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Internalist vs. Externalist Conceptions of Epistemic Justification

First published Mon Jan 24, 2005

Generally, when a person knows some proposition or other, she does so on the basis of something such as evidence, or good reasons, or perhaps some experiences she has had. The same is true of justified beliefs that may fall short of knowledge. These beliefs are justified on the basis of some evidence, or good reasons, or experiences, or maybe on the basis of the manner in which the beliefs were produced.

Internalism in the first instance is a thesis about the basis of either knowledge or justified belief. This first form of internalism holds that a person either does or can have a form of access to the basis for knowledge or justified belief. The key idea is that the person either is or can be aware of this basis. Externalists, by contrast, deny that one always can have this sort of access to the basis for one's knowledge and justified belief. A second form of internalism, connected just to justified belief but probably extendable to knowledge as well, concerns not access but rather what the basis for a justified belief really is. Mentalism is the thesis that what ultimately justifies any belief is some mental state of the epistemic agent holding that belief. Externalism on this dimension, then, would be the view that something other than mental states operate as justifiers. A third form of internalism concerns the very concept of justification, rather than access to or the nature of justifiers. This third form of internalism is the deontological concept of justification, whose main idea is that the concept of epistemic justification is to be analyzed in terms of fulfilling one's intellectual duties or responsibilities. Externalism with respect to the concept of epistemic justification would be the thesis that this concept is to be analyzed in terms other than special duties or responsibilities.

1. Awareness and Access

In an essay on Descartes, the British philosopher H.A. Prichard said that,

When we know something, we either do or can directly know that we are knowing it, and when we believe something we know or can know that we are believing and not knowing it, and in view of the former fact, we know that in certain instances of its use our intelligence is not defective…(Prichard, 1950. p. 94)

Prichard also characterized the point in terms of knowing by reflection:

…if there is to be such a thing as knowing that we know something, that knowing can be attained only directly, we in knowing the thing knowing directly, either at the same time or on reflection, that we are knowing it. (Ibid.)

Knowing by reflection is knowledge one achieves merely by thinking about the matter at hand. Further, even if one reflects a good deal, Prichard holds that the knowing thereby achieved is direct knowing, presumably because one need make no inferences from one belief to another in the activity of reflecting.

Prichard is here endorsing the KK-thesis, i.e., the thesis that knowing implies knowing that one knows. Philosophers who endorse what we can call knowledge internalism accept something akin to what Prichard endorses, though their main focus is slightly different. That is, knowledge internalism concerns not knowing that one knows, as in Prichard, but rather knowing or being aware of that on the basis of which one knows. For example, imagine that you know that a flock of Canada geese has landed in a neighborhood park in your city; and suppose that you came by this piece of knowledge on the basis of and as a result of some testimony from another person who has just returned from that park. Then knowledge internalism would be the view that in knowing that the geese are in the park, one also knows or is aware of that on the basis of which one knows, namely, one is aware of the testimony on the basis of which one has knowledge of the geese. Or, more plausibly, one could become aware merely by reflection of that on the basis of which one knows about the geese.

We can use the term ‘knowledge basis’ for that on the basis of which one knows something. A knowledge basis as here understood need not be restricted to other pieces of knowledge or beliefs, but could also include experiences a person has had. Using this terminology, we could say that knowledge internalism is the thesis that a person either is aware or can be become aware of the knowledge basis for each item of knowledge that person may have.

It is clear that when one is aware of the knowledge basis, or when one can become aware of the knowledge basis, that one thereby has a kind of access to the knowledge basis. Accessibility, it is often said, is the core idea behind internalism, and it is also usually supposed that the sort of accessibility one has is pretty much what Prichard spoke of, namely a kind of direct awareness that one actually engages in or could engage in merely by reflection. Using these ideas we can characterize two different forms of access knowledge internalism.

Actual Access KI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one is also aware of one's knowledge basis for p.

Accessibility KI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one can become aware by reflection of one's knowledge basis for p.

Here we assume that the awareness spoken of in Actual Access knowledge internalism is the direct sort that Prichard had in mind. It is an awareness that is not brought about by any calculation or reasoning.

To illustrate and partly defend Actual Access knowledge internalism, imagine that you look at a tree in the park, and thereby come to know that there is a tree there. We can suppose for these illustrative purposes that your knowledge basis is the visual experience of the tree, and thus that you acquire direct, non-inferential knowledge of the presence of the tree. In this example, when you acquire that knowledge, it seems plausible to also think that you are aware that you are engaged in seeing, and that the content of the visual event is a tree. Moreover, this same sort of point will hold for all manner of easily acquired perceptual knowledge, including that acquired by other sense modalities. So, for a very wide range of cases all involving, we are supposing, non-inferential perceptual knowledge acquisition, access will be quite plausible. In those cases it seems right to think that you are aware of the knowledge basis, the specific perceptual experience and its content, in which you engage when the knowledge is first secured.

Even so, Actual Access knowledge internalism is not plausible when taken in full generality, for these perceptual cases make up only a small portion of one's knowledge. We need only notice that most of one's knowledge is stored knowledge, that is, knowledge one gained at an earlier time and have since retained. Imagine that a person knows that Illinois was Abraham Lincoln's home state. She acquired this knowledge years before, while in elementary school, and has retained it ever since. It is most implausible to think that she is now aware of her knowledge basis for this knowledge about Lincoln, and this in two important senses. First, it is hardly likely that she is now aware of her original knowledge basis, whatever that may have been back in elementary school. Also, second, it is most likely that she has no current awareness of her present knowledge basis, presumably something to do with ongoing stable memory. Of course, some people will have such awareness, but we should not let this fact lead us to the conclusion that every person with this knowledge of Lincoln's home state will be aware of the workings of memory. We should, thus, reject Actual Access knowledge internalism as implausible.

2. Accessibility and Internalism

Most likely, defenders of internalism about knowledge will be unfazed by this rejection. Much more plausible, and also much more likely to be the actual view internalists have in mind, is accessibility knowledge internalism. It requires only that one can become aware of the knowledge basis, either by easy and quick reflection in some cases, or by more difficult and lengthy reflection in others. What matters, however, is not the temporal length of the reflection, but rather that this is an awareness one can achieve merely by reflection. And there is something right about this, because we all engage in this sort of activity all the time, often with good success. We can, then, focus attention on accessibility knowledge internalism.

