Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Kant's Philosophical Development

First published Mon Nov 3, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jan 18, 2007

1. Overview

Modern thought begins with Kant. The appearance of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781 marks the beginning of modern philosophy.[1] Today his texts are read on all continents, and his influence is global. The 2004 bicentennial of his death, for instance, was reflected in conferences in Austria, Canada, China, France, Germany, Hungary, Japan, Iran, Italy, Mexico, New Zealand, Paraguay, Poland, Portugal, Russia, Senegal, Spain, Sweden, Taiwan, and Turkey. Just like Confucius and Aristotle, Kant has contributed to the shape of world civilization. His practical ideas, such as the Categorical Imperative and its implications (1785), informed the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948), the Political and Economic Covenants (1966), and the International Criminal Court (2002).

His metaphysical ideas, particularly those of his pre-critical period (1747-1770), are stunning. Kant gave the first account of the evolutionary reciprocity of spacetime and momentum-energy, and formulated the first general law of free field radiation (1747). He suggested the conceptual solution of the three body problem, which emerges in the interplay of Earth, Moon, and Sun (1754). He was the first to construct a detailed evolutionary cosmology (1755). His ideas on biospherical dynamics allowed him to predict the rhythms of the monsoon and the oscillation of coastal winds (1755-1757). He suggested that the building blocks of matter are energy bubbles (1756)—an idea that is useful today in superstring theory in the guise of Calabi-Yau manifolds.

A number of recent findings have helped to shed more light on Kant's philosophical development.

First, in terms of science, it now appears that his metaphysics has withstood the test of time. While traditional scholars largely dismiss his holistic ontology prior to the Critique, innovations in the environmental and physical sciences have validated Kant's claims as realistic insights in the workings of nature. His evolutionary theory of the universe is now seen as “the essence of modern models” in cosmology (Coles 2001, 240), and his natural philosophy is seen as the last milestone of western philosophy prior to its “comedown” to skepticism (Hawking 2003, 166). In light of climate change, it stands to reason that Kant's grasp on biospherical dynamics and sustainable policies may well spur a philosophical return to Kant in the future.

Second, in terms of religion, an important new finding is that Kant disliked Christianity—something that his early biographers, all of them Lutheran theologians, did not let on.[2] Kant defended pantheism, naturalism, evolution, and holism when doing so was incompatible with an academic career. Because one's job was easily lost over such views, he was cautious. In the context of censorship writers tend to become circumspect. To avoid trouble, they may publish something anonymously; or they may make oblique remarks instead of direct statements; or they may have second thoughts and retract earlier “dares”. Kant did all three things, but for later readers of more secular ages, it was easy to miss such subtleties.

Third, in terms of culture, Kant's early views may be placed in a Eurasian rather than a purely Western context. Recent research suggests that key ideas of Kant's natural philosophy also have sources in Taoist and Confucian thought, which were disseminated in continental Europe by Jesuits based in China, popularized by Leibniz and Wolff, and further developed by Wolff's Sinophile student Bilfinger.[3] One example is the idea of dialectics that Bilfinger found in the Chinese classics, and which Kant encountered in the proceedings of the Russian academy. Kant was unaware of the Far Eastern roots of the notions that influenced him, and the historical irony is that he dismissed nonwestern cultures while being deeply influenced by their insights.

Scholars split Kant's development into stages: first the time from 1745 to 1770, known as the pre-critical period; next the time of insights or “the astonishing decade” (Beck 1969, 433) from 1781 to 1791, known as the critical period; and finally the works of old age, from 1798 to 1802, or the post-critical period.[4] Recent studies indicate that Kant's philosophical development was far more unified (Schönfeld 2000), and, in terms of its stages, involved deeper continuities (Edwards 2000) than previously recognized. From the start, Kant was pushing a unique agenda. His early claims not only line up with his late claims but also put oddities of the critical period in context, such as the Third Analogy of the Critique.[5] The new picture of Kant's development indicates that his intellectual trajectory was not as fractured and erratic as scholarship used to assume, and it also indicates that Kant was not a late bloomer?instead he struck gold from the start.

The following account covers Kant's development from his upbringing to the critical period. Its theme is his intellectual formation: the influences in his youth; the views shaped early on; the questions subsequently pursued; and the historical fate of his answers.[6]

2. Childhood: “The Starry Sky Above Me and the Moral Law Within Me”

Immanuel Kant was born April 22, 1724 in Königsberg, East Prussia (now Kaliningrad, Russia), as the eldest son of Anna Regina Kant, née Reuter, (1697-1737) and Johann Georg Kant (1683-1746). The Reuters were shoe- and harness-makers; the Kants were harness-makers (Riemer, a guild similar to saddlers). Originally, the Reuters were from Nuremberg in Bavaria; the Kants were from not-too-distant Tilsit (now Sovietsk, Oblast Kaliningrad; Russia). Anna was Lutheran and fit well into the like-minded Königsberg culture.

