Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Medieval Political Philosophy

First published Fri Jul 14, 2006

Medieval philosophy is the philosophy produced in Western Europe between Boethius and Descartes, a period of over one thousand years. Medieval political philosophy is the part of medieval philosophy that is concerned with political matters. Philosophical writing about politics during the middle ages (as during the early modern period) was often an attempt to influence public events. The history of the subject therefore involves reference to those events. It also involves reference to developments in medieval culture, e.g., the renaissances of the ninth and twelfth centuries, the development of institutions such as the legal system and the universities. The strong relationship during this period between philosophy and religion also complicates the story. These "extra-philosophical" connections are among the reasons why political philosophy underwent considerable development in the course of the middle ages, as religious thinking was modified by cultural developments and the stress of events. The general arrangement of this article is chronological.

1. The Scope of Medieval Political Philosophy

"Medieval" refers primarily to Europe (the term being applied to other cultures by analogy). Medieval philosophy includes the "pre-scholastic", "scholastic" and "late scholastic" periods.

"Scholasticism" refers to the intellectual culture characteristic of the medieval "schools", i.e., universities. Universities were a European invention of the early thirteenth century.[1] The working language of the schools was Latin, and teachers and students were clergy. The urban schools got a great boost from the translation into Latin of the works of Aristotle, commentaries on Aristotle and related works in Greek or Arabic. These translations were made and copied because there was a public whose interest in Aristotle had been formed by the schools of the twelfth century, in which some works of Aristotle that had been translated earlier (the logica vetus, the "old logic") were already objects of close study. Aristotle was studied in the Arts faculties, but philosophy was developed and employed also in the faculties of Theology. Writers on political philosophy used a number of the literary genres characteristic of scholasticism, such as the commentary, the disputed question, the dialogue and the treatise (see the entry on literary forms of medieval philosophy).

"Late scholasticism" overlaps with the early modern period in philosophy. The people we think of as the early modern philosophers were trained in the universities (or, in Descartes' case, in a Jesuit school), but they wrote mostly outside the universities and mostly in vernacular languages. At the same time philosophy of the scholastic kind continued in the universities, especially in Italy, Spain, and the Netherlands and in the Jesuit schools in many countries, until nearly the end of the 17th century.

The "pre-scholastic" medieval period includes Abelard and Anselm, and the writers of the Carolingian age, but it is difficult to say how far back it should be traced. Perhaps we should include two writers deeply influential in Europe from their own time until the end of the middle ages (and beyond), though they might also be regarded as belonging to late Antiquity, namely Augustine and Boethius. Boethius had provided some of the logical works studied in the twelfth century schools, Augustine was the dominant influence in medieval theology. Boethius wrote nothing directly relevant to political philosophy, but Augustine certainly did, so for the purposes of this article "medieval" begins with Augustine.

By medieval political philosophy we understand the medieval writings on politics that are recognizably akin to the modern writings we class as political philosophy. Most such writings were produced during the scholastic and late scholastic periods. Though some academics wrote commentaries on Aristotle's Politics and some academic "disputed questions" related to topics of political philosophy, political philosophy was not part of the university core curriculum and political writings were generally not produced in the course of teaching duties. But writers on political topics were usually academics writing to be read by university graduates, they drew upon ideas explored in university teaching and they wrote in an academic way. Generally they wrote in response to some political event: some wrote for the edification of a king or other ruler, many wrote to influence conflicts between the Church and secular rulers, many were concerned with controversies within the Church about the constitution of the Church and the powers of Popes and Councils. Often the writers were committed to one or other side in these conflicts—many theologians supported secular rulers even in their conflicts with the Church.

In this article I will not attempt to give a detailed account of medieval political thought (for a detailed account see Bibliography, Carlyle). Instead I will describe the important sources of medieval political ideas, and then I will sketch briefly the work of some of the scholastic and late scholastic writers.

The main sources of ideas on politics during the middle ages were the Bible, the Fathers of the Church, and especially St Augustine, the textbooks of Canon and Civil Law, and the works of Aristotle, especially the Politics.

2. The Bible

For Medieval Christians the Bible was what we call the Vulgate, a Latin translation of the Old Testament (as Christians called the Bible of the Jews) and the New Testament.[2] The Protestant reformers have persuaded many that the Bible was neglected during the middle ages—according to Luther the Bible "lay forgotten in the dust under the bench".[3] However, the many copies of the Bible made during the middle ages, the many commentaries on books of the Bible made by medieval scholars and the constant references to the Bible in their writings show that the Bible was a very familiar book.

2.1. Obedience to the Powers That Be

Political ideas conveyed by the Bible include the following:

The New Testament writers teach that Christians must obey their rulers: "Let every soul be subject to higher powers: for there is no power but from God: and those that are, are ordained of God. Therefore he that resisteth the power, resisteth the ordinance of God. And they that resist, purchase to themselves damnation. …For he is God's minister to thee, for good. But if thou do that which is evil, fear: for he beareth not the sword in vain. For he is God's minister: an avenger to execute wrath upon him that doth evil. Wherefore be subject of necessity, not only for wrath, but also for conscience' sake" (Romans 13:1-5). "Be ye subject therefore to every human creature for God's sake: whether it be to the king as excelling; or to governors as sent by him …For so is the will of God" (1 Peter 2:13-15).

In the 17th century both Protestants and Catholics inferred from these texts that subjects always have a religious duty to obey their rulers, reconciling this with the text "We ought to obey God, rather than men" (Acts 5:29) by means of a doctrine of "passive obedience".[4] Some of the Fathers and the Carolingian writers held a similar position, but most scholastic authors, under the influence of ideas drawn partly from Aristotle and partly from the law texts, held that under some circumstances disobedience and rebellion may be justified.

2.2 Slavery

New Testament writers say that whether a Christian is slave or free is a matter indifferent: "Let every man abide in the same calling in which he was called. Wast thou called, being a bondman? care not for it…For he that is called in the Lord, being a bondman, is the freeman of the Lord. Likewise he that is called, being free, is the bondman of Christ" (1 Corinthians 7:20-22). "There is neither Jew nor Greek: there is neither bond nor free: there is neither male nor female. For you are all one in Christ Jesus" (Galatians 3:28). The ancient Cynics and Stoics also held that a slave may attain virtue and happiness, since the essential freedom of a human being is not incompatible with external constraint.

Since being a slave is a matter indifferent, Christianity did not condemn slavery. Several New Testament texts exhort slaves to obedience (the Vulgate servi, which is normally and properly translated "slaves", is in the Douai version translated "servants"): "Servants, be subject to your masters with all fear, not only to the good and gentle, but also to the froward" (1 Peter 2:18). "Servants, be obedient to them that are your lords according to the flesh, with fear and trembling, in the simplicity of your heart, as to Christ" (Ephesians 6:5; cf. Colossians 3:22). Paul wrote a letter to the Christian slave owner, Philemon, exhorting him to treat well a fugitive slave "whom I have sent back to thee" (Philemon 12).

