Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Kant's Philosophy of Science

First published Tue Oct 21, 2003; substantive revision Tue Nov 13, 2007

Kant's philosophy of science has received attention from several different audiences and for a variety of reasons. It is of interest to contemporary philosophers of science primarily because of the way in which Kant attempts to articulate a philosophical framework that places substantive conditions on our scientific knowledge of the world while still respecting the autonomy and diverse claims of particular sciences. More specifically, Kant develops a philosophy of science that departs from (i) broadly empiricist views — such as David Lewis's, according to which purely contingent events in space and time (along with considerations of simplicity, etc.) determine what the laws of nature ultimately are — and (ii) certain necessitarian views — such as David Armstrong's, according to which the laws of nature consist of necessitation relations between universals, which place constraints on what events occur in space and time. Kant does so by holding that (i) scientific laws do involve necessity, but that (ii) this necessity is based not on (purely metaphysical and hence inaccessible) relations between universals, but rather on certain subjective, a priori conditions under which we can experience objects in space and time.

Kant's scientific writings are also of interest to historians of modern philosophy, historians of science, and historians of philosophy of science. Historians of modern philosophy are especially interested in determining how Kant's views on science might complement or clarify his distinctive metaphysical and epistemological doctrines (e.g., as expressed in the Critique of Pure Reason). Historians of science reflect on the way in which Kant's position fits in with the views of other natural philosophers of the period, such as Newton and Leibniz, including his novel account of the formation of the solar system according to Newtonian principles. Historians of philosophy of science investigate, among other things, Kant's work in the conceptual foundations of physics — in particular, his matter theory (e.g., the infinite divisibility of matter, attractive and repulsive forces, inertia, atoms and the void) and his dynamical account of the laws of mechanics.

Because physics was Kant's primary (though not exclusive) focus over the course of his lengthy career, his views on physics during his pre-Critical (1746-1770), Critical (1781-1790), and Post-Critical periods (after 1790) will be discussed in separate sections. Subsections will be devoted to each of the chapters of Kant's most influential work in philosophy of science, the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). Kant's basic positions on other sciences, including psychology, chemistry, and history, will be presented thereafter.

1. Physics: The Pre-Critical Period

Kant's early pre-Critical publications (1746-1756) are devoted primarily to solving a variety of broadly cosmological problems and to developing an increasingly comprehensive metaphysics that would account for the matter theory that is required by the solutions to these problems. Kant's first publication, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1746), explicitly attempts to solve the vis viva controversy, which had been hotly contested ever since Leibniz's attack on Descartes' laws of motion in the Acta Eruditorum in 1686. While Kant attempts to occupy an intermediary position between the Cartesian and Leibnizian positions by maintaining that both mv and mv² could be conserved in different contexts, what is of particular note is how his solution in Parts II and III rests on the conception of force developed in Part I. According to this conception, force is understood in terms of the activity of substances, an activity that Kant then uses to explain how the motions of bodies are generated, to solve the mind-body problem, and to account for both the possibility of other, actually existing worlds and the three-dimensionality of space.

Kant develops his account of the nature of substance in greater detail in A New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). While the first two sections of this work undertake revisions of Wolff's principles of non-contradiction and sufficient reason, the third section argues for two substantive principles that are alleged to follow from the principle of sufficient (or rather, following Crusius, determining) reason, namely the principles of succession and coexistence. The main thrust of the principle of succession is directed against Leibnizian pre-established harmony, arguing that only causal connections between substances can bring about changes in their states. Kant's position appears to be designed to account primarily for changes of bodily states (with changes in mental states being parasitic upon them, as was explicitly asserted in the True Estimation). For he maintains that mutual changes of state require mutual interaction, where it is clear that changes in motion are precisely the kind of mutual change that he has in mind (since one body cannot move closer to another without the other body moving closer to it). The principle of coexistence then argues that harmonious causal interaction between otherwise isolated, independently existing substances is possible only by means of God's coordination (just as Leibniz thought was required for harmonious relations between the states of such substances).

Kant's Physical Monadology (1756) takes as its task the reconciliation of the infinite divisibility of space, as maintained in geometry, with the simplicity of substances, which Kant believes is required in metaphysics. As was the case with his earlier works, the essential feature of his reconciliation lies in the way in which his matter theory is supported by his metaphysical views. Specifically, Kant asserts that simple substances fill space not by means of their mere existence, but rather in virtue of their spheres of activity. As a result, any division of the relevant spheres of activity does not compromise the simplicity of the substances themselves, since the spatial properties of substances (including the infinite divisibility of space) arise from the interaction between their activities rather than from their intrinsic features. In the course of the Physical Monadology, Kant also argues for the necessity of attractive and repulsive forces and attributes a significant role to the force of inertia. Kant's acceptance of such Newtonian principles represents an important change of position over the True Estimation, where Kant rejects the principle of inertia and pursues a dynamical theory much more in line with Leibniz's views.