Immanuel's early childhood seems to have been idyllic. The family was rather well off. The parents got along and loved their son. Johann Kant appears to have been a gentle and hardworking man. Anna Kant, who took care of the family's paperwork, was well educated. Little Immanuel was her constant company, and her influence on him was considerable.

After “Manelchen” could walk, Anna Kant took him out for walks in the meadows and fields. She taught him what she could, of the seasons, the plants and animals, and the sky. Her little son responded eagerly with questions; and the mother encouraged his outdoor curiosity with praise, patience, and more information (Wasianski 1804, 247).

For learning about the details of nature, the child grew up in a good environment. Königsberg enjoys a cool and gentle climate; typical of high latitudes, the flat Baltic terrain has not much biological diversity, and its biomes — meadows, moors, deciduous and conifer forests — are not hostile. At Kant's time, bears and wolves were common, but neither of which are in the habit of attacking humans (despite legends to the contrary). Walks as the ones he enjoyed, at the edge of town, were fun and perfectly safe. Excursions into nature also have a spiritual subtext. Like Japanese Shinto, German tradition invests natural places with meaning. The late and superficial conversion of the Baltic lands to Christianity, after the fourteenth century, coupled with the fact that persecution drove pagan faiths temporarily underground instead of eliminating them altogether, allowed the ancient nature-worship to prevail in forms inoffensive to the clergy, as in the guise of outdoor walks. Thus people used to attend Sunday service — before heading out for their Sonntagsspaziergang.

When Immanuel grew older, the local influence of Pietism grew. This Christian movement, founded by Jakob Spener (1635-1705) and promoted by August Hermann Francke (1663-1727), had spread north from Dresden, Leipzig, and Halle. It reached Königsberg at the turn of the century, making inroads with the creation of schools and orphanages. As Luther's Reformation had been the effort to return Roman Catholicism to a purer faith, Pietism tried to purify Lutheranism, stripping it of dogma and detail. The Protestant Church avoided a schism in Prussia, but at the price of friction between the Lutheran mainstream and the Pietist firebrands. Pietism stressed literal exegesis, quiet humility, and charitable deeds. It allowed believers to practice a spirituality of mystical intensity — but as the purge of Halle University (1723) illustrates, it had a totalitarian streak.

The local authorities frowned on the movement, but the Pietists enjoyed protection of King Friedrich Wilhelm I (reign 1713-40) and thus persisted. In 1731, the field chaplain Franz Albert Schulz came to town, rising to become the local leader of the movement. He was appointed to director of the Pietist high school (the Collegium Fridericianum) and later to professor of theology. One of his early converts was Immanuel's mother, who brought her children to his bible sessions.

According to Kant's later judgment (Wasianski 1804, 246; tr. Kuehn 2001a, 31), his mother lived out a positive form of Pietism, blending love, tolerance, and spirituality into a faith that was “genuine” and “not in the least enthusiastic” (‘enthusiasm’ or Schwärmerei means fundamentalism). The child's formation was apparently not hurt by Anna's piety; instead of turning into a zealot, she instilled a plausible sense of right and wrong into her son and always respected him as a person.

Kant said, “I will never forget my mother, for she implanted and nurtured in me the first germ of goodness; she opened my heart to the impressions of nature; she awakened and furthered my concepts, and her doctrines have had a continual and beneficial influence in my life” (Jachmann 1804, 169; tr. Kuehn 2001a, 31). Later, he would develop a metaphysics whose claims would anticipate scientific discoveries, and an ethics that culminated in the Categorical Imperative. His friends chose the dictum from the Critique of Practical Reason (1788) for his tombstone: “Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the more often and steadily we reflect upon them: the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me” (5:161.33-6; tr. Guyer 1992, 1). Had it not been for his sensitive and intelligent mother, his life might well have taken an entirely different course.

3. Youth: “In the Servitude of Fanatics”

Anna Kant's father died in 1729, when Immanuel was five. This triggered a series of events that would eventually ruin the family. The death left the harness-shop downtown without a boss and Anna's mother without a provider. To take care of his mother-in-law, Johann Kant moved his family and store into Grandma Reuter's house in the Sattlerstrasse, the saddler-street. The saddlers, a guild distinct from harness-makers while producing similar goods, did not welcome the competition. Johann Kant became the target of the saddle-makers' hostility, and the business failed to prosper in the new location. His income steadily declined.

When Immanuel was six or seven, he went to the Hospitalschule, a grammar school at the local clinic, whose teacher was a Pietist candidate in theology. In 1732, Pastor Schulz, who knew the child through Anna, arranged for Immanuel, now eight, to continue his education at the Collegium Fridericianum. Immanuel attended this high school until 1740, when he was sixteen.

