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John of Salisbury

First published Wed Jul 6, 2005

John of Salisbury (ca. 1115-76) has an enduring reputation based as much on whom he knew as on what he knew. He studied with almost all the great masters of the early twelfth century, including Peter Abelard and Gilbert of Poitiers, served as an aid to Thomas à Becket (1118-70), a friend to Pope Hadrian IV, an annoyance if not an enemy to England's King Henry II, and died as Bishop of Chartres. John walked the halls of power and learning as few have before or since. John's Policraticus reflects knowledge and insight that could only have come with practical experience; it was considered an authoritative text in political philosophy for centuries. His reflections on the schools of his day in the Metalogicon offer valuable insight into the academic life of Paris just as the works of Aristotle were being rediscovered.

1. Life and Works

John of Salisbury was born between 1115 and 1120 at Old Sarum near present day Salisbury, England. Little is know about his family circumstances, but they appear not to have been well off, as John bemoaned his relative poverty throughout his life. In 1136, John went to Paris where he studied under, or befriended, many of the greatest minds of his day: Peter Abelard, Gilbert of Poitiers, Adam du Petit Pont, William of Conches, Thierry of Chartres, and others. In 1147, for reasons that are still unclear, John left the schools of Paris. He was probably out of money and needed to find work, but it is also possible that he was fed up with the Parisian schools, or with the persecution endured there by his most influential teachers, Abelard and Gilbert.

John attended the Church Council of Rheims in 1148, most likely looking for employment, and witnessed the condemnation of Gilbert, which he chronicled in the Historia Pontificalis. He left the Council with a letter of recommendation from none other than Gilbert's persecutor, Bernard of Clairvaux (1090-1153), to take up a post as secretary and advisor to Archbishop Theobald of Canterbury. Much has been made of the fact that Bernard had written such a letter for John, but the letter itself shows that he had only secondhand knowledge of John, and it seems rather lukewarm.

John's duties at Canterbury were quite extensive, especially in the years before Theobald succumbed in 1161 to a protracted illness. During this period, John wrote his two most significant philosophical works, beginning in 1156 with what is now Book 7 and most of Book 8 of the Policraticus. He had fallen into disfavor with the king for reasons that are still unclear and begun to write his personal consolation of philosophy. On his return to favor, he used these writings as the seed for his voluminous work on political theory and human happiness, the Policraticus. He also composed the Metalogicon during this period, but the evidence regarding the precise dating of the various sections of these works is inconclusive. The many references to John's political activities suggest that they were written when John was at the height of his intellectual and diplomatic powers. The Metalogicon ends with John noting his personal sense of loss at the death of Pope Hadrian IV, the first and to date only English pope, who ruled 1154-59 (Meta. IV 42 m274). John tells us in the Policraticus that he was close enough to Hadrian to offer advice and criticism (Poli. VI 25 n135), even claiming some credit for convincing him to grant control of Ireland to the English (Meta. IV 42 m275).

Unfortunately for John, he was unable to translate his personal charisma into a successful career as a diplomat and politician. He lacked the most important quality of the truly successful courtier: the ability always to end up on the right side of a dispute. He seems to have been a man of principle who refused compromise, and it is likely that many of the charges he made against others in the Policraticus were taken personally. Even so, he avoided confrontation. Above all, John sought to live the life of authenticity, moderation, and virtue we see defended in his philosophical writings.

When Thomas à Becket succeeded Theobald, John remained in the new bishop's court, though his influence appears to have waned. Again, in 1163, John fell into disfavor with the king for reasons that remain obscure, and left for France. Through his many political and ecclesiastical connections John was able to act as an advance man for Becket's own exile the following year. John himself settled in Rheims with his longtime friend, Peter of Celle, then abbot of St. Remi. It was during these years that John wrote the Historia Pontificalis. Again, the extent of John's involvement with Becket is a matter disputed by historians. He did not live with Becket in exile, though he did lead the delegation charged with preparing for his return to England in 1170. Legend has it that John was present and wounded on December 29, 1170, when Becket was killed by King Henry's knights, but this almost certainly did not happen. In his own account of Becket's murder, John does not claim to have been present or to have witnessed it first hand (Letter 305). After Becket's death, John occupied a series of ecclesiastical offices, culminating in his appointment as Bishop of Chartres. He died on October 25, 1180.

John's literary output was substantial. In addition to the Metalogicon and Policraticus, titles contrived by John in the belief that a Greek-sounding name would provide an air of learned authority to his work, he left many other writings, including two poems, the Entheticus Major and Entheticus Minor, addressing various themes in philosophy. These poems sometimes accompanied copies of the Policraticus. John's Historia Pontificalis purports to be the continuation of a church chronicle, but its content is idiosyncratic; it is not history so much as a chronicle of events he found interesting. The Historia does contain a substantial exposition of Gilbert of Poitiers' controversial theological views, as well as an account of the council to which he was summoned to defend himself. John also wrote saint's lives of Anselm and Thomas à Becket. Finally, he left many letters written during his years of service as secretary to the archbishops of Canterbury. (See Neederman 2005 for a detailed discussion and assessment of John's life and activities.)

