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Contemporary Approaches to the Social Contract

First published Sun Mar 3, 1996; substantive revision Fri Sep 5, 2008

The idea of the social contract goes back, in a recognizably modern form, to Thomas Hobbes; it was developed in different ways by John Locke, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Immanuel Kant. After Kant the idea largely fell into disrepute until it was resurrected by John Rawls. It is now at the heart of the work of a number of moral and political philosophers. The basic idea seems simple: in some way, the agreement (or consent) of all individuals subject to collectively enforced social arrangements shows that those arrangements have some normative property (they are legitimate, just, obligating, etc.). Even this vague basic idea, though, is anything but simple, and even this abstract rendering is objectionable in many ways. To explicate the idea of the social contract we analyze contractual approaches into five variables: (1) the nature of the contractual act; (2) the parties to the act; (3) what the parties are agreeing to; (4) the reasoning that leads to the agreement; (5) what the agreement is supposed to show.

1. The Contractual Act

1.1 Consent and Agreement

The traditional social contract views of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau crucially relied on the idea of consent. For Locke only “consent of Free-men” could make them members of government (Locke 1689, §117). Now in the hands of these theorists—and in much ordinary discourse—the idea of “consent” implies a normative power to bind oneself. When one reaches “the age of consent” one is empowered to make certain sorts of binding agreements—contracts. By putting consent at the center of their contracts these early modern contract theorists (1) were clearly supposing that individuals had basic normative powers over themselves before they entered into the social contract (a point that Hume [1741] stressed), and (2) brought the question of political obligation to the fore. If the parties have the power to bind themselves by exercising this normative power, then the upshot of the social contract was obligation. As Hobbes (1651, 81 [chap xiv,¶7) insisted, covenants bind; that is why they are “artificial chains” (1651, 138 [chap. xxi, ¶5).

Although contemporary social contract theorists still sometimes employ the language of consent, the core idea is agreement. “Social contract views work from the intuitive idea of agreement” (Freeman 2007a, 17). Now one can endorse or agree to a principle without that act of endorsement in any way binding one to obey. Social contract theorists as diverse as Freeman and Jan Narveson (1988, 148) see the act of agreement as indicating what reasons we have. To Freeman the “role of unanimous collective agreement” is in showing “what we have reasons to do in our social and political relations” (2007, 19). Thus understood the agreement is not itself a binding act—it is not a performative that somehow creates obligation—but is reason-revealing (Lessnoff 1986). If individuals are rational, what they agree to reflects the reasons they have. In contemporary contract theories such as Rawls's, the problem of justification takes center stage. Rawls's revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice thus did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted. The aim of the original position, Rawls announced (1999, 16), is to settle “the question of justification … by working out a problem of deliberation.”

At the heart of contemporary social contract theories, then, is the “question of justification.” Justifying social arrangements (showing that they have the requisite normative property, see §5 below) requires showing that all (suitably idealized) citizens have reasons favoring the arrangements. Now this would be an otiose requirement unless, to some extent, the reasons of citizens differed. If all citizens had precisely the same set of reasons there would be no point in showing what they all can agree to. The idea of a unanimous collective agreement only does justificatory work when the reasons of citizens can differ, and so it is an open question what everyone has reason to endorse—what everyone would agree to. Under conditions of reasonable pluralism, we cannot suppose that the reasoning of one member of the public is a proxy for everyone else's reasoning. Consequently, under reasonable pluralism the requirement that every member of the public has reason to endorse a social arrangement is not implied by one member doing so.

1.2 Hypothetical Agreements

Given that the problem of justification has taken center stage, the second aspect of contemporary social contract thinking appears to fall into place: its reliance on models of hypothetical agreement. The aim is to model the reasons of citizens, and so we ask what they would agree to under conditions in which their agreements would be expected to track their reasons. Contemporary contract theory is, characteristically, doubly hypothetical. Certainly, no prominent theorist thinks that questions of justification are settled by an actual survey of attitudes towards existing social arrangements, and are not settled until such a survey has been carried out. The question, then, is not “Are these arrangements presently the object of an actual agreement among citizens?” (If this were the question, the answer would typically be “No”.) The question, rather, is “Would these arrangements be the object of an agreement if citizens were surveyed?” Although both of the questions are, in some sense, susceptible to an empirical reading, only the latter is in play in present-day theorizing. The contract nowadays is always hypothetical in at least this first sense.