Kant would later judge the time of youth as the hardest years of life, ruled by discipline, loneliness, and lack of freedom (Lectures on Pedagogy, w. 1776-87, p. 1803; 9:485.13-17). School, at the Collegium, was held six days a week. Sundays were spent with homework and prayer. Primary subjects of instruction were Latin and religion. Only male pupils were admitted; there was no way to meet girls. High school definitely changed his life for the worse.

And the education was not even good. Only rather elementary math was offered, and natural philosophy (biology, chemistry, geology, physics, and astronomy) was not taught at all. Pupils were groomed for administrative and clerical careers, so science did not matter. The sciences were also suspect theoretically. Pietist indifference to inquiry and fundamentalist denial of facts resulted in contemptuous hostility toward science. As late as 1750s, the clergy rejected the heliocentric system and frowned on Newton's celestial mechanics as make-believe. Pietist theologians such as Franz Budde (1667-1729), Joachim Lange (1670-1744), and Andreas Rüdiger (1673-1731) argued that the Bible teaches everything worth knowing of nature. The later Pietist thinker Christian August Crusius (1715-75) essentially concurred. For Pietism, particularly in its Saxon center, mathematics was useful for bookkeeping but worthless for describing reality. Physics was acceptable as long as its findings did not undermine the Bible. As independent research programs, however, the sciences were deemed wellsprings of heresy.[7]

Pietism in Königsberg — at the edge of its influence in the 1730's — was moderated by the task to proselytize the mainstream. Ideological fervor was reined in by the need for flexibility when making converts. Thus it was not as monolithic as further south, as Kant's later university teacher, Martin Knutzen (1713-51), illustrates. A passionate Pietist, he studied Newton and discussed the ideas of Leibniz and Wolff — possible for Pietists in East Prussia, but impossible for Pietists in Central Prussia and Saxony.

But this moderation was not felt in school. The instructors at the Collegium were stern. Pietist schooling involved a rigorous schedule, strict adherence to religious dogma, and instruction by repetitive drills. A former classmate, David Ruhnken, criticized the “discipline of the fanatics” (letter to Kant 10 Mar. 1771; 10:117.15); another classmate and life-long friend, Theodor Hippel (1741-96), spoke of Kant's “terror and fear” whenever Kant would later recall the “slavery of his youth” (Malter 1992, 95; tr. Kuehn 2001a, 45).

Typical penalties, next to physical punishment, were what would be called “guilt trips” today. In contrast to Catholicism (where sins are forgiven in confession), Protestant salvation depends on grace. The faithful cannot rely on a ritual for exoneration; non-Catholic Christians steadily collect sins. They can only do their best and better their odds for deliverance by remorseful introspection. Pietism honed remorse into a fine art. Essential to salvation is a sense of guilt — more an emotion, actually, than a sense (Schuldgefühl). God's grace will wipe the slate clean, but grace is neither predictable nor verifiable. The only measure, if any, is the intensity of shame — the stronger the cultivated feelings of guilt, the better the chances for salvation.

With the exception of a certain Heydenreich, a friendly Latinist who introduced Kant to Lucretius's De rerum natura (Borowski 1804, 38-9), high school stunted Kant's growth. The lack of scientific training would hamper his later explorations of nature. He tried to make up for it at the university in 1740, but his mathematics instructor, Privatdozent Christian Ammon (1696-1742) was ignorant of the calculus (Kuehn 2001b, 13-16) — an essential tool for understanding the cutting edge of physical research of the day. So Kant's quantitative skills remained substandard; when he calculated, the results usually came out all wrong (Adickes 1924a, 73-83; 1924b, 1:38-9). The lack in mathematical training played into his belated comprehension of Newton's work.

Hence Kant's later contributions to natural science would have to remain of a conceptual sort. They amounted to brilliant apercus — but it was later physicists, not Kant, who articulated them rigorously and substantiated them empirically.

High school may have also affected the development of Kant's ethics. In the absence of data, this effect is conjectural. Still, common sense suggests that his later interest in dignity and the value of autonomy had something to do with the treatment suffered and witnessed in school. It makes sense that a thinker who recalls the “slavery of his youth” with “terror and fear” would insist that treating humanity as an end, instead of a means only, is a Categorical Imperative.

Moreover, these experiences may also explain Kant's exclusion of emotion from ethics; a curious exclusion, given his emphasis of the importance of the good will (Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals 1785; 4:393-5). Anna Kant died in 1737, when Immanuel was thirteen. From then on, the sensitive teenager had to associate morality with feeling only negatively, in the daily exposure to the Collegium and without a mother as an affectionate and sane counterweight. He suffered the pious whim of teachers, eager to instill feelings of guilt for the sake of salvation. His later contempt for emotion is arguably unjustified, but his upbringing suggests an explanation.