2. Humanism

John is most commonly described as a humanist although he exhibits only some of the many different aspects of humanist thought and outlook. This mix of impulses gives his work a tone that is undoubtedly humanist, though it is a humanism on John's own terms. He is most certainly not a humanist in the modern, secular sense; rather, his writings, values, and goals are all in service of his vision of the role of Christianity in the secular world. John is also sometimes considered a humanist because of his extensive use of classical sources (Liebeschutz 1950). Like the later Renaissance humanists, he has no trouble appealing to classical pagan authorities alongside sacred authors and Church Fathers. In fact, when he invents an authoritative text to lend weight to his own novel ideas, the “authority” he invents is the so-called “Institutes of Trajan,” a work about a pagan emperor written by the pagan Plutarch. But although John's knowledge and use of classical sources was extensive, he was not motivated by any conception of fidelity to the ideas or ideals of classical authors (Southern 1995). Even where he believes classical authors are factually mistaken, their writings can still be made to fit his own purposes. In the case of Dido, the Carthaginian Queen tricked by Venus into falling in love with Aeneas, John thinks she was a chaste woman who could never have met Aeneas (Poli. VIII 14 p385). Nonetheless, he deliberately ignores Virgil's plotline about the machinations of Venus to argue that the female nature is too weak for governing (Poli. VI 22 n131). John looked to classical authorities for nuggets of truth he could apply to his own ends. He was of the opinion that there is good in all writing when it is read by the wise man; therefore, one ought to learn everything one can from classical authors. Omnivorous study of this kind provides the wise man with a store of knowledge of probable principles from which to reason, should the need ever arise.

There is another kind of humanism that extols human achievement in the intellectual and moral spheres. Once again, John is not obviously in this camp. He thinks that human beings are quite limited intellectually, and does not write much at all about technological advances even though the twelfth century was a time of innovation. As for our moral accomplishments, these fill a surprisingly small number of pages in an enormous book. Still, there are reasons to think that John embraced some aspects of a humanism of this sort. In particular, his advocacy of an active life where all things are done in moderation and his belief that some semblance of happiness is attainable in this life can be understood as humanistic.

John's humanism is perhaps best understood as a broad set of claims about human flourishing: how we can live well in communities and develop our limited intellectual capacities to the best of our ability. John's humanism is thus religious and spiritual but in direct opposition to any kind of asceticism or spirituality that rejects the world; it recognizes our ability to attain knowledge and happiness in this life through active engagement with the world and each other. John's humanism thus emphasizes those aspects of our flourishing proper to our status as wayfarers in this life, as goods to be valued in themselves (Nederman 2005; Olsen 1998).

3. Academic Skepticism

The main philosophical theme connecting all of John's work is his professed adherence to the Academic school of philosophy. John's Academic tendencies are behind his defense of probabilism in the Metalogicon. In the Policraticus, they shape his view of virtue and moderation, and motivate his use of exempla rather than argument. In John's view of the history of philosophy, Aristotle's attack on Platonism drove the Academy back to a Socratic skepticism. This skepticism took three forms (Meta. IV 31 m251). The first doubts all things in a self-defeating effort to avoid error; a skeptic of this sort, he says, “forfeits the right to be called a philosopher.” The second believes only what is necessary and self-evident; however, since only God knows the limits of possibility and necessity, this second form of skepticism reduces to the first, at least with regard to any science of the created world (Meta. II 13 g104). The third form of Academic skepticism requires that one withhold judgment on matters that are doubtful to the wise. It is this more moderate skepticism that appeals to John. On matters that only a fool would dispute, as well as on more complex matters where the wise agree, one can claim to have probable knowledge. This form of skepticism avoids dogmatism and saves one from falling too quickly into error, yet also leaves one open to new learning. It is the epistemic stance of a man who counsels moderation in all things.

4. Metalogicon

The Metalogicon is ostensibly written as a defense of the study of logic, grammar, and rhetoric against the charges of the pseudonymous Cornificius and his followers. There was probably not a single person named Cornificius; more likely John was personifying common arguments against the value of a liberal education. The Cornificians believe that training is not relevant because rhetorical ability and intellectual acumen are natural gifts (Meta. I 8 m28), and the study of language and logic does not help one to understand the world (Meta. I 6 m25). These people want to seem rather than to be wise. Above all, they want to parlay the appearance of wisdom into lucrative careers (Meta. I 2 m13). John puts up a vigorous defense of the need for a solid training in the liberal arts in order to actually become wise and succeed in the “real world.”

John's Metalogicon is the first attempt in the West to provide an outline for incorporating the whole of Aristotle's Organon into a liberal arts curriculum. It is often overlooked that John spent much of the book criticizing those masters who resisted the adoption of the new works of Aristotle and still taught the old logic. The old logic (logica vetus) consisted almost exclusively of the works of Boethius. In addition to Porphyry's Isagoge, and Aristotle's Categories and De Interpretatione, (as translated and glossed by Boethius) there were four of Boethius' own works: De Syllogismo Categorico, De Syllogismo Hypothetico, De Divisione, and De Differentiis Topicis:

What we have so far said has been directed against Cornificius. Against those who, in their conservatism, exclude the more efficacious works of Aristotle, and content themselves almost exclusively with Boethius, much could also be said, but it is not necessary. It is so clear to everyone that those who have consumed all their time and energy on Boethius know almost nothing and should be pitied (Meta. IV 27 m243).

