Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

The Analysis of Knowledge

First published Tue Feb 6, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jan 16, 2006

The objective of the analysis of knowledge is to state the conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for propositional knowledge: knowledge that such-and-such is the case. Propositional knowledge must be distinguished from two other kinds of knowledge that fall outside the scope of the analysis: knowing a place or a person, and knowing how to do something. The concept to be analyzed -- the analysandum -- is commonly expressed using the schema "S knows that p", where "S" refers to the knowing subject, and "p" to the proposition that is known. A proposed analysis consists of a statement of the following form: S knows that p if and only if -- . The blank is to be replaced by the analysans: a list of conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient. To test whether a proposed analysis is correct, we must ask (a) whether every possible case in which the conditions listed in the analysans are met is a case in which S knows that p, and (b) whether every possible case in which S knows that p is a case in which each of these conditions is met. When we ask (a), we wish to find out whether the proposed analysans is sufficient for S's knowing that p; when we ask (b), we wish to determine whether each of the conditions listed in the analysans is necessary.

1. Knowledge as Justified True Belief

According to the following analysis, which is usually referred to as the "JTB" account, knowledge is justified true belief.

The JTB Analysis of Knowledge:
S knows that p iff
  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S is justified in believing that p.

Condition (i), the truth condition, has not generated any significant degree of discussion. It is overwhelmingly clear that what is false cannot be known. For example, it is false that G. E. Moore is the author of Sense and Sensibilia. Since it is false, it is not the sort of thing anybody can know.

Although the truth-condition enjoys nearly universal consent, let us nevertheless consider at least one objection to it. According to this objection, Newtonian Physics is part of our overall scientific knowledge. But Newtonian Physics is false. So it's possible to know something false after all.[1]

In response, let us say that Newtonian physics involves a set of laws of nature {L1, L2,…, Ln}. When we say we know Newtonian physics, this could be interpreted as saying we know that, according to Newtonian physics, L1, L2,…, Ln are all true. And that claim is of course true.

Additionally, we can distinguish between two theories, T and T*, where T is Newtonian physics and T* updated theoretical physics at the cutting edge. T* does not literally include T as a part, but absorbs T by virtue of explaining in which way T is useful for understanding the world, what assumptions T is based on, where T fails, and how T must be corrected to describe the world accurately. So we could say that, since we know T*, we know Newtonian physics in the sense that we know how Newtonian physics helps us understand the world and where and how Newtonian physics fails.

1.1 The Belief Condition

Unlike the truth condition, condition (ii), the belief condition, has generated at least some discussion. Although initially it might seems obvious that knowing that p requires believing that p, some philosophers have argued that knowledge without belief is indeed possible. Suppose Walter comes home after work to find out that his house has burned down. He utters the words "I don't believe it." Critics of the belief condition might argue that Walter knows that his house has burned down (he sees that it has), but, as his words indicate, he does not believe it. Therefore, there is knowledge without belief. To this objection, there is an effective reply. What Walter wishes to convey by saying "I don't believe it" is not that he really does not believe what he sees with his own eyes, but rather that he finds it hard to come to terms with what he sees.

A more serious counterexample has been suggested by Colin Radford (1966). Suppose Albert is quizzed on English history. One of the questions is: "When did Queen Elizabeth die?" Albert doesn't think he knows, but answers the question correctly. Moreover, he gives correct answers to many other questions to which he didn't think he knew the answer. Let us focus on Albert's answer to the question about Elizabeth:

(E) Elizabeth died in 1603.

Radford makes the following two claims about this example:

  1. Albert does not believe (E). Reason: He thinks he doesn't know the answer to the question. He doesn't trust his answer because he takes it to be a mere guess.
  2. Albert knows (E). Reason: His answer is not at all just a lucky guess. The fact that he answers most of the questions correctly indicates that he has actually learned, and never forgotten, the basic facts of English history.

Since he takes (a) and (b) to be true, Radford would argue that knowledge without belief is indeed possible. But Radford's example is not compelling. Those who think that belief is necessary for knowledge could reply that the example does not qualify as a case of knowledge without belief because it isn't a case of knowledge to begin with. Albert doesn't know (E) because he has no justification for believing (E). If he were to believe (E), his belief would be unjustified. This reply anticipates what we have not yet discussed: the necessity of the justification condition. Let us first discuss why friends of JTB hold that knowledge requires justification, and then discuss in greater detail why they would not accept Radford's alleged counterexample.

1.2 The Justification Condition

Why is condition (iii) necessary? Why not say that knowledge is true belief? The standard answer is that to identify knowledge with true belief would be implausible because a belief that is true just because of luck does not qualify as knowledge. Beliefs that are lacking justification are false more often than not. However, on occasion, such beliefs happen to be true. Suppose William takes a medication that has the following side effect: it causes him to be overcome with irrational fears. One of his fears is that he has cancer. This fear is so powerful that he starts believing it. Suppose further that, by sheer coincidence, he does have cancer. So his belief is true. Clearly, though, his belief does not amount to knowledge. But why not? Most epistemologists would agree that William does not know because his belief's truth is due to luck (bad luck, in this case). Let us refer to a belief's turning out to be true because of mere luck as epistemic luck. It is uncontroversial that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck. What, though, is needed to rule out epistemic luck? Advocates of the JTB account would say that what is needed is justification. A true belief, if an instance of knowledge and thus not true because of epistemic luck, must be justified. But what is it for a belief to be justified?[2]

Among the philosophers who favor the JTB approach, we find bewildering disagreement on how this question is to be answered. According to one prominent view, typically referred to as "evidentialism", a belief is justified if, and only if, it fits the subject's evidence.[3] Evidentialists, then, would say that the reason why knowledge is not the same as true belief is that knowledge requires evidence. Opponents of evidentialism would say that evidentialist justification (i.e., having adequate evidence) is not needed to rule out epistemic luck. They would argue that what is needed instead is a suitable relation between the belief and the mental process that brought it about. What we are looking at here is an important disagreement about the nature of knowledge, which will be our main focus further below. In the meantime, we will continue our examination of the JTB analysis.