4. Student Years: “Marking Out the Path to Be Taken”

When Kant entered the university in 1740, now sixteen, his widowed father filed his taxes as a pauper. A maternal uncle, shoemaker Richter, supported Immanuel's studies. Pastor Schulz had hoped the boy would pursue a church career, but instead he took courses in logic, ethics, metaphysics, natural law, and mathematics. Knutzen, Kant's advisor, introduced him to the Principia (1687) and the Optics (1704), and probably led him to think about natural philosophy.

In 1744, Johann Kant suffered a stroke. Immanuel, twenty years old and now the head of the family, took care of his father and stopped going to classes the following year. He started writing on natural philosophy around this time, trying to determine the properties of force. In 1746, he buried his father, wrote the bulk of his first work, submitted it to the censor, and secured a publisher. In 1747, he completed the Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces, settled the family's affairs, found homes for his younger brother and three sisters, and moved in with another student. The Living Forces is his first known text, first publication, and first book.

But when Kant completed it, he dropped out. In 1748, he left town, without a degree, to work as a tutor in the countryside.

It is tempting to explain Kant's academic failure with financial reasons — the parents were dead and the children had no savings. But he had a benefactor, uncle Richter, who paid his fees when Kant was enrolled and financed his publication after Kant had left (Borowski 1804, 46; Lasswitz 1902, 521). Richter would keep supporting him and paid the printer for his second book (1755), too. Poverty was thus not the reason. Nor was it the lack of a thesis. The Living Forces is a technical tract, 256 pages in the 1749-edition, more than enough for a Magister-degree.

Yet Kant wrote the book in German, not in the Latin required for academic theses, although high school had provided him with excellent philological skills. Apparently he had not intended to submit the Living Forces as his Master's thesis. Why?

The contents supply the key. He declares that he shall criticize Leibniz and Wolff (ii, 1:7). He rejects the doctrine of pre-established harmony according to which substances do not interact, rejecting Leibniz's claim (Monadology 1714, sec. 7) that substances have no “windows”. For Kant, they do. Following Knutzen (who had earned his doctorate with a similar critique in 1735) he says that substances change each other's states by their mutual actions (# 4, 1:19). He also rejects Wolff's notion of a “moving force”. Kant argues (# 3, 1:18) that force and motion have little to do with one another. Force is not so much about motion and more about being. So a “moving force” is a misnomer. One better call the dynamic source an “active force” or a vis activa.

That Kant criticized Leibniz and Wolff should have improved his chances at graduation. Knutzen questioned their views, too. And bashing Leibniz and Wolff was the righteous thing to do. The theologian Lange in Halle had orchestrated Wolff's expulsion from Prussia (1723) and triggered a furious row over Wolff's Leibnizian leanings (1723-40). Other Pietists followed suit and rejected Wolff because his support of Leibnizian harmony, combined with his view of the world as a network of uniform substances, smelled of heresy. Wolff was a dangerous radical. But Kant's reasons for criticizing Wolff were different — Wolff was not radical enough.

Kant lays out his view in the first ten sections. Everything begins with force. It is even prior to extension, as Leibniz had already said (# 1; 1:17). Here Leibniz is right, Kant thinks, and praises him for having shed light on the Aristotelian concept of the entelechy. Nature's units are active forces (# 1-3; 1:17-18). Their action is constructive; they make and sustain the fabric of nature. The world is a tapestry of energy concentrations. Forces rule everything, not only bodily motions (# 2; 1:18.6-8), but all activities (# 3; 1:18.27-36). This includes mind-body interaction — materially produced ideas and mentally intended actions (# 6; 1:20.35-21.1; 21.14-16).

Dynamic action is absolutely fundamental. Force has effects by acting externally (ausser sich wirken; # 4; 1:19.5), and, in the full sense of the word, external action locates force (# 6; 1:20.36-1:21.1). A force acts by radiating its action; it spreads its effects out (ihre Wirkungen von sich ausbreiten; # 10; 1:24.23), and this spread determines its source as being inside it, locating force in virtue of its action. With action comes location (Ort), with location space (Raum), and with space the universe (Welt) — and none of this would be without force. Localized forces weave the world (# 8) such that their interaction forms networks (# 7), braiding relation, order, and space (# 9, 1:23.5-9). Force is the primum, knitting space and everything within.

As one source acts on what is outside of it, multiple sources act on one another. They do so when their fields meet. Just throw two pebbles into a pond and watch the interfering ripples: first, point sources encounter each other's activities at the boundary of their expanding radiations; next, these pulses, when striking each other, are modified when struck. External modifications of a radiation affect its internal makeup. Since force is an active pulse, and since activity, for Kant, describes force better than anything else, a collision with another field has constitutive effects on the original activity. (Consider weather — when air masses collide, they affect each other's dew point, temperature, or pressure.) Hence Kant concludes that the action of force-points amounts to mutual changes of their internal states (# 4; 1:19.4-6).

