this entry, three important assumptions will be made regarding consequentialist theories. First, consequentialist theories will be assumed to hold that the overall values of sets of consequences can be determined, and thus ranked, independently of the identity of any particular agent (thus, we can speak of the ‘best’ consequences without having to ask, ‘best relative to whom?’) Second, such theories will be assumed to hold that the impersonal good (i.e. the overall value of some particular state of affairs) is largely if not entirely composed of the interests of individual persons, and that the interests of each person count for just as much as those of every other person. Finally, it will be assumed that we are dealing with act consequentialist theories — theories, that is, which hold that the consequentialist standard is to be applied directly to the actions of agents, and that what is required is that every action (or overall pattern of action) maximize the impersonal good. Such a theory, then, requires that every agent always choose an action that will bring about consequences at least as good as those that would be brought about by any other available action. (It should be noted that rule consequentialism, which holds that the consequentialist standard is to be applied to rules of action rather than directly to actions themselves, is excluded by this set of assumptions. Rule consequentialism does incorporate a significant form of moral impartiality, but it is not the sort that is incorporated by more traditional act consequentialist theories (Howard-Snyder 1993).)

Together, these three assumptions regarding the nature of consequentialism result in a theory which, on the surface at least, seems to place each agent under a pervasive obligation to be strictly impartial between all persons, by requiring her always to exclude from her practical deliberations (almost) all considerations that do not bear directly on the ways in which people's interests might be advanced or injured by her actions.

The consequentialist standard, then, is strictly impartial in a very rigorous sense. A consequentialist agent is not permitted to prefer herself, nor any of her loved ones, in choosing a distribution of benefits and burdens. She may not accept a pleasure for herself if doing so involves passing up the opportunity to bring about a slightly larger pleasure for a stranger. Nor is she permitted to feed her own children if she could do more good by feeding hungrier strangers instead. She must sacrifice the life of a spouse, parent or child if, by doing so, she would save more lives, or even save the life of one other person whose contribution to the overall good would be greater than that of the person sacrificed. (Recall Godwin's Archbishop Fenelon case, discussed in section 2.3.) It is for reasons such as this that consequentialist impartiality is accused of being too demanding. By refusing to allow the agent's personal concerns to play a special role in her practical deliberations, it is claimed, consequentialism threatens her integrity and alienates her from herself and others (Kapur 1991, Scheffler 1982, Stocker 1976, Williams 1973, 1981). As Brian Barry has written, the effect of consequentialist impartiality “is, in effect, to extend to the whole of conduct the requirements of impartiality that on the common-sense view are restricted to judges and bureaucrats acting in their official capacities.” (Barry 1995, p. 23) The kind of impartiality that features in consequentialist theories, then, seems to be much more pervasive, and much more severe, than that recommended by common sense morality.

3.2 Is consequentialist impartiality too demanding?

The fact that consequentialist impartiality turns out to have such strict and demanding implications is, for the consequentialist, a double-edged sword. On the one hand, there is no doubt that consequentialism is a deeply impartial moral theory; on the plausible and popular assumption that a moral theory must be deeply impartial, consequentialism meets this criterion with flying colors. And consequentialists have typically been adept at exploiting this fact with powerful rhetoric (Godwin's famous query, ‘what magic is there in the pronoun ‘my’?’ being a noteworthy example.) On the other hand, the impartial demands of consequentialism are so strict and so extreme that some critics have found them unacceptable: consequentialism, they claim, simply demands too much and must therefore be rejected (Scheffler 1982, Slote 1985, Williams 1981).

Essentially, this worry is a version of what we referred to above as the puzzle of morally admirable partiality. The common-sense view is that it is permissible for an agent to be partial toward herself; that is, to treat her own projects and concerns as if they had special significance (Scheffler 1982). (From her point of view of course, they do have special significance.) This sort of self-concern, then, constitutes a form of partiality which seems, from the vantage point of common sense, to be morally endorsed. Similarly, certain sorts of partiality directed toward other people — friends, family members, and the like — are also forbidden by consequentialist impartiality, but regarded as justifiable, and in many cases admirable, from the standpoint of common sense (Blum 1980, Cottingham 1983, Kekes 1981, Slote 1985).

Defenders of consequentialism generally respond in one of three ways. First, a consequentialist might argue that any genuinely impartial moral theory will make extreme demands of agents. Second, they might argue that the view that consequentialism is excessively demanding depends on a false theory of practical reasoning, which accords too much significance to morality. Third, they might argue that in fact, the demands of consequentialism are not as extreme as have been supposed.

The first strategy faces a severe difficulty: namely, it at least seems to be the case that certain non-consequentialist moral theories — in particular, deontological theories — also incorporate impartial elements in a fundamental manner, and yet make demands on the moral agent which are considerably less extreme than those of consequentialism. Thus, while some consequentialists (e.g. Brink 1989) have argued that the truth of consequentialism can be logically derived more or less directly from the requirement that morality be impartial, this seems to be a mistake (Scheffler 1992, pp. 105-109). Of course, it is open to the consequentialist either to deny that deontological moral theories are genuinely impartial (Kagan 1989; Scheffler 1982, 1985), or to argue that, properly understood, any plausible ethical theory will be seen to make demands comparable to those made by consequentialism (Brink 1989, Ashford 2000). Both of these strategies, however, face difficulties; as we will see in section 4, there is in fact a very strong case in favor of viewing at least some deontological theories as genuinely and fundamentally impartial — a case which nevertheless does not prohibit us from viewing such theories as less demanding than their consequentialist rivals.