2.3 Property

"Thou shalt not steal" was one of the ten commandments (Exodus 20:15). Medieval writers assumed that the institution of private property was normal and right and that property should be respected. However, the New Testament encouraged voluntary poverty: "Jesus saith to him: If thou wilt be perfect, go sell what thou hast, and give to the poor…Then Jesus said to his disciples: Amen, I say to you, that a rich man shall hardly enter into the kingdom of heaven. And again I say to you: It is easier for a camel to pass through the eye of a needle, than for a rich man to enter into the kingdom of heaven" (Matthew 19:21-24; cf. Luke 18:22). The New Testament also seemed to recommend voluntary communism as an ideal. The early Christian community in Jerusalem "had but one heart and one soul: neither did any one say that aught of the things which he possessed, was his own; but all things were common unto them. …neither was there any one needy among them. For as many as were owners of lands or houses, sold them, and brought the price of the things they sold, and laid it down before the feet of the apostles. And distribution was made to every one, according as he had need" (Acts 4:32-35). The leading institutions of medieval Europe included monasticism and other forms of religious life based on a vow of poverty and communal living.

2.4 Pacificism

The New Testament included texts that seemed to forbid Christians to use force:

But I say to you not to resist evil: but if one strike thee on thy right cheek, turn to him also the other…Love your enemies: do good to them that hate you: and pray for them that persecute and calumniate you (Matthew 5:39-44).

2.5 Christ's Kingdom

Medieval Christians held that Christ was in some sense a king.[5] However, Jesus said "My kingdom is not of this world" (John 18:36), and he seemed to recommend obedience to the Roman Emperor: "Render therefore to Caesar the things that are Caesar's; and to God, the things that are God's" (Matthew 22:21). None of Christ's followers would have power over the others: "You know that the princes of the Gentiles lord it over them; and they that are the greater, exercise power upon them. It shall not be so among you" (Matthew 20:25-6).

Paul's text, "For what have I to do to judge them that are without? Do not you judge them that are within? For them that are without, God will judge" (1 Corinthians 5:12-13), was usually taken to imply that the Church has no jurisdiction over non-Christians ("them that are without", i.e., outside).

3. The Fathers of the Church

The Christian theologians of late antiquity are referred to as the Fathers of the Church.[6] The most influential of them in medieval Europe was St Augustine; others included Cyprian, Ambrose and Gregory. The Greek Fathers (Origen, Chrysostom etc.) were not so influential at first, but during the scholastic period many of their writings were translated into Latin. The Fathers were influential partly through their originalia (i.e., their original writings in their complete text), but perhaps more through extracts included in "glosses" on the Bible and in anthologies and through extensive quotations made by later writers. Many of the Fathers were influenced by the Platonism and Stoicism that every educated person became acquainted with in the ancient world. Augustine was particularly influenced by Platonism, in the version modern scholars call "neo-platonism", i.e., the philosophy of Plotinus.

The Fathers passed down to the middle ages the idea that certain key social institutions were not part of God's original plan for mankind, namely the institutions of coercive government, slavery and property. The idea found in Seneca and other ancient Stoics of a Golden Age had its parallel in Christian thinking in the age of innocence in the Garden of Eden, from which mankind were expelled because of the sin of Adam and Eve (the "Fall").[7] Just as Seneca ([1917-25], Letter 90) held that originally there would have been no need for coercion, since human beings would voluntarily have accepted the guidance of the wise, and no need for property, since no one would have sought to control more than they needed to support a temperate way of life, and no slavery, since a slave is a human being treated as property, so, according to the Fathers, these institutions would not have existed if Adam had not sinned. But because of sin they do exist, both as a result of sinfulness (the power hungry and greedy amass coercive power and property), and as a necessary and justified remedy for sin—ideally, governments should use coercion to repress wrongdoing, with slavery used only as a punishment, milder than execution, for wrongdoing, and property should be of moderate extent, its purpose being to protect possession of necessities from the greed of those who would otherwise try to control everything. (Of course the problem is to know when slavery, for example, is due to the greed of the slaver and when it is just punishment for the slave's sin! This question does not seem to have troubled anyone.)

The common opinion on coercive government and slavery was expressed by Augustine. God "did not intend that …[man] should have lordship over any but irrational creatures: not man over man, but man over the beasts. Hence, the first just men were established as shepherds of flocks, rather than as kings of men" (City of God, XIX.15, p. 942).[8] He goes on to say that slavery is a just punishment for sin, and that servi are so called because "those who might [justly] have been slain under the laws of war were sometimes spared" [servabantur].

On property, Gratian's Decretum[9] included a passage from Ambrose: "But you say, ‘Where is the injustice if I diligently look after my own property without interfering with other people's?’ O impudent words! ... No one may call his own what is common, of which, if a man takes more than he needs, it is obtained by violence.... Who is more unjust, more avaricious, more greedy than a man who takes the food of the multitude not for his use but for his abundance and luxuries?... The bread that you hold back belongs to the needy".[10] Thus even now that property exists, things are in some sense "common", and the amount of property people may legitimately keep for their own use is limited.

4. Augustine

4.1 The City of God

The work of Augustine's most likely to be known to modern students of political thought is The City of God. Although this work was often copied in the middle ages (382 manuscripts have survived),[11] a reading of the whole work was never part of the university curriculum. Extracts from it were included in influential anthologies, such as Gratian's Decretum and Peter Lombard's Sentences.[12]

The two cities, the city of God and the earthly city, are distinguished by "two loves", love of God and (misdirected) love of self, and by two destinies, heaven and hell. Augustine's most famous contribution to theology was the doctrine of predestination. God has decreed from all eternity that to some he will give the grace (special help) needed to attain eternal salvation, while the rest of mankind (the majority) will go to eternal damnation. Salvation requires the grace of "final perseverance", i.e. the grace of being in friendship with God at the moment of death. Some who live well for most of their lives may fall away at the very end. Thus we cannot tell for sure who is predestined to salvation. Since the city of God consists of those predestined to salvation, we cannot be sure of its membership. The city of God is not identical with the Church, since not all members of the Church will be saved. The earthly city is not identical with any particular state, since some members of any given state may be predestined to salvation. The citizens of any particular state will include citizens of both of the two cities.

Although the members of the two cities have different ultimate values, they may have intermediate ends in common—in particular, everyone desires peace on earth. Insofar as any particular state serves such common ends it will have the cooperation of members of the city of God. See City of God, XIX.17 (pp. 945-7). As a Platonist Augustine thought in terms of a hierarchy of levels of reality, in which lower levels imitate or reflect the higher levels. Augustine's is not a philosophy of "black and white", of stark opposition between the forces of light and the forces of darkness—this was the Manichean philosophy, to which Augustine at one time subscribed, until the reading of certain works of the Platonists had led him to reject it. (In the politics and popular culture of our times Manicheanism seems to be enjoying a revival!) According to Augustine there is no absolute evil.[13] Anything evil must be to some extent good, or it could not exist at all. Its evil consists in disorder or misdirection, in its failing to attain all the goodness appropriate to it. "The peace of all things lies in the tranquillity of order, and order is the disposition of equal and unequal things in such a way as to give to each its proper place" (City of God, XIX.13, p. 938). There are many orderings and sub-orderings, and there are therefore different kinds or levels of peace, and (for beings capable of moral choice) different kinds or levels of virtue, justice and happiness.[14]

True virtue presupposes obedience to the true God. But a simulacrum of true virtue, namely love of honour, may lead to something resembling justice and peace, as it did in the Roman Republic (City of God, V.12). In City of God, II.21 Augustine offers to prove that by Cicero's definition, the Romans never had a republic. "I shall attempt to show that no such commonwealth ever existed, because true justice was never present in it" (p. 80), since the Romans did not obey the true God; cf. XIX.21. But this is only an argumentum ad hominem. As Augustine says, "There was, of course, according to a more practicable definition, a commonwealth of a sort" (ibid.). It is only by an unduly narrow definition that it can be said that non-Christians cannot form a commonwealth. Motivated by love of honour, the Romans were able to live together in an approximation to peace, justice and happiness, though not in "true" peace, justice and happiness. Justice in some measure is essential to anything that deserves to be called a commonwealth. "Justice removed, then, what are kingdoms but great bands of robbers?... It was a pertinent and true answer which was made to Alexander the Great by a pirate whom he had seized. When the king asked him what he meant by infesting the sea, the pirate defiantly replied: ‘The same as you do when you infest the whole world; but because I do it with a little ship I am called a robber, and because you do it with a great fleet, you are an emperor’" (City of God, IV.4, pp. 147-8).