Dynamic expansion makes space, and reciprocal action creates structure. Force-points stretch, grip, and take hold, and the mutually modifying engagements constitute their connections (# 7; 1:21.30-33). This has consequences. That force, in virtue of its action, is put “somewhere” suggests a bond of force and space. This interactive bond is constitutive of reality.

These bold ideas doomed the text. A Christian advisor, even an open-minded one, could never approve it. The dynamic ontology in chapter 1 contradicts the Genesis. The Bible says God is the creator of everything. But Kant suggests that force creates everything — force, not God, is the creator of nature. Worse, force can be modeled mathematically, as he argues in chapter 2, and it can be jointly determined by two quantities, as he argues in chapter 3. “God” is merely a placeholder for the cause of force itself.

Now Kant speaks of God as possible maker of multiple universes (# 8; 1:22), as engineer of dimensions (# 11; 1:25), and as sealing off this world from improbable others (ibid.). But in the same breath (# 7-10), he makes force responsible for these tasks. And he already showed his hand in his praise for the entelechy. Entelechies are programs of the self-organization and sustenance of things — in Aristotle's words, a dynamis put en ergon or put in action; i.e. energeia.

Kant's waffling over God and force permits only two readings. Neither of them would be palatable to any Christian worth his salt: either God is creative force, or God created creative force. By Kant's account, the former would mean that God is describable as a physical quantity. The latter would imply that force, not God, created the universe. Whoever suggests either is not a believer and does not deserve to graduate under a Pietist advisor, not even a liberal one.

So Kant was passed over. Knutzen never recommended him, and in Knutzen's letters to Leonard Euler (1707-83), he is not on the list of excellent students (Waschkies 1987, 20). The professor had more regular favorites, such as Johann Weitenkampf (b. 1726) and Friedrich Buck (1722-86), who succeeded to Knutzen's chair (Pozzo 1993, 283-322; Kuehn 2001b, 23).

Kant took resort to irony (# 4; 1:21.3-8) and avenged himself by not mentioning his teacher — ever. Many years later (1770), after Knutzen's death, when Kant finally enjoyed some clout, he would secure his long-desired professorship by striking a deal with the administration to snatch Knutzen's chair from Buck, pushing the pet student to another post without even asking.

A word by Seneca sets the tune for Kant's debut — “Nothing is more important than to go where one ought to go, instead of following the herd, like cattle, and go where they went.”[8] Kant expresses the hope that “the freedom I take of contradicting great men won't be construed as a crime” (1:7.6-9). He needed hope because he had made up his mind. He knew what he was doing, and he was defiant. “My basis is as follows,” he writes (1:10.25-7), “I have already marked out the path that I shall take. I shall set out on my course, and nothing shall stop me from proceeding along it.”

5. Dynamic Debut: “Radiation in the Inverse Square”

Kant wanted to understand the powers of nature and intended to solve the puzzle of force. The Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces was a contribution to the so-called vis-viva-controversy; its goal was to settle the issue once and for all. The issue was as simple as profound: what is force, and how can it be measured?

The controversy had begun in the previous century. Descartes argued that force is reducible to the mathematical quantity of motion. Descartes contended that this quantity is conserved in the universe. Nature is matter in motion, and motion is the explanatory principle. “Force” is the product of mass and velocity (mv), a quantity called “quantity of motion” or “dead pressure” then and momentum now.[9] Beyond this, “force” does not mean anything. Force is not a dynamic essence, only a quantity of motion. Descartes reduced physics to a kinematics.

Leibniz rejected all this. When examining rising and falling bodies, he recognized that their behavior reveals a different quantity, derived from Galileo's law of fall, which is the product of mass and velocity squared (mv²). Leibniz thought this implied Descartes's quantity to be false and that only mv², not mv, is conserved. Leibniz called this new quantity “living force” (vis viva); we call it kinetic energy now. Force is real, he argued, and it is more than a quantity — it is the basic quality of nature. Leibniz expanded physics to a dynamics.

Leibniz was correct about rising and falling bodies, but the Cartesians (Descartes had died in 1650) pointed to other experiments in support of the mv-formula. The issue could not be decided because both sides had been right; there is both momentum and kinetic energy. So the arguments went on for decades. After Leibniz's death (1716), the controversy continued through his followers, who quarreled with the current crop of French Cartesians. Newtonians were split over vis viva; Newton and his British fans rejected it, while continental Newtonians accepted it. After Newton's death (1727), in the 1740's, the issue was settled — in Newton's favor. D'Alembert proved that there is a place for both quantities in physics (1743). Before that, Euler (1737) had already found out that Descartes's momentum is Newton's force acting over time, and Leibniz's kinetic energy is Newton's force acting through space. But it took a while before this information spread and became generally accepted. The debate died down around the time Kant published the Living Forces (1749).