The second strategy is to argue that those who object to consequentialism on the grounds that it is too demanding are placing too much importance on the role of morality in practical reasoning (Brink 1989; Wolf 1982, 1992). If moral considerations dominated practical reasoning — if, that is, they were the only or at any rate by far the most significant considerations in determining our actions — then consequentialism would be untenable, on account of its demanding too much. A proper perspective on practical reasoning, however, reveals that moral demands constitute only one set of demands among many. When put in their proper place then in the larger scheme of practical reasons and requirements, the extreme demands of consequentialist morality will no longer seem threatening. To borrow a pair of phrases from David Brink, what appear to be ‘moral worries’ about the tendency of consequentialism to make excessive moral demands, might really be ‘worries about morality’ — worries, that is, about whether or not we have reason to act as morality requires. Whether the view of morality presupposed by this strategy is true, however, is questionable; at the very least, it does not seem to be the case that the majority of those who have defended consequentialism as a normative theory of ethics have intended it to be viewed as a theory that could be frequently or easily overridden (Jollimore 2001, Chapter 3; see also Peter Railton (1984), Richard Miller (1992, Chapter 10).

The third strategy is perhaps the best known and most frequently employed. It is argued that, given a reasonable and accurate view of human nature and the abilities of agents, it will be seen that what consequentialism requires is not a radically different sort of life from the one most of us currently live; rather, consequentialism will require (in most cases, at least) only reasonable, and relatively minor, adjustments in our current lifestyles. In particular, it is argued that consequentialism permits the agent both to give preference to her own projects and concerns, and to favor particular other individuals (friends, family members, etc.), and that all this is consistent with the agent's having as her overriding project the maximizing of the good. The locus classicus of this argument is found in Mill's Utilitarianism:

The objectors to utilitarianism cannot always be charged with representing it in a discreditable light. On the contrary, those among them who entertain anything like a just idea of its disinterested character, sometimes find fault with its standard as being too high for humanity. They say it is exacting too much to require that people shall always act from the inducement of promoting the general interests of society. But this is to mistake the very meaning of a standard of morals, and to confound the rule of action with the motive of it […] The great majority of good actions are intended, not for the benefit of the world, but for that of individuals, of which the good of the world is made up; and the thoughts of the most virtuous man need not on these occasions travel beyond the particular persons concerned, except so far as is necessary to assure himself that in benefiting them he is not violating the rights — that is, the legitimate and authorized expectations — of any one else. The multiplication of happiness is, according to the utilitarian ethics, the object of virtue: the occasions on which any person (except one in a thousand) has it in his power to do this on an extended scale, in other words, to be a public benefactor, are but exceptional; and on these occasions alone is he called on to consider public utility; in every other case, private utility, the interest or happiness of some few persons, is all he has to attend to. (Mill 1992 [1861], pp. 64-66.)

Similarly, Godwin (1968 [1801]) argues that

True wisdom will recommend to us individual attachments […] since it is the object of virtue to produce happiness; and since the man who lives in the midst of domestic relations will have many opportunities of conferring pleasure, minute in the detail, yet not trivial in the amount. (Quoted in Cannold, et al., 1995)

(This position, of course, appears to be in some amount of tension with the more extreme consequentialist position attributed to Godwin in section 2.3).

More recent versions of this argument follow Mill's basic strategy. Peter Railton (1984) argues that a ‘sophisticated’ consequentialist will develop patterns of decision-making that do not, except on rare occasions, refer explicitly to consequentialist aims and goals, and that both the psychology and the outward behavior of such an individual will be similar to that of the typical non-consequentialist. Similarly, Frank Jackson (1991) argues that the most efficient strategy for a dedicated consequentialist is to concentrate on small groups of particular persons, rather than trying to promote the well being of humanity at large, and that this will involve the formation of close personal relationships with other individuals. Others who have deployed versions of this argument include Bales (1971), Brink (1989), and Pettit & Brennan (1986).

The evaluation of this consequentialist strategy is a difficult issue. Consequentialists are surely correct to point out that obsessive consequentialist strategizing is likely, at a certain point, to turn counter-productive, and that a consequentialist agent is therefore well-advised to develop more moderate approaches. On the other hand, Mill and many other consequentialists seem to underestimate the amount of good that a dedicated consequentialist agent might be able to contribute, and thus, to underestimate the amount of good that she will be required to contribute. Moreover, our powers to influence the lives of strangers have increased considerably since Mill's day. As Susan Wolf writes, “[T]his argument is simply unconvincing in light of the empirical circumstances of our world. The gain in happiness that would accrue to oneself and one's neighbors by a more well-rounded, richer life than that of the moral saint would be pathetically small in comparison to the amount by which one could increase the general happiness if one devoted oneself explicitly to the care of the sick, the downtrodden, the starving, and the homeless” (Wolf 1982, p. 428; see also Singer 1972). Moreover, while a theory such as Railton's sophisticated consequentialism can acknowledge that a sophisticated consequentialist agent might sometimes knowingly bring about less than maximally good consequences, such a theory must nonetheless continue to insist that each particular act of doing so is indeed morally wrong — an insistence which seems contrary to our moral intuitions (Jollimore 2001). It is not clear, then, that an appeal to the limits of human powers can succeed in converting what is, after all, a fundamentally radical moral theory, into a comfortably conservative one.