Some medieval writers, whom some modern historians have called "Political Augustinians",[15] inferred from Augustine's discussion of Cicero's definition of a republic that among non-Christians there can be no community. According to Giles of Rome (and a few others), non-Christians can have no property rights and no political rights, since such things presuppose membership of a community, and only Christians can form a true community. But the views of these so-called Political Augustinians were generally rejected by other medieval political thinkers.

In The City of God, Augustine does not suggest that only good Christians can be rulers. Nevertheless, he believes that Christian virtue makes for better government. For his characterisation of the ideal Christian ruler see City of God, V.24, p. 232.

Among medieval Christians there were at least three views of the goods and evils of government:

All three views could find support in The City of God.

4.2 Augustine on Warfare

Augustine insists, against the Manichees, that the God of the Old Testament is the same as the God of the New Testament. One of the most striking differences between the two testaments was in relation to warfare. In the Old Testament God permits, in fact requires, the Israelites to engage in massacres. In the land God has given to the Israelites, the inhabitants of a city that surrenders will be enslaved, but if the city resists, "you shall not leave a single soul alive" (Deuteronomy 20:11, 16). "You must utterly destroy them; you shall make no covenant with them, and show no mercy to them" (Deuteronomy 7:2). If in some Israelite city some inhabitants practice idolatry, "you shall surely put the inhabitants of that city to the sword, destroying it utterly, all who are in it and its cattle" (Deuteronomy 13:16). Moses himself carried out a massacre of Israelites who had practiced idolatry (Exodus 32:25-9). Moses was angry when the Israelites spared women and children, and ordered them to kill all the prisoners except the virgins, whom they could keep for themselves (Numbers 31:13-18). Samuel was angry with Saul when the army let some animals live; for that sin, God deprived Saul of the kingdom (1 Kings 15). Samuel himself hewed a prisoner to pieces (1 Kings 15:32-3). In the New Testament, in contrast, Christ says: "if one strike thee on thy right cheek, turn to him also the other". Can the New Testament be reconciled with the Old Testament? On Augustine's view, the two Testaments must be reconcilable, since everything in the Bible is true.

According to Augustine, God may treat his creatures as he pleases, and the Israelites accordingly did no wrong in carrying out God's commands. (As medieval authors often put it, God is "lord of life and death".) On the other hand, the New Testament's apparently pacifist injunctions relate to inner attitude, rather than to outward act. "These precepts pertain rather to the inward disposition of the heart than to the actions which are done in the sight of men, requiring us, in the inmost heart, to cherish patience along with benevolence, but in outward action to do what seems most likely to benefit those whose good we ought to seek" (Letter 138 ii.13).[18] Those whose good we ought to seek include ourselves, and also our enemies, and coercion and punishment may benefit them, so we may war against them for their own good, as well as for our own. Private individuals may not make war, but rulers, including Christians, may do so, and Christians may serve in such wars in obedience to a ruler, even a pagan. Augustine emphasises that both rulers and those who do military service in obedience to rulers must avoid hatred, greed and other dispositions incompatible with love. They must punish lovingly. Thus Augustine is able to construct a Christianised version of the Roman theory of the just war.[19]

On warfare see Contra faustum XXII.74-80, letters to Boniface (Letter 189.4), Marcellinus (Letter 138, chapter II), and Augustine [2001].

4.3 Augustine on Coercion of Heretics

In accordance with Augustine's view of warfare, Christians were entitled to ask the Roman authorities, including those among them who were Christian, for military protection against the violence of heretics and anti-Christians. But it was a further step to ask the authorities to coerce heretics to convert them to orthodox Christianity.[20] At first Augustine disapproved of such coercion: "A man cannot believe unless he is willing".[21] But after a while he was persuaded and became an advocate of the use of force to "compel them to come in" (Luke 14:16-24).[22] He was persuaded by converted Donatists who expressed gratitude to those who had compelled them to convert. (Letter to Vincentius, Letter 93 V.17-19).

According to Augustine, the property of heretical sects may rightly be confiscated: see Tractates on the Gospel of John, VI.25, in which Augustine justifies government seizure of Donatist property. He does not argue that only orthodox Christians can rightly possess property. Rather, his point is that whoever possesses property, possesses it only by virtue of human laws made by kings and emperors. Therefore, if the ruler decides to confiscate the property of heretics, he has the right to do so. This passage, quoted by Gratian, Decretum, dist. 8, c. 1, was often used in the middle ages to support the doctrine that property exists only by human law.

On the coercion of heretics, see the letters to Boniface (Letter 185), Vincentius (Letter 93) and Donatus (Letter 173), and Augustine [2001].

5. Carolingian Political Thought

The period in the history of Latin Europe after that of the "Fathers of the Church" has traditionally been called the "dark age", because very few writings were produced then. This was followed by what has sometimes been called "The Carolingian Renaissance", associated with the court of Charlemagne, toward the end of the eighth century. The political writers of the ninth century—Hincmar of Rheims, Rabanus Maurus, Jonas of Orleans etc.—are not household names, yet they gave expression to ideas that were important throughout the rest of the middle ages, in particular ideas about the role of a king and the difference between king and tyrant.[23]

According to these writers, the king is in some sense a religious figure. This meant that the king could involve himself in religious matters much more than would later be acceptable to the medieval church, but it also meant that the king was to be instructed in his duties by the clergy. Some of the writings of this period belong to what modern scholars call the "mirror of princes" genre (for an example see Jonas of Orleans [1983]). Writers taught the king that he had a duty to do justice. This was often construed as meaning that the king had a duty to enforce and also to obey the law, and the law was thought of as partly custom, partly royal decree, but also as something based on the consent of the people.[24] It was suggested that a king might be deposed as a tyrant if he failed to obey the laws and lost the consent of the people.[25]

6. Civil and Canon Law

Historians point to another "renaissance" (i.e., another stage in the re-appropriation of the culture of antiquity) during the 12th century. Part of this "renaissance of the twelfth century" there was a revival in the study of civil law, i.e., the Roman law as codified and digested by Justianian and his officials (the Corpus iuris civilis),[26] and this stimulated and influenced the study of the rules or "canons" of the Church (the Corpus iuris canonici), as collected in Gratian's Decretum.[27]

Ideas that medieval political thinkers took from the law texts included the following:

Of these points, what was probably most important for medieval political philosophy was the idea of natural law.