Kant's debut was one of the many attempts at settling the dispute, but for all practical purposes, it was a failure. The Living Forces appeared too late to make any difference, and Kant was unaware of d'Alembert's and Euler's research. But what doomed the book in the public eye was that Kant seemed to have bet on the wrong team of horses. He argued for a synthesis of Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, and did so at the expense of Newtonian mechanics. At the time he grasped Newton's ideas only partially. He did not yet understand that motion, like rest, is a state (something Galileo had discovered) and that force is needed only for changing, not for keeping a state (which is Newton's first law of motion). He not only implicitly rejected Newton through such mistakes, but also explicitly questions his authority (preface, 1:7). Later in the book, he criticizes the first law of motion (# 50-51, # 97-8), suggests an alternative to Newtonian inertia (#124-5, # 132-3), and dismisses as a “desperate excuse” Newton's view that loss of motion reveals nature's entropic tendency (# 50; 1:59). He tried to determine force without even mentioning the second law of motion that defines it as the product of mass and acceleration. Newtonian mechanics was irrelevant. While there are hundreds of references to Descartes and Leibniz in the book, the references to Newton can be counted on the fingers of one hand.

In fact, however, Kant was not as mistaken as it seemed at the time. For one thing, he arrived essentially at the same conclusion as d'Alembert and Euler: both mv and mv² are valid quantities. More importantly, he proposed a deep connection: while showing in chapter 2 that Descartes's quantity is empirically well supported, he argued in chapter 3 that Leibniz's quantity must be factored in to arrive at a full qualitative understanding of force. “Active force” is jointly measurable as “dead pressure” and “living force” — the full account of force requires a synthesis of Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, notwithstanding their conflicts.

That is, Kant not only regarded momentum and energy as relevant quantities, as d'Alembert had done, but he grasped that their union points to the universal nature of force. This is sharper than Euler's insight. Euler had discovered that these quantities are derivable from Newtonian force and that there is accordingly a quantitative connection among them. But Kant invested this connection with qualitative meaning, arguing that the structure of nature must be understood in dynamic terms, and that Newton really misses the point. The title of the book, “Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces” is no idle boast, for Kant's “true estimation” is the insight that “living force” and “dead pressure” are two sides of the same coin. Throughout the book, he wrestles with the harmony of opposites, Cartesian kinematics and Leibnizian dynamics, trying to marry momentum and energy — while having the audacity to criticize Newton. This is the thrust of the work. Taken as a prediction, it is superb. With his first publication, Kant intuited not only that matter is ultimately energetic, but also that its dynamic measure is momentum-energy.[10]

This apercu was no lucky guess. Kant understood what force involves. He argues that force is the essence of action (# 4). This action is a pulse that “broadens out” (# 9-10). Out-broadening of force (ausbreiten; 1:24.23) is an out-stretching of space (Ausdehnung; 1:24.6). Force makes the continuum, being governed, in turn, by the created structure (# 10). Dynamic interaction turns force into a field and the void into a plenum. Kant anticipated that momentum-energy is the substantial correlate of spacetime. Bypassing Newton, he caught up with Einstein.[11]

Connected with this apercu is the proposed bond of force and space — “force” understood as momentum-energy, Kant's active essence of substance, and “space” defined as Kant's dimensional continuum. For Kant, force grips the void, holding it as a dimensional presence that localizes the original pulse. Force extends space, ordering it, and space places force, governing it. Space dynamically expands; force structurally acts. Each needs the other. Without force, space would lack structure (Abmessungen or Dimensionen, # 9-10) and could not place a world (# 7-9, 11). Without space, force could not be a field (# 10). Force is spaced and space is forced. This is their bond (1:23-4). Indeed: mass stretches spacetime, and spacetime grips mass.

In fact, Kant caught up with modern physics in several regards. Another of his apercus is so basic that it is easy to miss. He defended force as the interactive matrix of nature and insisted on the importance of dynamics. The dynamic ontology of the Living Forces was ridiculed in its day, for Newton's mechanics had digested Kepler's celestial dynamics and marginalized Leibniz's physical dynamics. Yet Kant's stance would mark out the future course of science. We do not regard nature as a collection of particles and forces in empty space anymore, but instead as a system of energy-pulses interacting in fields. Dynamics has turned out to be fundamental.