3.3 Consequentialist impartiality and justice

In addition to claiming that consequentialist impartiality is too demanding, many critics have also argued that it is too permissive. Since consequentialism makes the permissibility of an action entirely dependent on the value of that action's consequences, it follows that there is no type of action that can be prohibited on consequentialist grounds (except, of course, for that ‘type’ which is defined explicitly in terms of sub-optimal consequences.) Thus instances of torture, premeditated murder, rape, and other violations of fundamental human rights are at least potentially justifiable on a consequentialist basis; no such action can be ruled out, morally speaking, until the comparative value of the state of affairs it will bring about has been determined.

The effect of this complaint, like the previous one, is not to deny the claim that consequentialism is a deeply impartial moral theory, but rather to suggest that it incorporates the wrong sort of impartiality. Suppose, to take an example common in the literature, that consequentialism recommends that an man be convicted of, and punished for, a crime he did not commit, in order to prevent the public from rioting (McCloskey 1963). Such an action would, according to common intuitions, constitute a gross violation of justice; and it seems a weak reply to point out that the recommendation was arrived at through an impartial calculation — a calculation that took the interests of every individual (including the framed man) into equal account. For while the claim is, strictly speaking, true, there is nevertheless a clear and compelling case in favor of concluding that the framed man was not treated impartially, in the sense that ought to matter here. We expect a judicial system to allocate punishments in accordance with degree of guilt, not in accordance with the expected value to society of the consequences in each case; and the fact that both methods constitute forms of impartial decision-making does not imply that they are equally morally acceptable.

Again, the classic response to this objection dates back to Mill's Utilitarianism (1992 [1861]). If institutions of justice are to be given a general justification, Mill argues, this justification must find its ultimate grounding in utility to society; for what else could explain why justice is valued at all, other than the fact that it serves and protects our interests? But since a justice system will only succeed in this role if it is governed by common principles of justice — principles including, for instance, that only the guilty should be punished, and that the punishment ought to be proportional to the crime — it follows that such principles are not opposed to consequentialism at all. Rather, at the deepest justificatory level, consequentialism and the demands of justice coincide.

The claim that such a coincidence generally obtains is probably easy to establish. The challenge for Mill, and for other consequentialists, arises in those particular cases in which the coincidence fails. Assuming that the possibility of such cases does not move one to simply abandon consequentialism in favor of some more justice-friendly conception (such as the rule consequentialism Mill himself sometimes seems to find attractive), there are two general defense strategies for consequentialists to employ. The first strategy argues that there are good consequentialist reasons for being the sort of agent who respects the dictates of justice even in cases in which the coincidence between the demands of justice and those of consequentialism fails (Pettit 1997; cf. Railton 1986). The second strategy admits that there are cases in which unjust actions can be given a consequentialist justification, but holds that when so much as it stake, justice must give way to consequentialism's demands (Smart 1973; Kagan 1989; Pettit 1997). Whether either approach is sufficient, given the apparent depth and force of our common intuitions about the requirements of justice, is a matter of ongoing debate.

4. Moral impartiality (2): Deontological moral theories

4.1 Deontological impartiality and the personal point of view

In section 3.2 we noted that while consequentialist impartiality is one possible interpretation of the demand that morality be impartial, it is not by any means the only available interpretation; nor is it clearly the most plausible. The considerations related to justice discussed in section 3.3 may help us to appreciate this. For consider once more the position of the framed innocent, whose fundamental interests have been sacrificed for the sake of the greater good. Such a person may well complain that he has not been treated impartially, in the appropriate sense; for, while it is true that his interests were counted in determining the nature of the overall good, it is nevertheless also true that ultimately, he became the victim of a form of abuse that was both harsh and undeserved. The framed innocent might also back up his complaint by making the plausible claim that, had he been in a position to choose, he would never have consented to a moral system that allowed anyone to be accorded such treatment. Thus, while there is a sense in which his interests were counted equally, there is another and very important sense in which his interests — and perhaps more importantly, his claims and rights — do not seem to have received full or adequate consideration at all.

Deontologists insist that consequentialism errs by failing to accord proper significance to the moral agent as an individual; in John Rawls' words, consequentialism “does not take seriously the distinction between persons” (Rawls 1971, section 5). (Rawls has utilitarianism in particular as his target, but the point applies more widely.) The fact that consequentialist impartiality makes extraordinary and, to many, unreasonable demands on the individual (section 3.2) indicates that consequentialism fails to take individuals seriously as agents. And the fact that consequentialist impartiality permits the individual to be used as a mere means when doing so promotes the greater good (section 3.3) indicates that consequentialism fails to take individuals seriously as patients. The conception of impartiality that tends to be favored by deontologists avoids such implications by refusing to view impartial action simply as a matter of maximizing interests (or some other version of the impersonally determined good.) Indeed, deontologists take the right rather than the good to be fundamental to ethics, and tend to see moral action in terms of acting in accordance with principles that are rationally acceptable to all.