6.1 Different Kinds of Natural Law

Complex reflections on natural law were prompted by a text of Isidore of Seville, quoted in Gratian, Decretum, dist. 1, c. 7, Ius naturale. According to Isidore, natural law includes "the common possession of all things, the one liberty of all, and the acquisition of what is taken from air, land and sea; also, the restitution of a thing or money left for safekeeping".[41] The common possession of all things seems inconsistent with the acquisition and restitution of property.

One of the early commentators on Gratian, Rufinus, distinguished within natural law between commands or prohibitions, to which there can be no exceptions, and "demonstrations" or "indications" pointing out what is better but not always obligatory. Thus natural law not only lays down rules but also recommends ideals. The "one liberty of all men" and "common possession of all things" belong to the "demonstrations". Since the demonstrations do not impose strict obligations, human laws can for good reasons set them aside. To do so may even serve the recommended ideals, under some circumstances. "For example... it was established that those who pertinaciously rebelled against those who have authority over them would be perpetually slaves when defeated and captured in war... that [they]... should thereafter become gentle...", a purpose recommended by natural law.[42]

One of the founders of Franciscan theology, Alexander of Hales, reported Rufinus's distinction and a similar distinction by Hugh of St Victor,[43] but also suggested another way of resolving the inconsistency in Isidore's list, based on Augustine's explanation of how the same God can be the author of the Old Law and of the New, namely that the same principles may require different particular rules for different circumstances.[44] According to Alexander, Isidore's list is not inconsistent after all, since natural law prescribes community for the state of innocence and respect for property for the fallen state.[45] The leading Franciscan theologian of the next generation, Bonaventure, adopted a similar position.[46]

Building on these ideas, Ockham developed a distinction between three kinds of natural law, according to which some principles of natural law apply everywhere and always, some applied only in the state of innocence, and some apply only "on supposition", viz. on the supposition of some voluntary act (e.g., an agreement or an act of legislation), unless those concerned agree on something else. Thus "the common possession of all things, the one liberty of all" belonged to the natural law in the state of innocence, but "the acquisition of what is taken from air, land and sea; also, the restitution of a thing or money left for safekeeping" belonged to natural law "on supposition"—supposing Adam's sin, and supposing that human law has since made a division of property, it is a requirement of natural law to respect others' property. [47] Many things that belong to the law of nations are also natural laws of the third kind.

7. Aristotle's Politics

Another aspect of the "renaissance of the twelfth century" was the translation into Latin of many Greek and Arabic philosophical and scientific writings (see the section on New Translations in the entry on medieval philosophy). The market for these translations was the teachers, students and alumni of the urban schools, which in the early thirteenth century began to form universities. The universities set the curriculum followed in the schools of the town, and, given Aristotle's fame, competition for students between the schools of different towns soon meant that Aristotle's works became the main element in the Arts curriculum (despite the misgivings of the theologians, who noted the conflicts between Aristotle's philosophy and Christian belief).

In their interpretations of Aristotle's natural philosophy and metaphysics and in philosophical thinking generally, the medieval schools were much influenced by certain Islamic and Jewish thinkers. This was not true, however, in political philosophy. By some accident of transmission, the Islamic world does not seem to have known Aristotle's Politics but did become acquainted with Plato's Republic (which was not translated into Latin during the middle ages). There was in Arabic a good deal of political philosophy showing the influence of Plato (for some information see "Political Thought in Medieval Islam" listed below under "Other Internet Resources"), but it had little or no influence over political philosophy in Medieval Europe.

Aristotle's Politics was translated into Latin for the first time in the mid-1260s by William of Moerbeke. (An incomplete translation had been made a few years earlier, possibly by Moerbeke, and the Nicomachean Ethics, some parts of which relate to politics, had been translated by Robert Grosseteste a little earlier.) Although the Politics did not become part of the core curriculum, it was closely studied by many of the leading philosophers of the scholastic period.[48] Notable commentaries on the Politics were written by Thomas Aquinas and Peter of Auvergne.[49] Ockham used their commentaries to give a clear and concise summary of Aristotle's political theory.[50] For a modern account of the work see the entry on Aristotle's political theory.

Ideas which medieval political writers took from Aristotle (or which Aristotle reinforced) include the following:

8. Papal Fullness of Power

The concept of papal "fullness of power" originally meant that the Pope had preeminently whatever power within the Church was possessed by any other authority within the Church, so that the Pope could intervene by full right in any Church affair.[64] During the 13th century this conception was invoked when the Pope authorised the mendicant friars to preach and perform religious functions in a diocese even without the consent of the diocesan bishop. Such interventions were strongly opposed by clerics who argued that bishops had their authority by divine law and were not merely agents of the Pope.[65]

During the 13th and 14th centuries Popes also claimed the right to intervene in affairs normally the province of secular rulers. This claim was made especially in reference to the Roman Empire: Pope Leo III had crowned Charlemagne in 800, and in 962 Pope John XII gave the title "Roman Emperor" to the German prince Otto I. From then until 1806 a line of German princes claimed the title. The Popes took the view that they had transferred the Empire from the Greeks to the Franks in the person of Charlemagne, and from the Franks to the Germans in the person of Otto I, thereby showing that the Roman Empire was subject to the Popes, and in particular that the Pope had a right to approve or reject the candidate elected to be emperor (by the German princes who constituted the electoral college—like the Pope, the Emperor was a monarch chosen by an electoral college to hold office for life.) Incidents in the history of the various kingdoms supported papal claims over the kingdoms.

Besides the historical arguments there were theological or philosophical arguments. If "there is no power but from God" (Romans 13:1, §2.1 above) and the Pope is God's representative on earth, then it seems that power comes to Christian kings through the Pope. Medieval writers were not acquainted with Plato's notion of a "philosopher king" (Republic, 473e), since very little of Plato had been translated into Latin, but in effect pro-papal theologians were arguing that the Pope was a "theologian king", an expert on the meaning of life whose guidance was authoritative in all matters.

The Popes did not in fact wish to take on the burdens of day-to-day government throughout the world. Their claim was that, while normally ruling was the business of kings, the Pope could intervene by full right in governmental matters whenever he saw good reason to do so. Canon lawyers drew up lists of circumstances in which the Pope might intervene,[66] but some items in the list were so comprehensive that no area remained in which Popes could not intervene. For example, intervention ratione peccati, ‘by reason of sin’ meant that if a secular ruler commits an injustice (which is a sin) then the Pope may intervene.

These claims were opposed by secular rulers, by clerical writers who saw some interest in defending the secular rulers, and by theologians unconvinced by the pro-papal arguments and concerned about the likely effects of papal encroachment. Most of the political writers of the 13th and 14th centuries were involved in controversy about the extent and limits (or absence of limits) of papal authority.[67]

9. Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas wrote a work in the "mirror of princes" genre, namely On Kingship, to the King of Cyprus, but otherwise his political writing was incidental to his academic work, and not, as was the case with most medieval political writers, an attempt to influence contemporary events. The Summa theologiae includes discussions of dominion in the state of innocence, natural law and other kinds of law, property, the best form of government, the duty of obedience, war, coercion of heretics and infidels, and other matters. These discussions are not organised into a separate treatise on politics but distributed through the work in accordance with its plan as a summary of theology.[68]

Whereas Augustine had held that in the state of innocence there would have been no lordship of man over man, Thomas says that there would have been dominium [lordship] in the state of innocence (Summa, 1, q. 96, a. 4). This has sometimes been taken as a rejection of Augustine in favour of Aristotle's doctrine that politics is natural. However, Thomas says that in the state of innocence there would have been no coercion, but there would have been government in the sense of wise leadership voluntarily accepted by the less wise. This is a view found not in Aristotle but in earlier Latin writers, for example Seneca (see §3), and the contradiction with Augustine is merely verbal—for Augustine dominium implies coercion, for Thomas its sense is broader.