Let us return to Radford's objection to the belief condition, which we considered above. We are now in a position to discuss further how that objection can be rebutted. Recall that Albert does not take himself to know the answer to the question about the date of Elizabeth's death. He does not because he does not remember having learned the basic facts of British history. Now, it is of course true that he did learn these facts, and is indeed able to recall them. But is this by itself sufficient for knowing them? Philosophers who think that knowledge requires evidence would say that it is not. Albert needs to have evidence for believing that he learned those facts. Until he is quizzed, he has no such evidence. After the quiz, when he is told that most of his answers are correct, he does have the requisite evidence. For once he comes to know that he is able to produce consistently correct answers to the questions he is asked, he has acquired evidence for believing that he must have learned this subject matter at school. This evidence is also evidence for the answers he has given. So at that point, the justification condition is met, and thus (since the other conditions of knowledge are also met) he knows (again) that Elizabeth died in 1603. However, he did not know this before finding out that he must have learned those facts, for at that point his answer to the question lacked justification and thus did not add up to knowledge. Evidentialists would deny, therefore, that Radford has supplied us with a counterexample to the belief condition.[4]

2. The Gettier Problem

In his short 1963 paper, "Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?", Edmund Gettier presented two effective counterexamples to the JTB analysis (Gettier 1963). The second of these goes as follows. Suppose Smith has good evidence for the false proposition

  1. Jones owns a Ford.[5]

Suppose further Smith infers from (1) the following three disjunctions:

  1. Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Boston.
  2. Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona.
  3. Either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Brest-Litovsk.

Since (1) entails each of the propositions (2) through (4), and since Smith recognizes these entailments, he is justified in believing each of propositions (2)-(4). Now suppose that, by sheer coincidence, Brown is indeed in Barcelona. Given these assumptions, we may say that Smith, when he believes (3), holds a justified true belief. However, is Smith's belief an instance of knowledge? Since Smith has no evidence whatever as to Brown's whereabouts, and so believes what is true only because of luck, the answer would have to be ‘no’. Consequently, the three conditions of the JTB account — truth, belief, and justification — are not sufficient for knowledge.[6] How must the analysis of knowledge be modified to make it immune to cases like the one we just considered? This is what is commonly referred to as the "Gettier problem".

Epistemologists who think that the JTB approach is basically on the right track must choose between two different strategies for solving the Gettier problem. The first is to strengthen the justification condition. This was attempted by Roderick Chisholm.[7] The second strategy is to search for a suitable further condition, a condition that would, so to speak, "degettierize" justified true belief. Let us focus on this second strategy. According to one suggestion, the following fourth condition would do the trick:

(iv) S's belief that p is not inferred from any falsehood.[8]

Unfortunately, this proposal is unsuccessful. Since Gettier cases need not involve any inference, there are possible cases of justified true belief in which the subject fails to have knowledge although condition (iv) is met. Suppose, for example, that James, who is relaxing on a bench in a park, observes a dog that, about 8 yards away from him, is chewing on a bone. So he believes

  1. There is a dog over there.

Suppose further that what he takes to be a dog is actually a robot dog so perfect that, by vision alone, it could not be distinguished from an actual dog. James does not know that such robot dogs exist. But in fact a Japanese toy manufacturer has recently developed them, and what James sees is a prototype that is used for testing the public's response. Given these assumptions, (5) is of course false. But suppose further that just a few feet away from the robot dog, there is a real dog. Sitting behind a bush, he is concealed from James's view. Given this further assumption, James's belief is true. So once again, what we have before us is a justified true belief that doesn't qualify as an instance of knowledge. Arguably, this belief is directly justified by a visual experience; it is not inferred from any falsehood. But if (5) is indeed a non-inferential belief, then the JTB account, even if supplemented with (iv), gives us the wrong result that James knows (5).

Another case illustrating that clause (iv) won't do the job is the well-known Barn County case (Goldman 1976). Suppose there is a county in the Midwest with the following peculiar feature. The landscape next to the road leading through that county is peppered with barn-facades: structures that from the road look exactly like barns. Observation from any other viewpoint would immediately reveal these structures to be fakes: devices erected for the purpose of fooling unsuspecting motorists into believing in the presence of barns. Suppose Henry is driving along the road that leads through Barn County. Naturally, he will on numerous occasions form a false belief in the presence of a barn. Since Henry has no reason to suspect that he is the victim of organized deception, these beliefs are justified. Now suppose further that, on one of those occasions when he believes there is a barn over there, he happens to be looking at the one and only real barn in the county. This time, his belief is justified and true. But since its truth is the result of luck, it is exceedingly plausible to judge that Henry's belief is not an instance of knowledge. Yet condition (iv) is met in this case. His belief is clearly not the result of any inference from a falsehood. Once again, we see that (iv) does not succeed as a solution to the Gettier problem.