In addition to these works, which bridge the gap, as it were, between physics and metaphysics, during this period Kant is interested in a series of specific issues in cosmology and empirical physics. For example, Kant writes several short exclusively scientific essays between 1754 to 1757, including “Brief Outline of Certain Meditations on Fire,” “Investigation of the question of whether the Earth has suffered changes in its axial Rotation,” “The Question of the Aging of the Earth, considered physically” as well as three papers on earthquakes. Of much greater significance is his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), which represents an important contribution to science as such. For in it Kant explains how one can explain the formation of the solar system from an initial state, in which matter is dispersed like a cloud, solely by means of the interaction of attractive and repulsive forces. In 1796, Laplace, unaware of Kant's argument, would develop a very similar derivation, with the result that the view is now typically referred to as the Kant-Laplace nebular hypothesis.

Later in his pre-Critical period (1763-1770), Kant attempts to build a comprehensive metaphysical account on the basis of the framework that he had established in his first works. Thus, in his The Only Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763) he attempts to extend his reasoning to fundamental issues in both philosophical theology and teleology, presenting, for the first time, his now famous criticisms of the three traditional arguments for the existence of God, while developing a new theistic proof, based on the idea that God is necessary as a real ground of the possibilities of things. After reading Hume's Enquiry concerning Human Understanding in German translation sometime after 1755, Kant distinguishes between real and logical grounds/opposition in his Attempt to Introduce the Concept of Negative Magnitudes into Philosophy (1763) in order to avoid Hume's objection that there is no logical contradiction in the existence of one thing not following the existence of another. But in this work he is also interested in exploring the notion of a real ground/opposition further by applying it more widely, e.g., to bodies, mental states, etc. Also relevant is Kant's Concerning the Ultimate Foundation of the Distinction of the Directions in Space (1768) which modifies his earlier account of space insofar as he seems to hold that certain spatial properties may not be able to be explained entirely on the basis of the interaction between fundamental substances. In his so-called Inaugural Dissertation (1770), Kant continues to develop a more comprehensive philosophical system, which would encompass the principles of both the sensible and the intelligible world, and in so doing modifies his account of space and time even further. Over the course of the next ten years, during which he published almost nothing, Kant would revise his views more systematically, with the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781 representing the first major step in his “critical turn.”

Adickes (1924), Harman (1982), Friedman (1992), Laywine (1993), Schönfeld (2000), Kuehn (2001), Lefevre & Wunderlich (2000), and Watkins (1997, 2001, 2003) have emphasized the importance of scientific issues in the development of Kant's thought during his pre-Critical period, as he reacted to Leibniz, Newton and other, more immediate predecessors (such as Christian Wolff, Christian August Crusius, Leonard Euler, Pierre Louis Moreau de Maupertuis, and Martin Knutzen).

2. Physics: The Critical Period (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science)

Though Kant discusses issues relevant to physics in various works throughout the Critical period (esp. the Critique of Pure Reason), his views on this topic are developed most explicitly in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), which consists of a preface and four chapters.

2.1 Preface

In the Preface to the Metaphysical Foundations Kant (i) analyzes the concepts of nature and science so as to establish what conditions must be met for a body of knowledge to constitute natural science in the proper sense, (ii) explains why science so understood requires “a pure part” (4:469) and what criteria would have to be satisfied for such a pure part to exist, (iii) argues that chemistry and psychology cannot at present meet these criteria, and (iv) describes what procedure should be followed to satisfy these criteria and thus to provide the “pure part” that science proper requires.

The feature of Kant's conception of natural science proper that is most immediately striking is how restrictive it is. It requires that cognition (i) be systematically ordered (ii) according to rational principles and (iii) be known a priori with apodictic certainty, i.e., with “consciousness of their necessity” (4:468). Because properly scientific cognition must satisfy these strict conditions, it requires “a pure part on which the apodictic certainty that reason seeks can be based” (4:469). But since Kant identifies pure rational cognition that is generated from concepts with metaphysics, it follows that science proper requires a metaphysics of nature. He then specifies that such a metaphysics of nature could consist in either a “transcendental part,” which discusses the laws that make possible the concept of a nature in general — “even without relation to any determinate object of experience” (4:469) — or a “special metaphysical” part, which concerns a “particular nature of this or that kind of things” for which an empirical concept is given.