The logical curriculum John prescribes in the Metalogicon includes only Porphyry and Aristotle. The Isagoge, Categories, and De Interpretatione are all introductory works. John criticizes the tradition of extensive commentary on these texts as harmful to students and as providing occasions for self-aggrandizement on the part of the masters who wrote them (Meta. II 16 m111). John had read the Prior and Posterior Analytics but does not quite know what to make of them. He finds the Prior Analytics overly complex and claims that the same material is covered comprehensibly elsewhere (Meta. IV 2 m205), whereas the Posterior Analytics is better suited to the study of geometry because of its focus on demonstration (Meta. IV 6 m212). Aristotle's Sophistical Refutations should be used as practice exercises for younger students (Meta. IV 22 m237). The centerpiece of John's reworked curriculum is Aristotle's Topics. Chapters 5-10 of Book III (m170-201) of the Metalogicon gives an introduction, commentary, and sales pitch for Aristotle's Topics, in which John finds the voice of Aristotle confirming his own probabilistic leanings. The Topics teaches us how to begin with probable principles and form convincing arguments. This is the method that is consistent with the moderate skepticism of the wise man because it is something he can put into practice with good effect. This should be the curriculum of the schools.

4.1 Probabilism

Logic is the essential methodology of all the sciences: “Let him who is not come to logic be plagued with continuous and everlasting filth” (Meta. II 6 m84). But John reveals himself to be a knowledgeable and informed critic of logic as well as its passionate advocate. He was acquainted with the Liar paradox (Poli. V 12 d134), the concept of sentential rather than syllogistic logic (Meta. III 9 m187), and the debate on the nature of the conditional (Meta. IV 21 m235). Still, he finds most discussions of pure logic to be irrelevant. This attitude makes the Metalogicon an important source of information about twelfth-century logical debates, though not for any particular contributions to them. Following Aristotle's Topics, John presents a conception of logic as a discipline that begins with principles generally agreed upon by wise men in the scientific disciplines, moving on to construct persuasive arguments from these principles.

John divides logic into three branches: demonstration, dialectic, and sophistry (Meta. II 3 m79). Sophistry is good practice for the young and presumably trains them to avoid sophistical argumentation later in life. Demonstrative logic is the method of deductive sciences such as arithmetic and geometry; it is the process of deducing necessary conclusions from necessary premises (Meta. II 5 m83). This conflicts with John's skepticism, however, which leads him to claim that demonstration has limited usefulness: “Nothing can be known with necessity about what is corruptible” (Meta. IV 8 m215). Demonstration is not the method of any science of the created world. Dialectic, on the other hand, starts with probable premises and makes persuasive arguments for probable conclusions. Dialectical premises are not necessary or certain, but they are as close to the truth as the feeble human mind can come, and the conclusions of dialectical arguments are acceptable to the wise. Dialectic is the science of effective argumentation, where effectiveness is a question of winning people over to one's own opinion (Meta. II 5 m80). The pedagogical advantage is also obvious to John. A student trained in the demonstrative method peculiar to geometry cannot reason with the same effectiveness even in the other branches of mathematics, but a student trained in dialectic – and in possession of a range of probable principles – can reason effectively on almost any subject.

John has two main criticisms of the “pitiable fools” who have not embraced the probabilism of Aristotle's Topics and are still teaching the old logic of Boethius. First, they pursue logic as an end in itself rather than as ancillary to the sciences. Logic is a tool:“Although the art of logic has many uses, if one is knowledgeable in logic and ignorant of everything else, his pursuit of philosophy is actually impeded by verbosity and overconfidence. By itself, logic is practically useless” (Meta. IV 28 m244). A result in pure logic does not add to the sum total of human knowledge. Second, in different ways the logic masters insist on a necessity that is impossible to attain as the criterion for successful arguments. When these two errors are combined, the study of logic becomes a sterile and even harmful exercise.

Surprisingly, John singles out Abelard, his teacher and a man he greatly admired, for criticism on both points. Abelard argued for a containment theory of conditionals—the sense of the consequent must be contained in the sense of the antecedent. In its strongest form, Abelard's view required that all true conditionals be necessarily true. Following a technicality in Boethius, Abelard held a weaker standard for valid arguments. Thus an argument might be valid while at the same time its corresponding conditional false. For example, the conditional, ‘If Socrates is a rational mortal animal, then Socrates is a man’ is, for Abelard, false, whereas the argument, ‘Socrates is a mortal rational animal,’ therefore, ‘Socrates is a man’ is valid (see Martin 2004 for a discussion of Abelard's arguments.) John finds it“hard to understand” why Abelard would advance and defend such an obviously useless distinction. The subtleties and intricacies of proof theory and of the truth conditions for sentential operators do not, he believes, help us better understand Socrates' humanity (Meta III 6 m177).