Above, we noted that the role of the justification condition is to ensure that the analysans does not mistakenly identify as knowledge a belief that is true because of epistemic luck. The lesson to be learned from the Gettier problem is that the justification condition by itself cannot ensure this. Even a justified belief, understood as a belief based on good evidence, can be true because of luck. So if a JTB analysis of knowledge is to rule out the full range of cases of epistemic luck, it must be amended with a suitable fourth condition, a condition that succeeds in preventing justified true belief from being "gettiered." Thus amended, the JTB analysis becomes a JTB+ account of knowledge, where the '+' stands for the needed fourth condition.

3. An Alternative Approach: Reliabilism

The analysis of knowledge may be approached by asking the following question: What turns a true belief into knowledge? An uncontroversial answer to this question would be: the sort of thing that effectively prevents a belief from being true as a result of epistemic luck. Controversy begins as soon as this formula is turned into a substantive proposal. According to evidentialism, which endorses the JTB+ conception of knowledge, the combination of two things accomplishes this goal: evidentialist justification plus degettierization (a condition that prevents a true and justified belief from being "gettiered"). However, according to an alternative approach that has in the last three decades become increasingly popular, what stands in the way of epistemic luck — what turns a true belief into knowledge — is the reliability of the cognitive process that produced the belief. Consider how we acquire knowledge of our physical environment: we do so through sense experience. Sense experiential processes are, at least under normal conditions, highly reliable. There is nothing accidental about the truth of the beliefs these processes produce. Thus beliefs produced by sense experience, if true, should qualify as instances of knowledge. An analogous point could be made for other reliable cognitive processes, such as introspection, memory, and rational intuition. We might, therefore, say that what turns true belief into knowledge is the reliability of our cognitive processes.

This approach — reliabilism, as it is usually called — can be carried out in two different ways. First, there is reliabilism as a theory of justification (J-reliabilism).[9] The most basic version of this view — let's call it 'simple J-reliabilism' — takes knowledge to be justified true belief but, unlike evidentialism, conceives of justification in terms of reliability:

Simple J-Reliabilism:
Part A: S knows that p iff S's belief that p is (i) true and (ii) justified.
Part B: S is justified in believing that p iff S's belief that p was produced by a reliable cognitive process (in a way that degettierizes S's belief).

Second, there is reliabilism as a theory of knowledge (K-reliabilism).[10] According to this approach, knowledge does not require justification. Rather, what it requires (in addition to truth) is reliable belief formation. Let us define this second version of reliabilism thus:

Simple K-Reliabilism:
S knows that p if, and only if, S's belief that p (i) is true and (ii) was produced by a reliable cognitive process (in a way that degettierizes S's belief).

The degettierization-clauses in parentheses are needed because the Gettier problem is no less of a problem for reliabilism as it is for the JTB approach. We will set this issue aside for now and return to it at the end of this section.

In the following passage, Fred Dretske articulates how K-reliabilism can be motivated:

Those who think knowledge requires something other than, or at least more than, reliably produced true belief, something (usually) in the way of justification for the belief that one's reliably produced beliefs are being reliably produced, have, it seems to me, an obligation to say what benefits this justification is supposed to confer…. Who needs it, and why? If an animal inherits a perfectly reliable belief-generating mechanism, and it also inherits a disposition, everything being equal, to act on the basis of the beliefs so generated, what additional benefits are conferred by a justification that the beliefs are being produced in some reliable way? If there are no additional benefits, what good is this justification? Why should we insist that no one can have knowledge without it? (Dretske 1989, p. 95)

Further below we will discuss how advocates of the JTB approach might answer Dretske's question. In the meantime, let us focus a bit more on Dretske's account of knowledge. According to Dretske, reliable cognitive processes convey information, and thus endow not only humans, but (nonhuman) animals as well, with knowledge. He writes:

I wanted a characterization that would at least allow for the possibility that animals (a frog, rat, ape, or my dog) could know things without my having to suppose them capable of the more sophisticated intellectual operations involved in traditional analyses of knowledge. (Dretske 1985, p. 177)

It does indeed seem odd to think of frogs, rats, or dogs as having justified or unjustified beliefs. Yet attributing knowledge to animals is certainly in accord with our ordinary practice of using the word 'knowledge'. So if, with Dretske, we want an account of knowledge that includes animals among the knowing subjects, we might want to abandon the traditional JTB account in favor of K-reliabilism.

Advocates of J-reliabilism take justification, and thus reliable belief formation, to be a necessary condition of knowledge. Advocates of K-reliabilism also take reliable belief formation to be a necessary condition of knowledge, however without saying anything about justification. We might wonder, therefore, whether there is any substantive difference between the two views, a difference that goes beyond the mere terminological difference of using vs. not using the word 'justification'. Why not think that J and K-reliabilism actually amount to the same thing?[11]

Simple J-reliabilism and simple K-reliabilism would appear to be extensionally equivalent: whatever is a case of knowledge according to the former is also a case of knowledge according to the latter, and vice versa. This does not mean, however, that there is no important difference between the two views. Suppose B is a belief that, though produced by a reliable faculty or process, is in fact false. About B, K-reliabilism implies one and only one thing: B is not an instance of knowledge. But J-reliabilism implies two things about B: (i) B is not an instance of knowledge; (ii) B is a justified belief. So although the two theories do not differ with regard to which beliefs qualify as instances of knowledge and which do not, they do differ in the following respect: Whereas J-reliabilism yields implications about justification or the lack of it, K-reliabilism does not. This could be viewed as a consideration favoring J-reliabilism. Beliefs that fail to qualify as knowledge can, after all, still exhibit an epistemically desirable quality, namely that of being justified. We might be interested in having an account of this quality even if we do not want to conceive of justification as resulting from the possession of evidence.