Exactly what these principles are, and exactly what method should be used to determine them, are matters of some disagreement among deontological theorists. But there does seem to be a general consensus among deontologists that moral impartiality does not require that an agent be strictly neutral between her own good and the good of other people in ordinary decision-making contexts. Rather, an agent is permitted on deontological views to give special attention to her own projects and interests. An important distinction can be drawn here between first-order and second-order impartiality (Barry 1995). First-order impartiality is that displayed by an agent in ordinary choice situations — choosing how to spend one's day, who to spend time with, and so forth. Second-order impartiality, by contrast, operates only in a certain, special sort of context: contexts in which the rules, principles and institutions which govern first-order behavior are evaluated and selected. Thus a moral rule granting individuals complete freedom of association, and thus allowing them to display first-order partiality by spending time with whomever they please regardless of whether doing so promotes the greater social good in any particular case, might be given a second-order impartialist justification by demonstrating that such a rule would promote the impersonal good, or that it would be selected by a group of impartial persons who were choosing the moral rules that were to govern society.

The fact that deontological theories generally permit (some degree of) first-order partiality — that is, that agents are permitted to pay special attention to their own interests, projects, and loved ones — should not, then, be taken to imply either that the agent's interests are objectively more valuable than those of other persons, or that the agent is justified in viewing them as such. Rather, the deontologist will claim, it reflects the fact that it is morally legitimate (perhaps, again, because justifiable in second-order impartialist terms) for an agent to regard her own goals and interests as especially important to her. Thus, deontological moral systems tend to incorporate an irreducible element of agent-relativity of a sort that consequentialist theories cannot embody (Nagel 1986; McNaughton & Rawling 1992, 1993, 1998; Jollimore 2001).

The incorporation of agent-relativity of this sort into deontological theories allows such theories to escape the most straightforward versions of the claim that they demand too much of moral agents (Jollimore 2001). Nevertheless, various versions of that objection have been leveled against deontological theories. It has been claimed, for instance, that Kantianism, by insisting that only actions performed out of the motive of duty have moral worth, delegitimizes or even forbids the type of motives which typically (and perhaps necessarily) operate in the context of close personal relationships (Stocker 1976; Williams; 1981). Typically, Kantians have responded by distancing themselves from the view that only actions motivated by duty have value, and acknowledging instead that a commitment to duty need only function as a limiting condition, rather than as the primary source of motivation in all cases (Baron 1995). The Kantian account of moral value, of course, is not essential to deontological theories; and those theories which eschew it may well be able to avoid the demandingness objection altogether.

4.2 Impartiality and universalizability

On many deontological views, particularly Kantian ones, the significance of moral impartiality is seen as arising from the fact that a core role is given to the concept of universalizability (Gert 1998; Hare 1981; Kant 1964 [1785]; Kohlberg 1979). The requirement that moral judgments be universalizable is, roughly, the requirement that such judgments be independent of any particular point of view. Thus, an agent who judges that A ought morally to do X in situation S ought to be willing to endorse the same judgment whether she herself happens to be A, or some other individual involved in the situation (someone who, perhaps, will be directly affected by A's actions), or an entirely neutral observer. Her particular identity is completely irrelevant in the determination of the correctness or appropriateness of the judgment.

Universalizability, thus formulated, does imply at least one sort of impartiality: an agent whose judgments are universalizable will be morally consistent, in the sense that she will judge her own actions by the same standards she applies to others. Such an agent will not make an exception of herself by allowing herself to break a rule she regards as binding for others, or to perform any other action which she would not accept if performed by another agent. Impartiality of this sort, however, does not necessarily imply any sort of impartiality with respect to other individuals' interests, rights, or claims. On a minimally demanding interpretation of the universalizability requirement, the judgments made by a person whose conception of the good was intrinsically racist — that is, a person who held that the well-being of members of some one particular race mattered more (or less), objectively speaking, than the well-being of members of other races — could very well turn out to be universalizable, so long as the racist held that his judgments were objectively correct, and so ought to be assented to by all individuals — including those individuals who would be disadvantaged by the general adoption of those views (cf. Gewirth 1978, p. 164; Gert 1998, Chapter 6; Wiggins 1978; Williams 1985, p. 115).

However, the conclusion that the racist's judgments are universalizable presupposes a very minimal account of what universalizability requires. On this account, it requires only that an agent be sincerely committed to the objectivity of his judgments, in the sense that he views them (from his current perspective) as correct from all perspectives, and thus as calling for everyone's assent (whether or not that assent is actually given.) There are two ways of making the universalizability requirement more demanding. The first is to appeal to certain counterfactual claims about what the agent would endorse if he actually did occupy various perspectives. On this view, a particular judgment by A is universalizable if and only if A endorses that judgment from his current perspective, and would endorse the same judgment from any other perspective. Given this understanding of universalizability, it is much less likely — indeed, extraordinarily unlikely — that racist views will turn out to be universalizable; for it is not generally true of individuals that they would endorse the view “The well-being of members of race R matters less than the well-being of members of other races” if they themselves were members of race R. However, such a view may well require too much, for there are few if any moral judgments or principles that would be endorsed from every perspective any given agent might occupy.

A different approach to universalizability eschews the appeal to psychological facts altogether, and holds that whether or not a particular judgment is universalizable is a logical fact rather than a psychological one. Kant's categorical imperative test, for example, holds that universalizability is the distinguishing feature of correct moral judgments, and that a judgment is universalizable if and only if it can, without contradiction, be willed as a universal practical law (Kant 1964 [1785]). Since the test hinges on whether the willing of a judgment as a universal law results in a contradiction, it follows that whether or not a judgment is universalizable in this way is a matter of practical reason, and does not depend on which particular individual's will happens to be involved.