Kant's very conception of natural science proper thus immediately gives rise to several systematically important questions. First, if the “transcendental part” of the metaphysics of nature can be identified with the results of the Critique of Pure Reason, then the Metaphysical Foundations is a work in special metaphysics. But what exactly is a special metaphysics? In particular, what particular natures or kinds of things could be its object? And how precisely can an empirical concept of such things be given without compromising the necessity required of the pure part of natural science? Second, how is the special metaphysics provided by the Metaphysical Foundations supposed to be related to the transcendental part of the metaphysics of nature that was established in the Critique of Pure Reason? Does the former presuppose the principles of the latter or are they logically independent, but still related to each other in some other way?

First, Kant suggests that in special metaphysics the principles of the transcendental part “are applied to the two species of objects of our senses” (4:470). Thus, the particular kinds of things that could be investigated in a special metaphysics are (i) the objects of outer sense, i.e., matter, and (ii) the objects of inner sense, i.e., thinking beings, which would thus result in a doctrine of body and a doctrine of soul. Kant then argues that because “the possibility of determinate natural things cannot be cognized from their mere concepts … it is still required that the intuition corresponding to the concept be given a priori, that is, that the concept be constructed” (4:470), which is a task that requires mathematics. This is Kant's justification for his famous claim that “in any special doctrine of nature there can be only as much proper science as there is mathematics therein” (4:470). This argument suggests that the necessity required of the pure part of natural science derives from the necessity of the rules by which the mathematical construction of determinate things must proceed.

Kant then uses the claim that science proper requires the construction of the concept of the object in a priori intuition to exclude the possibility that chemistry and psychology, at least as they were practiced at that time, could count as science proper. In the case of chemistry, the problem is that “no law of the approach or withdrawal of the parts of matter can be specified according to which … their motions and all the consequences thereof can be made intuitive and presented a priori in space (a demand that will only with great difficulty ever be fulfilled)” (4:471). Since its principles are “merely empirical,” it can, at best, be a “systematic art” (ibid.). The case of psychology is more complex, since Kant provides (at least) two separate reasons in the Preface for denying it the status of natural science proper. First, Kant claims that mathematics is inapplicable to the phenomena of inner sense and their laws, though he grants that the law of continuity (discussed, e.g., at A207-209/B253-255 and A228-229/B281 in the Critique of Pure Reason) ought to apply to changes in our representations as well. He downplays the significance of this application of the law of continuity, however, by noting that time has only one dimension, which does not provide enough material to extend our cognition significantly. Second, Kant also complains that empirical psychology cannot separate and recombine the phenomena of inner sense at will; rather, our inner observations can be separated “only by mere division in thought” (4:471). Kant's fuller views on chemistry and psychology will be discussed further below.

Second, in explaining how mathematics can be applied to bodies Kant asserts that “principles for the construction of the concepts that belong to the possibility of matter in general must first be introduced. Therefore a complete analysis of the concept of a matter in general [must be provided in which it] makes use of no particular experiences, but only that which it finds in the isolated (although intrinsically empirical) concept itself, in relation to the pure intuitions in space and time, and in accordance with laws that already essentially attach to the concept of nature in general” (4:472). Kant then explains that this means that the concept of matter must be determined according to the Critique of Pure Reason's categories of quantity, quality, relation, and modality (4:474-476). Further, Kant holds that “a new determination” (4:476) must be added to the concept of matter in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations. This suggests not only that the principles argued for in the Metaphysical Foundations are to be developed “in accordance with” the principles defended in the Critique of Pure Reason, but also that both the concept of matter and the Metaphysical Foundations itself is structured according to the Critique of Pure Reason's table of categories.

Unfortunately, these points of clarification do not resolve all of the issues that are immediately raised by Kant's pronouncements about what is required for natural science proper. One further issue that is relevant here concerns the concept of matter that is at the heart of the Metaphysical Foundations. Kant introduces it in the Critique of Pure Reason (A847-848/B875-876) as the concept of something that is impenetrable, extended, and inert. Yet, in the beginning of the Preface of the Metaphysical Foundations, he describes it as whatever is an object of outer sense, and later he argues that the “basic determination of something that is to be an object of the outer senses had to be motion, because only thereby can these senses be affected” (4:476). Whatever weight one accords Kant's justification of the connection between matter, outer sense, and motion, one faces a dilemma. If the concept of matter, most fundamentally, is simply the concept of any object of outer sense, then how is it still empirical in any genuine sense (and what has become of the structural difference Kant draws between the Critique of Pure Reason and the Metaphysical Foundations)? If, by contrast, impenetrability, extension, and movability are deemed the basic traits of the concept of matter, then how can one know a priori that any object we might encounter in outer sense must behave in accordance with the laws that would govern matter so defined?

