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Coherentist Theories of Epistemic Justification

First published Tue Nov 11, 2003; substantive revision Tue Sep 18, 2007

Coherentism is a view about the structure of justification or knowledge. The coherentist's thesis is normally formulated in terms of a denial of its contrary foundationalism. Coherentism thus claims, minimally, that not all knowledge and justified belief rest ultimately on a foundation of noninferential knowledge or justified belief.

This negative construal of coherentism occurs because of the prominence of the regress problem in the history of epistemology, and the long-held assumption that only foundationalism provides an adequate, non-skeptical solution to that problem. After responding to the regress problem by denying foundationalism, coherentists normally characterize their view positively by replacing the foundationalism metaphor of a building as a model for the structure of knowledge with different metaphors, such as the metaphor which models our knowledge on a ship at sea whose seaworthiness must be ensured by repairs to any part in need of it. Coherentists typically hold that justification is solely a function of some relationship between beliefs, none of which are privileged beliefs in the way maintained by foundationalists, with different varieties of coherentism individuated by the specific relationship among beliefs appealed to by that version.

1. The Regress Problem

When we are justified in believing a claim, we often are so justified because our belief is based on other beliefs. Yet, it is not an adequate defense of a belief merely to cite some other belief that supports it, for the supporting belief may have no epistemic credentials at all — it may be a belief based on mere prejudice, for example. In order for the supporting belief to do the work required of it, it must itself pass epistemic muster, standardly understood to mean that it must itself be justified. If so, however, the question of what justifies this belief arises as well. If it is justified on the basis of some yet further belief, that belief, too, will have to be justified; and the question will arise as to what justifies it.

Thus arises the regress problem in epistemology. Skeptics maintain that the regress cannot be avoided and hence that justification is impossible. Infinitists endorse the regress as well, but argue that the regress is not vicious and hence does not show that justification is impossible. Foundationalists and coherentists agree that the regress can be avoided and that justification is possible. They disagree about how to avoid the regress. According to foundationalism, the regress is found by finding a stopping point for the regress in terms of foundational beliefs that are justified but not wholly justified by some relationship to further beliefs. Coherentists deny the need and the possibility of finding such stopping points for the regress. Sometimes coherentism is described as the view that allows that justification can proceed in a circle (as long as the circle is large enough), and that is one logically possible version of the view (though it is very hard to find a defender of this version of coherentism). The version of coherentism that is more popular, however, objects in a more fundamental way to the regress argument. This version of coherentism denies that justification is linear in the way presupposed by the regress argument. Instead, such versions of coherentism maintain that justification is holistic in character, and the standard metaphors for coherentism are intended to convey this aspect of the view. Neurath's boat metaphor — according to which our ship of beliefs is at sea, requiring the ongoing replacement of whatever parts are defective in order to remain seaworthy–and Quine's web of belief metaphor–according to which our beliefs form an interconnected web in which the structure hangs or falls as a whole — both convey the idea that justification is a feature of a system of beliefs.

To see exactly where this conception of justification takes a stand on the regress problem, a formulation of the standard skeptical version of the regress argument will be helpful. To formulate such an argument, we need to use the idea of an inferential chain of reasons. Such an inferential chain traces the inferential dependence of a given belief, including in it as first link the belief in question, as second link whatever reason justifies it, as third link whatever epistemically supports the reason in question, and so on. The skeptical argument then proceeds as follows:

  1. No belief is justified unless its chain of reasons
    • is infinitely long,
    • stops, or
    • goes in a circle.
  2. An infinitely long chain of reasons involves a vicious regress of reasons that cannot justify any belief.
  3. Any stopping point to terminate the chain of reasons is arbitrary, leaving every subsequent link in the chain depending on a beginning point that cannot justify its successor link, ultimately leaving one with no justification at all.
  4. Circular arguments cannot justify anything, leaving a chain of reasons that goes in a circle incapable of justifying any belief.

As noted, coherentists are ordinarily characterized as maintaining that premise 4 of this argument is false. Though such a view would count as a version of coherentism, standard coherentism has no quarrel with 4, but instead rejects 1 because it presupposes that justification is non-holistic. Premise 1 assumes that justification is linear rather than holistic in virtue of characterizing justification in terms of inferential chains of reasons, and it is this feature of the regress problem to which typical coherentists object.