Access to a knowledge basis can itself be thought of in two ways. One might be capable of attaining awareness of what is in fact one's knowledge basis, but without also being capable of being aware that this item is one's knowledge basis. Or, one might actually be capable of attaining awareness that some item is one's knowledge basis. The difference is this: in the first case, one might have an awareness directed at what is in fact a knowledge basis, but without realizing that it is one's knowledge basis; while in the second sort of case, one's awareness is directed at the fact that some item is one's knowledge basis. Recall the Canada geese example where the knowledge basis is testimony from a friend. A person might be aware of the testimony, and also aware of who it is that is giving the testimony (and thus this person is aware of the knowledge basis); but, not be aware that this testimony is her knowledge basis. In principle, this distinction is no different from a more familiar one. One can be aware of an electrical transformer, without being aware that this item before one is an electrical transformer.

By making use of this distinction in the knowledge case, we can specify two different versions of accessibility knowledge internalism (AKI), a weak form and a strong form. (Hereafter it will be presumed that we are speaking only of accessibility knowledge internalism, and we can speak of weak and strong AKI.)

Weak AKI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one can become aware by reflection of what is in fact one's knowledge basis for p.

Strong AKI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one can become aware by reflection that some item is one's knowledge basis for p.

In the geese example, the weak version would tell us that one can become aware by reflection of the fact that someone has testified to the presence of geese. By contrast, the strong version would go beyond this and say that one can become aware by reflection that this testimony counts as one's knowledge basis for one's belief about the geese.

The two definitions as presently stated may be thought of as complete knowledge basis versions of knowledge internalism, for they both demand a form of accessibility to all of one's knowledge basis for any given piece of knowledge. There are, however, a great many cases where one has a multiplicity of knowledge bases for an item of knowledge. For instance, if one comes to know that p as a result of a lengthy piece of reasoning, as in the construction of a mathematical proof with many steps, then one has many knowledge bases standing behind one's knowledge that p. Or we can think of perceptual cases where one comes to have knowledge based upon a complex assortment of perceptual cues, all of which count as knowledge bases, but only some of which are accessible by reflection. It would be much too stringent a requirement to insist that a person must be capable of becoming aware by reflection of all of her knowledge bases, for every piece of knowledge she then possesses. If that were a requirement, then probably neither weak nor strong AKI would have any plausibility at all. Hence, the two definitions require some amendment, which we can easily provide.

Weak AKI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one can become aware by reflection of what is in fact some essential part of one's knowledge basis for p.

Strong AKI:
Whenever one knows some proposition p, then one can become aware by reflection that some item k is some essential part of one's knowledge basis for p.

We may think of these two definitions of knowledge internalism as partial knowledge basis accounts, for each requires only some form of accessibility to some element or elements of one's knowledge basis. We will confine attention to these two partial knowledge basis accounts.

The use of the term ‘essential’ in weak and strong AKI is important. Imagine that one's knowledge basis for proposition p is quite complex, including a number of different elements. Perhaps one has amassed a good bit of evidence concerning p, and the cumulative effect is to make up one's knowledge basis for p. It may be that some element in this evidence base is inessential, in the sense that even if one were to delete that element, the remaining evidence would still constitute a knowledge basis for p. A case like this might well arise when one has amassed an over-abundance of evidence, perhaps with the aim of being especially careful and diligent. Without the use of the term ‘essential’ in the above definitions, we would allow for cases in which a person was capable of becoming aware of what was in fact an inessential part of her knowledge basis for p. This would unfairly saddle the internalist with an unnecessarily implausible position, and the use of the term ‘essential’ is designed to avoid that consequence.

It should be noted that Strong AKI is here understood to actually incorporate the weak version, though this is not explicitly stated. To see this, it is helpful to notice two statements that are here assumed to be true.

A: If someone is aware that some item k is some essential element of her knowledge basis for p, then she is also aware of k.

B: If someone can become aware by reflection that some item k is some essential part of her knowledge basis for p, then she can become aware by reflection of k.

In a broad sense of the term ‘aware,’ both A and B seem to be true; indeed, in this sense, B is implied by A. Thinking of these two statements as conjoined with strong AKI leads to the result that the strong version of AKI includes the weak.

Another fairly obvious point but one still worth noting is that reflective awareness for one known proposition's knowledge base may be quite easy, while for the same person and a different item of knowledge the reflective access to a knowledge base for that piece of knowledge might prove to be difficult. Defenders of internalism of either variety will doubtless find this point acceptable.

Knowledge externalism, at least with respect to accessibility, is generally regarded as just the denial of knowledge internalism. If we had rested content with knowledge internalism as we first stated it, which required some form of accessibility to all of one's knowledge basis, then knowledge externalism would just be the denial of that internalist position. But that would not be an interesting knowledge externalist position. For, denying that one can access by reflection all of one's knowledge basis for a proposition p is perfectly compatible with one being able to access some of one's knowledge basis for p, indeed some essential part of that basis. Knowledge externalism, however, wants to incorporate the idea that in some cases one cannot access any of one's knowledge basis. Knowledge externalism, then, aims to deny the partial knowledge basis accounts. As we have two of the latter we will naturally expect to find two versions of externalism with respect to accessibility. A weak version of accessibility externalism for knowledge will deny merely the strong version of AKI, thus:

Weak AKE:
It is false that, whenever one knows some proposition p, one can become aware by reflection that some item or other k is a knowledge basis for p.

Weak externalism of this variety is perfectly compatible with one form of accessibility internalism concerning knowledge, namely weak AKI. Defenders of externalism, however, most likely would be interested in going beyond this weak form to an externalist position that is more wide-ranging. This stronger version of externalism would be this:

Strong AKE:
It is false that, whenever one knows some proposition p, one can become aware by reflection of some essential knowledge basis for p.