When examining the force-space bond in detail (# 10), Kant discovered the law of free point source radiation (1:24.19-23), historically the first generalization of the individual inverse-square laws in natural philosophy:

The pressure of any point-source radiation in a free field drops at a rate that is inversely proportional to the square of the propagated distance.[12]

Kant's generalization unites Kepler's law of photo measurement (1604), Newton's law of universal gravitation (1697), and Coulomb's later law of electrostatic force (1785) as instantiations of the spread of energy.[13] Kant's law governs multiple forms of free radiation, not just light, gravity, and electrostatic force, but also radioactivity, radio waves, and sound. Its most famous application, in its first, Keplerian, instantiation, was Hubble's measure of the luminosity of distant variable stars (1924) — which led to the discoveries of cosmic expansion and the Big Bang.

In the concluding reflection of the pivotal tenth section of the Living Forces, Kant recognized the contingency of the pressure-propagation ratio (1:24.26-8), inferred that other ratios would generate continua with other dimensions (1:24.28-30), and surmised that a science in command of the dimensional range would be the highest geometry achievable (1:24.31-3). In light of quantum geometry and its modern guises — superstring and M-theories — this last remark might well have been Kant's most far-sighted prediction. Despite suffering from insufficient scientific training, the rejection by his advisor, the academic failure, and the catastrophe in his family, Kant's philosophical debut in 1749 reveals the mark of genius.

6. Newtonian Stargazing: “The Splendor of a Single Universal Rule”

For the next seven years, Kant's life would be quiet. He was now teaching children in the Baltic countryside. As a Hofmeister (private teacher), he educated the sons of Pastor Andersch, from 1748 to 1751, in the French settlement Judtschen, half a day's walk from Königsberg. Next he taught the sons of Knight von Hülsen at his Arnsberg estate until about 1753, a two-day day ride from Königsberg. Finally he worked as a tutor for Count Keyserlingk until 1754.

When Kant left town, the main influence on his thought had been Georg Bernhard Bilfinger (1693-1750), Wolff's former assistant at Halle. Bilfinger's heuristic method had inspired the project of Living Forces. This rule for finding truth is to identify an intermediate position when experts advance contrary views, provided ulterior motives are absent (1:32.7-13). Bilfinger's rule had guided Kant to reconcile Leibniz and Descartes over force.

Bilfinger was known for a work on Confucianism (1724), a quasi-Taoist commentary on Wolff's German Metaphysics (1725), and a tract on force (1728). Wolff's speech on the Chinese (1721) — a watershed event in the Enlightenment — had motivated him, then at Tübingen, to study these provocative pagans (in 1726 Wolff would cite Bilfinger when preparing his speech for print). In Taoist ontology, the dynamic principle (Tao) weaves the world by “stretching out” the void (dao zhong) and that produces things and life by individuating the resulting field into lingering wholes. Nature and the good are opposites but harmonize in their parallel thrust toward sustainable complexity. Moral practice is their alignment. Bilfinger stressed the significance of this thrust, in the guise of Aristotle's possibilitas or dynamis, in his Wolffian commentary. The theologians at Tübingen were upset, and Bilfinger lost his job. He joined Daniel Bernoulli (1700-82) at the Russian Academy to study dynamics — and the resulting tract on force inspired Kant in not-too-distant Königsberg two decades later.[14]

Kant was ignorant of the Chinese but absorbed the Taoist motif. The middle way is not a lukewarm compromise but a dialectical harmony of opposites in a golden mean. Bilfinger's transmission of the Tao involved a Western spin: while Taoism stresses the paradoxical essence of nature, the Jesuit translators of Tao as “light of nature” (lumen naturalis) and “rational nature” (natura rationalis) had read it to mean that nature is consistent and rational — which is, of course, a premise of scientific research. Kant says that he put Bilfinger's rule to good use (# 20; 1:32), and he certainly did — it led him to reconcile momentum and energy, force and space, field and void, mind and matter, and God and nature. It was Kant's universal rule, guiding him at the time. It is an irony that one of the West's greatest thinkers was first inspired by the Tao of the East.

But in the countryside, Kant realized that his debut, no matter its inspiration, had been a failure. His synthesis of Leibniz and Descartes was ignored. Having criticized Newton, he now had second thoughts. When he reemerged with the Spin-Cycle essay (1754), his misgivings had turned into admiration. As its title states, it is an “investigation of the question whether the earth in its axial rotation, whereby it causes the change of day and night, has experienced any change since the earliest times of its origin, and how one could answer this question, announced for the current year's prize, by the Royal Academy of Sciences in Berlin.” (1:183.1-12)

Kant describes gravitational attraction there as “nature's universal engine” (das allgemeine Triebwerk der Natur), which allowed Newton to reveal the secrets of nature in a manner that (as Kant now admits) is “as clear as it is indubitable” (1:186.35-7). In the essay, he also announces his next book (1755) with the working title, “Cosmogony, or attempt to deduce the origin of the cosmos, the constitution of celestial bodies, and the causes of their motions, from the general laws of motion of matter according to Newton's theory” (1:191.4-8).