In sum, then, coherentism can be negatively characterized as the view that, first, agrees with foundationalism that there is no regress of justification that is infinite (thereby rejecting both skepticism and infinitism) and, second, disagrees with foundationalism that justification depends on having an inferential chain of reasons with a suitable stopping point. This negative point can be maintained either by denying that the chain has a stopping point, thereby endorsing a linear version of coherentism, or by denying the assumption that justification requires the existence of an inferential chain of reasons, thereby endorsing a holistic viewpoint. Since the primary examples of coherentism in the history of the view are holistic in nature, I will focus in the remainder of this entry on this version of the view.

2. The Positive Account

Coherentists often defend their view by attacking foundationalism, implicitly relying on the implausibility of infinitism and skepticism. They attack foundationalism by arguing that no plausible version of the view will be able to supply enough in the way of foundational beliefs to support the entire structure of belief. This attack takes two forms. First, coherentists argue against the very idea of a basic belief, maintaining that it is always a sensible question to ask, “Why do you believe that (i.e., what reason can you give me for thinking that is true)?” Second, coherentists attack the idea that the kind of foundation developed will be adequate to support the structure. If, as is usual, foundationalists limit foundational beliefs to those about our experience in the specious present, it is hard to see how such a limited foundation can support the entire edifice of beliefs, including beliefs about the past and future, about the vast array of scientific opinion both about the observable realm and the unobservable, and about the abstract domain of mathematical and logical truth and the truths of morality. Foundationalists may, of course, introduce epistemic principles of justification that license whatever chain of reasons they wish to endorse from the foundations to the rest of the edifice of belief, but the resulting theory will look more and more ad hoc as new epistemic principles are offered whenever the threat of skepticism looms regarding a kind of belief not defensible by standard inductive and deductive rules of inference.

Regardless of the persuasiveness of these challenges to foundationalism, coherentists must and do go beyond negative philosophy to provide a positive characterization of their view. A bit of taxonomy and some specific examples will allow us to see how the required positive characterization is provided by coherentists. A useful taxonomy for coherentism can be provided by distinguishing between subjective and objective versions of coherentism. At a purely formal level, a version of coherentism results from specifying two things: first, the things that must cohere in order for a given belief to be justified, and second, the relation that must hold among these things in order for the belief in question to be justified. In the realm of the logical space of coherentism, both features can be given subjective or objective construals.

2.1 The Things Over Which Coherence is Defined

Consider first the items that need to cohere. As noted already, coherentists typically adopt a subjective viewpoint regarding the items that need to cohere, maintaining that the system on which coherence is defined is the person's system of beliefs. Coherence could be defined relative to other, more objective systems, however. Social versions of coherentism may define coherence relative to the system of common knowledge in a given society, for example, and religious versions may define coherence relative to some body of theological doctrine. These latter two systems are objective in that the obtaining of the system in question implies nothing about the person whose belief is being evaluated. For this reason, they tend to be rather implausible, since they deny the perspectival character of justification, according to which whether or not one's beliefs are justified depends on facts about oneself and one's own perspective on the world. Versions that combine subjective and objective features are also possible. For example, a theory might begin with the system of a person's beliefs, and supplement it with additional claims that any normal person would believe in that person's situation. It is true, however, that standard versions of coherentism are subjective about the items relative to which coherence is defined.

Even if this aspect of the view is subjective, however, belief is not the only subjective item to which a theorist might appeal, leaving one to wonder what explains the uniform agreement among coherentists that coherence should be defined relative to the class of beliefs. The reasons for this uniformity fall into two categories. One kind involves the claim that the only other possibly relevant mental states are experiential states (appearance states, sensation states), and that such states cannot be reasons at all since they lack propositional content(see Davidson 1989). This viewpoint has little plausibility to it, however. It may be true that there are some experiential states without content (perhaps the experience of pain is an experiential state without content), but it is equally true that some have content. It can appear to a person that it is raining, and the mental state involved has as content the proposition that it is raining.

A more plausible way to pursue this kind of argument is to maintain that if experiential states play a role in justification, they'll have to be able to play that role whether or not they are the kind of state that has propositional content. So, if some lack content and cannot be reasons on account of lacking content, then experiential states cannot play a role at all.