On natural law and other kinds of law Thomas again follows not Aristotle but the tradition of civil and canon law going back to the Roman Stoics.[69] He distinguishes divine law (eternal and positive) from human law, and among human laws he distinguishes natural law from the law of nations and civil law; see Summa, 1-2, q. 95, a. 4. Law is concerned with direction to the common good, which belongs to the whole people (Summa, 1-2, q. 90, a. 3). All positive human law must be in accordance with natural law, though its prescriptions will depend upon choice and circumstances (for example, natural law prescribes that we must not kill, but whether there should be a law requiring motorists to drive on the left or on the right is not determined by natural law). See Summa, 1-2, q. 95, a. 2. Natural law is in effect morality, and according to Thomas the human mind, reflecting on and analysing human experience, can see the truth of various fundamental moral principles, which are thus "self-evident", not in need of proof, and too fundamental to be capable of proof (Summa, 1-2, q. 91, a. 3, and q. 94, a. 2.).[70]

On property Thomas follows the view of the Stoics and the Fathers that property exists by human positive law. Natural law permits us to use things (Summa, 2-2, q. 66, a. 1), but property goes beyond permission to use—it includes a power to exclude others from use, and this power is conferred by human positive law (Summa, 2-2, q. 66, a. 2). Property rights give way to extreme need (see §6 above), so in time of extreme need using another's property without permission is not theft (Summa, 2-2, q. 66, a. 7).

The best form of government, according to Thomas, is a mixed government combining elements of democracy, aristocracy and kingship (Summa, 1-2, q. 105, a. 1). This is reminiscent of Aristotle's preference for polity over either democracy or oligarchy, but in fact many ancient writers, including Cicero, advocated mixed government, and on this topic Thomas is closer to Polybios than to Aristotle.[71]

On the duty to obey government, Thomas does not adopt the position that many others found in the New Testament, that disobedience is never justified. According to Thomas Aquinas, though there is a general duty to obey the law and the government, an unjust law is not a law (Summa, 1-2, q. 96, a. 4; see also 2-2, q. 104, a. 5).

On war, Thomas is an exponent of a version of the "just war" theory Augustine took from the ancient Romans. For a war to be just, it must be commanded by someone in authority, there must be a just cause, and it must be carried on without disproportionate violence. It is not justifiable to lie to an enemy, since that would destroy the trust that will be needed to restore peace. See Summa, 2-2, q. 40, a. 1, a. 3.

On questions relating to the coercion of heretics and unbelievers, Thomas supports the practice of the medieval Church. A heretic (i.e., someone who has been baptised as a Catholic but has since rejected orthodox Catholic doctrine) can rightly be compelled to return to the Church, but a Jew or unbeliever who has never been a Catholic cannot be converted by force (Summa, 2-2, q. 10, a. 8). Simple people should not be exposed to the opinions of unbelievers (Summa, 2-2, q. 10, a. 7, 9). The children of Jews cannot be taken from them and brought up as Catholics, since this would violate the natural rights of the parents (Summa, 2-2, q. 10, a. 12). The religious rites of Jews may be tolerated, but not those of other unbelievers except to avoid strife or in hope of their gradual conversion (Summa, 2-2, q. 10, a. 11).

9.1 Thomas Aquinas on Secular and Spiritual Power

This topic is discussed briefly at the end of an early work, the Scripta super libros sententiarum. (For translation, see Thomas Aquinas [1978], pp. 106-7.) Thomas asks, When two authorities conflict, how should we decide which to obey? He answers that if one authority originates totally from the other (as, he says, the authority of a bishop derives from the Pope), greater obedience in all matters is due to the originating authority. If, however, both powers originate from a higher authority, the higher authority will determine which of them takes precedence on which occasion. Spiritual and secular power, he says, both come from God, so we should obey the spiritual over the secular only in matters which God has specified, namely matters concerning the salvation of the soul, and in civic matters we should obey the secular power—"unless spiritual and secular power are joined in one person, as they are in the Pope, who by God's arrangement holds the apex of both spiritual and secular powers". In other words, the Pope has supreme authority in both secular and spiritual matters.

In a late work, De regno, Thomas constructs an Aristotelian teleological argument to the same conclusion. A polity has an end, purpose or goal, which may be sought in a variety of ways, effectively or not, and it is a composite entity consisting of many individuals with their own individual purposes. For both reasons there is needed some directing agency to guide the potentially conflicting individuals effectively to their common goal. The goal is in some way single—otherwise the polity will disintegrate. Every being is in some way one; a composite entity has a unity of order, i.e., of direction to a single end. In preserving its being, therefore, the directing agency has to preserve the polity in peace and unity by ordering it to a common goal. There is a hierarchy of goals, that is, there are intermediate ends which are also means to higher ends. A polity exists to secure its citizens' lives, but above living there is living well, i.e., virtuously, and above that there is living so as to attain the "beatific vision" of God (the Christian heaven). If all these ordered ends were attainable simply by human effort, the one supreme directing agency would be concerned with them all; however, to attain the beatific vision requires "grace", i.e., God's special help, which natural human activity cannot earn. God's Church is a human agency that God has established as a means to grace, especially through the sacraments. Hence there is a distinction between secular government using naturally available means to guide citizens to their final goal, and ecclesiastical government using supernatural means, the sacraments. Secular rulers must be subject to the Pope, "for those to whom pertains the care of intermediate ends should be subject to him to whom pertains the care of the ultimate end".

For more detail see the section on Political Community in the entry on Aquinas's moral, political and legal philosophy.

10. Giles of Rome

Philip IV, King of France 1285-1314, was one of the most ruthless of medieval rulers. His conflict with Pope Boniface VIII, one of the most arrogant of medieval Popes, and with Pope Clement V, one of the most timid (who acquiesced in Philip's attack on the Templar Order and other outrages to evade the king's pressure to condemn his predecessor as a heretic), gave rise to a body of writings of great interest to the history of political thought.[72] Of these the most important were Giles of Rome's De ecclesiastica potestate (On Ecclesiastical Power) and John of Paris's De potestate regia et papali (On Royal and Papal Power), both c. 1302,[73] respectively an assertion of supreme papal power and an attempt to restate the dualism of Duo sunt (see §6 and note 35).