Moreover, even if one can find an appropriately nuanced sense in which the concept of matter is empirical while still allowing for an appropriate kind of necessity, questions can still be posed about the “new determinations” that are to be added to that concept in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations. For example, what is the justification for each specific determination that is added when one thinks of matter as having a quantity, a quality, etc.? Also, what is the relationship between each new determination of matter and the various claims that Kant makes in each chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations? In particular, when Kant explicitly invokes principles for constructing concepts belonging to the possibility of matter, is his idea that these principles are required insofar as they make experience of the relevant “new determination” of matter possible (so that Kant would be developing a transcendental argument in the Metaphysical Foundations similar in many respects to the Critique of Pure Reason)? Answers to these questions depend on how one interprets the arguments Kant develops throughout the Metaphysical Foundations.

The conception of science that Kant presents in the Preface has been the focus of considerable attention over the past several decades. In the German literature, the issues raised above have been discussed at length by Plaass (1965), Schäfer (1966), Hoppe (1969), Gloy (1976), and Cramer (1985). Pollok (2001) has recently produced a detailed and comprehensive textual commentary on the Metaphysical Foundations. Important work has also been done in the English literature by Walker (1974), Brittan (1978), Buchdahl (1968, 1969, and 1986), Butts (1986), and Watkins (1998a). Friedman (1992, 2001, and 2002) has been especially influential on these issues as well.

2.2 Phoronomy

The first chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Phoronomy, considers the quantity of motion of matter and how it is to be constructed in intuition a priori (so as to produce the kind of rules that are necessary for our experience of matter in motion). Since extension and impenetrability are not directly relevant to how different magnitudes (or degrees) of motion can be represented, Kant restricts his discussion in this chapter to matter considered as a point. Since the motion of a point in space can be represented straightforwardly, the main issue is how to represent the composition of two different motions. Kant's primary claim in this chapter is that due to the relativity of space (i.e., the fact that every motion can be viewed arbitrarily as either the motion of a body in a space at rest, or as a body in a state of rest in a space which is in motion in the opposite direction with the same velocity) “the composition of two motions of one and the same point can only be thought in such a way that one of them is represented in absolute space, and, instead of the other, a motion of the relative space with the same speed occurring in the opposite direction is represented as the same as the latter” (4:490). The proof of this Theorem considers the three possible cases for the composition of two motions: (i) The two motions are in the same direction; (ii) the two motions are in opposite directions; (iii) the two motions enclose an angle. Kant then shows how one can construct a priori in intuition a single motion out of the two motions described in cases (i)-(iii).

Very little has been written directly on Kant's Phoronomy. (Kant's philosophy of mathematics, by contrast, has received considerable attention.) The most extensive discussions of the Phoronomy are by Palter (1972) and Pollok (2001).

2.3 Dynamics

The second chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Dynamics, considers how it is possible to experience matter as filling a determinate region in space. Propositions 1-4 are devoted to exhibiting the nature and necessity of repulsive forces. In Proposition 1 Kant argues that repulsive force is required for matter to fill space, since solidity, understood by “Lambert and others” as the property matter would have by means of “its mere existence” (4:497), cannot truly explain how one matter resists another matter's attempt to penetrate it. Kant then specifies several central features of repulsive forces in Propositions 2 and 3. Repulsive forces admit of degrees to infinity, since one must always be able to think of a slightly greater or lesser force, and although matter can be compressed to infinity, it can never be penetrated, since that would require an infinite compressing force, which is impossible.

In Proposition 4 Kant draws an important consequence from his characterization of repulsive forces, namely that matter is infinitely divisible (4:503). What is especially striking about this point is that it represents a significant departure from his own earlier Physical Monadology, where he had accepted attractive and repulsive forces, but denied the infinite divisibility of what ultimately constitutes matter, namely physical points or monads. It is true that part of Kant's rationale for his change of position on this point stems from the “critical turn” undertaken in the Critique of Pure Reason (and in its Second Antinomy in particular). For once one recognizes that both space and spatial properties such as divisibility are not properties of things in themselves but rather only appearances, one can reject the proposition that seems to necessitate the acceptance of simple substances, namely the idea that simple substances must precede the wholes they compose (4:506). However, Kant's proof also seems to depend, in its details, not merely on the idea that every space is filled by means of some repulsive force or other, but on the stronger claim that every space is divisible into smaller spaces that are filled by different repulsive forces.