The difficulty with this line of argument is the conception of reasons it involves. It is true that if an experience has no content, then it cannot be in virtue of its content that it provides a reason. Even so, it is far from obvious that a reason has to be one in virtue of its content, for if we attend to ordinary defenses people give of their beliefs, they often cite their experience as a reason. One can question whether they are merely explaining their beliefs rather than justifying them, but when that distinction is clarified, they'll still cite their experience as their reason (“Why are you grimacing?” “Because my leg hurts.” “Why do you think your leg hurts?” “Because I can feel it.” “Well, your experience may explain why you believe that your leg hurts, but I'm not asking for an explanation of your belief, I'm asking you to provide a reason for thinking that your belief that your leg hurts is correct; can you give me such a reason?” “Yes, because I can feel it hurting…”)

The second category of defense for the idea that coherence is a relation on beliefs involves an argument to the effect that other mental states are either irrelevant to the question of the epistemic status of a belief (e.g., affective states such as hoping, wishing, fearing, and the like) or are insufficient for generating positive epistemic status (e.g., states such as sensation states or appearance states) — there is, after all, the issue of what to make of the sensory input, and that issue takes us beyond the sensation state itself (see Lehrer 1974, esp. p. 188). The former point is unproblematic, but the latter point fails to imply the claim in question. Arguing that an appeal to experiential states is insufficient for justification in no way shows that an appeal to such states is not necessary for an adequate account of justification.

There is, however, a deeper motivation behind coherentists' aversion to defining coherence over a subjective system that includes experiential states. The worry is that appealing to experiential states in any way will result in a version of foundationalism. The understanding of foundationalism which results from the regress argument involves two features. The first is an asymmetry condition on the justification of beliefs — that inferential beliefs are justified in a way different from the way in which non-inferential beliefs are justified — and the second is an account of intrinsic or self-warrant for the beliefs which are foundationally warranted and which support the entire structure of justified beliefs. There are various proposals for how this latter commitment of foundationalism is to be formulated, but we can already see the outline of an argument for requiring that coherence not be defined over a system that includes experiential states. For if a theory were to include such states in the class of things with which a belief must cohere in order to be justified, the above considerations might seem to suggest that such a theory would have to involve some notion of intrinsic warrant or self-warrant. Some justification or warrant would be possessed by a belief, but not in virtue of some warrant-conferring relationship to any other belief. Hence, it might seem, this relation between the appearances and related beliefs would have to generate at least some positive degree of warrant for such beliefs, even if that warrant were not sufficient for full justification. Even if not sufficient for full justification, though, the theory would appear typically foundationalist in that it includes some notion of positive warrant not dependent on any relationship to other beliefs.

This argument is quite persuasive, but is ultimately flawed. The distinctive feature of foundationalism, in the context of the relationship between appearances and beliefs, is that this relation between appearances and beliefs is taken to be one which imparts positive epistemic status (perhaps only in the absence of defeaters). So, for example, if a version of foundationalism appeals to the appearance that it is raining as that which undergirds the foundational warrant for the belief that it is raining, that theory must maintain that the appearance supplies some positive warrant for the belief. It is this warrant-conferring requirement that allows coherentism to escape the above argument, for it is open to coherentists to deny that appearances impart, or tend to impart (even in the absence of defeaters), any degree of positive epistemic status for related beliefs. The coherentist can maintain, instead, that appearances are necessary (in the usual situations) for those beliefs to have some degree of positive epistemic status, but in no way sufficient in themselves for any degree of positive epistemic status. Coherentists can go on to identify what would be sufficient in conjunction with the relation to appearances in typically coherentist fashion, focusing on the way in which any one of our beliefs is related to an entire system of information in question. The resulting theory would be one in which experience plays a role, but not the kind of role that is distinctive of foundationalism.

Another way to make this same point is to recall that coherentism is not committed to the view that coherence is a relation on the system of the person's beliefs. For one thing, coherence might be a relation on an objective body of information, perhaps in the form of coherence with some body of common knowledge (or, more plausibly, by supplementing a system of beliefs with information any normal person would believe). So when coherentists defend a subjective version of the items over which coherence is defined, there cannot be some definitional requirement on the view that coherence must be a relation on a system of beliefs. That conclusion could be drawn only if there were a sound argument that showed that any appeal to experience would turn a theory into a version of foundationalism. Since the argument for that conclusion is flawed as explained above, coherentism proper need not prohibit the subjective system over which coherence is defined from containing experiential states.

2.2 The Relation of Coherence

The second positive feature required of coherentism is a clarification of the relation of coherence itself, and here again we find an important distinction between subjective and objective approaches. The most popular objective approach is explanatory coherentism, which defines coherence in terms of that which makes for a good explanation. On such a view, hypotheses are justified by explaining the data, and the data are justified by being explained by our hypotheses. The central task for such a theory is to state conditions under which such explanation occurs.