4.2 Universals

The early twelfth century was a high-water mark for the debate over universals and John studied with most of the leading protagonists. Although he professes disdain for the issue, the longest individual chapters in the Metalogicon discuss this most famous philosophical dispute (Meta II 17-20 m111-141). John's purpose for entering the fray was to criticize and chronicle, not to contribute. In his mind, the obsession with universals was symptomatic of the pernicious culture that had taken over the schools. The various masters had departed from the authority of Aristotle and, even worse, were positing merely verbal distinctions that did not lead to greater understanding: each master, “to make a name for himself, coins his own special error” (Meta II 18 m117). The Metalogicon's catalogue of twelfth-century theories of universals was written as a litany of errors. (Yukio Iwakuma has recently published an invaluable discussion of the universals debate at this time, to which the following discussion owes much; see Iwakuma 2004.)

As valuable as it is, John's catalogue of the various views is not complete. Surprisingly, the two most famous logicians of the early twelfth century get little discussion, while less influential figures get considerably more. The second-most famous logician, William of Champeaux, is not even mentioned. William's absence is perhaps a sign of how thoroughly discredited his views had become due to the criticism of the most famous logician of the day, Peter Abelard. As for Abelard, his views are only addressed indirectly, as are those of his followers.

John divides the various camps into two groups: anti-realists who hold that universals are not things, and realists those who hold that universals are things. In the first group are Roscelin of Compiègne, Abelard and his followers, and defenders of an unattributed notio theory.

John presents Roscelin and Abelard as motivated by the same false belief that only words can be predicated. Thus, things cannot be predicated of things. While Roscelin had been discredited long before John wrote, he clearly views Abelard and his school as having inherited Roscelin's anti-realist mantle. Both men are dismissed as holding views contrary to Aristotle.

Roscelin had been famously derided by Anselm for arguing that universals were mere flatus vocis, a pun even in Anselm's day. Called “vocalism” by current scholars, Roscelin's view interprets the Isagoge and Categories as being about words rather than things, making universals into mere words. Roscelin is reported to have held such an extreme vocalism that he interpreted the definition of accident—admitting of more or less—to mean that an accident is a word that can be correctly modified in a sentence with the word “more” or “less” (Marenbon 2004).

The opinion of Abelard and his followers is that universals are sermones (translated as “word-concepts” by McGarry). Abelard adopted the term “sermo” in his later writings to make it clear that the universal is not the individual spoken word, i.e., the utterance or puff of air. Abelard's view of universals is semantic in nature, though it falls short of the extreme vocalism of Roscelin (for discussion, see entry on Peter Abelard.)

John does not name any proponents of the notio theory, and there do not seem to be any twelfth-century defenders of that view except perhaps John himself. The notio theory claims that the universal is an act of understanding, a view John claims is supported by Cicero, Boethius, and most importantly, by Aristotle.

As for the realist views, John discusses the status realism of Walter of Mortagne, the Platonic theory of exemplars held by Bernard of Chartres, Jocelin of Soisson's collective realism, and Gilbert of Poitiers' theory of native forms. He also very briefly mentions two unattributed realist views, a maneries theory and another form of status realism.

Walter of Mortagne begins with the assumption that only individuals exist and argues that the individual and the universal are essentially the same thing: Plato is an individual insofar as he is Plato, species insofar as he is man, genus insofar as he is animal etc. According to Walter, Plato's status or state of being-a-man is a positive feature shared with other men. By contrast, William of Champeaux formulated a negative version of status realism, arguing that although Plato and Aristotle do not share the same status, they do not differ in status either. This negative or indifference theory is not mentioned by John, however. Abelard had discredited both versions of status realism, reducing to absurdity the claim that a particular thing can be both individual and universal at the same time (King 2004). Abelard tells us that William left teaching. John tells us Walter converted to the Platonism of Bernard of Chartres.

Bernard's exemplar theory receives by far the most extensive discussion. As described by John, Bernard defended a fairly straightforward Platonism. John finds this appealing but notes that it is irreconcilably at odds with Aristotle. His extensive discussion of this view is puzzling as it appears to have developed outside of the main Parisian schools. Unfortunately, there are no surviving texts that fully explicate and defend Bernard's view (Iwakuma 2004).

The collective realist view John attributes to Jocelin of Soissons is most clearly described in a short text, De Generibus ac Speciebus (King 1982) (this text was once mistakenly attributed to Abelard but is now attributed to an unidentified person expressing Jocelin's view known as ‘Pseudo-Jocelin’). The collective realist argues that the universal is the whole collection of individuals of the same kind: e.g., the universal man is the collection of past, present, and future men. This view was also soundly refuted by Abelard on the grounds that if an individual is a man only because it is a member of the collection of men, there can be no prior basis for putting an individual into one collection rather than another. If the universal is defined as the collection, then any arbitrary collection of individuals would be a universal and therefore would be a species or genus (King 2004). John comments only that this view cannot be rectified with Aristotle.

Gilbert of Poitiers' theory of native forms is a more sophisticated and subtle resurrection of the collective realism of Jocelin of Soissons (Iwakuma 2004). According to Gilbert, native forms are instantiations of exemplars in the divine mind. The native form makes an individual to be the kind of thing it is, and when these forms are taken collectively, the collection is the universal. Although little is known about this view, it is easy to see how it might have been developed to save collective realism from Abelard's charge of arbitrariness.