According to Dretske, his version of K-reliabilism avoids Gettier problems. He says:

Gettier difficulties … arise for any account of knowledge that makes knowledge a product of some justificatory relationship (having good evidence, excellent reasons, etc.) that could relate one to something false…. This is [a] problem for justificational accounts. The problem is evaded in the information-theoretic model, because one can get into an appropriate justificational relationship to something false, but one cannot get into an appropriate informational relationship to something false. (Dretske 1985, p. 179)

However, consider again the case of the barn facades. Henry sees a real barn, and that's why he believes there is a barn near-by. Since the barn he is looking at is an actual barn, it would appear that the perceptual process that causes Henry to believe this does not relate him to anything false. So if perception, on account of its reliability, normally conveys information, it should do so in this case as well. Alas, it arguably does not. Since Henry would have believed the same had he been situated in front of one of the many barn-facades in the vicinity, we are reluctant to judge that Henry knows there is a barn nearby. There is reason to doubt, therefore, that Dretske's version of K-reliabilism escapes the Gettier problem.

In general terms, since reliable faculties can be just as misleading as a person's evidence, a bare bones reliability condition does little toward solving the Gettier problem. When Henry travels through Barn County, surely his vision works just as well as it would elsewhere. Hence, unless we are told how to gauge reliability relative to the subject's environment, reliabilism offers us no reason to judge that Henry fails to know that there is a barn near-by. Or consider the example of the Japanese toy-dog. When James believes that there is a toy-dog before him, his failure to know this is not due to a sudden deterioration of his vision. Rather, James fails to know because an otherwise reliable faculty, vision, is misleading on this particular occasion. Hence, if reliabilism is to yield the correct outcome about this case, it needs to be amended with a further clause. We need to be told either a principled reason why James's visual faculty fails to be reliable under the circumstances, or else why James fails to know even though his belief is produced by a reliable faculty. Clearly, then, Gettier cases pose as much of a problem for reliabilism as for an evidentialist JTB account. Neither theory, unless amended with a clever degettierization clause, succeeds in stating sufficient conditions of knowledge.[12]

4. Internalism and Externalism

Evidentialists reject both J-reliabilism and K-reliabilism. We will first focus on J-reliabilism and further below discuss why evidentialists reject K-reliabilism as well. Evidentialists reject J-reliabilism because they take justification to be something that is internal to the subject. J-reliabilists, on the other hand, take justification to be something that is external to the subject.[13]

How are we to understand the difference between the, so to speak, internality and the externality of justification? Let us turn to Roderick Chisholm, one of the chief advocates of internalism. In the third edition of Theory of Knowledge, Chisholm says the following:

If a person S is internally justified in believing a certain thing, then this may be something he can know just by reflecting upon his own state of mind. (Chisholm 1989, p. 7)

In the second edition of this book, he characterizes internalism in a somewhat different way:

We presuppose … that the things we know are justified for us in the following sense: we can know what it is, on any occasion, that constitutes our grounds, or reasons, or evidence for thinking that we know. (Chisholm 1977, p. 17)

These passages differ in the following respect: in the first Chisholm is concerned with the property of justification (a belief's being justified); in the second, with justifiers: the things that make justified beliefs justified. What is common to both passages is the constraint Chisholm imposes. In the first passage, Chisholm characterizes justification as something that is recognizable on reflection and, in the second, as the sort of thing that can be known on any occasion. Arguably, this is just a terminological difference. It would not be implausible to claim that what can be recognized through reflection is something that can be recognized on any occasion, and what can be recognized on any occasion is something that can be recognized through reflection. Although this point deserves further examination, let us here simply assume that recognizability on reflection and recognizability on any occasion amount to the same thing. In what follows, we will refer to it as direct recognizability.

As already noted, in the first passage Chisholm imposes the direct recognizability constraint on justification, in the second on justifiers. Does this amount to a substantive difference? If the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, and vice versa, then the two passages we considered would indeed just be alternative ways of stating the same point. Whether they really are is perhaps debatable, but here we will simply assume that it makes no substantive difference whether the characterization of internalism focuses on justification or justifiers.

Chisholm, then, defines internalism by saying that justification is recognizable on reflection, and thus in terms of the accessibility of justification. This type of internalism may therefore be called accessibility internalism. Alternatively, internalism could be defined in terms of limiting justifiers to mental states. According to this second approach, internalism says that justifiers must be internal to the mind, i.e., must be mental events or states. Internalism thus defined could be labeled mental state internalism.[14] Whether accessibility internalism and mental state internalism are genuine alternatives depends on whether being directly recognizable is an essential property of mental states. If it is, then what appear to be genuine alternatives might in fact not be.[15] Since here we cannot go into the details of this issue, we will cut this matter short and simply define internalism, as suggested by Chisholm, in terms of direct recognizability, while acknowledging that it might be preferable to define it by restricting justifiers to mental states. We will refer to internalism as defined here as "J-internalism," since it imposes the direct recognizability constraint not on knowledge but justification.

Justification is directly recognizable. At any time t at which S holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified.[16]

J-internalism is to be contrasted with J-externalism, which is simply its negation.

Justification is not directly recognizable. It is not the case that at any time t at which S holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified. (There are times at which S holds a justified belief B but is not in a position to know that B is justified.)