Giles's book argues that the Pope's fullness of power extends to political matters, so that the Pope is the supreme ruler of the world, God's deputy on earth, who delegates power to governments and supervises their activities. Giles's term for governmental power is dominium, which was also a term for property; Giles assimilates the two kinds of dominium, so that he holds that the Pope is also the supreme owner. He supports his position by a multiplicity of arguments, of which I will report only two. (1) He appeals to the idea that the universe is a single unity with a hierarchical ordering in which the Pope is the supreme hierarch among mankind: there are two swords, but the temporal sword must be subject to the spiritual, i.e., secular rulers must be subject to the Pope.[74] (2) He applies Augustine's discussion of the question whether the Romans had a true republic (see §4.1) to argue that no one who does not submit to Christ's dominium, and therefore to the dominium of the Pope as Christ's vicar, can have any just dominium himself. As Augustine said, property is possessed by the laws of emperors and kings (§4.3), which presupposes the authority of a community: so, Giles argues, since people who fail to honour the true God cannot belong to a community, only members of the community of the faithful can have any right to political power or property.[75] Wyclif later took these arguments further to the conclusion that no sinner, indeed only the predestined, can have any just dominium, a doctrine condemned by the Council of Constance. The thesis that only Christians can have lordship was inconsistent with the theological tradition and was generally rejected.[76]

Giles of Rome may have had a hand in drafting Boniface's document Unam sanctam, generally regarded as the most extreme statement of papal authority. Whether he drafted it or not, the ideas and language of Unam sanctam are reminiscent of Giles's work.[77]

For more on Giles's philosophy and political philosophy, including his influential book on the education of a prince,[78] see Giles of Rome.

11. John of Paris

John of Paris reasserts the traditional distinction between ownership and rulership. The fact that a ruler adjudicates property disputes does not make him supreme owner. A community (a state, or the Church, or particular communities) acquires property only from individuals, and the head of the community is the administrator of the community's property, not its owner. This is true also of the Pope, who does not have unrestricted power over Church property,[79] still less over the properties of lay people. John's assumption that original appropriation is by individuals, and his remark that individuals acquire property by "labour and industry", have led to suggestions that he anticipated Locke's theory of property. However, John indicates that individuals acquire property under human law,[80] which is the view traditional among medieval theologians, following Augustine (see §4.3). Property is acquired under human law, but it is acquired by individuals, not directly by rulers.

As for rulership, John argues that the spiritual and temporal powers should be held by different persons, so that the Pope cannot be the supreme temporal ruler. John gives the traditional reasons (see §6), emphasizing the argument that the priest should be exclusively devoted to spiritual affairs. The temporal power is not established by, or in any way caused by, the spiritual power. Both come from God, but neither comes through the other. The spiritual is in some sense superior, but not as being the cause of the temporal power. The basis of the distinction between the two powers is not subject matter or ends, but means. Each power is limited to its own appropriate means of action; the secular power uses natural means, the Church uses supernatural means (the sacraments, which confer God's grace). This is very much like Thomas Aquinas's picture of two powers leading mankind toward the goals of human life in ordered hierarchy, one using natural means and the other supernatural. Thomas infers from the fact that the Church is concerned with the highest end the conclusion that the Pope ought to direct the secular ruler. John explicitly rejects this line of argument. In a household the physician guides the pharmacist but cannot give authoritative directions or dismiss the pharmacist, since they are both under the authority of the householder, and similarly both Pope and prince derive their authority from God. God sets the limits of their power, and he has not subordinated either to the other.

12. Marsilius of Padua

Another upsurge in writing about politics was prompted by the actions of Pope John XXII (Pope 1316-1330). John's opponents included Marsilius of Padua and William of Ockham. Pope John rejected the Franciscan doctrine that the highest form of religious poverty, practiced by Christ and the Apostles, was to own nothing whatever, either as an individual or as a member of a body that owns communal property. Relying on arguments drawn from the civil law, John held that no one can justly use consumables, such as food, without owning what they use—no one can live without property. John also became involved in conflict with Ludwig of Bavaria. Relying on the papal claim that the emperor elect requires papal approval, John rejected the electors' choice of Ludwig as Roman Emperor (see §8).

Marsilius of Padua's Defensor pacis (1324)[81] set out to refute the doctrine of papal fullness of power and, in particular, to prove that the pope is not the source of government power. He argues that all coercive power comes from the people (pp. 44-9, 61-3), and that no people can have more than one supreme ruler, who is the source of all coercive power in that community (pp. 80-6). (Marsilius is the first exponent of the doctrine of sovereignty later put forward by Hobbes and many others, i.e., the doctrine that there must be ultimately just one coercive power in a state.) The supreme ruler cannot be a cleric, since Christ has forbidden the clergy to become involved in temporal affairs (pp. 113-40). And the supreme ruler does not enforce divine law as such, since God wills that divine law should be enforced by sanctions only in the next world, to give every opportunity for repentance before death (pp. 164, 175-9). The supreme ruler is therefore not an enforcer of religion and his rule is not subject to direction by the clergy. Among the clergy, the Pope has from Christ no more authority than any other. Christ did not appoint Peter as head of the Church, Peter never went to Rome, the bishop of Rome is not Peter's successor as head of the Church (pp. 44-9). As for property, Marsilius sides with the Franciscans and takes their doctrine further—not only is it legitimate for religious to live entirely without ownership of property, but this is what Christ intended for all the clergy (pp. 183-4, 196-215). Thus on his view the Pope and clergy should have no lordship at all, either in the sense of coercive jurisdiction or in the sense of ownership of property. His position is diametrically opposite that of Giles of Rome.

Marsilius did believe that the Church exercised some authority over its members, but, so far as this was a doctrinal authority, it was exercised not by the Pope but by a general Council (Marsilius held that the Bible and general Councils are infallible, but not the Pope (pp. 274-9)), and now that Europe is Christian a general Council cannot be convened or its decisions enforced except by the Christian lay ruler (pp. 287-98). The establishment of a hierarchy and the division of the Church into bishoprics and other acts of Church government are also done by authority of the lay ruler. Rather than secular government being subordinated to the Church, the Church is subordinated to the secular government in all that concerns coercive power.[82]

13. William of Ockham

When his authorship of Defensor pacis was discovered, Marsilius hastily left Paris and took refuge at the court of Ludwig of Bavaria in Munich. Not long afterwards a number of dissident Franciscans also took refuge in Munich, among them William of Ockham.

13.1 Ockham on Property

The first of Ockham's "political" writings, the Work of Ninety Days, was a defence of Franciscan poverty against Pope John. Against the Pope's position Ockham restated and elaborated the view common among theologians that property exists by human convention and law rather than by natural law.[83] There are clear echoes in 17th century theories of property of the debate on poverty between Pope John and the Franciscans.[84]

13.2 Ockham on Fullness of Power

Soon Ockham began to write about the conflict between John and the Roman Empire, and, like Marsilius, he saw the papal claim to fullness of power as the root of many evils.[85] Unlike Marsilius, he did not reject the idea of papal fullness of power in every sense. Against Marsilius (whom he quotes extensively on this topic),[86] Ockham defended the traditional belief that Christ appointed Peter as head of the Church, and he held that the Pope, as Peter's successor, has supreme power in the Church, though his power is not unlimited. The Pope and other clergy must not become involved in secular affairs, normally—but in exceptional circumstances, Ockham says, the Pope may intervene in secular matters when no lay person is able or willing to take the lead in some matter necessary to the welfare of the Christian community. This is an application of Aristotle's notion of epieikeia (see §7).[87] The Pope's regular power in religious matters and occasional power to intervene in secular matters justify the traditional ascription to the Pope of fullness of power, but all the same it is a power within limits. Not only must the Pope respect the moral law and the teachings of the Church, but he must also respect rights based on human law and compact, and he must respect the Gospel liberty of Christians. A Pope who oversteps these bounds may be deposed; indeed, if his action involves heresy, he is deposed ipso facto—and according to Ockham, Pope John was a heretic.