John does not know much about the final two realist views. Of the maneries-theory, John claims not even to know what the name means. He suggests that its author does not have a sufficient grasp of Latin. The view has recently, and tentatively, been attributed to William of Conches and to the school of Adam du Petit Pont, the Parvipontani (Iwakuma 2004). The additional form of status realism is only mentioned by John in the final sentence of chapter 17. This second form of status-realism takes the status to be participated in by many individuals and so to be a universal, whereas Walter's version held that the status is the individual's state of existence or being. This view was likely held by followers of Robert of Melun (Iwakuma 2004).

Of the many views John lists, only two are still mentioned in the next century: a nominalist theory owing its origins to Abelard, and the more obscure maneries theory (Iwakuma 2004).

John does not explicitly offer his own theory but rather devotes a chapter to what he considers the “correct” explication of Aristotle (Meta II 20 m119-141). Universals are “notiones of actual, natural things, intellectual images of the mutual likenesses of real things, reflected in the soul's native purity.” These notiones are representative fictions (ficta) that philosophers use to better understand the nature of individuals. John likens these to fictions in civil law, idealizations that help us understand the general principles that govern the world of individuals. We form these representative fictions through a process of abstraction in which we compare many individuals and form an understanding of their “mutual conformity”. In order to study or learn about a universal we contemplate this constructed representation. Thus, the proposition ‘Man is an animal’ is not a claim about a particular man or animal any more than about all men and animals; rather it is a claim about this mental representation of the mutual likeness of all individual men (Meta. II 20 m138).”

Needless to say, John's account of Aristotle raises many questions that are unfortunately left unanswered. On this and other perplexing issues, John falls back on his Academic skepticism, saying that he does not wish to be dogmatic on questions disputed by the wise.

5. Policraticus

The Policraticus is John's massive, eight-book attempt to discuss all aspects of ethical and political life. Its topics vary from whether it is permissible to kill a tyrant to whether it is permissible to tell off-color jokes at dinner parties.

In the course of developing and elaborating his ideas, John rarely develops an explicit argument. Instead, he presents litanies of exempla, excerpts from classical and sacred authorities. The use of exempla is the practical embodiment of John's Academic skepticism and probabilism: because he does not wish to appear to pass dogmatic judgment on doubtful questions, he lines up the pronouncements of the wise in support. By illustrating that several wise men hold an opinion, John can claim that the rest of us should agree and be led to the same probable conclusions. While in many cases the intended conclusion is fairly obvious, not all of John's exempla have a clear point. Where John presents several exempla under one heading, it is not always obvious how they might even be consistent. For this reason, John's style has been likened to that of Peter Abelard in Sic et Non. Like Abelard, John has collected various exempla on particular issues. They all serve the purpose of advancing John's argument, but it is up to the reader to discover how (Von Moos 1984).

John's commitment to authority rather than novel argument and to exempla rather than explication is so central to John's conception of his purpose that when his ideas are truly novel he invents a source: Plutarch's “Institutes of Trajan”. Plutarch was a widely respected classical author and Trajan (30-117) was the Roman Emperor of such legendary good character that he was said to be the only pagan posthumously saved (Poli. V 8 n81). Policraticus books 5 and 6 are written as a commentary on this letter of instruction from the great Roman author to the great Roman Emperor. The “Institutes of Trajan” provide the luster of venerable age and hide the novelty of John's thought.

5.1 Virtue and Happiness

“Virtue contains everything to be done and happiness contains everything to be desired” (Poli VIII 8 n157). Virtue for John is moderation in all things, and although he has a lot to say on the subject, it is mostly reiteration of the standard taxonomy of virtues mixed with practical advice about how to navigate life at court. His discussion of happiness is, on the other hand, somewhat surprising. There are two kinds of happiness: salvific happiness and the happiness attainable in this life. The latter is inferior to the former and does not necessarily lead to salvation, though it is still to be valued.

Although salvific happiness in not attainable in this life, John describes three necessary conditions for its attainment: we must“worship God, attend to the justifications of the Lord, and delight in the cognizance of one's own good works” (Poli VIII 8 n158). Proper worship is the regulation of one's spiritual life; one must love God and worship correctly. Attending to the justifications of the Lord means seeking to understand spiritual matters; only a person who at least tries to understand the nature of eternal life can recognize the possibility of attaining greater happiness. Cognizance of one's own good works is something akin to the good will; it is to know what is right and do what is right for the right reason: because it is right, taking joy in its rectitude. We cannot, however, achieve the requisite knowledge to understand God's designs or purity of will in this life.

The lesser happiness is for those who lack the understanding and love of God but “whose souls are unencumbered by vices so they are occupied by matters arising from love” (Poli VIII 8 n159). It is possible to act out of love for neighbor and the desire to live well in community without knowing God. The ancients achieved this secular happiness through the cultivation of virtue. Without an understanding of God, however, they remained ignorant of the immortality of the soul and the true nature of eternal life and so they did not recognize that there is something more to be valued and sought. They thought that the secular happiness of a virtuous life is the greatest happiness (Poli VIII 8 n160).