BonJour (1985) presents a different objective account of the coherence relation, citing the following five features in his account:

  1. logical consistency;
  2. the extent to which the system in question is probabilistically consistent;
  3. the extent to which inferential connections exist between beliefs, both in terms of the number of such connections and their strength;
  4. the inverse of the degree to which the system is divided into unrelated, unconnected subsystems of belief; and
  5. the inverse of the degree to which the system of belief contains unexplained anomalies. (pp. 95,98)

These factors are a good beginning toward an account of objective coherence, but by themselves they are not enough. We need to be told, in addition, what function on these five factors is the correct one by which to define coherence. That is, we need to know how to weight each of these factors to provide an assessment of the overall coherence of the system.

Even such a specification of the correct function on these factors would not be enough. One obvious fact about justification is that not all beliefs are justified to the same degree, so once we know what the overall coherence level is for a system of beliefs, we will need some further account of how this overall coherence level is used to determine the justificatory level of particular beliefs. It would be easy if the justificatory level simply matched the overall coherence level for the system itself, but this easy answer conflicts with the fact that not all beliefs are justified to the same degree.

One way to address this problem is to distinguish between beliefs and strength of belief or degrees of belief. We believe some things more strongly or to a greater degree than other things. For example, I believe there is a cup of coffee on my desk much more strongly than I believe that I visited my parents in 1993, even though I believe both of those claims. Using the concept of a degree of belief, a coherentist may be able to identify what degree of belief coheres with a system of (degrees of) belief, and thereby explain how some beliefs are more justified than others. The explanation would be that one belief is more justified than another just in case a greater degree of belief coheres with the relevant system for one of the two beliefs.

The best-known example of a theory that employs the language of degrees of belief is also a useful example of a subjective account of the coherence relation. Such a subjective account can be developed by identifying a subjective theory of evidence that determines whether and when a person's belief, or degree of belief, is justified. A beautiful and elegant theory of this sort is a version of probabilistic Bayesianism. The version in question identifies justified beliefs with probabilistic coherence, so that a (degree of) belief is justified if and only if it is part of a system of beliefs against which no dutch book can be made. (A dutch book is a series of fair bets which are such that, if accepted, are guaranteed to produce a net loss.) In addition, this version of Bayesianism places a conditionalization requirement on justified changes in belief. Conditionalization requires that when new information is learned, one's new degree of belief match one's conditional degree of belief on that information prior to learning it. So if p is the new information learned, one should change one's degree of belief in q so that it matches one's degree of belief in q given p (together with everything else one knows) prior to learning q. The idea is that each person has an internal, subjective theory of evidence at a given time, in the form of conditional beliefs concerning all possible future courses of experience, so that when new information is acquired, all one needs to do is consult one's prior conditional degree of belief to determine what one's new degree of belief should be. Further, it is this subjective theory of evidence that defines the relation of coherence on the system of beliefs in question: coherence obtains when a belief conforms to the subjective theory of evidence in question, given the other items in the set of things over which coherence is defined.

More generally, subjective versions of the coherence relation can be thought of in terms of the specification of a theory of evidence that is fully internal to the believer. One obvious way for the theory of evidence to be fully internal is for the theory of evidence to be contained within the belief system itself, as is true on the Bayesian theory above. There are other options, however. A subjective theory could appeal to dispositions to believe rather than to actual beliefs, or to something like one's deepest epistemic standards for trying to get to the truth and avoid error. Foley (1986) develops such a view in service of a type of foundationalist theory, understanding one's deepest standards in terms of the views one would hold given time to reflect without limitation and interference, and subjective coherentists could adopt much of this account in service of their view.

This broader characterization of the options open to subjective versions of the coherence relation carries the additional cost of appealing to the concept of what is internal to a believer, a notion that is none too clear (see the related entry justification, epistemic, internalist vs. externalist conceptions of). In broad terms, there are two important ways of thinking about what is internal here, one emphasizing whether the feature in question is somehow “in the head”, and the other emphasizing whether the feature is accessible to the believer on the basis of reflection alone. Unconscious beliefs would count as internal in the first sense, but not in the second; one's own existence is internal in the second sense, but presumably not in the first.