There is a reading of the (first-order) hypothetical question “Would the arrangements be the object of agreement if___” which, as indicated, is still resolutely empirical in some sense. This is the reading where what is required of the theorist is that she try to determine what an actual survey of actual citizens would reveal about their actual attitudes towards their system of social arrangements. (This is seldom done, of course; the theorist does it in her imagination. See, though, Klosko 2000). But there is another interpretation that is more widely accepted in the contemporary context. On this reading, the question is no longer a hypothetical question about actual reactions; it is, rather, a hypothetical question about hypothetical reactions—it is, as we have said, doubly hypothetical. Framing the question is the first hypothetical element: “Would it be the object of agreement if they were surveyed?” Framed by this question is the second hypothetical element, one which involves the citizens, who are no longer treated empirically, i.e. taken as given, but are, instead, themselves considered from a hypothetical point of view—as they would be if (typically) they were better informed or more impartial, etc. (see further §2.2 below). The question for most contemporary contract theorists, then, is, roughly:“If we surveyed the idealized surrogates of the actual citizens in this polity, what social arrangements be the object of an agreement for them?”

Famously, Ronald Dworkin has objected that a (doubly) hypothetical agreement cannot bind any actual person. The point of second-stage hypotheticalizing is, inter alia, that, as one actually is, you might not agree to be bound by some principle P regulating social arrangements. Suppose that it could be shown that your surrogate (a better informed, more impartial version of you) would agree to P. What has that to do with you? Where this second-stage hypotheticalization is employed, it seems to be proposed that you can be bound by agreements that others, different from you, would have made. While it might (though it needn't) be reasonable to suppose that you can be bound by agreements that you would yourself have entered into if given the opportunity, it seems crazy to think that you can be bound by agreements that, demonstrably, you wouldn't have made even if you had been asked. This criticism is decisive, however, only if the hypothetical social contract is supposed to invoke your normative power to self-bind via consent. That your surrogates employs his power to self-bind would not mean that you had employed your power. Again, though, the power to obligate oneself is not typically invoked in the contemporary social contract: the problem of deliberation is supposed to help us make headway on the problem of justification. So the question for contemporary hypothetical contract theories is whether the hypothetical agreement of your surrogate tracks your reasons to accept social arrangements, a very different issue.

1.3 The Importance of Actuality

It is almost a commonplace today that contemporary social contract theory relies on hypothetical, not actual, agreement. And, as we have seen, in one sense this is certainly the case. However, in many ways the “hypothetical/actual” divide is artificial: the hypothetical agreement is meant to model, and provide the basis for, actual agreement. Understanding contemporary social contract theory is best achieved, not through insisting on the distinction between actual and hypothetical contracts, but by grasping the interplay of the hypothetical and the actual.

The key here is Rawls's (1996, 28) distinction among the perspectives of: (1) you and me, (2) the parties to the deliberative model, and (3) persons in a well-ordered society. The agreement of the parties in the deliberative model is certainly hypothetical in the two-fold sense we have analyzed: a hypothetical agreement among hypothetical parties. But remember, the point of the deliberative model is to help us (i.e., “you and me”) solve our justificatory problem—what social arrangements we can all accept as “free persons who have no authority over one another” (Rawls 1958, 33). The parties' deliberations and the conditions under which they deliberate, then, model our actual convictions about justice and justification. As Rawls says (1999, 514), the reasoning of the hypothetical parties matters to us because “the conditions embodied in the description of this situation are ones that we do in fact accept.” Unless the hypothetical models the actual, the upshot the the hypothetical could not provide us with reasons.