Propositions 5-8 are all devoted to attractive force. In Proposition 5 Kant argues that matter must have an attractive force in order to fill space. Kant's argument is that if there were only repulsive forces, then matter “would disperse itself to infinity” (4:508) since neither space nor other matter could limit it. Proposition 6 argues that both attractive and repulsive forces must be considered essential to matter. That is, attractive forces alone are not sufficient to account for matter filling a space, since if matter consisted solely of attractive forces, there would be no force to counteract the attractive force being exercised and the universe would collapse into a single point. Proposition 7 then specifies how attractive forces are to be understood, namely as the immediate action of matter on other matter through empty space (and therefore at a distance). Kant thus directly confronts the metaphysical question of how to understand attraction that Newton attempted to avoid by positing it merely mathematically. As Kant interprets the situation, Newton “abstracts from all hypotheses purporting to answer the question as to the cause of the universal attraction of matter … [since] this question is physical or metaphysical, but not mathematical” (4:515). In response to the “most common objection to immediate action at a distance,” namely “that a matter cannot act immediately where it is not” (4:513), Kant argues that action at a distance is no more problematic than action by means of physical contact (whether it be by collision or pressure), since in both cases a body is simply acting outside itself. Proposition 8 concludes by arguing that attractive forces act immediately to infinity and by adding a “preliminary suggestion” (4:518) as to how one might be able to construct the concept of cohesion (which Kant understands as attraction that is restricted to contact).

In the General Remark to Dynamics Kant addresses two main issues. First, Kant considers how it is that the specific varieties of matter (e.g., water as different from mercury) might be reduced, at least in principle, to the fundamental forces of attraction and repulsion. The second issue concerns the fundamental distinction between the “mathematical-mechanical” and the “metaphysical-dynamical mode of explanation”. The former mode of explanation, which is associated with the postulation of atoms and the void, employs nothing more than the shapes and motions of fundamental particles and empty interstices interspersed among them. It contrasts with the metaphysical-dynamical mode, which employs fundamental moving forces (e.g., attraction and repulsion) in its explanations. Kant grants that the mathematical-mechanical mode has an advantage over the metaphysical-dynamical mode, since its fundamental posits can be represented (indeed, “verified” (4:525)) mathematically, whereas he repeatedly admits that the possibility of fundamental forces can never be comprehended, i.e., their possibility can never be rendered certain. However, Kant thinks that this advantage is outweighed by two disadvantages. First, by presupposing absolute impenetrability, the mathematical-mechanical mode of explanation accepts an “empty concept” at its foundation. Second, by giving up all forces that would be inherent in matter, such a mode of explanation provides the imagination with more freedom “than is truly consistent with the caution of philosophy” (4:525).

Given that the bulk of Kant's matter theory is presented in the Dynamics, it is unsurprising that it has received the greatest amount of attention in the literature. Of particular note are discussions by Buchdahl (1968, 1969), Brittan (1978), Kitcher (1983), Butts (1986), Carrier (1990), Friedman (1990), Malzkorn (1998), Warren (2001), Pollok (2002), and Engelhard (2005).

2.4 Mechanics

The third chapter of Kant's Metaphysical Foundations, the Mechanics, concerns how it is possible to experience matter as having a moving force, that is, how one matter communicates its motion to another by means of its moving force. Kant begins, in Proposition 1, by clarifying how the quantity of matter is to be estimated before stating, in Propositions 2-4, three Laws of Mechanics.

After first defining the quantity of matter and the quantity of motion (or, in contemporary terms, impulse, i=mv), Kant asserts that the quantity of matter, in comparison with every other matter, can be estimated only by the quantity of motion at a given speed (4:537). Kant's proof proceeds by way of elimination. The quantity of matter, which is the aggregate of the movable in a determinate space, cannot be estimated by counting the number of parts it has, since, as was established in the Dynamics, every matter is infinitely divisible. Nor can one estimate the quantity of matter merely by considering its volume, since different matters can have different specific densities. As a result, the only universally applicable way of estimating the quantity of matter is to hold the velocity of matter constant.

In Proposition 2, Kant states his First Law of Mechanics: the total quantity of matter remains the same throughout all changes in matter (4:541). His proof seems to rely (i) on the principle of the First Analogy of Experience that no substance arises or perishes throughout any change in nature and (ii) on the identification of what in matter must be substantial. On this latter point, Kant quickly assumes that the ultimate subject of all accidents inhering in matter must be the movable in space, and that its quantity is the aggregate of the movable in space. In his remark to this proposition, Kant explicitly notes that there is a crucial difference between spatial and non-spatial substances, since the latter, unlike the former, could gradually fade away by degrees. (Kant cites the possibility of consciousness as a concrete example.) Kant uses this difference to argue that since the quantity of matter consists in a plurality of real things external to each other that cannot fade away (as consciousness might), the only way to decrease its quantity is by division.

Kant's Second Law of Mechanics, stated in Proposition 3, is that every change in matter has an external cause. (Immediately after this principle, Kant adds in parentheses a version of the law of inertia that is much closer to Newton's: “every body persists in its state of rest or motion, in the same direction, and with the same speed, it is not compelled by an external cause to leave this state” (4:543). Since Kant's Second Law of Mechanics is not identical to Newton's law of inertia, it would require argument to show that, and by means of what additional assumptions, the former entails the latter.) The proof of the main principle depends on the Second Analogy of Experience (which asserts that all changes occur in accordance with the law of cause and effect and thus entails that every change in matter has a cause) as well as on the further assumption that matter has no internal grounds of determinations (such as thinking and desiring), but rather only external relations in space. In his remark to this proposition, which clarifies this “law of inertia,” Kant explains that inertia is to be contrasted with life or the ability of a substance to determine itself to act from an internal principle. Thus, a body's inertia “does not mean a positive striving to conserve its state” (4:544), but rather what it does not do, its lifelessness.