The two kinds of happiness are related such that the highest grade entails the lower: one who understands, worships, and loves God will be free of vice and act from love. But the converse does not hold: one who is free of vice and acts from love will not necessarily be led to love and understand God. Promotion of the lesser, earthly happiness is in the purview of the secular state but it is not independent of or coequal to the higher happiness.

As for virtue, John's rule is moderation in all things. The virtuous person is moderate in his or her use and enjoyment of what the world has to offer. Hunting, feasting, and the other entertainments of courtiers are acceptable recreation so long as they are done in moderation and do not conflict with duties. Those external goods that one can acquire in life are tools that help people perform virtuous acts; as such, they to be valued and sought (Poli. VIII 15 p393). John adds the usual caveats: one must not value them beyond their utility in enabling or promoting good acts and happiness, or seek them in immoral or excessive ways. John in fact takes moderation to its logical extreme: “Truly all vehemence is inimical to salvation, and all excess is in error; an excess of goodness and of habitually good deeds is very evil” (Poli. IV 9 n53). He explains that it is in the interests of good fellowship to relax virtue once in a while (Poli VIII 13 p383). Aside from the irony, these claims show that virtue is the path to secular happiness. John counsels moderation in all things but wisdom. There is certainly a defect but not an extreme of wisdom (Poli VII 11 n161). The wise person will find the moderate path between excess and defect.

5.2 Organic Metaphor for the State

In John's theory the state is a body, an organic, integrated whole unified for the good of its members. Each office in the state, or role in the society, is likened to a part of the body and its functions are described analogously. The state can be divided into three tiers: first, those who exert some governmental authority, second, those who perform governmental functions, and third, everyone who is governed but not part of government. In the primary tier the prince is the head, with governors and judges acting as the eyes and mouth, the senate as the heart, and the church as the soul. The second tier of the state is likened to the body's hands, internal organs, and flanks. Soldiers, sheriffs, tax collectors, and so on are the hands. Officials who make up the bureaucratic machine of government are the internal organs. The flanks are the courtiers. The remainder, or third tier, of the citizenry are the peasants and craftsmen rather than any kind of merchant middle class. These constitute the feet.

The Prince, not the senate or church, wields political authority. The senate seems to have an advisory role, but John has very little to say about it except that senators should be virtuous and wise old men (Poli V 9 n81). What John envisioned as the proper relation between church and state is considerably harder to grasp. The purpose and goals of a just state are not exactly coextensive with those of the church, nor are the goals in conflict; they simply differ. Although salvific happiness is a higher goal, the secular state, headed by the prince, has its own goals. An integrated community, like an integrated person, works to achieve both. Between the church and the state John describes a hierarchy of function, but he does not subordinate state to church or church to state. The spiritual authority of the church is a higher, more noble form of authority than the coercive secular authority of the prince, but secular authority is conferred on the prince by God, not by the church. The church has not outsourced this function by granting secular authority to the prince; coercive power was not the church's to begin with.

As for the prince, John has a very high standard for the prince's character and conduct, and a fairly low threshold for his success. According to the contrived “Institutes of Trajan”, there are four responsibilities or duties of the prince: to revere God, to love his subjects, to have self-discipline, and to educate his officials (Poli V 3 n68).

The Prince's reverence for God and love of his subjects is shown by the pious subjugation of his will to the will of God and the collective will of his subjects (Poli IV 5 n40). Nonetheless, given that often neither the people nor God is very forthcoming, the prince must be able to read and to reflect daily on the divine law (Poli IV 6 n44). By performing this daily Socratic reflection the prince can attempt to keep his own will in complete conformity with the divine will. In this sense, the good prince does not even have his own will; he merely wills what is just (Poli IV 2 n30). Because what God wants for each person is sufficient for each person, the prince whose will is in conformity with the justice of the divine will can expect to be obeyed (Poli VIII 22 n216).

The prince's self-discipline is shown in his good moral character and his moderate use of coercive force. A vicious prince acts badly and thus rules badly. Just as importantly, he sets a bad moral example, inspiring the corruption of his inferiors and denying them the possibility of both secular and eternal happiness (Poli V 7 n77). The prince should take particular care to avoid greed: just as his will is not his own, neither is his wealth (Poli VIII 4 p307). He should consider his wealth to be the wealth of the people, to be used for their advantage (Poli IV 5 n40). The prince's moral vices may set a bad example, but mismanagement of money is truly disruptive. When exercising coercive force the prince must find the mean between justice and mercy: too much mercy inspires vice by failing to punish it; too strict an application of justice destroys the liberty that is necessary for the acquisition of virtue (Poli VII 25 n176). The prince should err on the side of mercy and liberty.

The prince's duty to educate officials arises from the fact that judges and governors do not simply act in the name of the prince, but due to exigencies of time and geography must often act in his place. The motivating forces of fear and money are not sufficient to ensure the good behavior of the highest-ranking officials. Where there is princely power there must be princely virtue. For this reason, a virtuous prince is not sufficient for good government; judges and governors must be virtuous too. The character and education of officials is ultimately the prince's responsibility, but the virtue of the prince alone is not sufficient for good government.