This position is thus denying that the ability to become aware of an essential knowledge basis is a necessary condition on having knowledge. The proponent of strong AKE can allow that in some cases one might have this ability. Her denial is that one has it in all cases, for each piece of knowledge one happens to possess.

Strong AKE is so called because it rejects even the weak version of knowledge internalism. And since weak knowledge internalism is included in strong knowledge internalism as a part, as per comments made above concerning statements A and B, we may say that strong AKE also rejects strong knowledge internalism. Put more generally, we can say that strong AKE rejects knowledge internalism across the board.

3. Justification and Internalism

Knowledge internalism and externalism have been less extensively discussed in recent literature than justification internalism and externalism. These two opposing theses focus on justified belief rather than knowledge, though there are close parallels. Consider again the Canada geese example, and suppose that the testimony you receive from another person produces in you the justified belief that there are geese in the park. We may also suppose that this justified belief falls short of knowledge. We can say that a justifier for this belief is the testimony one has received from the other person. Here a justifier is an analog of what was termed above a knowledge basis and, as in the latter case, we will allow that justifiers can be other beliefs, or experiences, or facts about the production of the belief. Philosophers take different stances on what legitimate knowledge bases and justifiers may be, but here those questions will be left entirely open.

When one has a justified belief, one is sometimes also aware of the justifier for that belief. And perhaps, for any justified belief and accompanying justifier, one can become aware of the justifier, and do this merely by reflection. This is the core idea behind justification internalism. As with knowledge internalism, this core idea has to do with a form of access, in this case access to the justifiers. Further, continuing the parallel with knowledge internalism, justification internalism can be construed as having weak and strong forms: weak and strong accessibility justification internalism. We may here safely assume that access internalism concerning justification will be no more plausible that its cousin regarding knowledge, discussed above; hence, access internalism regarding justification will be passed over in favor of versions stressing accessibility rather than actual access.

Still, there is the question of whether justification internalism demands accessibility of all of the justifiers for a given justified belief or only some of them. Discussions of justification internalism have tended to focus on the former of these. Here are some passages that point in this direction.

Internalism…treats justifiedness as a purely internal matter: if p is justified for S, then S must be aware (or at least be immediately capable of being aware) of what makes it justified and why. (Kent Bach, 1985. p. 250. Quoted in Alston, 1989. p. 212)

We presuppose, second, that the things we know are justified for us in the following sense: we can know what it is, on any occasion, that constitutes our grounds, or reason, or evidence for thinking that we know. (Roderick Chisholm, 1977. p. 17. Quoted in Alston, 1989. p. 212.)

The most explicit statement of this view comes from Carl Ginet:

Every one of every set of facts about S's position that minimally suffices to make S, at a given time, justified in being confident that p must be directly recognizable to S at that time. (Carl Ginet, 1975. p. 34. Quoted in Alston, 1989. p. 213)

In line with these sentiments, we could define two concepts of accessibility justification internalism, analogous to knowledge internalism that requires accessibility of the complete knowledge basis. We would have these two theses:

Weak AJI:
Whenever one has a justified belief that p one can become aware by reflection of all of one's justifiers for p.

Strong AJI:
Whenever one has a justified belief that p can become aware by reflection that some item j makes up all of one s justification for p.

With strong AJI as just given, the item j might be a single justifier, perhaps a single previously justified belief; or it might be a complex, taking any number of contributing justifiers as elements, as would be the case with a complex of many previously justified beliefs making up one's evidence for p. What is to be stressed is that in both weak and strong AJI as here defined, ability to access all of the justifiers is required; this is a demand for accessibility of the complete justification basis, we might say, on a par with the earlier discussion of a complete knowledge basis. These are, then, complete justifier accounts of weak and strong AKI.

It is unlikely, however, that these two forms of justification internalism will stand up to close scrutiny. To see this, consider a case of rapid acquisition of many justified beliefs at a single moment or in a very short and hurried period of time. We need only think of some emergency situation where very swift reactions are needed, and where the presence of the emergency is based upon a host of sensory cues. In such cases a person will often acquire a battery of justified beliefs, all pretty much in an instant of time, and quick action on those beliefs is necessary to avert some disaster or other unwanted consequence. Certainly the person cannot access, at the acquisition moment, all of the justifiers for each of these newly acquired justified beliefs; she is too busy taking steps to avert the disaster. Nor should we think that she will be able to access all of the justifiers for those beliefs at a later, and calmer time; for, however good her memory might be, it is just unrealistic to suppose that each person will be able to recall all of those justifiers for every one of those justified beliefs. This would be too great a demand to place on memory in the interests of an epistemological theory. It is better to give up the epistemological theory in favor of something more feasible. Such a view is easy enough to come by; we simply weaken things to yield partial justifier accounts of justification internalism.

Weak AJI:
Whenever one has a justified belief that p one can become aware by reflection of some essential justifier one then has for p.

Strong AJI: Whenever one has a justified belief that p one can become aware that some item j is an essential justifier one then has for p.

We thus see that weak and strong internalism regarding justification are straight analogs of weak and strong internalism regarding knowledge. Further, these versions of justification internalism are much more plausible than the complete justifier versions of justification internalism. It is, after all, easier for just about any cognizer to access some essential justifier in any given case than it is to access all of them.

Another important point concerns the time at which one does or could become aware of essential justifiers. We have hitherto spoken as though the internalist is demanding that each cognizer have the ability at any given moment to then become aware of essential justfiers for each of her justified beliefs. There is no reason why internalism should be understood in this fashion. To see the point, imagine that some essential justifier j, for belief b, itself has five sub-elements, where each of these is an essential justifier. Perhaps the cognizer can become aware, by reflection, of two of these elements of j at a single time, but become aware of the remaining three only after much reflection lasting some period of time. Nothing in the internalist picture should rule this out. What is essential is that the awareness be achieved by direct reflection, and not that it occur at a moment.

Externalism with regard to justification is also analogous to knowledge externalism. That is, the weak form of justification externalism is a thesis that merely denies strong AJI, and is perfectly compatible with weak AJI. More interesting is strong justification externalism, or strong AJE, namely:

Strong AJE:
It is false that, whenever one has a justified belief that p, one can become aware of some justifier or other for one's belief that p.