Next, we will discuss what consequences we can derive from J-internalism. To begin with, we can derive the result that Simple J-reliabilism is an externalist theory. Suppose S's belief B has, at time t, the property of being reliably formed. B's being reliably formed at t, and S's being able to recognize at t that B is reliably formed, are clearly two different affairs. It could be the case that B is reliably formed without S's being able to tell at t that B is reliably formed. According to Simple J-reliabilism, however, reliability by itself — without the subject's having any evidence indicating its presence — is sufficient for justification. Simple J-reliabilism, therefore, allows for cases of the following kind: S's belief B is reliably formed and therefore justified, but, since B's reliability is, so to speak, "hidden" from S, S cannot directly recognize that B is justified. J-reliabilism is, therefore, an externalist theory.

To illustrate this point, let us consider a familiar example due to Laurence BonJour.[17] Suppose Norman is a perfectly reliable clairvoyant. At time t, his clairvoyance causes Norman to form the belief that the president is presently in New York. However, Norman has no evidence whatever indicating that he is clairvoyant. Nor has he at t any way of recognizing that his belief was caused by his clairvoyance. Norman, then, cannot at t recognize that his belief is justified. So Simple J-reliabilism implies that Norman's belief is justified at t although Norman cannot recognize at t that his belief is justified.

Second, J-internalism allows us to derive the consequence — as it should — that evidentialism is an internalist theory. The question of what a person's evidence consists of is of course not uncontroversial. Nor is it uncontroversial what kind of cognitive access a subject has to her evidence. However, it would not be without a good deal of initial plausibility to make the following two assumptions. First, a subject's evidence consists of her perceptual, introspective, memorial, and intuitional states, as well as her beliefs. In short, a subject's evidence consists of her mental states. Items other than mental states are never part of a subject's evidence.[18] Second, a subject's mental states are directly recognizable to her.[19] If we now add the further assumption (mentioned above) that the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, then we get the result that evidentialism is a form of J-internalism. Let us display the argument in detail:

Why Evidentialism is a Version of J-Internalism:
  1. According to evidentialism, justifiers consist of a person's evidence.
  2. A person's evidence (consisting of her mental states) is directly recognizable to that person.
  3. Therefore:
    According to evidentialism, a person's justifiers are directly recognizable to that person.
  4. If the justifiers that make a person's justified beliefs justified are directly recognizable to that person, then the justification of that person's justified beliefs is directly recognizable to that person.
  5. Therefore:
    According to evidentialism, the justification of a person's justified beliefs is directly recognizable to that person.

The crucial premises in this argument are (2) and (4). Evidentialists would be reluctant to call ‘evidence’ something that is not directly recognizable to a subject.[20] So (2) would appear to be a premise that evidentialists are likely to endorse. And (4) expresses no more than one part of what we already assumed: that the direct recognizability of justifiers implies the direct recognizability of justification, and vice versa. Of course, both premises might be challenged. What seems safe to say, therefore, is the conditional point that, if (2) and (4) capture what is essential to evidentialism, then evidentialism implies internalism about justification.

As mentioned at the beginning of this section, evidentialists also reject K-reliabilism. They do so because, pace Dretske, they think that internal justification — justification in the form of having adequate evidence — is necessary for knowledge. In other words, they deny that a belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is sufficient for the belief's being an instance of knowledge. Let us refer to this position as internalism about knowledge, or K-internalism, and let us define it using the concept of internal justification: the kind of justification that meets the direct recognizability constraint.

Internal justification is a necessary condition of knowledge. A belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is not sufficient for its being an instance of knowledge.

K-externalism is the negation of K-internalism:

Internal justification is not a necessary condition of knowledge. A belief's origin in a reliable cognitive process is sufficient for its being an instance of knowledge. Consequently, there are cases of knowledge without internal justification.

In this section, we have merely concerned ourselves with what internalists and externalists disagree about with regard to both justification and knowledge. In the next two sections, we will examine what reasons internalists and externalists can cite in support of their respective views.

5. Why Internalism?

First, both J- and K-internalism can be motivated by appealing to evidentialism as a premise. As we saw in the previous section, evidentialism is plausibly construed as entailing internalism. Consequently, reasons in support of evidentialism are also reasons in support of J-internalism. Moreover, evidentialists would say that internal justification is a necessary condition of knowledge. Evidentialists would support this claim with examples. Consider again BonJour's clairvoyant Norman. Norman has no evidence for thinking that he is a reliable clairvoyant. Suppose Norman's belief B is caused by his clairvoyance. Suppose further Norman has no independent evidence for B. Evidentialists would say that, since due to the lack of evidence B is unjustified, B is not an instance of knowledge. Considerations supporting evidentialism, then, are also considerations in favor of K-internalism.[21]

Second, there is an argument for internalism that starts with what is known as the deontological conception of epistemic justification:

Deontological Justification:
S is justified in believing that p iff in believing that p, S does not violate any of his epistemic duties.

The concept of duty employed here must not be confused with ethical or prudential duty. The type of duty in question is specifically epistemic.[22] What exactly epistemic duties are is a matter of controversy. A fairly uncontroversial starting point is to say that epistemic duties are those that arise in the pursuit of truth.[23] Thus we might express the concept of deontological justification alternatively as follows: S is justified in believing that p iff in believing that p, S does not fail to do what he ought to do in the pursuit of truth. Of course, this way of putting things leads us directly to a further question: In the pursuit of truth, exactly what is it that one ought to do? Evidentialists would say: It is to believe what, and only what, one's evidence supports.[24]

Let's call proponents of the deontological concept of justification deontologists. If deontologists conceive of epistemic duty in the way suggested in the previous paragraph, then they can argue as follows: To be justified is to meet the duty of believing what one's evidence supports. Evidential support is directly recognizable. Therefore, deontological justification is directly recognizable. Hence, deontological justification is internal justification.