When offering a taxonomy of subjective versus objective characterizations of the coherence relation, it is not necessary to prefer one of these characterizations of what is internal. Instead, we can allow either to be used to specify a subjective account. Doing so places a greater burden on what kinds of arguments could be given for preferring one account of the coherence relation to another, and here the arguments will proceed in two stages. The first stage will address whether one's account of the coherence relation should be objective or subjective. On the side of an objective construal are the manifold intuitions in which we describe views as unjustified even though they are, from the point of view of the believer, the best view to hold. For example, we would say that cultic beliefs, such as the belief that accepting a blood transfusion is a terrible thing to do, are unjustified; and our judgment is not altered by learning that the believer in question was raised in the cult and can't be held responsible for knowing better. On the side of a subjective construal are the arguments for access internalism, according to which the fact that some people can't be held responsible for knowing better is a clear sign that their beliefs are justified, for justification is a property whose presence is detected by careful reflection. Another argument for subjective accounts relies on the new evil demon problem. Descartes' evil demon problem threatens the truth of our beliefs, for the demon makes the beliefs of the denizens of that world false. The new evil demon problem involves the concept of justification rather than truth, threatening theories that require objective likelihood of truth for a belief to be justified. For beliefs in demon worlds are false and likely to be so, but seem to have the same epistemic status as our beliefs do, since, after all, they could be us!

Recently, a new argument has appeared for subjective accounts of justification and, by extension, for subjective accounts of the coherence relation, if coherentism is the preferred theory of justification. This argument appeals to the idea that an adequate theory of knowledge needs to account both for the nature of knowledge and for the value of knowledge. This issue arose first in Plato's dialogue between Meno and Socrates, in which Meno originally proposes that knowledge is more valuable than true belief because it get us what we want (his particular example is finding the way to Larissa). Socrates points out that true belief will work just as well, a response that befuddles Meno. When he finally replies, he expresses perplexity regarding two things. He first wonders whether knowledge is more than true belief, and he also questions why we prize knowledge more than true belief. The first issue is one concerning the nature of knowledge, and the second concerning the value of knowledge. To account for the nature of knowledge requires minimally that one offer a theory of knowledge that is counterexample-free. To account for the value of knowledge requires an explanation of why knowledge is more valuable than its (proper) parts, including true belief and justified true belief (for more on why knowledge is more than justified true belief, see knowledge, analysis of). Such an explanation would seem to require showing two things: first, that justified true belief is more valuable than true belief; and second, that justified true belief plus whatever further condition is needed to produce a counterexample-free account of the nature of knowledge is more valuable than justified true belief on its own. These requirements show the need for a conception of justification that adds value to true belief, and it is difficult for objective theories of justification to discharge this obligation. In the context of objective accounts of the coherence relation, such an account would be governed by a formal constraint to the effect that satisfying that account would increase one's chances of getting to the truth, and theories of justification guided by such a constraint are prime examples of theories that find it difficult to explain why justified true belief is more valuable than mere true belief. The problem they encounter is called “the swamping problem.” It occurs when values interact in such a way that their combination is no more valuable than one of them separately, even though both factors are positively valuable. Examples that provide relevant analogies to the epistemic case include: beautiful art is no more valuable in terms of beauty for having been produced by an artist who usually produces beautiful artwork; functional furniture has no more functional value for coming from a factory that normally produces functional furniture. Just so, true beliefs are no more valuable from the epistemic point of view — the point of view defined in terms of the goal of getting to the truth and avoiding error — by having the additional property of being likely to be true.

Adopting a subjective theory allows one to avoid the swamping problem. The swamping problem arises for theories that characterize the teleological concept of justification in terms of properties whose presence makes a belief an effective means for getting to the goal of believing the truth and avoiding error. Subjective theories may also characterize the relationship between justification and truth in terms of a means/ends relationship, but they reject the requirement that something is a means to an end only if it is an effective means to that end, i.e., only if it increases the objective chances of that goal being realized. Subjectivists advert to the deepest and most important goals in life as examples, for such goals are rarely ones for which we have much idea of which means will be effective. Consider, for example, the goal of securing some particular person as a spouse, or the goal of raising psychologically healthy, emotionally responsible children. In each case, there are well-known ways in which achieving these goals can be sabotaged, and so we try not to proceed in that fashion. The problem is that there are too many ways that have worked for other people in securing similar goals, with no good way of assessing which of these ways would be effective in the present case. Doing nothing will certainly not work, but among the various actions available, we can only choose and hope for the best.

Subjectivists say the same for beliefs. They maintain that what is objectively a good ground for a belief is no more transparent to us than is how to maximize happiness over a lifetime. We learn by trial and error on what to base our beliefs, in much the same way as we fumble along in trying for fulfilling existence. In doing our best in the pursuit of truth, subjectivists hold, we generate justification for our beliefs, even if all we have is hope that our grounds for belief make our beliefs likely to be true.