Kant also asserts that the very possibility of natural science proper depends on the law of inertia, since the rejection of it would be hylozoism, “the death of all natural philosophy” (4:544). In a later remark in the Mechanics, Kant explicitly objects that “the terminology of inertial force (vis inertiae) must be entirely banished from natural science, not only because it carries with it a contradiction in terms, nor even because the law of inertia (lifelessness) might thereby be easily confused with the law of reaction in every communicated motion, but primarily because the mistaken idea of those who are not properly acquainted with the mechanical laws is thereby maintained and even strengthened” (4:550). Kant goes on to point out that if inertia were to entail an active force of resistance, then it would be possible that when one moving body hits another, the moving body has to apply part of its motion solely to overcome the inertia of the one at rest and might not have any motion left over, as it were, to set the body at rest into motion, which is contrary to experience (and Proposition 2).

Kant's Third Law of Mechanics, expressed in Proposition 4, asserts the equality of action and reaction in the communication of motion. Kant formulates a version of the Third Analogy of Experience (according to which all external action in the world is interaction) and suggests that the main point at issue in mechanics is establishing that mutual action is necessarily reaction. Kant's argument for this law is based on the following line of thought: (i) if all changes of matter are changes of motion; (ii) if all changes of motion are reciprocal and equal (since one body cannot move closer to/farther away from another body without the second body moving closer to/farther away from the first body and by exactly the same amount); and (iii) if every change of matter has an external cause (a proposition that was established as the Second Law of Mechanics), then the cause of the change of motion of the one body entails an equal and opposite cause of a change of motion of the other body or, in short, action must be equal to reaction.

In Remark 1, Kant then shows how his position differs from that of other authors. Newton “by no means dared to prove this law a priori, and therefore appealed rather to experience” (4:449). Kepler likewise derived it from experience, though he went further, conceiving of it in terms of a special force of inertia. Certain unnamed “transfusionists” (presumably Locke and perhaps Descartes or Rohault) attempted to deny the law altogether by suggesting that motion could simply be transferred from one body to another in the communication of motion, a view Kant rejects on the grounds that explaining the communication of motion in terms of the transfer of motion is no explanation at all and also amounts to admitting that accidents could be literally transferred from one substance to another.

Kant's Laws of Mechanics have been discussed widely in the secondary literature. One can point to discussions by Palter (1972), Duncan (1984), Friedman (1989, 1992, and 1995), Brittan (1995), Westphal (1995), Carrier (2001), and Watkins (1997 and 1998b). Friedman's interpretation (1992) deserves special mention. According to Friedman, in light of Kant's rejection of Newton's absolute space and time, he must develop some way of providing an appropriate meaning for absolute motion, i.e., for the real, as opposed to merely apparent, relative motion of bodies. To this end, he “views the laws of motion as definitive or constitutive of the spatio-temporal framework of Newtonian theory, and this, in the end, is why they count as a priori for him” (p. 143). More specifically: “We need to presuppose the immediacy and universality of gravitational attraction in order to develop a rigorous method for comparing the masses of the primary bodies in the solar system. We need such a method, in turn, in order rigorously to determine the center of mass of the solar system. This, in turn, is necessary for rigorously determining a privileged frame of reference and thus for giving objective meaning, in experience, to the distinction between true and apparent (absolute and relative) motion. This, finally, is necessary if matter, as the movable in space (Definition 1 of the Phoronomy: 480.5-10), is to be itself possible as an object of experience. Hence an essential — that is, immediate and universal — attraction is necessary to matter as an object of experience. It follows, for Kant, that the immediacy and universality of gravitational attraction must be viewed — like the laws of motion themselves — as in an important sense a priori. These two properties cannot be straightforwardly obtained from our experience of matter and its motions — by some sort of inductive argument, say — for they are necessarily presupposed in making an objective experience of matter and its motions possible in the first place” (pp. 157-158).