Freeman has recently stressed the way in which focusing on the third perspective—of citizens in a well ordered society— shows the importance of actual agreement in Rawls's contract theory. On Freeman's interpretation, the social contract must meet the condition of publicity. Freeman (2007b:15) writes:

Rawls distinguishes three levels of publicity: first, the publicity of principles of justice; second, the publicity of the general beliefs in light of which first principles of justice can be accepted (“that is, the theory of human nature and of social institutions generally)”; and, third, the publicity of the complete justification of the public conception of justice as it would be on its own terms. All three levels, Rawls contends, are exemplified in a well-ordered society. This is the “full publicity” condition.

A justified contract must meet the full publicity condition: its complete justification must be capable of being actually accepted by members of a well-ordered society. The hypothetical agreement itself provides only what Rawls (1996, 386) calls a “pro tanto” or “so far as it goes” justification of the principles of justice. “Full justification” is achieved only when actual “people endorse and will liberal justice for the particular (and often conflicting) reasons implicit in the reasonable comprehensive doctrines they hold” (Freeman 2007b, 19). Thus understood, Rawls's concern with the stability of justice as fairness, which motivated the move to political liberalism, is itself a question of justification. Only if the principles of justice are stable in this way are they fully justified.

2. The Description of the Parties

2.1 Non-moralized v. Moralized Parties

The description of the parties to the hypothetical agreement, then, is determined by our (actual) justificatory problem, and what is relevant to solving it. A major divide among contemporary social contract theories is just what is our justificatory problem. Among those who—very roughly—can be called followers of Hobbes, the crucial justificatory task is, as David Gauthier puts it, to resolve the “foundational crisis” of morality:

From the standpoint of the agent, moral considerations present themselves as constraining his choices and action, in ways independent of his desires, aims, and interests….And so we ask, what reason can a person have for recognizing and accepting a constraint that is independent of his desires and interests? … [W]hat justifies paying attention to morality, rather than dismissing it as an appendage of outworn beliefs? (Gauthier 1991, 16)

If our justificatory problem is not simply what morality requires, but whether morality ought to be paid attention to, or instead dismissed as a superstition based on outmoded metaphysical theories, then obviously the parties to the agreement must not employ moral judgments in their reasoning. On this account, the aim of the contract is to show that commitment to morality is an effective way to further one's non-moral aims and interests. Doing that would solve our justificatory problem—why be moral? This so-called “contractarian” project is reductionist in a pretty straightforward sense: it derives moral reasons from non-moral ones. Insofar as we doubt that moral reasons are genuine, or are motivationally effective, such a reductionistic strategy is appealing; there is alleged to be little trouble understanding how purely prudential reasons can serve as motives—though, of course, this is a common assumption, rather than a demonstrated conclusion.

On the other hand, so-called “contractualists,” such as Rawls, John Harsanyi (1977), and Thomas Scanlon (1998), already attribute ethical or political values to the parties. The kinds of surrogates that model the justificatory problem of ‘you and me’ are already so situated that their deliberations will be framed by ethico-political considerations. (See the article “Original Position”. The agents' deliberations are carried out in purely prudential terms, but they are subject to the ‘veil of ignorance’, which itself embodies important ethico-political notions.) Here the core justificatory problem is not whether the very idea of moral and political constraints makes sense, but what sorts of moral or political principles meet certain basic moral demands, such as treating all as free and equal moral persons, or not subjecting any person to the will or judgment of another (Reiman 1990, ch. 1). This approach, then, is non-reductionist in the sense that not all of morality is derived from the non-moral.