There is also an argument from deontology to internalism that does not depend on evidentialism as a premise.[25] It derives the direct recognizability of justification from the premise that what determines epistemic duty is directly recognizable.

From Deontology to Internalism:
  1. Justification is a matter of epistemic duty fulfillment.
  2. Therefore:
    What determines justification is identical to what determines epistemic duty.
  3. What determines epistemic duty is directly recognizable.
  4. Therefore:
    What determines justification is directly recognizable.
  5. If what determines justification is directly recognizable, then justification itself is directly recognizable.
  6. Therefore:
    Justification is directly recognizable.

(2) follows directly from the deontological conception of justification. (5) is nothing new; we have assumed it above already. The argument's main premise is of course (3).[26] Though certainly not implausible, this premise is open to criticism. Clearly, then, the argument is not uncontroversial. Nevertheless, it seems fair to say that it represents a straightforward and not obviously implausible derivation of internalism from deontology.

Third, internalism (J or K) can be supported by objecting to particular externalist accounts of justification or knowledge. Let us use reliabilism for the purpose of illustration. Internalists will argue that reliable belief formation is neither necessary nor sufficient for justification, nor sufficient for knowledge when added to true belief. To challenge sufficiency, internalists would cite cases like BonJour's Norman, the unwittingly reliable clairvoyant. Evidentialists would say that the beliefs arising from his clairvoyance (unless supported by adequate evidence) are neither justified nor instances of knowledge. To support the claim that reliable belief production is not necessary for justification, internalists will appeal to the possibility of being deceived by Descartes's evil demon. Let's suppose you are a victim of such deception, and let's distinguish between the normal world and the evil demon world. Your memories, experiences, and beliefs in the evil demon world mirror your memories, experiences, and beliefs in the normal world. However, whereas your beliefs in the normal world are by and large true, by far most of your beliefs in the evil demon world are false and thus unreliably produced. Simple J-reliabilism implies, therefore, that your beliefs in the evil demon world are unjustified. To internalists, this is an intuitively implausible result. Here is why. Your beliefs in the normal world are (as we may assume) by and large supported by adquate evidence and therefore justified. However, as far as your evidence is concerned, there is no difference between the evil demon world and the normal world. Your beliefs in the evil demon world, internalists would therefore say, are also by and large supported by adequate evidence and therefore justified. Hence internalists would reject the claim that being produced by reliable faculties is a necessary condition of epistemic justification.[27]

6. Why Externalism?

One reason for externalism lies in the attraction of philosophical naturalism. According to Gilbert Harman, this view, when applied to ethics, "is the doctrine that moral facts are facts of nature. Naturalism as a general view is the sensible thesis that all facts are facts of nature" (Harman 1977, p. 17). What naturalists in ethics want, according to Harman,

is to be able to locate value, justice, right, wrong, and so forth in the world in the way that tables, colors, genes, temperatures, and so on can be located in the world. (Harman 1984, p. 33)

According to this conception of naturalism, a naturalist in epistemology wants to be able to locate such things as knowledge, justification, certainty, or probability "in the world in the way that tables, colors, genes, temperatures, and so on can be located in the world." How, though, are naturalists to accomplish this? According to one answer to this question, they can accomplish this by identifying the non-epistemic grounds on which epistemic phenomena supervene. Alvin Goldman describes this desideratum as follows:

The term ‘justified’, I presume, is an evaluative term, a term of appraisal. Any correct definition or synonym of it would also feature evaluative terms. I assume that such definitions or synonyms might be given, but I am not interested in them. I want a set of substantive conditions that specify when a belief is justified … I want a theory of justified belief to specify in non-epistemic terms when a belief is justified. (Goldman 1979, p. 1)

However, internalists need not deny that epistemic phenomena supervene on non-epistemic grounds, and that it is the task of epistemology to reveal these grounds. It is doubtful, therefore, that the goal of locating epistemic value in the natural world establishes a link between philosophical naturalism and externalism.[28]

According to a second approach, the way to locate epistemic value in the natural world is to employ the methods of the natural sciences.[29] Appealing to this methodological constraint, externalists might argue that, because the study of justification and knowledge is an empirical study, justification and knowledge cannot be what internalists take it to be, but rather must be identified with reliable belief production: a phenomenon that can be studied empirically. It is far from clear, however, that the fundamental questions of epistemology can be answered by employing the methods of the natural sciences. For example, can empirical sciences solve the Gettier problem? Can they answer the question of whether knowledge requires evidence? Can they tell us whether the beliefs of evil demon victims are justified, or whether BonJour's Norman can acquire knowledge on account of his clairvoyance even though is he as no reason to suppose that he is in possession of such a faculty? Indeed, is the question of whether epistemology can be done solely by employing empirical science a question that can be answered by empirical science itself? It is not easy to imagine that these questions should be answered affirmatively. But if the methodological constraint in question cannot be sustained with complete generality, then this constraint offers us no compelling reason to think that justification and knowledge are the sort of thing that can only be studied empirically, and thus cannot be what internalist take them to be.