2.5 Phenomenology

The final chapter of the Metaphysical Foundations, the Phenomenology, focuses on how the motion of matter can be experienced modally, that is, in terms of it being possibly, actually, or necessarily in motion. Its three Propositions specify (in accordance, Kant suggests, with the results of the three previous chapters) that (i) rectilinear motion is a merely possible predicate of matter, (ii) circular motion is an actual predicate of matter, and (iii) the equal and opposite motion of one matter with respect to another is a necessary motion of that matter. In the General Remark to the Phenomenology, Kant discusses the status of absolute space, which had been presupposed by the possible, actual, and necessary motions of matter at issue in the three main propositions, and explains that since it is not itself an object of experience, it must be represented by means of an idea of reason (in Kant's technical sense of “idea”, namely as a concept for which a corresponding object could never be given to us in intuition). Though we can never know absolute space, it none the less functions as a regulative principle that guides us in our scientific practice by forcing us to look for further conditions for the conditioned objects we meet with in experience. Kant's view that ideas of reason can function as regulative principles is developed in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic in the Critique of Pure Reason.

There is relatively little secondary literature that discusses Kant's Phenomenology. Carrier (1992) provides a detailed interpretation of Kant's conception of absolute space. Friedman (1992, Chapter 3, but also 1995) argues that the Phenomenology should be read “as attempting to turn Newton's argument of Book III of Principia on its head” (1992, p. 142).

3. Physics: The Post-Critical Period (Opus postumum)

Kant's interest in physics continued after the publication of the Metaphysical Foundations, in fact, until the very end of his productive years. Though Kant never completed a manuscript that could be put forward as a publication, the various notes, sketches, and drafts on topics in physics that he was working on intensively during this time (especially after 1796) were gathered together over a century after his death and published as his so-called Opus postumum.

Despite the fragmentary nature of the Opus postumum, Kant makes it clear that it is designed to fill an important gap in his system. Just as the Metaphysical Foundations had attempted to connect the transcendental principles of the Critique of Pure Reason and the principles that explain how matter is possible, the Opus postumum undertakes the task of effecting a transition from the special metaphysics of nature contained in the Metaphysical Foundations to physics itself. However, Kant does not clarify adequately what systematic principles would guide this transition project. On the one hand, in a note that stems from a period shortly after the publication of the Metaphysical Foundations, Kant suggests that one could “follow the clue given by the categories and bring into play the moving forces of matter according to their quantity, quality, relation, and modality” (21:311), a procedure that could be similar to that of the Metaphysical Foundations. On the other hand, if the Metaphysical Foundations already presupposes an empirical concept (namely matter), the transition to be carried out in the Opus postumum cannot be understood as moving from something non-empirical to something empirical. As Kant struggles with the problems that result from trying to account for now much more specific features of matter, it is unclear that (or how) the categories are supposed to be of help in structuring Kant's argument. Thus, the precise argumentative structure of the Opus postumum (i.e., its relationship to Kant's other works and its fundamental presuppositions) remains problematic.

Whatever its form, the content of the Opus postumum includes reflections on a series of important topics in physics. Three clusters are particularly noteworthy. (1) Kant develops more detailed views about a number of outstanding issues concerning matter theory that he had discussed (often in a tentative way) in the Metaphysical Foundations, such as fluidity, rigidity, cohesion, and the quantity of matter. (2) Kant argues for the existence of an all-encompassing ether. This might seem to be a natural development, since the Metaphysical Foundations was non-committal on the point, but what is surprising is that Kant thinks that the ether can be established a priori (e.g., 21:222), which might seem to conflict with Kant's project in the Critique of Pure Reason (or with his description of his position as “formal idealism,” 4:337). (3) Kant also explores the idea that the subject must posit itself in positing the various forces in matter, a doctrine that has come to be known as the Selbstsetzungslehre, and attempts to incorporate it into his views on how man is situated in between the world of experience and God, whose existence is a central requirement of morality.

The Opus postumum has long been a topic of interest especially insofar as it offers the hope of clarification and development of central issues in Kant's Critical philosophy. While much of the original literature focussing on it was in German (Adickes 1920, Hoppe 1969, Tuschling 1971, and, more recently, Blasche, 1991 and Emundts, 2004), it has received increased attention of late in English with discussions by Friedman (1992, chapter 5), Förster (2000), Edwards (2000), and Guyer (2001).

4. Chemistry

In the Preface to the Metaphysical Foundations Kant claims that chemistry, at least as he understood it in 1786, was not science “proper”, but such a claim leaves open the possibility that chemistry could be fully scientific in some other sense or that, with time, it could develop into science proper. Up through 1787, Kant accepted the fundamental tenets of Stahl's chemical theory, according to which water and air are fundamental elements that function as vehicles for change in both inflammable and “earthy” substances, and he commented on particular issues in chemistry in his various physics lectures. As a result, it is clear that Kant considers chemistry to be a science in some sense even during the Critical period. However, beginning in the mid-1780s (and extending through the mid to late 1790s), Kant becomes aware of significant new developments in chemistry (as evidenced in the Danziger Physik and documented in Lichtenberg's revised, third edition of Erxleben's Anfangsgründe der Naturlehre from which Kant lectured). In particular, Kant comes to reject Stahl's theory, favoring Lavoisier's anti-phlogistic account of combustion and calcination, which relied on his doctrines of latent heat and the caloric theory of the states of aggregation. While Kant never explicitly claims that chemistry, so understood, can be considered science proper, Kant's interest in these issues in the Opus postumum suggests that he was optimistic about providing the kind of foundation that would be required for it to attain this status.