2.2 The Level of Idealization and Abstraction

The core idea of social contract theories, we have been stressing, is that the deliberation of the parties is supposed to model the justificatory problem of “you and me.” Now this pulls social contract theories in two opposing directions. One the one hand, if the deliberations of the hypothetical parties are to model our problem and their conclusions are to be of relevance to us, they must be similar to us. The closer the parties are to “you and me” the better their deliberations will model you and me, and be of relevance to us. On the other hand, the point of contract theories is to make headway on our justificatory problem by constructing parties that are idealizations of you and me. There are two important motivations behind idealization. First, you and I, as we now are, may be confused about what considerations are relevant to our justificatory problem. We have biases and false beliefs; to make progress on solving our problem of justification we wish, as far as possible, to see what the result would be if we only reasoned correctly from sound and relevant premises. So in constructing the hypothetical parties we wish to idealize them in this way. On the face of it, such idealization does not seem especially troublesome, since our ultimate concern is with what is justified, and so we want the deliberations of the parties to track good reasons. But if we idealize too far from citizens as they presently are—suppose we posit that they are fully rational in the sense that they know all the implications of all their beliefs and have perfect information—their deliberations may not help much in solving our justificatory problems. For example, suppose that hyper-rational and perfectly informed parties would have no religious beliefs, so they would not be concerned with freedom of religion or the role of religion of political decision making. But our problem is that, among tolerably reasonable but far from perfectly rational citizens, pluralism of religious belief is inescapable. Consequently to gain insight into the justificatory problem among citizens of limited rationality, the parties must model our imperfect rationality.

Secondly, however, social contract theories are pulled towards idealized and abstracted representations of the parties in order to render the choice situation determinate. The problem is this. Suppose that the parties to the contract closely model you and me, and so they have diverse bases for their deliberations— religious, secular, perfectionist, and so on. In this case it is hard to see how the contract theorist can get a determinate result. Just as you and I disagree, so will the parties. Social contract theorists have sought to generate a determinate result by modeling the parties in a very abstracted way, supposing that they are all centrally concerned with promoting their conception of the good, and insuring that they reason in the same way. Rawls (1999, 121) acknowledges that his restrictions on particular information in the original position are necessary to achieve a determinate result. If we exclude “knowledge of those contingencies which set men apart … ” then since “everyone is equally rational and similarly situated, each is convinced by the same arguments”(Rawls 1999, 17, 120). Gaus (2007) has recently argued that a determinative result can only be generated by an implausibly high degree of abstraction, in which the basic pluralism of evaluative standards—the core of our justificatory problem—is abstracted away. Thus, on Gaus's view, modelings of the parties that make them anything approaching representations of you and me will only be able to generate a non-singleton set of eligible social contracts. The parties might agree that some social contracts are better than none, but they will disagree on their ordering of possible social contracts.

3. The Object of Agreement

Social contract theories differ about the object of the contract. In the traditional contract theories of Hobbes and Locke the contract was about the terms of political association. In particular, the problem was the grounds and limits of citizen's obligation to obey the state. In his early formulation, Rawls's parties deliberated about “common practices” (1958). In his later statement of his view Rawls took the object of agreement to be principles of justice to regulate “the basic structure:”

The basic structure is understood as the way in which the major social institutions fit together into one system, and how they assign fundamental rights and duties and shape the division of advantages that arises through social cooperation. Thus the political constitution, the legally enforced forms of property, and the organization of the economy, and the nature of the family, all belong to the basic structure. (Rawls 1996, 258)

For Rawls, then, the object of agreement is not, at least directly, the grounds of political obligation, but the principles of justice that regulate the basic institutions of society. Freeman (2007a: 23), perhaps the preeminent student of Rawls, focuses on “the social role of norms in public life.” Gauthier (1986) and Scanlon (1998) employ the contract device to justify inter-personal moral claims.

The level at which the object of the contract is described is apt to affect the outcome of the agreement. “A striking feature of Hobbes' view,” Russell Hardin points out, “is that it is a relative assessment of whole states of affairs. Life under one form of government versus life under anarchy” (2003, 43). Hobbes could plausibly argue that everyone would agree to the social contract because “life under government” is, from the perspective of everyone, better than “life under anarchy.” However, if a Hobbesian sought to divide the contract up into, say, more fine-grained agreements about the various functions of government, she is apt to find that agreement would not be forthcoming on many functions. As we “zoom in” (Lister, forthcoming) on more fine-grained functions of government, the contract is apt to become more limited. If the parties are simply considering whether government is better than anarchy, they will opt for just about any government (including one that funds the arts); if they are considering whether to have a government that funds the arts or one that doesn't, it is easy to see how they may not agree on the former. In a similar way, if the parties are deliberating about entire moral codes, there may be wide agreement that all the moral codes, overall, are in everyone's interests; if we “zoom in” in specific rights and duties, we are apt to get a very different answer.