The idea here is that it is false that one is always in a position to access at least one justifier for each one of one's justified beliefs; in some cases, one is unable to access by reflection any of the justifiers, and this fact does nothing to impugn or weaken one's justification for the belief. For an illustration, think again of the emergency situation where one gains a number of beliefs nearly all at once, all of them justified by a number of different justifiers. It is plausible to think that in some cases of this sort, one is unable to access merely by reflection any of the justifiers, either at the moment of belief acquisition or at any later time. Notice that strong AJE does not contend that one is never able to access relevant justifiers. It claims instead that there are some cases where one cannot become aware by reflection of any of one's justifiers for a belief that p, and that this fact does not undercut one's justification for believing that p.

One way to see the import of the externalist position regarding justification is by means of examples. The case described earlier wherein one gains a great number of justified perceptual beliefs all in a short and very hurried time span seems appropriate to this purpose. Another method for getting a sense of the externalist position is by consideration of a theory of epistemic justification that allows for that position. A simple version of the reliable process theory of justification will illustrate the point.

A person S is justified in believing a proposition p if and only if S's belief that p is produced or sustained by a process or method M and M is reliable.

In this illustrative context we may think of the reliability of M as the actual frequency with which true beliefs are produced or sustained by M. If more true beliefs have been produced or sustained by M than false beliefs, then M is reliable. The main point for present purposes is this: being so produced or sustained is all there is to being justified in a belief according to this theory. Nothing more is required, either of the process M or the epistemic agent S. Since this is so, then nothing further is required concerning accessibility to S of any of her justifiers for belief that p.

This theory is illustrative only. No defender of a reliable process theory of justification is apt to regard reliability as determined merely by the actual frequency of true versus false belief production or sustenance. Instead, reliability would be thought of as a propensity that a method M has to produce or sustain mostly true beliefs. This important point about how to best understand reliability, however, will not affect the point just made concerning reliable process theories and externalism regarding justification. Exactly the same argument will apply when reliability is understood as a propensity. Reliability of that sort as applied to process M will be all that is required for S's belief that p to be justified. Accessibility via reflection to any of the justifiers, if present as a capability in S, will not be relevant to her being justified in believing p, and neither will the absence of such a capability. So, if the reliable process theory as here depicted is correct as an account of justified belief, then internalism regarding justification would be false. This point is the main contention of the externalist thesis regarding justification.

4. Other Forms of Internalism

It might be thought that one's view as to exactly what sorts of things count as justifiers will also determine whether one is committed to justification internalism or justification externalism. This question is bound up with another way of drawing the distinction between internalism and externalism, namely, with the view that restricts justifiers to items that are literally internal to the cognizer. One version of this position is perspectival internalism, to use a phrase coined by William Alston, which in one of his formulations comes to this:

PI: The only thing that can justify S's belief that p is some other justified beliefs of S. (Alston, 1989. Epistemic Justification, p. 191.)

These other justified beliefs, of course, would be the justifiers, and since they are beliefs that the person S has, they count as internal to S in the sense that they are internal to S's overall mental framework.

Closely related to perspectival internalism is a somewhat broader thesis according to which all justifiers are mental states of cognizers. This thesis has been termed “mentalism” by Earl Conee and Richard Feldman. Making use of some ideas suggested by Matthias Steup, John Pollock, and Ernest Sosa, they say that this version of internalism,

…is the view that a person's beliefs are justified only by things that are…internal to the person's mental life. We shall call this version of internalism “mentalism.” (Earl Conee and Richard Feldman, 2001. In Kornblith, 2001. p. 233)

Mentalism is broader than PI because it does not restrict the justifiers to justified beliefs, nor even to beliefs. So, mentalism but not PI is perfectly compatible with a view that says that sensory states that are themselves not beliefs and not things that can be appropriately said to be justified can nonetheless function as justifiers. A very simple example that illustrates the difference would be one in which a person acquires a justified belief that there is a tomato in front of her on the basis of a perceptual experience of something looking red and spherical. Mentalism can allow that this very experience of something looking red and spherical is a justifier for the belief that there is a tomato present. For PI, by contrast, if this experience is to contribute to the justified tomato belief, it would have to be because one has a justified belief about something appearing red and spherical. In short, mentalism allows that the very experience may count as a justifier, while PI requires that a justified belief, presumably about that experience, is the appropriate justifier.

A somewhat weaker form of mentalism would maintain only that for each justified belief a person has, some essential justifiers for that belief are mental states of that person, but that other essential justifiers for that belief need not be mental states. Such an account would not be a wholly internalist account, of course, in either the mentalist sense or the accessibility sense, for these further essential justifiers need be neither mental states nor particularly accessible to reflective awareness. The account would rather be one that contained both some internalist elements (some essential justifiers are mental states) and some externalist elements (some essential justifiers are not mental states). The result would count, therefore, as a mixed theory, though the theory might be otherwise perfectly viable as a general account of justified belief.

Since externalism with respect to justification contrasts with internalism, we should expect there to be an externalist contrast to mentalism. The denial of mentalism would simply be the view that holds that something other than mental states of a cognizer can qualify as genuine justifiers. Once again we can illustrate such a position by considering a reliable process theory of justification. On that theory reliability is defined across mental states, so one might think that the theory is either mentalist or that at least it strongly overlaps the mentalist doctrine. That is, the theory directs our attention to belief-formation processes and belief-sustaining processes, and both of them take some mental states as inputs and yield other mental states as outputs. The simplest version of the former might be a perceptual case in which the inputs are sensory states and the outputs are beliefs. Or, if one thinks of the process of reaching a new belief through reasoning, the inputs are some prior beliefs and the outputs are new beliefs. The difference between this theory and mentalism comes in the fact that for reliabilism the inputs and outputs, though certainly mental, are not themselves justifiers. Rather, it is the reliability of the processes in which these inputs and outputs figure that count as appropriate justifiers. So, in addition to being an externalist theory with regard to accessibility, the reliable process theory is externalist with regard to whether the justifiers for a belief are or have to be mental states. The externalist with regard to this issue insists that they need not be.