A prince who could fulfill these four duties would be a truly great prince. To be merely successful, a prince must simply do no harm. This practical advice for a prince is yet another instance of John's academic reserve. On matters that are intractable the prince's goal should be to avoid action or decision. The mediocre prince who leaves the world not much worse than he found it can expect a greater reward in heaven than an average man because the prince had the power to do grave harm but did not (Poli IV 10 n55).

The second tier of the body is treated quite differently by John. Unlike those who hold first tier offices the people of the second tier cannot be counted on or be required to be virtuous, a fact that leaves John somewhat contemptuous of them (Poli VI pro. n103). This difference is crucial to understanding the meaning of the organic metaphor as the unifying principle of the state. These officials are kept in line with the carrot and stick of pay and punishment (Poli V 9 n84). An economic incentive to do the right thing is not always sufficient, but for these officials it works most of the time.

The arms and hands are the soldiers, sheriffs, tax collectors and similar officers of the state. John has the most to say about the soldiers: “Their role is to protect the church, attack the faithless, venerate the priesthood, protect the poor, shed blood for their brothers, and die if necessary” (Poli VI 8 n116). Soldiers need physical skills, but as for virtue they need little beyond courage (Poli VI 4 d186ff). The arms and the hands of the state have vital jobs to perform and they must be well trained for those jobs, but they must also be given incentives to perform jobs appropriate to their status. The same is true of the internal organs of the official bureaucracy.

It is in the discussion of the flanks, the courtiers, that John most frequently vents the frustration he built up during his years as an administrator and, ironically, as a courtier. If he were writing the Policraticus today, he would probably call this segment of the state the ‘abs’. This is the part of the body that is hardest to keep in shape and that is most noticeable when it goes bad. Courtiers are the gatekeepers of justice at court; when people have claims or cases before the prince, courtiers shepherd them through the bureaucracy. John likens them to Cerberus, the vicious guard dog at the gates of hell, the difference being that there are many more courtiers (Poli. V 10 n88). Courtiers wield the power of access, the power of bureaucracy, and the power behind the scenes that can be exercised without responsibility. This is the power that corrupts. John offers no hope that courtiers can either cultivate or sustain virtue; the temptations to self-indulgence and the opportunities to exert subtle influence are all but unavoidable.

He is best who resists for the longest time, who is strongest, who is corrupted least. For in order that virtue be unharmed, one must turn aside from the life of the courtier … He who engages in the trifles of the courtier and undertakes the obligations of a philosopher or a good man is an hermaphrodite … the philosopher/courtier is a monstrous thing. (Poli V 10 n90-91)

Many political thinkers, notably Machiavelli and St. Augustine, have held that it is difficult if not impossible for a good man to govern or for a governor to remain a good man. John is squarely in this tradition, but uniquely places the moral burden on the administration of government rather than on the power of ruling.

The final part of the body, the feet, is constituted by everyone who does not have a state function: peasants, tradesmen, husbandsmen etc. This is the most numerous class of citizens, and these are the people on whom society is based; the feet literally support the rest of the body in all things. For these reasons, the well-being of the feet is a primary concern of the prince. Despite their vital importance, the feet have no political power; rather, they should realize that it is for the common good that they respect the rights of the superior classes just as the superior classes should realize their obligation to protect their inferiors (Poli VI 20 n126).

The meaning of the organic metaphor as a unifying principle of the state is ambiguous. At one extreme of interpretation is the view that the parts of the state are simply organized by natural function. The state is an organic whole that arises naturally with each part properly suited to its own function, just like a biological organism (Leibeschutz 1950 p45ff). At the other extreme is the view that the state is a voluntary community, consciously organized, acting for the common good. On this view, the state is a corporate whole rather than a biological unity (Nederman 1987). John's real meaning, not surprisingly, is likely somewhere between these two extremes. The first tier of state officials is organized and unified via the voluntary recognition of principles of justice and common purpose. Governors, judges, and senators need to be virtuous; they must recognize what is just and choose to act accordingly. John illustrates this point in Policraticus book 5, but then there is a natural break in John's text. In book 6, John discusses the remaining tiers of the state. The second tier of officials cannot be expected to be virtuous and so the successful performance of their function cannot depend on their voluntary recognition and acceptance of a common purpose. Of the third tier, John argues that they ought to recognize that the social arrangement is for the common good—not that they will, of course. In the prologue to book 6, John apologizes for being“caustic” in his description of those in the second and third tiers,“who refuse to discern the rules which they follow and according to which they are living” (Poli VI pro n103). He adds his hope that these people can find virtue, but this is not required for their proper functioning.

5.3 Tyrannicide

One of the most famous aspects of John's Policraticus is his claim that it is just to slay a tyrant. This view is somewhat surprising on its face and the precise meaning is obscured by seemingly contradictory claims. For these reasons, there is considerable doubt as to what John's real views were. There are several commentators who believe that John does not in fact advocate tyrannicide but merely points out that tyrants come to bad ends (Larhoven 1984). Other commentators, however, argue that John has a philosophical defense of a duty to slay tyrants, though it must be teased out of the exempla (Nederman 1988). There is abundant textual evidence for each interpretation.