4. The Reasoning that Leads to a Solution

Suppose we have identified the object of the parties' deliberations: practice, norms, basic institutions, moral codes, etc. Now social contract theories fundamentally differ in whether the parties reason differently or the same. As we have seen (§2.2) in Rawls's contract everyone reasons the same: the collective choice problem is reduced to the choice of one individual. Any one person's decision is a proxy for everyone else. In social contracts of this sort, the description of the parties (their motivation, the conditions under which they choose) does all the work: once we have fully specified the reasoning of one party, the contract has been identified.

The alternative view is that, even after we have specified the parties (including their rationality, values and information), they continue to disagree in their rankings of possible social contracts. On this view, the contract only has a determinate result if there is some uniquely rational or correct way to commensurate the different rankings of each individual to yield a social choice (D'Agostino, 2003). We can distinguish three different commensuration mechanisms.

(i) Bargaining Solutions. As Rawls recognized in his 1958 essay on “Justice as Fairness” one way for parties to resolve their disagreements is to employ bargaining solutions, such as that proposed by R.B. Braithwaite (1955). Rawls himself rejected bargaining solutions to the social contract since, in his opinion, such solutions rely on threat advantage and “to each according to his threat advantage is hardly a principle of fairness” (Rawls 1958, 58n). However, Gauthier famously pursued this approach, building his Morals by Agreement on the Kalai-Smorodinsky bargaining solution (see also Gaus 1990, Ch. IX). Ken Binmore (2005) has recently advanced a version of social contract theory that relies on the Nash bargaining solution. In addition to Rawls's concern about threat advantage, a drawback of all such approaches is the multiplicity of bargaining solutions, which can significantly differ. Although the Nash solution is most favored today, it can have counter-intuitive implications. Although appealing to a bargaining solution can give determinacy to a social contract, it does so at the cost of appealing to a controversial commensuration mechanism.

(ii) Aggregation. We might distinguish bargaining from aggregation solutions. Rather than seeking an outcome that (as, roughly, the Kalai-Smorodinsky solution does) splits the difference between various claims, we might seek to aggregate the individual rankings into an overall social choice. Arrow's theorem and related problems with social choice rules casts doubt on any claim that one specific way of aggregating is uniquely rational: all have their shortcomings (Gaus 2008, ch. 5). Harsanyi (1977, Chs. 1 and 2; 1982) develops a contractual theory much like Rawls's. Reasoning behind a veil of ignorance in which people do not know their post-contract identities, he supposes that rational contractors will assume it is equally probable that they will be any specific person. Moreover, he argues that contractors can agree on interpersonal utility comparisons, and so they will opt for a contract that aggregates utility at the highest average (see also Mueller 2003, ch. 26). This, of course, depends on the supposition that there is a non-controversial metric that allows us to aggregate the parties' utility functions.

(iii) Equilibrium. Brian Skyrms (1996, 2004) suggests a different approach. Suppose that we have a contractual negotiation in which there are two parties, ordering four possible “social contracts”: (a) both Alf and Betty hunt stag, (b) both hunt hare; (c) Alf hunts stag, Betty hunts hare; (d) Alf hunts hare, Betty hunts stag. Let 3= best outcome, and 1= worst in each person's ranking (Alf's ranking is first in each pair). We thus get Figure 1

Hunt Stag Hunt Hare
Betty  Hunt Stag
Hunt Hare

Figure 1: A Stag Hunt

The Stag Hunt, Skyrms argues, “should be a focal point for social contract theory” (2004, 4). The issue in the Stag Hunt is not whether we fight or not, but whether we cooperate and gain, or each go one's own way. There are two Nash equilibria in this game: both hunting stag and both hunting hare. Alf and Betty, should they find themselves at one equilibrium, consulting only his or her own ranking of options, will stick to that contract. (Or should we say that only when both hunt stag is there really a contract?) Being Nash equilibria, neither has a reason to defect. Of course the contract in which they both hunt stag is a better contract: it is Pareto superior to that in which they both hunt hare. Skyrms argues that the theory of iterated games can show not simply that our parties will arrive at a social contract, but how they can come to arrive at the cooperative, mutually beneficial contract. If we have a chance to play repeated games, Skyrms holds, we can learn from Hume about the “shadow of the future”: “I learn to do a service to another, without bearing him any real kindness; because I foresee, that he will return my service, in expectation of another of the same kind, and in order to maintain the same correspondence of good offices with me and with others” (Skyrms 2004, 5).