A second reason for externalism (more specifically, J-externalism) has to do with the connection between justification and truth. Internalists conceive of a justified belief as a belief that, relative to the subject's evidence or reasons, is likely to be true. However, such likelihood of truth is compatible with the belief's actual falsity. Indeed, likelihood of truth as internalists conceive of it can be exemplified in the evil demon world, in which your justified beliefs about the world are mostly false. Hence externalists view the connection between internalist justification and truth as being too thin and therefore demand a stronger kind of likelihood of truth.[30] Reliability is usually taken to fill the bill.[31] William Alston, for example, has argued that, without a reliability constraint, the connection between justification and truth becomes too tenuous.[32] He argues that only reliably formed beliefs can be justified, and defines a reliable belief-producing mechanism as one that "would yield mostly true beliefs in a sufficiently large and varied run of employments in situations of the sorts we typically encounter" (Alston 1993, p. 9). Suppose we endorse this conception of justification. Let's suppose further that most of our beliefs are justified. It then follows that most of the beliefs we form in ordinary circumstances would have to be true most of the time. Such a belief system could still be brought about by an evil demon. However, it would not be a belief-system consisting of mostly false beliefs, and thus the evil demon responsible for it wouldn't be quite as evil as he could be. So what Alston-type justification rules out is this: a belief system of mostly justified beliefs that is generated by an evil demon who sees to it that most of our beliefs are false. This, then, is the benefit we can secure when, as externalists suggest, we make reliability a necessary element of justification.

Internalists would object that a strong link between justification and truth runs afoul of the rather forceful intuition that the beliefs of an evil demon victim are justified even when they are mostly false. In response, externalists might concede that the sort of justification internalists have in mind and attribute to evil demon victims is a legitimate concept, but question the epistemological relevance of that concept. Of what epistemic value (of what value to the acquisition of knowledge), they might ask, is internal justification if it is the sort of thing an evil demon victim can enjoy, a person whose belief system is massively marred by falsehood? Internalists would reply that internal justification should not be expected to supply us with a guarantee of truth, and that its value derives (at least in part) from the fact that internal justification is necessary for knowledge.

A third reason for externalism has to do with Dretske's question about justification: "Who needs it, and why?" Dretske would say, of course, that nobody needs it (for the acquisition of knowledge, that is) because reliable belief production is sufficient for turning true belief into knowledge. With this, internalists disagree.[33] As we have seen, they take the existence of examples like BonJour's clairvoyant Norman as a decisive reason to reject this sufficiency claim. Internalists, therefore, would answer Dretske's question thus: Those who wish to enjoy knowledge need justification, and they need it because one does not know that p unless one has adequate evidence for believing that p.

In reply to this, Dretske might repeat a point — one that amounts to a fourth reason for externalism — from the passage we considered above: he takes animals such as frogs, rats, apes, and dogs to have knowledge. This is surely in line with the way we ordinarily use the concept of knowledge. The owner of a pet who does not attribute knowledge to it would be hard to find. But are animals capable of the sophisticated mental operations required by beings who enjoy the sort of justification internalists have in mind? It would seem not.[34]

7. Two Analyses of Knowledge

K-internalism and K-externalism, then, are supported by conflicting intuitions. On the one hand, there are examples like BonJour's clairvoyant Norman, examples that strongly suggest that internal justification is necessary for knowledge. On the other hand, there is Dretske's point that knowledge is enjoyed by not only humans but animals as well. This strongly suggests that internal justification is not necessary for knowledge. Both of these thoughts are inherently plausible. Might it be possible to reconcile them? If animals could have the sort of justification internalists have in mind, internalism would be compatible with animal knowledge. Certainly, animals have sensory experiences, just as humans do. Some internalists think that sensory experiences, in and by themselves, constitute evidence. Such internalists might not shy away from attributing internal justification and therefore knowledge to animals. Other internalists, however, think that S's sensory experiences constitute evidence only if S can coherently view them as a reliable guide to truth. That, it would seem, is a condition animals can't meet.

Suppose animals are not the sort of beings that can have internally justified or unjustified beliefs. If so, we get two alternative and irreconcilable analyses of knowledge: one internalist, the other externalist. Let us state a gloss of the respective analyses. In these analyses, the term "internal justification" stands for the kind of concept internalists have in mind, and the term "external justification" for the kind of concept externalists employ.

External Knowledge (EK):
S knows that p iff
  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S is externally justified in believing that p (in a way that degettierizes S's belief).

Internal Knowledge (IK):
S knows that p iff

  1. p is true;
  2. S believes that p;
  3. S is internally justified in believing that p;
  4. S's belief that p is degettiered.

EK and IK agree and differ in the following respects:

  1. According to both EK and IK, knowledge requires true belief. The question each of these analyses is intended to answer is: what do we need to add to true belief to get knowledge?
  2. According to both, whether or not one knows is an external matter. K-internalists acknowledge the externality of knowledge for two reasons. The first is that knowledge requires truth; the second is that knowledge requires degettierization. Let us consider each of these reasons in turn.

    First, consider an evil demon victim's false belief that he has hands. By the victim's own lights, it certainly looks as though he has hands. Surely, the victim would take himself to know that he has hands. Since he has no hands, he is mistaken in thinking he knows he has hands. His failure to know, however, is not directly recognizable to him. For unless his evidential situation were to change radically, no amount of reflection will enable him to figure out that he has no hands. So because of the truth condition, it is not always directly recognizable whether or not one knows. Knowledge, therefore, is essentially external.