Whether these arguments on behalf of subjectivism in the theory of knowledge are weighty enough to overcome the strong intuitions on behalf of more objective accounts is not yet settled, though there is something approaching a consensus that subjectivism cannot quite be right in spite of the arguments in its favor. To the extent that the arguments are deemed plausible, a burden is created for relieving the tension that exists between the attractions of objective accounts and the arguments for subjective accounts. One move to reconcile this conflict is to posit different senses of the term ‘justified’ and its cognates. There are costs to such a move, however. One cost is that subjectivists and objectivists are confused, thinking they are disagreeing when they are not. In ordinary cases when a term has more than one meaning, competent speakers of the language are not confused in this way. Another cost is that ambiguity must be posited without any linguistic clues to its existence, and ambiguities that linguists would not discover but can only be discovered by philosophers are suspect for that reason.

3. Problems for Coherentism

Besides these family disputes within the coherentist clan, there are various problems that threaten to undermine every version of coherentism. The focus here will be on three problems that have been widely discussed: problems related to the non-linear character of coherentism, the input problem, and the problem of the truth connection.

3.1 Problems Related to the Basing Relation

The non-linear approach adopted by the most popular versions of coherentism raises concerns that coherentism is incompatible with a proper account of the basing relation. In brief, an account of the basing relation is needed to explain the difference between a situation where a person has good evidence for a belief, but believes it for other reasons, and a situation where has person holds the belief because of, or on the basis of, the evidence. The idea behind an appeal to the basing relation is that if the explanation of a person's belief does not appeal to the evidence for the belief, then the belief itself is not justified (even if the person has good evidence for the belief and thus the content of the belief is, in some sense, justified for that person). In the former case, where the belief is based on the evidence for it, we will say that the belief is doxastically justified; when there is good evidence for the belief, but the belief is held on other grounds, we will say that the belief is only propositionally justified.

The difficulty is that this way of drawing the distinction makes it appear that holistic coherentism can only use the distinction if, somehow, the entire belief system of a person explains the holding of each belief that is a part of the system since, it would seem, a belief needs to be based on that which justifies it if the belief is to be properly based. If coherentism is at its best in its holistic guises, then coherentism succumbs because it is unable to distinguish properly based from improperly based beliefs (see Pollock 1985). If one goes so far as to maintain the stronger position that coherentism can only be a holistic theory, then coherentists may find themselves in the position of having to maintain that all warranted beliefs are properly basic. For if holistic coherentists cannot draw a distinction between properly and improperly based beliefs, every belief will have automatically survived all requisite tests for warrant just by cohering with the relevant system. If a belief is properly based when it has survived all appropriate scrutiny, then all warranted beliefs will be properly basic, according to coherentism (see Plantinga 1993).

Another way to voice this complaint is to find in the belief system a set of beliefs that can be inferentially related in an appropriate way, thereby allowing for the final step of the inference to be justified. It doesn't follow, however, that any inferential path using the same set of beliefs is a justifying one, simply because one such path is. So suppose there are two paths through the same set of five beliefs, one allowing for justification and the other not allowing for it. Let the contents of the beliefs be p, q, r, s, and t. Further, let each belief imply the next in sequence, i.e., p implies q, q implies r, and so forth. Assume as well that p, q, r, and s are all justified for the person in question. If so, a person can come to justifiably believe t by inferring from p to q to r to s and then to t. Suppose, however, that there are no other inferential relationships here besides the ones already assumed. If the order of inference were from p to s to r to q and then to t, believing t would not be justified. If holistic coherentism can only explain proper basing in terms of whatever justifies the belief, then holistic coherentism will be in trouble since in the case in question there is no difference in the system of beliefs in question. The only difference is in the order of inference, and this difference need imply no difference in belief.

One resource for a coherentist to use in replying to this concern about the basing relation is to distinguish between that which justifies a belief and that which is epistemically relevant to the epistemic status of belief, using this distinction to challenge the assumption that proper basing must be characterized in terms of that which justifies a belief. Consider a very abstract example. Suppose we have evidence e for p. This evidence can be defeated by further information we have, and this defeater might itself be undermined by even further information, information that would reinstate justification for p. Furthermore, there is no limit to the complexity that might be involved in this sequence of defeaters and reinstaters. Suppose, then, that the sequence of defeaters and reinstaters is significantly complex, e.g., suppose there are 20 levels of defeaters and reinstaters. From the perspective of a linear view, what must the person base a belief that p on in such a case in order for that belief to be justified? It would be unrealistic to assume that all 20 levels play a causal role in the belief, for it is not necessary to consider explicitly the sequence of defeaters and reinstaters in order to be justified in believing p. All that is necessary is that there be a reinstater for every level of defeat. If so, however, even a linear theorist will give an account of the basing relation on which it is acceptable to base a belief on something other than that which justifies the belief, all-things-considered.