5. Deontological Justification

There is one additional view that is often thought of as internalist in epistemology, namely the idea that the concept of justification is a deontological concept. In saying this, what is meant is that being epistemically justified in believing something is bound up with, or to be analyzed in terms of, one's living up to one's intellectual duties or responsibilities. We can easily think of cases where justification and obligation seem to be closely connected. When a scientist runs an elaborate experiment in the attempt to confirm some hypothesis H, and she gathers more and more evidence that tends to bear on and confirm H, we tend to suppose that she has an intellectual duty or obligation to follow the evidence wherever it goes and to believe in accord with that evidence. She should not tailor her beliefs, in other words, to non-evidential factors such as her desire to believe something incompatible with H, or her emotional attachment to some proposition incompatible with H. Nor should one's religious or political beliefs get in the way; one's intellectual duty is to follow the evidence and to believe in accord with it, even in cases where the evidence seems to overthrow a proposition one would dearly like to see confirmed.

One may well wonder why the thesis that the concept of epistemic justification is deontological has any connection to internalism. That the justification of a belief is a matter of living up to one's intellectual duties, after all, has no obvious bearing on accessibility to the justifiers for any given belief, nor to any special view as to the nature of those justifiers, such as may be given in mentalism. This question is addressed more fully below. At this point what we can say is that the deontological concept of justification has some internalist component because it seems related to a kind of control over beliefs that the epistemic agent may be thought to have. If one is intellectually obligated to take on a belief given one's evidence, then one must be capable of doing so. This point is underwritten by the general principle that Ought implies Can, i.e., one has an obligation to do action A only if one can do A. If one has the ability to take on new beliefs given one's evidence, then one has some form of control over belief formation, a control that is lodged in the epistemic agent. This is the sense of “internal” ingredient in the deontological conception of justification, and it is this that makes that concept a species of epistemic internalism.

It is now easy to see what the corresponding form of externalism with respect to the concept of justification would be. It would be an account of that concept that steers completely clear of talk of intellectual duties or responsibilities, but instead analyzes the concept of justification in some other way, perhaps in terms of degree of evidential support or in terms of being truth-conducive.

6. Some Possible Interconnections

We have isolated three different forms of internalism regarding justification, and it is natural to ask how, if at all, they might be related to one another. Accessibility internalism, for example, seems to be strongly related to mentalism. If we ask, what might qualify as accessible by reflection, it is difficult to see what else there might be except for one's own mental states. The relationship between these two forms of internalism is not apt to be entailment; for, it is at least conceivable that one has access via reflection to some state of affairs in the non-mental world. Still, we may safely say that if accessibility internalism is true, this is evidence in favor of mentalism.

The evidence is particularly strong if we focus on complete justifier versions of accessibility internalism. On that view it is held that all of the justifiers for any given belief are accessible by reflection. If it is true in fact that everything that is accessible by reflection is a mental state, then mentalism will follow directly from this fact coupled with complete justifier internalism. With a partial justifier account of accessibility internalism, which we noted earlier is the more plausible internalist position, matters are different. On that view it is required that the cognizer merely be able to access by reflection some of the justifiers for any given belief. Hence, this position will permit cases in which the justifiers that are accessible by reflection are all mental states, but other inaccessible justifiers are not. Mentalism, though, is a view about the character of all of the justifiers, to the effect that all justifiers are mental states. So, while we can agree that a partial justifier account of accessibility internalism is evidence for mentalism, the evidence is not as strong as one might initially expect.

Neither does mentalism entail accessibility internalism. It is a familiar point that not all of one's mental states are accessible, but that some are only brought to conscious awareness by medical procedures. Moreover, the example used earlier in which one gains a multitude of new justified beliefs in a rapidly changing perceptual context, all backed by a variety of sensory justifiers, strongly suggests that there will be many justifiers that will not be accessible via reflection even though they are mental states. So mentalism might well be correct even when accessibility internalism is not.

There would be a tight connection between mentalism and accessibility internalism if all of the mental states that are justifiers for beliefs were occurrent mental states. That is, if all of these states were attentively before the mind when one held a justified belief, then those states would then be accessible via introspection. Here we assume that if some mental state occurrently exists or obtains at some time, then one can turn one's attention to that state at that time. However, occurrent justifiers make up but a tiny percentage of the justifiers standing behind the large numbers of justified beliefs any person will have at any time. Any adult cognizer, for instance, is apt to have many thousands of justified beliefs at any moment, with very few if any of them occurrent at a given time, and all of them backed by justifiers. If all of these justifiers are mental states, as mentalism contends, most of them would be buried deep in one's mental storehouse, beyond the reach of reflective awareness.

A possible response to this line of thought would be to point out that typically a person can think of a justification for her justified beliefs, even for cases where one's justified beliefs and their respective justifiers have been stored in the mind for a long time. Consider again the case of one's justified belief that Illinois was Lincoln's home state. For most people this belief is justified, but hardly ever occurrent, and neither are its justifiers. On an occasion when the belief is occurrent one may be able to supply a justification for it. For instance one might note that one must have learned this fact in elementary school, and that one had entertained this fact on earlier occasions since the belief was first acquired. These are thoughts one has on the present occasion and so are mental states; and they are items of awareness and thus accessible to reflective awareness. So even when the justifiers that are mental states are not directly accessible, we might think, some justifiers are always available to reflection, because we can think of what would serve to justify current beliefs. So mentalism does after all entail accessibility, because one can always provide or think of a justification.

It cannot be denied that people very often can supply justification for their beliefs. It can be wondered, however, whether this is always so. Supplying a justification is a fairly sophisticated activity, and many children would be poorly equipped to engage in it. Yet surely these children have justified beliefs. Another perhaps more fundamental point is this: it is not clear that the justification one would supply on some occasion constitutes the set of justifiers one then has for that belief. In the case at hand, one is now justified in believing that Illinois was Lincoln's home state. Further, one has been justified in believing this for some time, including the time period immediately before one attempted to supply a justification. Hence, prior to making that attempt, one already has, or there already are in place, some justifiers for that belief about Lincoln. The only alternatives to thinking this would be to say either that on this occasion, prior to supplying a justification, nothing justifies one's belief about Lincoln, though the belief itself is justified nonetheless; or that the belief is not justified, contrary to appearances. Neither of these possibilities seems at all plausible, however, so we need to allow that there are some justifiers for the Lincoln belief prior to and independently of one's attempt to think up a justification. Thus, even if we presume that every cognizer is always in a position to provide a justification, this point does not serve to show that mentalism entails accessibility internalism.

