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Public Justification

First published Tue Feb 27, 1996; substantive revision Fri Jan 19, 2007

The idea of public justification is the key idea in contemporary liberal-democratic political theory. The idea is, roughly, that no regime is legitimate unless it is reasonable from every individual's point of view. (As will be seen, this formula conceals considerable ambiguity.) Although John Rawls was the foremost exponent of the idea of public justification, its importance is also marked in the work of Jürgen Habermas, David Gauthier, and others. There is considerable current interest in the question of how the ideal of public justification is to be properly articulated. Some theorists, such as Rawls, seem to read ‘reasonable from every individual's point of view’ more or less empirically, whereas others, most notably Jerry Gaus, claim that this crucial phrase must be given a normatively-loaded reading. On the first account, something like actual (or only mildly idealized) agreement is required for legitimacy, whereas, on the second account, reasonable means supported by good reasons. If the first account is accepted, there is some danger that regimes will be judged legitimate which are supported only or mainly by bad reasons — i.e. which depend for their legitimacy on mistaken beliefs or on morally inadmissible desires and preferences. If the second account is accepted, demonstrations of legitimacy may not be practically efficacious — i.e. they may need to be supplemented by forceful impositions of requirements which, while supported by good reasons, are not actually accepted by the individuals concerned. Much work in the area is concerned with the degree to which these competing demands — of practical efficacy and morality — can be balanced to yield some public conception of public justification. (For a good overview of work in this area, see D'Agostino and Gaus, 1998.)

1. Situating the Idea of Public Justification

It may seem innocuous to suggest that the measure of legitimacy of regimes is fundamentally tied to discursive justifiability. This view is nevertheless controversial and, indeed, may be unsupportable. (Steven Wall (2002) argues that the idea of public justification is actually "self-defeating".)

On the first point, methodological conservatives such as F.A. Hayek and Michael Oakeshott would certainly be sceptical about the idea that legitimacy could be established discursively.

According to Hayek, this kind of approach embodies the "synoptic delusion", or, in other words, the idea that it is possible to survey adequately the full range of information that might be relevant to determinations of legitimacy, to manipulate this information as needed, and to arrive, via reasoning, at some conclusion one way or another. Furthermore, any such attempt would fail, as other approaches might not, to take adequate account of the "dispersed knowledge" of a large community. On Hayek's account, we can make an assessment of legitimacy by considering facts about the course of social evolution of the institutions involved.

According to Oakeshott, a fully discursive treatment of complex political issues associated with legitimacy will fail on account of its inability to take adequate notice of the "tacit knowledge" of practitioners. There is, on this account, much more that is relevant to determining legitimacy than could be expressly articulated, and much more, hence, than could ever be made available as "input" to a justificatory course of reasoning.

These are, if you like, methodologically traditionalist alternatives to the rational, discursive, and intellectualized approach of the advocates of public justification. Both depend on, though neither explicitly articulates the notion, as Herbert Simon (1983) put it, that rationality is bounded. (See the article "Original Position" for more discussion of this point.)

Another point of contrast is with those approaches to politics which think that it is mistaken — perhaps corrupt — to seek the kind of stasis (however temporary) that seems to be implied in the idea that some determinate regime might be publicly justifiable and hence legitimate. On this account, the point of politics is not to resolve existing differences — which seems, at least in some sense, to be the point of attempting public justification; it is, rather, to keep alive those differences which are (i) fertile of edifying forms of controversy, and (ii) expressive of the irresolvable plurality of views, frameworks, and life-styles in any decently free and moderately diverse community.

Jean-Francois Lyotard seems to be an advocate of this position, and resistance to reduction to consensus is also implied by Michel Foucault's views on "normalization"; he says (1988), for instance, that "The search for a form of morality acceptable to everyone ... seems catastrophic". On this account, the main mechanism for facilitating the achievement of public justification would have to be coercive; whether actually or from some normatively-loaded perspective that corrects for ideological distortion, people's interests are irreconcilable and hence can be brought only by coercion into sufficient alignment to support a claim to public justification. The very demand for public justification is hence itself implicitly authoritarian.

Rawls himself wrestled with both these points. He certainly acknowledged the ideas which inform Hayek's critique, especially in the way in which he reversed the machinery of impartial spectator theory to lighten the computational and informational burdens on parties to the original position. (See the article "Original Position".) And he worried too about the tension between the demands, with respect to ideals of public justification, for consensus, and the reality of diverging ethical perspectives. As Rawls put it in later work (1993, 56), "all our concepts … are vague and subject to hard cases [and] this indeterminacy means that we must rely on judgement and interpretation … where reasonable persons may differ".