The types of impartiality implied by both of these more demanding versions of the universalizability requirement are likely to be considerably more substantial than the formal consistency required by the minimal version. Kant, for instance, seems to hold that universalizability implies a certain level of altruism or charity, in the form of the imperfect duties we owe towards other individuals. There are problems, however, with Kant's argument for this. In particular, it is not clear just how the universal willing of a maxim such as “When others are in need of help, I always ignore their needs” give rise to any sort of contradiction. It is true, of course, that, were we actually in a position to choose the universal maxims on which all rational persons would act, this would be a poor choice, for we might someday be in need of assistance from another. But to say that the willing of this maxim as a universal law would be imprudent is not to say that doing so is contradictory. Moreover, as David Wiggins (1978) points out, certain other actions that seem as if they ought to be morally permissible — the act, for instance, of releasing a debtor from his debt out of generosity — have maxims that seem to fail the universalizability test so conceived. These examples may point to a general problem with the attempt to derive impartiality from universalizability: whereas the latter, at least on a Kantian interpretation, is a formal property of moral judgments, moral impartiality, as we have seen, is a substantive rather than a formal concept. (See Herman 1993 and Korsgaard 1996 for attempts to respond to these problems.)

It should be mentioned that some moral theorists have attempted to derive various versions of consequentialist impartiality more or less directly from the universalizability requirement (Hare 1981, Pettit 2000; see also Harsanyi 1982). However, the claim that a conception of impartiality that is not only substantive but also extraordinarily demanding can be derived from a requirement which, as just pointed out, is essentially a formal one, continues to strike a majority of moral philosophers as dubious.

4.3 Contractualist models of deontological impartiality

The requirement that moral judgements be universalizable seems to reflect two fundamental moral insights: first, that morality is objective, and not simply a matter of personal opinion or expression of interest and desire; and second, that from the standpoint of morality, each person matters just as much as, and no more than, any other person. The contractualist approach to moral theorizing provides one method of giving expression to these fundamental ideas about morality.

Contractualism borrows from the social contract tradition the idea that morality may be viewed as the result of an agreement between those who are to be bound by its dictates. Two variants of this approach can be distinguished. The former, sometimes referred to as contractarianism, identifies the participants in the bargaining process with actual individuals, and thus is broadly historical. The latter approach, by contrast, appeals to what agents would choose under various, quite possibly unrealizable conditions, and is thus hypothetical rather than historical. It is the latter approach that will concern us here.

The hypothetical contractualist model, then, regards moral principles as the result of a bargaining process among a group of agents, subject to certain restrictions that are specified so as to guarantee that the chosen principles will meet the demands of second-order impartiality. The most famous example of this approach is John Rawls' ‘veil of ignorance’, as described in (Rawls 1971). According to Rawls, the principles of a just society are those that would be chosen by self-interested rational agents in the ‘original position’ — a position in which agents possess broad knowledge about human history and the nature of the world they live in, but are denied specific information regarding their own particular identities or prospects in the society in question, the nature of that society, and, crucially, the nature of their own particular conception of the good. Since nobody knows who they will be or what social position they will occupy, there is no opportunity for anyone in an advantaged position to take advantage of that position in order to force a less privileged party to concede to an otherwise unacceptable outcome. It is this fact that allows Rawls to claim that principles chosen under the veil of ignorance are guaranteed to be impartially acceptable to all — and thus, guaranteed not to be unjust.

It should be noted that Rawls does not intend that morality in its entirely be derived from the original position. Rather, the function of the original position is limited to the choice of the most general principles of social justice in a well-ordered society (Rawls 1971, section 2; 2001, section 12). Nevertheless, Rawls' mechanism is intended to draw the broad outlines of what many see as the most important part of morality: its public or political aspect. By viewing political morality as the result of an agreement between contractors limited by the strictures of the veil of ignorance, Rawls intends to develop a political philosophy that reflects his commitment to the idea of liberal neutrality: the idea, that is, that each person has a private right to her own conception of the good, and that particular conceptions of the good therefore ought not to be legislatively instituted, nor legislated against

An especially difficult task attending a project of this sort is that of determining what shape this political morality will take — that is, determining which principles would be chosen by agents in the original position. On Rawls' account, the contractors settle on principles that guaranteed as much liberty as possible for all and, within the limits set by this guarantee, a roughly egalitarian distribution of goods in which inequalities are allowed only if they are to the benefit of the worst off (Rawls 1971, section 11; 2001, Part II). The claim that such principles would recognize all persons as equals — and thus, their claim to reflect the demands of moral impartiality — is supported by several considerations, of which three are perhaps most significant: first, that all persons are guaranteed equal (and substantial) civil liberties; second, that the resulting allocation of resources is broadly egalitarian, and in particular, ensures, so far as is possible, that the fundamental needs of all persons are met; and third, that since the only inequalities that are permitted are those that would benefit the least advantaged, it can presumably be assumed that the least advantaged would give their assent to the existence of such inequalities (they would not, even if they could, veto the system.)