Such a theorist may still maintain that one must base the belief on something that imparts prima facie justification (the kind of justification that will be all-things-considered justification if there is a reinstater for every defeater). What matters to the present discussion, however, is that even for non-holists there can be parts of a system of beliefs that are relevant to the justificatory status of a belief and yet which need not play a role in the proper basing of a justified belief. If, on the one hand, everything involved in the all-things-considered justification of a belief has to play a role in the basing relation, then every theory will be susceptible to unrealistic assumptions about the basing relation, for it is implausible to think that known rebutted defeaters enter into any kind of causal or deliberative process of belief formation and hence are not suitable candidates for helping to explain the presence of the resulting belief. For example, if I build a room with a blacklight in it, but include a device to block the light from shining on anything less than six feet off the floor, then I can know the color of my daughter's shirt without this information about room construction entering into the story of belief formation — I needn't consciously think of that information or engage in any inference guided by it, and that information need to be part of the cause of my belief. If, on the other hand, a belief can be properly based by being based on only part of the all-things-considered justification for the belief, then holists are free to clarify the basing relation in non-holistic terms as well. They can say that a belief is properly based when its presence is explained by features relevant to the all-things-considered justificatory status of a belief, even if these features themselves do not constitute an all-things-considered justification of the belief.

A simple example of such a feature illustrates how this idea would work in a holistic setting. On a holistic theory, every particular belief is insufficient for warrant on its own. Even so, a given belief might be an essential ingredient of the larger system on which coherence is defined, where that system is one of the systems under which a target belief in question could be justified. In such a case, the belief is relevant to the epistemic status of the target belief, even though it imparts no warrant to the target belief. Beliefs with such special epistemic relevance can be used to clarify what is required for a belief to be properly based without violating the holistic requirement that no such beliefs impart any degree of warrant by themselves.

3.2 The Isolation Objection

A second major problem for coherentism is the isolation objection, also called “the input problem,” which Laurence BonJour formulates as follows:

Coherence is purely a matter of the internal relations between the components of the belief system; it depends in no way on any sort of relation between the system of beliefs and anything external to that system. Hence if, as a coherence theory claims, coherence is the sole basis for empirical justification, it follows that a system of empirical beliefs might be adequately justified, indeed might constitute empirical knowledge, in spite of being utterly out of contact with the world that it purports to describe. Nothing about any requirement of coherence dictates that a coherent system of beliefs need receive any sort of input from the world or be in any way causally influenced by the world (BonJour 1985, p. 108).

The input problem concerns the relationship between a system of beliefs and the external world. It underlies a multitude of counterexamples to coherentism on which we take a person at a given time with a coherent system of beliefs whose system of beliefs meshes well with their experience of the world at that given time. We then freeze this coherent system of beliefs, and vary the person's experience (so that the person still thinks, e.g., he's climbing a mountain when he's really at an opera house experiencing a performance of La Boheme), thereby isolating the system of beliefs from reality. The result is that coherentism seems to be a theory that allows coherence to imply justification even when the system of beliefs is completely cut off from individuals' direct experience of the world around them.

The standard response by coherentists is to try to find a way to require some effect of experience in a belief system, perhaps in the form of spontaneous beliefs (BonJour 1985). Such attempts are not very promising, and lead to the impression that the only way to deal with the input problem is to transform coherentism into a version of foundationalism. That is, the harder coherentists try to find some ineliminable effect of experience on a belief system, the more their theory hinges on finding a role for experience in the story of justification; and when foundationalism is conceived as the kind of theory that allows such a role, then the efforts of coherentists to find such a role for experience look more like acquiescence to the inevitability of affirming foundationalism. For if the only way to avoid the isolation objection is to insist that a belief system must be responsive to experience in order for the beliefs involved to be justified, and if any appeal to experience commits one to foundationalism, then coherentism succumbs to the isolation objection.

As noted above, however, there is nothing in coherentism proper that requires coherence to be defined solely as a relation on beliefs. It is a mere artifact of the history of the view that coherentists always claim such, and whatever the force of the isolation objection against standard versions of coherentism, it disappears as a problem unique to coherence theories once experience is allowed to play a role in a coherentist theory.