    Second, let us examine why degettierization is an external matter. Call the condition needed to rule out Gettier-cases the 'G-condition'. If the G-condition is met, then S is not in a Gettier situation. If the G-condition is not met, then S is in a Gettier situation. Whether or not the G-condition is met might not be directly recognizable to S, just as whether or not S's beliefs are reliably produced might not be directly recognizable to S's. For example, BonJour's Norman has a faculty (his clairvoyance) whose reliability is hidden from him. On reflection, Norman cannot tell that that he is a reliable clairvoyant. (Of course, future experiences might reveal this to him.) Similarly, evil demon victims cannot through reflection figure out that their perceptual faculties are unreliable. Likewise, a subject who is in a Gettier situation cannot directly recognize — find out through reflection alone — that he is. Consider Henry in Barn County: that there is an abundance of barn facades in the area is a feature of his situation that is (at least for the time being) hidden from him. Therefore, it's not directly recognizable to him that he is in a Gettier situation. This point can be generalized. It is an essential aspect of the G-condition that, when it is not met, the subject is not in a position to recognize this directly. Hence degettierization, and thereore knowledge, are essentially external.

  3. IK requires internal justification, EK does not. That is the one condition where the two analyses differ. As a result of this difference, EK includes within the scope of knowledge animals, but fails to accommodate the intuition underlying BonJour's case of clairvoyant Norman and other cases like that. IK, on the other hand, does accommodate this intuition, but — counter-intuitively, as K-externalists would say — excludes animals from the range of subjects that can have knowledge.

If the internalism/externalism controversy is seen as essentially a controversy over the nature of justification, then the debate over J-internalism vs. J-externalism would appear to be a case of talking past each other. J-internalists and J-externalists simply intend justification to achieve different things. They each operate with a different concept of justification. J-externalists take justification to be the sort of thing that turns true belief into knowledge, and they view the Gettier problem merely as the problem of adding the right sort of bells and whistles to the justification-condition. J-internalists, on the other hand, cannot view degettierization as something that can, in the form of a suitable clause, be tacked on to the justification condition, for degettierization is an external matter. Rather, internalists take justification to be the sort of thing that turns true and degettiered belief into knowledge. Since J-internalists and J-externalists assign different roles to justification, what they ultimately disagree about is not the nature of justification, but the sort of thing in relation to which the theoretical role of epistemic justification is fixed: knowledge. Internalists assign justification the role of turning true and degettiered belief into knowledge because they think that internal justification is necessary for knowledge. In contrast, externalists (J-externalists, that is) assign a different role to justification — that of turning true belief into knowledge — because they think that internal justification is not necessary for knowledge. It is this difference in their respective views on the nature of knowledge that leads to different views on the nature of justification.

Thus we are confronted with a fundamental disagreement about the nature of knowledge. Externalists such as Dretske would say that the desideratum of making knowledge a natural phenomenon that is instantiated equally by humans and animals must trump the demand that knowledge require the possession of justification in the form of adequate evidence. Externalists of that persuasion would have to say, therefore, that Norman, the unwitting clairvoyant, has knowledge just as much as a mouse that knows where to look for the cheese. Internalists would argue the other way around. To them, Norman-type cases establish the necessity of adequate evidence. And so they would say that, just as Norman's reliable clairvoyance (by itself, in the absence of evidence) does not give him knowledge, a mouse's reliable cognitive mechanisms do not give it knowledge of where to look for the cheese. Externalists would say that it merely seems to us that Norman lacks knowledge when in fact he has it. Internalists would say that it merely seems to us that animals know when in fact they do not.

It might be a mistake to expect that there is a decisive argument that settles the dispute between internalists and externalists one way or another. One way to respond to the intracatability of the debate is to acknowledge that there simply is not one concept of knowledge for which there is an analysis that has any chance of meeting with broad assent. Rather, we might conclude that, when we use the word "knowledge", we have sometimes one concept and at other times another concept in mind. If we take this approach, we can distinguish beween animal knowledge and reflective knowledge. The former, we might say, is reliably formed true belief (that meets a suitable Gettier-clause built into the reliability condition), and the latter is internally justified true belief (that meets a suitable, separate Gettier-condition). Whereas the former kind of knowledge can be shared by animals and humans alike, the latter kind is available only to beings who are capable of intellectual reflection.[35]

To sum up, if we attempt to articulate an analysis of knowledge, we must find answers to the following questions:

As we have seen, how these questions are to be answered is extremely controversial. Most likely, there isn't one single concept of knowledge that permits consensus on what the necessary and sufficient conditions of knowledge are. Rather, it might be that we must distinguish between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge, and that each of these concepts has its own analysis. In addition to the problems we have discussed in this essay, there are further issues that bear, in a broader sense, on the analysis of knowledge. One of these is:

When we discuss this question, we are confronted with a paradox. On the one hand, there is a seemingly sound argument for the conclusion that we don't even know that we have hands, and thus know much less than we are inclined to think. On the other hand, we are convinced that we do know that we have hands. If this conviction is right, the argument can't be sound after all. The following, supplementary chapter discusses the issues that arise when we try to solve this paradox and examines how they bear on our understanding of the concept of knowledge.

Supplement: Knowledge and Skepticism


Bibliography for the Supplement

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

brains in a vat | contextualism, epistemic | epistemic closure principle | epistemology: naturalized | epistemology: social | epistemology: virtue | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of


I wish to thank Laurence BonJour and Michael Bergman for helpful comments and criticisms.