In Rawls' scheme, the function of the veil of ignorance is necessary to prevent rational self-interested persons from using their knowledge of their own positions to win unfair advantages over others. (Whether such an approach can provide genuine impartiality between competing conceptions of the good is a difficult question that will be further considered in section 5.) An alternative approach abandons both the veil of ignorance and the assumption that the bargaining parties are primarily self-interested. This is the strategy favored by T.M. Scanlon, whose contractors are motivated not by self-interest but by ‘the desire for reasonable agreement’ (Scanlon 1982, p. 115 n. 10; see also Scanlon 1978, 1998; Barry 1995). On the resulting account of moral permissibility, “an act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any system of rules for the general regulation of behavior which no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced general agreement.” (Scanlon, 1982, p. 110) The requirement of impartiality is captured here by the basic fact that the question is whether everyone who is to live under the selected rules can reasonably accept them. As in Rawls' theory, however, the principles of second-order impartiality accepted at the contract level allow for considerable first-order partiality at the level of agent-choice.

Harsanyi (1977) argues that a version of utilitarianism can be defended on the basis of an ‘equiprobability model,’ according to which an agent ought to choose between social systems “under the assumption that, in either system, he would have the same probability of occupying any one of the available social positions” (Harsanyi 1982, p. 45; cf. Hare 1981). Gert (1998) argues for a list of moral rules which “all impartial rational persons would favor including […] as part of the moral system” (p. 158). Gauthier (1986) defends a contemporary version of contractarianism.

5. Objections to traditional conceptions of moral impartiality

Traditional conceptions of impartiality such as those we have been discussing face a variety of objections. Many of these objections focus on the claim that such conceptions take insufficient account of the nature of the moral agent and of the pragmatics of the situations in which impartial decisions are actually made. Along these lines, some objectors claim that traditional conceptions set the bar too high, demanding superhuman abilities or cognitive efforts from moral agents. Others, meanwhile, concentrate on the fact that the traditional conceptions tend to identify impartiality with an unemotional, dispassionate disposition, or to otherwise characterize it in impersonal or otherwise negative terms — in terms, that is, of what the moral agent lacks, rather than what she possesses. Two other types of objection are particularly troubling for liberal theorists. The first argues that, by restricting impartiality within the bounds of individual societies, liberal theory tends to fall short of the level of impartiality actually demanded by morality. The second objection here questions whether the liberal conception of impartiality can remain genuinely neutral between competing conceptions of the good. We shall examine these objections in turn.

5.1 The cognitive impossibility of impartiality

The first charge — that impartiality, as conceived by traditional ethical theories, makes extraordinary and unreasonable cognitive demands on moral agents — must be distinguished from the objection to consequentialist impartiality considered earlier, which claimed that the sacrifices demanded by consequentialist impartiality were unreasonable and excessive. The objection now being considered is not that impartiality asks the agent to give up too much, but rather that the cognitive feats demanded by these moral theories will exceed the capacity of the typical moral agent. Indeed, one popular version of this objection alleges that an agent will require an unreasonable amount of knowledge or cognitive ability simply to be able to identify what the demands of impartiality are (Friedman 1989; Walker 1991). Given the conception of the impartial point of view as a ‘God's eye’ point of view, for example (Baier 1958), it seems questionable whether it is ever reasonable to expect a human moral agent to be able to occupy such a perspective. God, quite obviously, possesses far more knowledge than does any human being; moreover, God's point of view is both objective and impersonal in ways that an individual human's perspective cannot be. (As Margaret Urban Walker points out, it is often said that human beings have to live with their decisions, but it sounds very odd to say that of God (Walker 1991, p. 765).) Similar remarks apply to the conception of the impartial point of view as ‘the point of view of the universe’ (Sidgwick 1907), to Hare's conception of the ideal moral agent as a so-called ‘archangel’ (Hare, 1981), and, Walker claims, to Firth's conception of the ideal impartial observer (Firth, 1952.) Similarly, Marilyn Friedman points out that even if a person did manage to occupy such a point of view for a period of time — supposing such a thing to be possible — there would be no way to confirm that she had successfully done so: standard conceptions of impartiality, she claims, prescribe “methods of normative thinking [which] represent psychological and epistemic feats, the achievement of which we have no independent way to confirm” (Friedman 1991, p. 645).

5.2 Impartiality, Impersonality, and Indifference

The second objection finds fault with the traditional tendency to define impartiality in negative or abstract terms — in terms, that is, of which elements must be absent from the psychology of the agent, or which we must pretend are absent in the process of idealization. M.C. Henberg, for instance, claims that most if not all procedural accounts of impartiality confuse it with distinterest or impersonality, and thus, ultimately, with indifference. (It should be noted that many impartialists are quite explicit about the link between morality, impartiality, and the lack of emotion; Baier (1958), for instance, writes that “the moral point of view [is] that of an independent, unbiased, impartial, objective, dispassionate, disinterested observer” (p. 201; see also Firth 1952).) Similarly, Richard Brandt argues that it is a mistake to define moral impartiality with reference to an ideal observer who is defined as (among other things) distinterested; for after all, “it is not clear that a purely disinterested being would support a moral system at all” (Brandt 1979, p. 227). While Brandt's complaint is particularly directed at the ideal observer theory of (Firth 1952), this objection seems to apply much more broadly; it is obvious, for instance, that Rawls's veil of ignorance is designed precisely to prevent the contractors from acting in an interested manner.