The deontological concept of justification could be conjoined with either accessibility internalism or with mentalism. But these latter two forms of internalism are not logically connected to the deontological concept. Advocates of the deontological concept of justification are defending a thesis concerning the meaning of the term ‘justified,’ and by itself this thesis concerning the meaning of the term has no implications for what the actual justifiers may turn out to be. Hence, if it were a fact that the concept of epistemic justification is deontological, this fact would not imply mentalism. Nor does mentalism entail the correctness of the deontological concept. For mentalism is compatible with a concept of justification defined in terms of degree of evidential support, or adequacy of evidential support, and there is nothing particularly deontic about either of these ideas. Exactly the same may be said of accessibility internalism. It readily conjoins with a concept of justification of either of these evidential sorts, and so accessibility internalism does not entail that a deontological concept of justification is correct.[1]

The reverse may be true, however. That is, if justification is really a deontological concept, this fact may have implications for accessibility. Further, since we saw earlier that accessibility internalism is some evidence for mentalism, the correctness of the deontological concept would also have some bearing on mentalism. This line of thought is taken up in the next section, where arguments in favor of various forms of internalism are considered.

7. Arguments For Internalism

One line of argument that can be offered in favor of accessibility internalism, though not one that has found explicit expression in the literature, trades on the idea that one is justified in believing p only if one has justified the belief that p. Justifying a belief, of course, is an activity in which one adduces evidence or reasons in favor of the belief, and when one is engaged in this activity one is actively aware of the evidence or reasons brought forward. Of course, if one actually is aware of these bits of evidence or reasons, then certainly one can be aware of them. These items of evidence or reasons offered in the act of justifying, we may say, are the justifiers for the belief in question. Hence, if being justified implies having justified, then being justified implies that one can be aware of the justifiers. So, we might conclude, the mere fact that there are justified beliefs implies accessibility internalism.[2]

There are, however, two important problems with this argument. First, the major premise of the argument seems false. A very large percentage of one's of justified beliefs were never justified in the manner envisioned. We need only recall the example of rapid acquisition of many perceptual beliefs, all of them justified. But none were justified by any activity engaged in by the cognizer, either at the moment of acquisition or at any later time. Moreover, second, even if each justified belief was at some time justified, this fact implies only that there was some time at which the cognizer could be aware by reflection of the relevant justifiers. It hardly follows that the cognizer can be reflectively aware of these justifiers at any time she cares to try, and it is this sort of accessibility that internalism requires. If accessibility internalism were merely the thesis that for each justified belief p, there is some time at which the cognizer can be aware of the essential justifiers for the belief that p, then accessibility externalism would become the thesis that there is never a time at which the cognizer can be reflectively aware of the relevant justifiers. Yet the externalist position is the much more modest point that there are some cases of justified belief where the cognizer is unable to be reflectively aware of the essential justifiers. Defense of accessibility internalism on the grounds that being justified implies having actually justified would make externalism into far too strong a thesis.

Another possible argument for accessibility internalism trades on being able to justify one's belief. The idea is that one is justified in believing p only if one can justify the belief that p. If one were to actually engage in justifying this belief, then at that time one would be aware of the justifiers. So, if one can justify the belief that p, it is reasonable to think that one can be reflectively aware of the justifiers for p.

Here, again, we would have to contend with the examples of young cognizers who certainly have justified beliefs but are in no position intellectually to justify those beliefs. They simply lack the cognitive wherewithal to engage in that sort of activity, but this fact does not prevent them from having beliefs that are justified. Thus, the core idea in this argument for internalism is false. There is also another problem, even if the core idea could be sustained. Any activity of actually justifying a belief is context and audience sensitive. What one would say by way of justifying the belief that p in a context of one sort, made up of an audience of highly sophisticated cognizers, is apt to be quite different from what one would say in a different context and to an audience of quite naïve cognizers. For this reason, it is difficult to say which if any of the things one would offer in an activity of justifying would actually constitute the set of justifiers for the given belief. What one would identify as justifiers in such activities would be subject to such variability, that it is hard to see how we could select any sub-set of such items and safely maintain that they are the justifiers.

The last two arguments, making use of the idea, first, that being justified implies having justified, and then second, that being justified implies being able to justify, may be taken to show a key way that defenders of accessibility internalism may conceive of justified belief or knowledge. The paradigm they may have in mind is that being justified in believing that p is a state one achieves by working things out, reasoning through some sequence of evidentiary steps and then drawing a conclusion that counts as the justified belief. When one engages in reasoning of this type one is aware of the steps through which one reasons and, inter alia, also aware of the justifiers that serve to support one's conclusion. Following this line of thought, it is perhaps natural to think that one can recapitulate at a later time the reasoning one went through enroute to one's justified belief. If this is so, then surely one can justify one's belief, and thus be reflectively aware of the justifiers for that belief.

It cannot be denied that one often arrives at beliefs, including justified ones, in just this fashion. It should also be clear, however, that a great many beliefs, including many justified ones, are not acquired or sustained in this manner. We need only remind ourselves of how much knowledge and justified belief is gotten from perceptual experience and we then realize that a great many items of knowledge and justified belief are not arrived at via reasoning, however generously we construe that operation.