3.3 Problems Related to the Truth Connection

A longstanding objection to coherentism can be expressed by noting that a good piece of fiction will display the virtue of coherence, but it is obviously unlikely to be true. The idea is that coherence and likelihood of truth are so far apart that it is implausible to think that coherence should be conceived of as a guide to truth at all, let alone the singular such guide that justification is supposed to constitute.

This concern over the truth connection is sometimes put in the form of the alternative systems objection, according to which there is always some coherent system to fit any belief into, so that if a person were to make sufficient changes elsewhere in the system, any belief could be justified. This particular version of the worry involves too many distractions from the fundamental problem, however. For one thing, it appeals to the idea of making vast changes to one's system of beliefs, but beliefs are not the sort of thing over which we typically can exert control. Furthermore, there is no reason to think that only one system of beliefs can be justified, so rather than constituting an objection to coherentism, this particular formulation of the problem in question looks more like a pleasantly realistic consequence of any adequate theory of justification.

Hidden behind the explicit language of the alternative systems objection, however, is a deeper concern relying on the idea that justification is somehow supposed to be a guide to truth, and mere coherence is not a likely indicator of truth. The deeper concern will have be to formulated carefully, however, for once we see the proper response to the isolation objection above, it is far from clear how coherentism suffers from any failure on this score that would not equally undermine foundationalism. For one way of thinking about the isolation objection is in terms of the idea that coherent systems of belief can be completely cut off from reality, in the same way that a good piece of fiction can be, and once such severance occurs, likelihood of truth must go as well. As we have seen, however, nothing about coherentism proper forces it to succumb to this problem (as long as finding a role for experience in the story of justification blocks the objection, as it must if foundationalism can escape the objection), and if coherentists are able to find a role for experience in their theory, then coherentism cannot be criticized for failure to provide a suitable guide to truth anymore than foundationalism can.

Moreover, there are problems with casual formulations of the truth concern. First, such casual formulations can run into difficulty explaining how one can be justified in believing a scientific theory rather than believing merely the conjunction of its empirical consequences. Since the theory implies its empirical consequences, the conjunction will, in ordinary cases, have a higher probability than the theory (since it is a theorem of the probability calculus that if A entails B, then the probability of A is less than or equal to the probability of B). Second, casual formulations of the truth concern ordinarily fall prey to the new evil demon problem discussed earlier. Inhabitants of demon worlds would appear to have roughly the same justified beliefs that we have (since they could be us), but their beliefs have little chance of being true. So any formulation of the truth concern that insists that justification must imply likelihood of truth will have to find an answer to the new evil demon problem. Further, one of the fundamental lessons of the lottery and preface paradoxes has been held to be that justified inconsistent beliefs are possible. (The lottery paradox begins by imagining a fair lottery with a thousand tickets in it. Each ticket is so unlikely to win that we are justified in believing that it will lose. So we can infer that no ticket will win. Yet we know that some ticket will win. In the preface paradox, authors are justified in believing everything in their books. Some preface their book by claiming that, given human frailty, they are sure that errors remain, errors for which they take complete responsibility. But then they justifiably believe both that everything in the book is true, and that something in it is false, from which a contradiction can be easily derived.) The paradoxes are paradoxical because contradictory beliefs cannot be justified, but inconsistent beliefs, even when the inconsistency is known, are not the same thing as contradictory beliefs (the challenge, of course, is to find a principled way to stop the inconsistency from turning into a contradiction). If justified inconsistent beliefs are possible, and it surely seems that they are, then a system of beliefs can be justified even if the entire system has no chance whatsoever of being true.

This possibility of justified inconsistent beliefs has been held to constitute a refutation of coherentism (see, e.g., Foley 1986), but some coherentists have demurred (e.g., Lycan 1996). One idea is to partition a system of beliefs and only apply the requirement of consistency within partitions of the system, not to the entire system itself. If consistency applies only with partitions, then, presumably, that is also where coherence does its work, leaving us with a coherence theory that is less than globally holistic. A further issue is how the partitioning is to be accomplished, and in the absence of an account of how to do so, it remains undetermined whether the possibility of justified inconsistent beliefs is compatible with coherentism.

It is fair to say that the issue of the truth connection has not been resolved for coherentism. In a way, this fact should not be surprising since the issue of the truth connection is a fundamental issue in epistemology as a whole, and it affects not only coherentism but its competitors as well.


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justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | knowledge: analysis of