A final point of contrast is with those approaches which see in Rawlsian, Habermasian, and other mechanisms of public justification some attempt to substitute allegedly but not actually politically-innocent notions of rationality for self-admittedly political negotiation of conflict. Benjamin Barber is representative of this school, which wants to seek legitimacy where it can be found, not in the theorist's discourse on justification, but, instead, in institutionally-embodied, public, "real-time" explorations of disputed issues. "We, the People" must do the work of legitimation ourselves, on this account; no theorist's claims to have discovered some "overlapping consensus" implicit in our public political culture can save us from this work. As with Lyotard and others of his ilk, members of this school see the theorist of public justification as a closet authoritarian.

2. Contrasting Conceptions of Public Justification

As mentioned earlier, the phrase "reasonable from the point of view of every individual" conceals numerous ambiguities. At least three are of special importance in understanding the great variety of different schemes for articulating the concept of legitimacy as justifiability.

2.1 Empirical/Normative

On the empirical reading, some proposal is reasonable from some particular person's point of view only if that person has beliefs and desires which, according to h/er own scheme of reasoning, support that proposal to the degree, which, by h/er standards, is required. There are multiple concessions to the individual's actual perspective embodied in this idea. First of all, we deal with the individual's actual beliefs and desires, not those that s/he would have if s/he were better informed, more committed to believing what is supported by evidence, less selfish, etc. We take the individual, qua believer and desirer, as we find h/er. Secondly, we respect the individual's actual ways of reasoning, however defective they might be from the point of view of formal theories of decision-making and inference. Thirdly, we accept as given the particular level of evidential and inferential adequacy that the individual h/erself sets; we don't require h/er to meet standards that we think are better from the point of view of formal rationality.

Even in this sketchy formulation, we can see the difficulties which the empirically-minded theorist of public justification will face. Whereas "right reason", "correct" beliefs and "proper" values might be univocal (though at least the reasoning and the valuing arguably are not), there are a lot of ways of being wrong about reasoning, what the facts are, and what it's appropriate to value (and how). How we could get consensus or even convergence from such a multiplicity of different points of view is mysterious.

On the normative reading, all this is reversed, at least at the limit. Some proposal is reasonable for a particular individual, on this reading, if it conforms to the beliefs and desires that individual would have if___; if it is supported to the degree that s/he would demand if___; if it was developed in accordance with the inferential procedures she would use if___. In each case, if s/he were ideally rational, at least up to the point at which, given fallibility and finitude, it makes sense to imagine h/er being.

A normative reading of the demands of public justification seems to recommend itself. Certainly, we don't have to embrace Marxist notions of ideology to realize that a purely empirical approach to legitimation is likely to fail in two opposed ways as well as a third I've already alluded to. (i) There are (pre-theoretically) illegitimate regimes that would be judged legitimate, on the empirical standard, on account of the population's believing and desiring what they shouldn't, and wouldn't if their thinking hadn't been corrupted — precisely by their membership of this community. (ii) There are (pre-theoretically) legitimate regimes that would be judged illegitimate, on the empirical standard, again on account of their population's believing and desiring what they shouldn't. Surely, a normative approach must be preferred in view of these possibilities. Finally, (iii) because of the multiplicity of ways in which people can be wrong in their beliefs, values, and reasoning, what can be justified to all of them might be, precisely, the null set.

On the other hand, a normative approach seems to be vulnerable on two counts. First, it presupposes an accessibly univocal reading of what it is reasonable to believe and desire and to infer from one's beliefs and desires with respect to public political arrangements. If there is reasonable disagreement about the demands of reason itself, then potentially — and if so reasonably — groups within a community may have different understandings of what is publicly justified within that community, and hence different notions of what institutions might be legitimate for that community. And, of course, it is arguable, at least, that reason does not pronounce univocally in disciplining our empirical beliefs, desires, and inferences, at least in the realm of human social arrangements. This, if you like, is the lesson of much philosophy of science and epistemology inspired by the work of Thomas Kuhn, who noted (1970) very clearly the possibilities (i) that different people might apply the standards of reason in different ways, and (ii) that their doing so was an important factor in the longer-term development of scientific understanding. (Among the points that Kuhn made is that such diversity is a device for spreading the risk of prematurely investing all the community's resources and/or credulity in a particular position which could turn out to be wrong. He also emphasized the degree to which a living diversity of judgments could contribute to the vitality of dialogue, even when the point of conducting such discussions was, precisely, to resolve disagreement.)