The problem is not only that impersonal persons of this sort are likely to suffer from massive indifference, but also that there is alleged to be a conceptual difficulty with the very idea of conceiving impartiality in such terms. An abstract or impersonal evaluator, it is argued, could not possibly make reliable judgments about substantive moral matters (whether or not he was motivated to), since he would be unable to appreciate the particular concerns of the contesting parties. Both of these difficulties — the motivational and the cognitive — are well expressed by Iris Marion Young, who rejects altogether the idea that morality is primarily a matter of impartiality:

The ideal of impartiality is an idealist fiction. It is impossible to adopt an unsituated point of view, and if a point of view is situated, it cannot stand apart from and understand all points of view. It is impossible to reason about substantive moral issues without understanding their substance, which always presupposes some particular social and historical context; and one has no motive for making moral judgments and resolving moral dilemmas unless the outcome matters, unless one has a particular and passionate interest in the outcome […] when class, race, ethnicity, gender, sexuality, and age define different social locations, one subject cannot fully empathize with another in a different social location, adopt her point of view; if that were possible then the social locations would not be different. (Young 1990, pp. 104-5; cf. Benhabib 1987, p. 90)

5.3 Open and Closed Impartiality

As noted above, liberal theorists often tend to conceptualize impartiality using the model of a social contract. If society is pictured as the result of a hypothetical agreement between persons, each of whom is equally empowered to revoke the agreement, then it stands to reason that the resulting set of rules must in some sense be acceptable to all, and must embody, in some deep way, the ideal of equal respect. Some have complained, however, that this approach risks leaving those not party to the contract out in the cold. But surely it is plausible to think that a society, in order to be just, must not only treat (and avoid treating) its own citizens in certain ways, but must also respect certain rules regarding its behavior towards members of other societies. As Charles Jones (1999) writes, “Unlike Rawls … I see no reason to restrict our moral focus to the basic structure of any particular nation-state; on the contrary, if one's concern is with the justifiability of the institutions which determine people's life chances, there are compelling grounds for taking a wider view.”

Amartya Sen (2002) draws a distinction between ‘open’ and ‘closed’ impartiality, which “turns on whether or not the exercise of impartial assessment is confined … to a fixed group.” Since the contractors behind the veil of ignorance are aware that they are part of a certain society (and do not see themselves in any sense as representing the world as a whole), the veil of ignorance represents an impartial system only in the closed sense. Therefore, Sen complains that “As a device of structured political analysis, the procedure is not geared to addressing the need to overcome group prejudices.” By contrast, open impartiality, which Sen finds recommended in the works of Adam Smith (see Smith 1759), demands “that the viewpoints of others, whether or not belonging to some group of which one is specifically a member, receive adequate attention.”

There are various responses open to Rawlsian theorists. Rawls himself suggests that we imagine a second veil of ignorance behind which representatives of various societies can meet in order to set fair and impartial ground rules for international relations. Much like justice within states, Rawls writes, “Justice between states is determined by the principles that would be chosen in the original position so interpreted. These principles are political principles, for they govern public policies toward other nations.” (Rawls 1971) Such a position, of course, will not satisfy everyone, and some critics worry that reiterating the veil of ignorance on the international level will simply reiterate its more problematic elements in a wider scale. Nonetheless, it is important to keep in mind that the objection, here, is not to impartiality itself, but to a particular version of it. Indeed, what critics such as Sen and Jonse are really claiming, of course, is that the framework Rawls provides is not impartial enough.

5.4 Liberalism, Neutrality, and the Justification of Impartiality

If genuine impartiality is an illusion, as Young alleges, then impartialists may be suspected in smuggling in their own substantive moral positions and biases under the guise of neutrality. Rawls' use of the veil of ignorance, for example, has been criticized by Thomas Nagel and others on the basis that, by requiring that agents lack knowledge of their conceptions of the good (a necessary stipulation of the bargainers are to achieve a consensus), the veil of ignorance excludes from the original position information that is morally relevant, and indeed may put some of the bargainers at a disadvantage. “The original position,” Nagel writes, “seems to presuppose not just a neutral theory of the good, but a liberal, individualistic conception according to which the best that can be wished for someone is the unimpeded pursuit of his own path, provided it does not interfere with the rights of others” (Nagel 1973; see also Teitelman 1972; Schwartz 1973; Sandel 1982; Benhabib 1987). Such a conception, it is held, clearly does favor some conceptions of the good over others: in particular, atomic, individualistic conceptions focusing on personal fulfillment (constituted, perhaps, through the acquisition of consumer goods) are privileged over more communal or social ideals that focus on solidarity and mutual interaction between persons (Sandel 1982; cf. O'Neill 1997, Chapter 1).

Feminist critics have paid particular attention to the ways in which liberal conceptions of neutrality and impartiality presuppose and reinforce traditional male-dominated, individualistic approaches to moral theory, and in doing so reinforce the social status quo (Gilligan 1982; Noddings 1984; Benhabib 1987; Young 1990). As Benhabib has pointed out, “Universalistic moral theories in the Western tradition from Hobbes to Rawls are substitutionalist, in the sense that the universalism they defend is defined surreptitiously by identifying the experiences of a specific group of subjects as the paradigmatic case of the human as such. These subjects are invariably white, male adults who are propertied or at least professional.” (Benhabib 1987, p. 81) As a result, the dominant social positions of such parties tend to be protected and even enhanced in the social and political theories resulting from such allegedly neutral liberal theories.

The problem of neutrality is a pressing one for liberals: given the importance to their view of the thought that an impartial government must be neutral between various moral conceptions (it must, that is, respect what Rawls calls ‘the fact of pluralism’), it is essential to show that liberal impartialism does not simply represent another such moral conception (or ‘sectarian view’) in its own right. Liberal impartialism, then, must turn out to be a framework that can be agreed to by all relevant parties, even as they continue to disagree regarding particular substantive moral issues.