13.3 Ockham on Limited Secular Government

Besides disagreeing with Marsilius over the status of Peter and the extent of the Pope's power, Ockham criticised his thesis that no community can be well governed unless all coercive power is concentrated in one sovereign authority.[88] On the contrary, Ockham argues that such concentration is dangerous and incompatible with freedom. Just as he had argued that the extreme version of the doctrine of papal fullness of power would make Christians the Pope's slaves, contrary to the gospel, so he argues that the corresponding doctrine of fullness of power for the Emperor would be incompatible with the best form of government, whose subjects are not slaves. Ockham suggests limitations on the power of the secular ruler. That the emperor is "released from the laws" (legibus solutus) is not true, because he is bound not only by natural and divine law but also by the law of nations (a branch of human positive law), according to which some are free and not slaves. "What pleases the prince has the force of law", but only when it is something reasonable and just for the sake of the common good and when this is manifestly expressed.

13.4 Ockham on Freedom of Discussion

In part I of his Dialogus, books 3 and 4 (c. 1334) Ockham discusses heresy and heretics, suggesting that to show that someone is a heretic it is not enough to show that something that person believes is heresy, it is necessary also to show that he or she believes it "pertinaciously", and to show this it is necessary to enter into discussion to discover whether the person is ready to abandon the error when it is shown to be such. Until this has been shown to that person, he or she may maintain something that is in fact a heresy "a thousand times", even in the face of contradiction by bishop or Pope, without being a heretic (1 Dialogus 4.23). On the other hand, a Pope who tries to impose a false doctrine on others is known to be pertinacious precisely from the fact that he is trying to impose false doctrine on others, and a Pope who becomes a heretic automatically ceases to be Pope. Thus ordinary Christians (or a Pope arguing as a theologian and not purporting to exercise papal authority) can argue for a heresy in discussion as long as they make no attempt to impose it on others, whereas a Pope who tries to impose a heresy ceases to be Pope and loses all authority. Christians must defend dissidents who are upholding a position that may possibly be the truth against a possibly heretical Pope, until the uncertainty is resolved by discussion. This is an argument for freedom of discussion within the Church (though not for toleration in general).[89]

14. The Conciliar Movement

In 1378 some of the cardinals who had elected Pope Urban VI met again and elected another Pope, claiming that their earlier choice had been coerced. This was the beginning of the Great Western Schism. Various possible solutions were debated. One proposal was to call a General Council of the Church to end the schism. To this it was objected that only a Pope could call a Council and that its decisions needed papal confirmation. The prominent French churchman and academic, Jean Gerson, argued that such requirements were a matter of human ecclesiastical law, which should be set aside if it impeded the reformation of the Church. The arguments of Gerson and others prevailed, and the schism was in the end healed by a Council. The Council of Constance, 1414-1418, deposed two rival Popes (by then there were three, one of whom resigned) and elected a new Pope. The Council also passed the decrees Sacrosancta (otherwise called Haec Sancta) which claimed that a Council has power over a Pope in all matters pertaining to faith and the reformation of the Church and in particular the present schism,[90] and Frequens, which required the calling of a Council every ten years.

The conciliarists were those who argued that, at least in extraordinary circumstances, a Council could be called, if necessary without papal permission, to deal with schism, with authority over even a true Pope. They included Pierre d'Ailly, John Gerson, Henry of Langenstein, John Maior, Jaques Almain, Nicholas of Cusa and others. They argued that every corporation has the power to take the measures that may be necessary if its survival is endangered by failure in its head. The Church must be able to deal with situations in which the papacy is vacant or uncertain or corrupt; otherwise its existence would be more precarious than the existence of a secular body politic, which can replace its head if necessary. The analogy between the Church and a secular body politic ran through much conciliarist thinking.

As the conciliar movement developed, some argued that even in ordinary circumstances the judgment of a Council could prevail over that of a Pope. Later Popes (though they owed their position to Constance) opposed conciliarism, at least in its more radical form, and warned secular rulers that conciliarist ideas also threatened the power of kings—they were aware of the analogy between conciliarist views of church government and anti-monarchical views of secular government. The analogy was also noticed by some of those who wrote during the quarrel between Parliament and the King in 17th century England.[91] Despite its possible anti-monarchical implications, the notion that the Pope was subordinate to a Council remained attractive to the French monarchy, and in France conciliarism was one of the sources of Gallicanism.

There were a number of strands in conciliarist thought. One important influence was the tradition of canon law, in which it had been acknowledged that a Pope could be judged and deposed if he became a heretic or notorious sinner.[92] Ockham had likewise argued that "on occasion" anyone able to do so could rightly do whatever was necessary to preserve the Church, for example by deposing a Pope who had become a heretic or notorious sinner. An unacknowledged influence was Marsilius, who had argued that the ultimate authority in the Church was the Christian people, that Councils should be convened by the secular ruler and that a Council could not err in matters of faith.[93] Many conciliarists held that Christ's commission (Mark 16:15, "Go ye into the whole world, and preach the gospel to every creature") was primarily to the Church as a whole, and held either that the authority of the whole Church derives to the Pope, or to the Council when papal power is obstructed or abused, or else that the authority of the whole Church derives normally to a Council (while a Council is in session). On either view, the Council could depose an unsatisfactory Pope, but on the second view the Council is the chief organ of Church authority even in normal circumstances. Ockham's view was that the normal constitution of the Church is monarchical (according to Ockham, Christ had appointed Peter as sole head of the Church), and a Council or indeed someone else may acquire power over a Pope, or in place of a Pope, only in exceptional circumstances.[94]

15. Franciscus de Vitoria

Franciscus de Vitoria was a Spanish Dominican, who studied at the University of Paris, where he was influenced by a revival of interest there taking place in the work of Thomas Aquinas. He returned to Spain and became professor of theology at Salamanca in 1526. He was one of the originators of what some modern historians have called "the second scholasticism", a revival in Spain and Italy of interest in Thomas Aquinas and other theologians of the scholastic period.[95]

Vitoria's lectures on the American Indians and on the law of war were given originally in 1532 and published after his death in 1557. Another sixteenth century theologian who defended the rights of the Indians was Bartholomew de Las Casas.[96] Another philosopher-theologian of the late Scholastic period who wrote about political questions was Francisco Suárez.

15.1 Vitoria on the Indians Lately Discovered

Vitoria argues that the Indians had a right to property and independent government which the Spaniards ought to respect. The Indians are not "natural slaves". Aristotle did not mean "that it is lawful to seize the goods and lands, and enslave and sell the persons, of those who are by nature less intelligent" (p. 251). (Vitoria may have been influenced by Duns Scotus's discussion of slavery—see note 53.) The Emperor is not lord of the whole world, and even if he were he would not be able to transfer the Indians' property to others (pp. 252-8). Likewise the Pope is not temporal lord of the world, and even in spiritual matters he has no jurisdiction over non-Christians—"For what have I to do to judge them that are without?" The right of discovery, i.e., the right to appropriate a new discovery that did not already belong to anyone, does not apply, since what the Spaniards have discovered in America did already belong to someone. The Indians cannot be dispossessed on the pretext they have not accepted the Christian faith. Even if they had rejected the faith after it had been properly preached to them (but "I hear only of provocations, savage crimes, and multitudes of unholy acts" on the part of the Spaniards, p. 271), they could still not justly be despoiled of their possessions. Their sins do not justify dispossession. Even when the Indians consent to be dispossessed, they cannot justly be dispossessed: "The barbarians do not realize what they are doing; perhaps, indeed, they do not even understand what it is the Spaniards are asking of them. Besides which, the request is made by armed men, who surround a fearful and defenceless crowd" (p. 276).