Secondly, a normative approach seems to abandon an important guiding principle of justificationist accounts of legitimacy — to wit, their responsiveness to broadly voluntaristic considerations. As Thomas Nagel (1991)has pointed out, a regime which is publicly justified, although inevitably employing coercion to enforce its primary rules of association, has, on account of its being reasonable from every point of view, some of the advantages of a purely voluntary association. A normative approach also seems to sever the historically important link between liberalism and anti-paternalistic thinking. If social arrangements are legitimately enforced against the actual reasons of the populace, then this is, within a normative framework, on account of the superiority of the theorist's understanding of the reasons for those people to embrace this regime. Obviously, this is a form of patronage.

2.2 Consensus/Convergence

A second basic ambiguity also can be detected in the phrase "reasonable from every point of view". On the one hand, this might be read as invoking the notion of a consensus of grounding reasons. If A and B are members of a community for which a regime S is publicly justified, then, on this reading, there must be some reason r, which A has and B has too, which is their common (consensual) reason in relation to the regime S. On the other hand, this phrase might be read as invoking the notion of a convergence on a conclusion from a variety of distinct (sets of) premises. If S is reasonable from A's point of view on account of r(A), then it may well be that it is reasonable from B's point of view on account of an r(B) which is distinct from r(A). (Clearly, the risk-spreading that Kuhn identifies as a benefit of diversity is more adequately catered for within a perspective emphasizing convergence, which, of course, leaves underlying diversity intact even when there is superficial consensus in judgments.)

Rawls's position on this matter is somewhat obscure. On the one hand, the preferred phrase in his later work (Rawls, 1993), "overlapping consensus", might have suggested the first, consensual reading. On the other hand, other statements of his seemed to suggest that, for instance, the Kantian's legitimating reasons for some regime might differ quite markedly from the utilitarian's or the Christian's, thus suggesting that the convergence interpretation was more faithful to his intentions. Nevertheless, the consensual reading might be the right one. In his book Political Liberalism, Rawls appeared to suggest that the overlapping consensus which he has in mind is one of "reasonable" doctrines. Roughly, these are doctrines which acknowledge or are at least compatible with the acknowledgement of (i) the "burdens of judgment" (roughly, the reasonableness of disagreement over high-level issues in ethico-political and scientific investigations), and (ii) an obligation not to free ride on working and mutually beneficial social arrangements. In fact, it is arguable that it is these constituents of reasonableness that do the work in the Rawlsian derivation of principles of justice, and, hence, that what makes a regime embodying those principles legitimate is its conformity with an individual's commitment to being reasonable. In this case, the mode of justification is consensual, as initial appearances would suggest. (Another possibility is that, once the test of reasonableness is imposed, each of the potentially convergent starting-points for public reasoning shares, with each of the others, a core and, in particular, a set of commitments that is adequate to justifying the original position reasoning that Rawls deploys to derive fundamental constitutional principles.)

2.3 Maximizing/Universalizing

A third basic ambiguity trades on different modalities of reason. Brian Barry and David Gauthier, for instance, both distinguish maximizing and universalizing conceptions of reason. Considering matters from the point of view of the maximizing conception, a regime might be legitimate, for an individual, for the reason that it (maximally) advances that individual's interests. Considering matters from the point of view of the universalizing conception, a regime might be legitimate, for an individual, for the reason that it fairly advances the interests of all as seen from that individual's point of view. Obviously, these two perspectives are distinct, at least superficially. On the one hand, the maximizing conception of public justification suggests a negotiation between parties in search of a stable equilibrium of opposed forces — each has been assigned, by a regime, as much as s/he can be assigned consistently with the need to assign enough to every party to secure h/er compliance. On the other hand, the universalizing conception suggests a discourse between the parties in search of an ideal that each can endorse as a public ideal for the community of which they are members. In the first case, we have individuals thinking as private agents about their individual welfare; in the second, we have individuals thinking as public deliberators about the common good. The first conception produces the public out of the private, much in the manner of Bernard Mandeville and Adam Smith, whereas the second conception presupposes (as in the case of Rawls's reasonableness) some prior public-spiritedness on the part of individuals. Jon Elster (1986) notes this distinction and labels it that between the market and the forum. (Notice that utilitarianism is, on this account, a universalizing, not a maximizing conception. It is not maximizing, in the sense Barry and Gauthier have in mind because it is not the individual's utility which is being maximized, but, rather, the total or average of utility for the society. The grounding principles for utilitarianism are clearly universalizing in the Barry/Gauthier sense: e.g. generalized benevolence or, perhaps, some form of impartiality.)