How is the liberal to establish this? Nagel (1987) endorses what he calls ‘epistemological restraint,’ which holds that it can be reasonable for an individual to hold certain beliefs yet simultaneously unreasonable to attempt to decide matters of public policy on the basis of such beliefs. Such beliefs, which tend to be moral or religious in nature, are said to be viewed differently from the inside (from which standpoint they have perfect authority) than from the outside (from which standpoint they are regarded as questionable). The difficulty, as Barry (1995) and Raz (1990) have pointed out, is to explain why doubts visible from the outside would not infect the internal point of view, thus weakening these beliefs' internal authority as well. (It should be noted that Nagel himself has expressed doubts about this argument in Nagel 1991.)

Rawls's view appears to be similar to Nagel's (and thus, subject to the same difficulty). According to Rawls, to endorse a view of justice is not to claim that it is true; moreover, the acceptability of liberal impartialism is not to be derived from its truth; rather, such a view will be accepted (it is to be hoped) because, in societies of the relevant sort, it will form a common element (an ‘overlapping consensus’) in the various competing conceptions of the good that occupy the public sphere (Rawls 1993). (Again, the criticisms contained in Raz 1990 are especially trenchant.)

While both Nagel and Rawls explicitly reject the idea that liberal impartialism is to be justified on the basis of skepticism toward various conceptions of the good, Barry (1995) explicitly endorses this form of justification. (Barry emphasizes that the relevant form of skepticism does not involve eschewing one's moral and religious beliefs, but rather rejecting the claim to be certain of the truth of those beliefs.) This approach has been criticized on the basis that such skepticism itself constitutes a sectarian view, and therefore is not neutral (Larmore 1987, Mendus 2002) However, as Barry points out, the decisive issue is not whether some people would reject skepticism, but whether it can reasonably be rejected — and given Barry's definition of skepticism, its claim to resist being so rejected seems considerably stronger than the claims of the various conceptions of the good themselves, which must indeed be excluded from the public sphere.

6. The partialist-impartialist debate

Although many people continue to speak of a ‘partialist vs. impartialist debate,’ it should by now be clear that neither ‘partialism’ nor ‘impartialism’ unambiguously denote any single moral position; at best, they designate two poles of a continuum, one of which attributes no moral significance to the demands of (any sort of) impartiality, the other of which sees morality as exhausted by (some version of) impartiality. While a somewhat general distinction can be usefully maintained, it is misleading to think of the partialist-impartialist debate as a dispute between two clearly defined, and clearly opposed, camps (Deigh 1991; Barry 1995, pp. 191-5).

Thus, any general claim beginning with the words 'partialists (or impartialists) think that...' is bound to be both misleading and contentious. In particular, there is good reason to be wary of objections to impartialism which claim that all impartialists endorse extreme moral demands, or that they require that practical reasoning be completely expunged of every vestige of the partial. It is true, of course, that at least some impartialists, such as Godwin, have endorsed such claims. But many do not. Deontologists, as we have seen, hold impartiality to be a deep and significant element of morality, but they also tend to allow for a considerable degree of first-order partiality. And even many consequentialists are prepared to admit the legitimacy of partial reasoning in some contexts, if only on an instrumental basis. It is useful, then, to draw a distinction between two sorts of impartialist moral theory. Impartialist theories which require all agents to display first-order impartiality at all times (Godwin's, for example) might be referred to as strict impartialist theories. Impartialist theories which allow for some first-order partiality, but which nevertheless insist that all such behavior be justified in second-order impartialist terms, might be referred to as fundamentally impartialist moral theories. The class of fundamentally impartial theories will include not only contractualist, Kantian, and rule consequentialist theories, but also certain act consequentialist theories (e.g. Railton 1986) which allow the practice of first-order partiality as a means of promoting the impersonal good. Such theories allow for partiality that is permissible, justifiable, and perhaps even admirable in moral terms. At the same time, however, they insist that all such partiality is ultimately reducible — that is, justifiable in impartialist terms at some deeper level.

Within the partialist camp, a strict partialist might be defined as holding that no sort of impartiality plays any moral role whatsoever — a logically possible, but uncommon, position. A moderate partialist, by contrast, would admit that impartiality of some sort plays a moral role, but deny that this role encompasses, or grounds, all of morality; in particular, such a figure would be committed to the existence, in some contexts at least, of irreducible morally admirable partiality. A virtue theorist, for instance, might make a significant place for impartiality by selecting it as one of the virtues; but a virtue of this sort would presumably have to compete with other deeply partialist virtues such as loyalty, which would override impartiality in at least some contexts.

To the extent that a deep issue between partialists and impartialists can be identified, it is presumably the question of whether (irreducible) morally admirable partiality does indeed exist; and it is along this line of dispute that the debate seems likeliest to continue. (Whether this debate is identical to the so-called ‘justice-care’ debate, as contended in Cannold, et al (1995), is questionable, though it is undeniable that there are important parallels.) However, this way of classifying the disputants, and of characterizing the issue itself, is meant to be suggestive rather than definitive. The fact remains that there are many types of partialist theories, and many types of impartialist ones, and that continuing to speak of the ‘partialist-impartialist debate’ in loose and imprecise terms is more likely to obscure than to illuminate.


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consequentialism | equality | ethics: deontological | Godwin, William | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Mill, John Stuart | original position