By the law of nations, the Spaniards have the right to travel among the Indians and trade with them, and Spanish visitors have the right to share in anything that the Indians treat as unappropriated or common. Also by the law of nations, the children born to Spaniards in America have the right to citizenship where they have been born (p. 281). If the Indians refuse such rights, the Spaniards should reason with them. If the Indians try to drive them away by force, it is lawful for the Spaniards to meet force with force. But "the barbarians may still be understandably fearful of men whose customs seem so strange, and who they can see are armed and much stronger... If this fear moves them to mount an attack... it would indeed be lawful for the Spaniards to defend themselves... but... they may not exercise the other rights of war" (p. 282).

15.2 Vitoria on Just War

Vitoria's concern about conflict in America led him to write on the justice of warfare. Following Augustine, Vitoria says that notwithstanding such texts as Matthew 5:39, Christians may engage in war (pp. 297-8). An individual has a right of defensive war if attacked, since natural law permits a person to resist force with force, but offensive or punitive war can be waged only by a commonwealth or ruler (pp. 299-302). There must be a just cause. Just causes do not include difference of religion, the ruler's glory, or the expansion of an empire. There is only one just cause, namely a serious wrong done to citizens of the state that goes to war (or done to some other person—humanitarian intervention is permitted (p. 288)). For the purpose of correcting and deterring wrong done to his subjects, a ruler has jurisdiction over foreigners, and he may exercise this jurisdiction through warfare (p. 305). If a subject is convinced that a war is wrong, he ought not to serve in it, but people without access to good information are entitled to accept the ruler's assurance that the war is just. "There may nevertheless be arguments and proofs of the injustice of a war so powerful that even citizens and subjects of the lower class may not use ignorance as an excuse for serving as soldiers." The intentional killing of innocent subjects of the enemy regime is never permissible (despite the Old Testament texts that approve it). Collateral damage to the innocent is permissible but must not be disproportionate (p. 315). (See the entry on the doctrine of double effect.) War must not be waged so as to ruin the people against whom it is directed. There is an obligation to see that greater evils do not arise out of the war than the war would avert.[97] Vitoria's discussion of warfare is still worthy of attention.

16. The Medieval Tradition of Political Philosophy

Although Political Philosophy was not part of the core curriculum in the universities, and although the writings surveyed above were generally not produced with the idea of contributing to a philosophical discipline, by the end of the middle ages the discipline of political philosophy (or political theology) had attained self-consciousness and a sense of constituting a tradition. Manuscript copies of political writings by different authors were often bound together as volumes; see Oui [1979]. There was a readership to which such works could be addressed; see Miethke [1980]. Writers of the "second scholasticism" usually included a sketch of the history of a problem and surveyed what others had said about it. In the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries a number of collections of political writings were published, e.g., by Dupuy, Dupin, and Goldast. In the early modern period philosophers such as Hooker, Grotius, Hobbes and Locke could easily find the works of at least some writers who had written on some political topic during the middle ages, or would know of their ideas at least by hearsay.

If there is a theme to this history, it is perhaps the development of political liberalism. The liberal trend was helped, perhaps paradoxically, by the close interweaving of religion with other threads of medieval life. This meant not only that religion influenced all aspects of life, but also, reciprocally, that the other departments of life influenced religious thinking. The influence of the Roman Law and Aristotle, and of the culture of late antiquity familiar to the Fathers of the Church, also meant that ideas originating outside the framework of the Christian religion had an impact on religious thinking. The duality between kingship and priesthood (perhaps originally due merely to the fact that Christians had no political power), and the conflicts that resulted from that duality, meant that religious thinking had to accommodate the concerns of powerful people who were not officials in the religious institutions.

From the time of Constantine, and in the west especially from the time of Augustine, Christians practiced the coercion of heretics and the repression of unbelief. However, their regime was never completely repressive. Among medieval political philosopher-theologians there was always some acknowledgement of the rights of unbelievers (e.g., of the rights of Jewish parents, the Church's lack of jurisdiction over "those without", the property rights of unbelievers). There was a recognition of the duty to reason and persuade ("A man cannot believe unless he is willing"). In social relations there was a belief in an underlying liberty and equality, and a belief that originally government and slavery did not exist, an idea that government, law, and property arose by "pact" or custom, and an idea that originally government belonged to "the people" and was entrusted to rulers by the consent of the people. These beliefs were akin to the modern liberal presumption in favour of personal liberty. There was a belief in the "rule of law", in a distinction between good government and tyranny, in "natural rights". There was a belief in limited government (see Ockham in §13.3) and in a distinction (not yet a separation) between Church and State. Concerning the constitution of the Church a strong claim for unfettered papal power was made by some Popes and their supporters, but this was strongly resisted by writers who argued that a heretic or sinful Pope, including one who violated the rights of the laity and of unbelievers, could be deposed. Something like freedom of speech was embodied in the practice of disputation, and in Ockham's case was explicitly advocated for disagreements among Christians. Where all this still fell short of political liberalism was the absence of any argument for equal freedom of all religions. That came in the 1680s (though Locke and Bayle did not advocate equal freedom for all religions—not for Catholics! But this was because Catholics, who at that time rejected equal freedom of religion, were dangerous to others).

The arguments of medieval political philosophers are only partly available in modern political philosophy. Non-believers cannot make much use of arguments with theological premises. But even for us, there is perhaps some value in the reminder that, under some circumstances, a religious tradition is capable of developing—not only in response to external pressure but even out of its own resources—in the direction of peace and cooperation between members of the two cities.


Editions of Latin Texts

See below, Augustine [1955], Bonaventure [1882], Dyson [1999a], [1999b], Giles of Rome [1961], [1968], Gratian [1879], John of Paris [1969], Marsilius of Padua [1928], [1932-33], [1979], William of Ockham [1974], [1995b].

Translations of Latin Texts

See below, Augustine [1998], [2001], Dyson [1999a], [1999b], Giles of Rome [1986], James of Viterbo [1995], John of Paris [1971], [1974], Jonas of Orleans, Marsilius of Padua [1980], [1993], Ptolemy of Luca [1997], Suárez [1944], Thomas Aquinas [1978], [2002], Vitoria [1991], William of Ockham [1992], [1995a], [1995b], [1998], [2001].

More or Less Comprehensive Histories

See below, Burns [1988], Canning [1996], Carlyle [1930], Coleman [2000], Gierke [1951], Lagarde [1956-70], Miethke, [2000a], Skinner [1978], Tierney [1982].

General Bibliography

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas: moral, political, and legal philosophy | Aristotle, General Topics: political theory | Augustine, Saint | Giles of Rome | John of Salisbury | medieval philosophy | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | Ockham [Occam], William | Wyclif, John