These three ambiguities provide the basis for a typology of styles of public justification, and, certainly, different approaches to public justification can be observed. Rawls and Gauthier are both proponents of public justification, but their approaches could hardly be more different. The typology developed here helps foreground the ways in which they are different — and to provide pigeon-holes for the accommodation of numerous other perspectives.

Of course, there is a problem implicit in this variety of different approaches to public justification. Suppose that we wonder whether a regime S is legitimate. We want to know whether we should give our willing commitment to its demands or, instead, hold ourselves in readiness to oppose these demands when circumstances permit this. Suppose we accept that public justification — reasonableness from every perspective — is the basis for legitimacy. Suppose someone suggests that S is legitimate because there is an actual empirical convergence of maximizing reasons in favor of S. Do we know now whether to conform or resist? Not necessarily. Someone else might come along with the information that there is no hypothetical (i.e. normatively informed) consensus of universalizing reasons in favor of S. The question of legitimacy is — so far, anyway — indeterminate because the notion on which it depends is ambiguous.

3. Prospects for Public Justification

The notion of legitimacy is a practical notion in the sense that it is meant to inform our decision to acquiesce in or (try to) resist the demands of the political regime of which we are citizens. It is an important desideratum for such a notion that it facilitate the formation of determinate judgments — e.g. that the regime S determinately is (or isn't) a legitimate regime. As indicated, the notion of public justification may not satisfy this desideratum. Crudely, it is ambiguous, at least prima facie what is in accordance with reason in relation to social arrangements.

Some mechanisms developed by Rawls and put by him to other uses may be relevant in resolving this ambiguity. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls considered a related problem — posed by the fact that there is, in our society and societies like it, no public conception of justice. Of course, there is a shared concept of justice, but this is too vague and abstract to serve as a practical guide. And while there are conceptions of justice which are sufficiently specific to have concrete practical implications, there is no agreement about which of these is the right one for the group as a whole. So far the analogy is obvious with the issue of public justification. There is widespread agreement on the concept, but a plurality of interpretations of that concept. What did Rawls suggest in this case? To determine which conception of X is best fitted to play the role of public conception of X, we ask which conception best embodies the ideal of X, where that is given by functional analysis of the concept and its role in collective life. (This method is most obvious at section 23 of A Theory of Justice, where Rawls sets out the "formal conditions that it seems reasonable to impose on the conceptions of justice".) A similar approach might be satisfactory in the case of public justification.

A functional analysis in relation to public justification reveals many different desiderata for any adequate public conception of that concept. In particular, it is reasonable, given the role of the idea of public justification, to expect that any public justification will capture the double-sidedness of that concept. On the one hand, public justification does seek some distance from people's actual reasons, in search of genuine justification rather than specious rationalization. On the other hand, publicly justificatory arguments are meant to have an impact on the individuals which they target, and, in particular, to give them motives as well as reasons for conformity (or otherwise) to the demands they are subject to. (Stephen Macedo (1990) makes these points especially forcefully.) Unfortunately, there is prima facie incompatibility between these dual demands. To the extent that a given course of reasoning satisfies the demands for normative distance, to that extent is it likely to fail to meet the demands for motivational impact. In fact, there is a catalogue of such incompatibilities. (See D'Agostino (1996), chapter 6.) (This is one reason for suggesting, as in the entry on the original Position, that it may be necessary to take an ex post rather than, as is more typical, an ex ante approach. We ask, in other words, not where there is a prior basis for motivational impact, but rather whether some basis for such impact might be developed as a result of implementing certain forms of life.)

Of course, prima facie means ‘at first glance’. Perhaps there is some canonical way of balancing these competing demands and hence some public conception of what's required for public justification to be achieved. For reasons which Kuhn has suggested in another context, and which have already been alluded to, and which perhaps reflect elements of Lyotard's preferred ‘heterology’, it is hard to see how a canonical trade-off amongst the various desiderata can in fact be identified. (See D'Agostino (1996), chapter 7.) This means that the prospects are poor for public justification — and hence for discursive redemption of legitimacy claims — in societies like ours. Perhaps the Foucauldians and post-modernists are right in claiming that notions of legitimacy are inherently and inescapably themselves instruments of power, rather than rational alternatives to force. Certainly, if there is no public conception of public justification, any regime is legitimate only given a conception of legitimacy that is itself controversial, and hence can be imposed only by force — not by the inducements of reason.


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