8. Goldman's Argument for Internalism

Alvin Goldman, no friend of accessibility internalism, has reconstructed a line of argument for that doctrine, and his reconstructed argument has the merit of being extendable to mentalism. Goldman begins by noting that internalists often adopt a specific deontological position, namely a “belief-guidance” position, or a guidance deontological concept (GD concept). The idea behind GD is that one ought to guide the formation of one's beliefs by the amount and strength of the evidence one has on hand, and this certainly has a deontological ring to it. This guidance theme is slightly different from what we have identified as the deontological concept of justification, for that is a thesis about what ‘being epistemically justified’ means. The GD conception, on the other hand, is a thesis about how a person ought to go about forming her beliefs.[3] With this distinction drawn, Goldman's reconstruction is straightforward:

  1. The guidance-deontological (GD) conception of justification is posited.
  2. A certain constraint on the determiners of justification is derived from the GD conception, that is, the constraint that all justification determiners must be accessible to, or knowable by, the epistemic agent.
  3. The accessibility or knowability constraint is taken to imply that only internal conditions qualify as legitimate determiners of justification. So, justification must be a purely internal affair. (Goldman, 2001. In Kornblith, 2001. pp. 207-208.)

In the terms that have been used in this paper, what Goldman gestures toward in step (3) by saying that “justification must be a purely internal affair” is just mentalism as we have construed it. And plainly a form of accessibility internalism is what is being noted in (2), though Goldman does not distinguish between whether all or only some of the justifiers (determiners) are to be accessible. The inference from (2) to (3), however, certainly seems to suppose that accessibility internalism implies mentalism, a move that was found questionable earlier in this article.

The point about complete justifier accounts matters for the evaluation of Goldman's argument.[4] As we noted earlier, complete justifier accounts of accessibility internalism provide strong support for mentalism. If complete justifier accounts were considered, Goldman's (3) would have some ring of plausibility. However, we have seen, complete justifier versions of accessibility internalism are too strong; and, partial justifier accounts considerably weaken the support for mentalism. Considering Goldman's (3) in the light of partial justifier accounts of accessibility, we would have to say at once that (3) is false. Partial justifier accounts do not even provide strong support for mentalism, let alone imply it.

There is also a problem with premise (1), concerning the GD conception of justification. While it is true that some philosophers who have accepted internalism, of either the accessibility or mentalist forms, have also accepted this GD conception, they need not do so. Indeed, two leading internalists, Conee and Feldman, explicitly reject the GD conception and any deontological concept that is proposed as an analysis of the concept of justification, and yet this fact has no effect on their favored form of internalism, namely mentalism. These comments reinforce the comments made earlier to the effect that the deontological concept of justification is really independent of accessibility internalism and mentalism.[5]

If accessibility internalism is not to be defended by means of something like the argument Goldman presents, then it is most likely one would have to fall back on the arguments given earlier concerning either actually justifying a belief or being capable of justifying that belief. As we saw, those arguments break down, thereby leaving accessibility internalism wholly unsupported.

9. Defending Mentalism

A strong argument for mentalism has been proposed by Earl Conee and Richard Feldman. Their argument has two prongs: first, they present a number of cases in which the best explanation for why one person has a higher degree of justification than another is that the first person has some specific mental state; and then second, it is argued that the mentalist theory they propose can satisfactorily deal with problem cases and criticisms. One of their examples used in the first part of their argument is this:

Bob and Ray are sitting in an air-conditioned hotel lobby reading yesterday's newspaper. Each has read that it will be very warm today and, on that basis, each believes that it is very warm today. Then Bob goes outside and feels the heat. They both continue to believe that it is very warm today. But at this point Bob's belief is better justified.

Comment: Bob's justification for the belief was enhanced by his experience of feeling the heat, and thus undergoing a mental change which so to speak “internalized” the actual temperature. Ray had just the forecast to rely on. (Conee and Feldman. 2001 In Kornblith, 2001. p. 236)

The strength of this argument is that it makes use of something indisputable, viz., that Bob's justification is stronger than Ray's; and it is hard to think of any other difference between them except that Bob has felt the heat and Ray has not. On the basis of this case and a number of similar ones, Conee and Feldman generalize to the conclusion that “…every variety of change that brings about or enhances justification either internalizes an external fact or makes a purely internal difference.” (Ibid., p. 238)

It is clear that this argument is not decisive, though neither is it claimed to be. The number of cases it examines is very small, of course, but that is not the principal limitation. The important point is that enhancing one's justification, as in Bob's situation, is compatible with the initial justifiers prior to enhancement being elements other than the mental states of the individuals involved. The example of Ray and Bob, and the other examples Conee and Feldman give in which justification is enhanced, all assume that some degree of justification is already on hand before the enhancement event. Nothing in their examples gives us reason to suppose that initial justification is supplied by mental states. So, while it may be granted that their argument provides some good evidence for mentalism, it does not go far enough by itself.

The second prong of their overall argument, however, may well make up the difference. In this part of their case for mentalism, Conee and Feldman address a number of important objections that have been lodged against internalism, either of the accessibility or the mentalist variety, and explain how the mentalist position can accommodate the points made in the objections. The natural idea is that meeting outstanding objections strengthens the overall argument for mentalism.

One of these objections and their reply to it brings up what may be the deepest and most fundamental issue dividing internalists and externalists. Goldman states the objection:

…every traditional form of internalism involves some appeal to logical relations, probabilistic relations, or their ilk. Foundationalism requires that nonbasically justified beliefs stand in some suitable logical or probabilistic relations to basic beliefs; coherentism requires that one's system of beliefs be logically consistent, probabilistically coherent, or the like. None of these logical or probabilistic relations is itself a mental state, either a conscious or a stored state. So these relations do not qualify as justifiers… (Goldman, 2001. in Kornblith, 2001. pp. 216-217.)

The problem, in short, is that justifiers other than or in addition to mental states are needed if we are to explicate the justification of many beliefs, and that even defenders of mentalism will have to recognize this point. Not all justifiers, therefore, are mental states, and so mentalism would have to be either abandoned or modified.

The important question being raised by this objection is whether the logical or probabilistic support relations are themselves justifiers; or are the justifiers confined to the entities over which the support relations are to hold? If we think that these support relations holding between one's evidence and the beliefs are themselves justifiers, then mentalism is compromised (though the mixed mentalist theory cited earlier as a possibility is not thereby unaffected). A way out of the difficulty would be to impose a “higher order requirement” according to which one need be aware of these support relations. Then, one could say that being aware of these relations is a justifier, as are the mental states making up one's evidence; and, of course, awareness is a mental state. Taking this option, however, leads to worries about whether all cognizers will be in a position to meet the high-order requirement. Recognition of logical and probabilistic support relations, after all, is a fairly sophisticated act.