Kant's views on chemistry have not been widely discussed in the secondary literature. However, outstanding discussions of Kant's views on the topic can be found in Carrier (1990, 2001) and Friedman (1992, chapter 5, III).

5. Psychology

Kant's views on psychology are intimately bound up with his more general position in the philosophy of mind. (See the separate entry on this topic.) Still, one can take note of the fact that Kant distinguishes between rational and empirical psychology and, in the Critique of Pure Reason's Paralogisms, denies that rational psychology contains arguments that could justify any substantive principles (especially concerning our immortality). Thus, only empirical psychology, it seems, could be possible as a science. However, if Kant continues to maintain that science requires a pure part, and denies that rational psychology contains any substantive knowledge that might constitute the pure part of psychology, then it follows that empirical psychology cannot qualify as science proper either.

At the same time, Kant's own project in the Critique of Pure Reason requires what one might call transcendental psychology, that is, the study of those faculties that are required for us to have cognition. Transcendental psychology thus differs from rational psychology insofar as the former presupposes that we have experience (albeit of a very general sort), whereas the latter is restricted to the mere concept “I think”. Thus, it would seem that many of Kant's most important claims in the Critique of Pure Reason would fall under the domain of transcendental psychology. As is well known, Kant's Critique of Pure Reason came under attack immediately after its publication (most notably by Johann Georg Hamann) for not presenting an explicit account of how we obtain knowledge of our transcendental faculties.

Just as Kant held that chemistry could either be scientific in less than the strictest sense or perhaps become science proper (depending on how it develops), the same could be said for psychology. For one, Kant may simply be objecting to psychology as it was practiced in the 18th century, e.g., as based on introspection (a method that both rules out the application of mathematics and gives rise to other difficulties, 4:471). Further, in the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant holds that although objects can never be given in intuition that would correspond to ideas of reason, such ideas never the less function as regulative principles that direct our understanding with regard to what it should inquire into next. Thus, our idea of the world as a totality is supposed to drive us to look for smaller and smaller parts to bodies and objects in further regions of space and at earlier moments of time. But if we have an idea of our soul, then it too should guide our scientific inquiry into our own representations, which seems to imply that psychology is a legitimate scientific practice (even if it does ultimately fall short of being science proper).

Kitcher (1990) presents a detailed argument for the role of transcendental psychology within Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. Sturm (2001) argues that Kant's critical comments about psychology are primarily directed against introspection-based conceptions of psychology.

6. Other Sciences: History, Physical Geography, and Anthropology

Though Kant is sometimes quite strict about what qualifies as science “proper,” we have seen that he clearly accepts that other disciplines, such as chemistry and psychology, can be scientific in some other sense. (Kant is also extremely interested in providing an explanation of the nature and origin of organisms, which is central to an account of biology. For a more detailed description of Kant's stance on biology, see the entry on his views on aesthetics and teleology.) However, his explicit reflections about science (taken broadly so as to encompass not only “Wissenschaft” but any kind of “Lehre” or “Kunde”) extend even further so as to include bodies of cognition such as history, physical geography, and anthropology. (Even in the Metaphysical Foundations Kant leaves room for such “scientific cognition” by dividing the doctrine of nature into natural science — e.g., physics — and the historical doctrine of nature, which is separated further into natural description and natural history, 4:468). In the case of historical sciences, Kant views its cognitions as related not by subordination (as is the case in physics), but rather by coordination, since historical facts cannot be derived from each other, but rather merely related to each other in space (geographically) and time (chronologically). Kant views anthropology as having the same subject matter as empirical psychology. What enables the coordination of facts in each of these domains is not a theoretical, but rather a practical idea. In the case of history, it is the idea of reason (or freedom) that provides a guiding principle of coordination (cf. Kant's “Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View”), while anthropology is framed by the cosmopolitan moral ideal of the world-best. Thus, it is clear that Kant's emphasis on physics throughout his career did not blind him to the value of other sciences, nor did it keep him from reflecting creatively on how best to account for them from the perspective of his Critical philosophy.

Kant's views on history are discussed by Yovel (1980) and, more recently, Kleingeld (1995 and 1999). Kant's Physical Geography has been discussed by Adickes (1911). Brandt (1999), Wood (1999), and Makkreel (2001) have recently published important discussions of Kant's anthropology.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: aesthetics and teleology | Kant, Immanuel: philosophical development | Kant, Immanuel: view of mind and consciousness of self | laws of nature