One of the interesting developments in social contract theory spurred by game theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore is the appeal to evolutionary game theory as a way to solve the commensuration problem. What cannot be solved by appeal to reason (because there simply is no determinate solution) may by solved by repeated interactions among rational parties. The work of theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore also blurs the line between justification and explanation. Their analyses shed light both on the justificatory problem—what are the characteristics of a cooperative social order that people freely follow?—while also explaining how such orders may come about.

5. What Does the Contract Show?

Suppose, then, we have arrived at some social contract. Depending on the initial justificatory problem it will specify principles (P) that have some normative property (N)— such as justice, morality, authority, obligation, legitimacy, mutual benefit, and so on. But, supposing that the contract has generated principle P with the relevant normative property N, precisely what is shown by the fact that P was generated through the contractual device?

Throughout we have been distinguishing the justificatory problem from the deliberative model. Now the strongest that could be claimed for a contractual argument is that the outcome of the deliberative model is constitutive of both the correct solution of the justificatory problem and that P has N. On this “constructivist” reading of the outcome of the deliberative model, there is no independent and determinate external justification that P has N that the contractual device is intended to approximate, but, rather, that P is the outcome of the deliberative model is the truth-maker for “P has N”. Rawls was attracted to such a reading. At one point he (1999, 104) describes the argument from the original position as invoking “pure procedural justice”—the deliberative situation is so set up that whatever principles it generates are, by the fact of their generation, just. But though Rawls sometimes seemed attracted to this strong interpretation, his considered position is that the outcome of the deliberative model is indicative (not constitutive) of the correct solution to “the question of justification” (1999, 16). We might say that the deliberative model is evidence of the proper answer to the question of justification. However, this is still consistent with Rawls's “constructivism” because the answer to the justificatory problem is constitutive of P‘s having N. So we might say that Rawls's two principles have the property of being just simply because they are in reflective equilibrium with the considered judgments of you and me, and that they would be chosen in the original position is indicative of this.

The weakest interpretation of the contract is that the contractual result is simply indicative of the correct answer to the justificatory problem, which itself is simply indicative of the fact that P has N. One could be a “realist,” maintaining that whether P has N is a fact that holds whether or not the contract device generates principle P with N, and independently of whether the correct answer to our justificatory problem (i.e., what we can justify to each other) is that P has N. There is still room for contractualism here, but not “constructivism.” Some, for example, have argued that Scanlon's theory is actually based on a sort of natural rights theory, where these rights are prior to the contract (Mack 2007). Even if this is correct, Scanlon can be a sort of social contract theorist.

6. Conclusion: The Social Contract and Public Justification

The social contract theories of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau all stressed that the justification of the state depended on showing that everyone would, in some way, consent to it. By relying on consent, social contract theory seemed to suppose a voluntarist conception of political justice and obligation: what is just depends on what people choose to agree to—what they will. Only in Kant (1797) does it become clear that consent is not fundamental to a social contract view: we have a duty to agree to act according to the idea of the “original contract.” Rawls's revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted as a way to help solve the problem of justification. As the question of public justification takes center stage (we might say as contractualist liberalism becomes justificatory liberalism), it becomes clear that posing the problem of justification in terms of a deliberative or a bargaining problem is a heuristic: the real issue is “the problem of justification”—what principles can be justified to all reasonable citizens or persons.


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As of September 5, 2008, Gerald Gaus has become a co-author of this entry for the purpose of maintaining it and keeping it current. Changes introduced in this and subsequent versions reflect joint modifications to the entry which had been solely authored and maintained by Fred D'Agostino.