In support of the first interpretation are John's claims that the tyrant (like all who wield power) has his power from God and inflicts the just punishment of God on those whom he exploits (Poli VIII 18 n201). If the tyrant justly holds power, and the people are justly punished, then the appropriate response is to live rightly, keep one's head down, and wait for God to decide when the people have been punished enough (Poli VIII 20 n209). On this interpretation, John's extensive list of exempla detailing the bad ends to which tyrants come are meant to show that the tyrant will be removed in due time.

In support of the second interpretation, John describes a tyrant as the “image of depravity … [who] … springs from evil and should be cut down with the axe wherever he grows” (Poli VIII 17 n191). A tyrant is an enemy of the human race and should be killed (Poli VIII 19 d364). John goes so far as to say that a man who fails to kill a tyrant sins against himself and the whole body of the state, while he who frees a penitent and humble people from tyranny is blameless (Poli III 15 p211; VIII 20 n205).

John defines a tyrant as anyone who abuses his power over others. The tyrant's crucial character flaw is that his lust for power has killed his charity for the meek and his love of honor and justice (Poli VIII 17 n191). The tyrannical prince is acting contrary to the public good and is harmful to the state, that much is clear. However, the mere fact that the prince is a tyrant does not warrant his assassination. The vices of the prince corrupt the whole of the body politic, but the leadership of other, potentially virtuous, members of government—the senate, judges, and in very rare cases, the courtiers—can mitigate the harm of a corrupt prince (Poli VI 29 n132). Even when the prince's tyrannical vices are excessive, John still advocates patience in both the modern sense of “waiting” and the medieval sense of “suffering”. John's reticence is reflective of his idea of tyranny. He is thinking of Caligula not Stalin. Because of his extensive experience with civil and bureaucratic government, John recognized the limited reach the state has into the everyday lives of its citizens. Marauding soldiers are no doubt troublesome, but they are not the KGB. The tyrants of the twentieth century brought a magnitude and bureaucratic efficiency to violence that John would have been unable to fully envision. This is why John could think that suffering under a rapacious and exploitive prince might reasonably be understood as the just punishment of a virtueless people.

Nonetheless, under the proper conditions and when the time is right, the tyrant must be removed. John presents the Roman Emperor Julian as the worst example of a tyrant. His problem was not personal vice, avarice, incompetence, or any of the faults of other tyrants. Julian was an apostate or perhaps even worse; John intimates that Julian was a Christian in public, but in private read a corrupt philosophy that nurtured his lust for empire (Poli VIII 21 d378). The most serious of Julian's harmful acts was his attempt to reinstitute pagan religion. In this attempt, Julian extended his pernicious influence into the most important aspect of the lives of his citizens, their religious worship and thus their hopes of salvation. It is safe to assume that there is nothing the whole people could have done to warrant, as a punishment from God, that their prince alienate them from their means of salvation. In John's version of the story, Julian is assassinated by a soldier—the Christian Martyr Mercurius—acting on the command of the Blessed Virgin. In this clearest case the tyrant's harm is extreme and unmerited, and the divine command is explicit, leaving open the questions of whether there is a duty to kill a lesser tyrant and to whom that duty might fall.

John provides numerous exempla of justified tyrannicide where the tyrant's harm is not as great as Julian's and where the assassin is not acting on an explicit divine command. Based on these other exempla, if there is a duty to kill a tyrant it seems to fall to the right person at the right time who recognizes that killing the tyrant is the right thing to do. In Policraticus book 8, John approves of the senatorial execution of Julius Caesar, the military execution of Caligula, the execution of Julian by Mercurius, and of Holofernes by Judith (a woman and a citizen of a foreign exploited people). This seems to cover all the bases. The right person can come from the political ranks or the military and so would have a clearly defined public role that might confer an obligation to prevent harm to the state. However, Julian and Holofernes are killed by private citizens with no defined public role or duties. It is true that Mercurius was a foot soldier in Julian's army but he was not acting in his capacity as a soldier. It is equally certain that Judith was not enrolled in the Bethulian army. If John did think that there is a duty to slay a tyrant, this duty could fall to anyone and would likely derive from every citizen's very broad interest that the state be well run.

Many political philosophers who have sought to formulate a duty of tyrannicide have tried to limit that duty to those acting in clearly defined public roles. It is not clear whether John failed to see the potential for anarchy in opening this duty to all, or whether he thought that there was no definable duty, but believed instead that whatever manner God might choose to eliminate the tyrant (or impose a greater tyranny, for that matter) would be right and just. “God always punishes a tyrant but sometimes uses the sword of man to do so” (Poli VIII 21 n210).


Primary Sources: Editions and Translations

All citations from primary sources are to the book and chapter numbers of the Latin text and to page numbers of the English translation. Page references for the Metalogicon are from McGarry 1962 (m). There is no single translation into English of the Policraticus; in this article I have used Nederman 1990 (n), Dikinson 1963 (d), and Pike 1972 (p).

Select Secondary Literature

David Luscombe has provided an extensive bibliography for the years 1953-1982 in The World of John of Salisbury (Wilkes 1984). Cary Nederman has carried this task into the new millennium in John of Salisbury (Nederman 2005). (I would like to thank Professor Nederman for allowing me to see an advance copy of his manuscript—KG.)

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Abelard [Abailard], Peter | political philosophy: medieval | syllogism: medieval theories of | universals: the medieval problem of