Conee and Feldman dismiss this worry. This higher order requirement, they say,

…is not any implausible requirement that one have information about justification. It is merely a requirement that one have evidence that there is a supporting connection — for instance, the logical consequence relation — between what is ordinarily regarded as one's evidence and what it is evidence for. This evidence can come from direct insight or from any other source. This is evidence that people normally have in a variety [of] normal situations. (Conee and Feldman, 2001. In Kornblith, 2001. p. 253)

Many will think, however, that even this awareness of some support relation vaguely characterized is beyond the grasp of some cognizers, such as young children, who nonetheless have perfectly justified beliefs.

The other alternative would be to deny that the logical and probabilistic support relations are themselves justifiers. This would protect mentalism from Goldman's criticism; the only justifiers would be the mental states themselves. Justification for a belief supported by evidence would “grow out of” that evidence with no need for awareness of the support connections. Conee and Feldman suggest how this might work for very simple cases.

The general idea is that some propositions, p and q, have a primitive or basic epistemic connection. If p and q have this connection, then, necessarily, if a person has a justified belief in p, then the person is also justified in believing q. Perhaps it is part of understanding p that one grasps the connection between p and q. There is, then, no need for additional information about the link between p and q that a person who is justified in believing p might lack. (Ibid., p. 252)

The key idea here is what it is to understand a proposition p. The suggestion is that in very simple cases, where the logical connection between p and q is immediate, part of one's understanding of p is to also believe q.

This line of argument depends squarely on a concept of understanding a proposition, and its prospect for success awaits development of a theory of understanding. Even if this can be developed in a promising way, however, it will work only for very simple logical connections. For more complex logical relations and probabilitistic ones holding between one's evidence and one's belief, the only available mentalist alternative would be to embrace the idea of awareness of the support relations. This higher order requirement does not seem to be satisfied in all the remaining cases where the support relations have any degree of complexity.

10. A Case for the Deontological Concept

The deontological concept of justification has not been supported by extensive argumentation, unlike the other internalist positions. But some support for this concept can be provided, particularly from a close examination of cases in which a person does not live up to something we regard as a norm, and with the result that justification is lacking. BonJour has presented striking examples of just this sort, one of which concerns a clairvoyant named Maud.

Maud believes herself to have the power of clairvoyance, though she has no reasons for this belief. She maintains her belief despite being inundated by her embarrassed friends and relatives with massive quantities of apparently cogent scientific evidence that no such power is possible. One day Maud comes to believe, for no apparent reason, that the President is in New York City, and she maintains this belief, despite the lack of any independent evidence, appealing to her alleged clairvoyant power. Now in fact the President is in New York City, and Maud does, under the conditions then satisfied, have completely reliable clairvoyant power. Moreover, her belief about the President did result from the operation of that power. (Bonjour, 1980. p. 61)

BonJour's aim in presenting this case, and other similar ones, is to criticize a reliabilist account of justification and knowledge. For present purposes, interest in BonJour's example centers on his diagnosis of what has gone wrong with Maud's belief. BonJour suggests that Maud is being both irrational and irresponsible in maintaining belief in her clairvoyance when she has such powerful evidence to the contrary. What Maud has done is to disregard evidence that she has on hand and that she either is or can easily be aware of, and it is this fact that leads us to the intuitively supported conviction that Maud's belief about the President's whereabouts is not justified. It fails to be justified precisely because Maud has been intellectually irresponsible in her belief formation.

This important example, and another that BonJour presents concerning an individual, Samantha, who is also clairvoyant but who disregards a lot of evidence that she has on hand to the effect that the President is not in New York City, makes a strong case for the idea that there is some deontological component to the concept of epistemic justification. This deontological component may not be all there is to the concept of justification, as defenders of the deontological concept sometimes allege; but, BonJour's examples do strongly support the view that there is some deontological ingredient in our concept of justification.

We have seen that externalism is generally the denial of some internalist position, typically regarding accessibility or mentalism as accounts of justifiers. It is not surprising, then, that major arguments for externalism are, first, the failure or weakness in arguments for either accessibility internalism or for mentalism. Externalism fares best on this count in regard to accessibility internalism, since the arguments for that doctrine that we have considered are hardly compelling. Arguments for mentalism are in somewhat better shape, for in many contexts it does appear that a difference in mental states best explains a difference in the degree of justification for a belief. The support provided to mentalism by this explanatory argument is limited, mainly because explaining a difference in degree of justification falls short of establishing that it is plausible to hold that all justifiers are mental items. But it cannot be denied that the explanatory argument considered earlier goes some way in this direction.

Externalism is also supported to varying degrees by any cogent criticisms that have been devised against internalism. On this score, too, it is accessibility internalism that is especially vulnerable, particularly in the face of the perceptual examples already considered in which many justified beliefs are received either simultaneously or in rapid order. Mentalism is only marginally better off in this regard, because as we noted earlier, the evidential support relations that obtain between justifiers and resulting beliefs seem themselves to be justifiers though they are not mental states. Even if we allow that in simple cases one's justification for a belief that follows immediately from one's understanding of simple premises from which the believed proposition follows, this sort of strategy will only work in a small class of cases. Wherever the evidential support relations are more complex, mere understanding of the propositional content of the justifiers will not suffice to issue in justification for a resulting belief. In other words, Goldman's criticism of the mentalist position, while perhaps not wholly effective, nonetheless has force against all but the simplest of cases, and to that extent the case for externalism is strengthened by the weakening of the support for mentalism.

Externalism is also supported by any general defense of theories which incorporate or imply it, such as the reliable process theory. This sort of defense of externalism, of course, is quite independent of criticisms of accessibility internalism and of mentalism, and also independent of critical attacks on arguments that support those internalist positions.


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epistemology: naturalized | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | knowledge: analysis of | skepticism


My thanks to Louise Antony and Larry BonJour for helpful comments and suggestions.