Kant's Newtonian conversion would be completed while working on the Spin-Cycle essay. The early drafts still involve discussions of Huygens's dynamics (23:5-7). But published argument is sharpened to a Newtonian point — no other natural philosopher is even mentioned. Newton had become Kant's authority and his sole scientific point of reference.

Little is known of Kant's actual conversion. Only start and finish — Living Forces and Spin-Cycle — are present. But it does not take much imagination to fill in the blanks. In 1749, Kant promoted his book and waited for a reaction. When keeping track of the relevant journals, it could not have escaped him that Newton was the winner, nor that Leibnizian dynamics was on the wane and that support for Cartesian kinematics had all but collapsed. Force was Newtonian force. Newtonian physics had become the new paradigm of natural philosophy.

By his own account, Kant was not enthusiastic about his employment, but he did not hate it either. Some of his charges affectionately stayed in touch and later sought him out in the city. He was on good terms with Andersch and Hülsen, and the work for the Keyserlingks was the start of lifelong friendships. So his jobs were not too bad. Afterwards, he would churn out publications at breath-taking speed — two tracts, one book, a Master's thesis, and a dissertation; each of them on a different topic, and all of them in little more than one year (from June 1754 to September 1755). The timing suggests that he had written some of it already in the countryside.

This means he had leisure. He taught, but also pursued his own interests. Remarkable about his Newtonian conversion is not the change of heart (everybody loves a winner), but the change in competence. His first publication, despite its brilliance, reveals his confusions over basic mechanics. His next group of works displays a firm grasp of celestial mechanics. In between he must have studied the Principia, not an easy read. Digesting its contents, particularly in the given form (in fluxion instead of normal calculus) could have taken months, if not years.

Rural life is life in daylight. Kant had to adapt to his employers and attended to his charges during the day. Because his leisure would have been after dinner (sundown) or before breakfast (sunrise), he probably read the Principia at night. Nights before the industrial revolution were different than they are now. Nights were dark, and when there was neither clouds nor a full moon, stars would blaze with intensity unfamiliar to us today. Starry skies must have been awe-inspiring. We can conjecture that Kant, studying the Principia, would occasionally step outside and look up. He was reading about celestial mechanics — and then he would see it. Stargazing put the work in context. Kant's subsequent publications reveal his exuberance about the stars and the laws they display; just as they reveal his grasp of the planetary dance and his recognition of Newton's achievement. There was definitely no better place than the countryside to learn this.

Kant's earlier work had sensitized him to the dynamics of nature, and this would have made it all the easier to marvel over celestial mechanics while stargazing. Thinkers with a dynamic bent, from Pythagoras to Kepler, listened to the music of the spheres. As Kepler's Harmonice Mundi (1619) shows, the music of the spheres is not a poetic delusion but a heuristic device.[15] It turns one's attention on cosmic patterns, the harmonies and beats that point to laws. As the Spin-Cycle essay illustrates, Kant followed in the footsteps of such thinkers. Listening to the music of the spheres would generate the astonishing apercus of the 1750s.

On the face of it, it seems inexplicable how Kant could apply Newton's theory of the tides to the fate of Earth's axial rotation. But in the Spin-Cycle essay (1754), Kant arrived at the right result for the right reasons. Newton showed that the primarily lunar gravity acts on ocean tides. This action, Kant argues, constitutes a retarding moment on the Earth's surface (1:187); this retardation, he infers, slows down the Earth's rotation (1:188); and the lunar brake only lets go, he concludes, when days are as long as lunar months (1:190). He found the solution despite multiple handicaps: minimal data, unimpressive formal skills, and no instruments.

But if the planet's rotational fate is modeled as music, the solution will be loud and clear. The gravitational pulls beat out different rhythms. Daily terrestrial rotation and monthly lunar revolution are not in sync. The resonance of their two spheres rattles with a noise — drumming a syncopated beat, the lows and highs of oceanic tides. This tidal noise distracts from the rotating rhythm. The tidal taps, every six hours, weaken the Earth's beat. Syncopates do not sound nice; they are mechanical wobbles, and they have got to go. And they do. Undermining the cosmic beat, the dynamic opposites slow the Earth's spin down until they dissolve in harmony. When in the far future the Moon always shines over the same spot, Earth will have found its rhythm, sans tidal cacophony, and be in sonic step with its celestial neighborhood. Thus Kant's astrophysical essay was possible.

In retrospect, Newton had clarified to Kant the force-space bond of the Living Forces. In its new guise, the bond is so useful that its implications go beyond the Earth-Moon system. Its pulse, the pulls and pushes, beats out the cosmos. The lesson of the Living Forces is that matter is energy, and that forces act and interact with space. Aristotle's entelechy reveals that an initial dynamic push produces material order when put into action. This action involves Bilfinger's dialectical harmony of opposites, but it is Newton who reveals its actual and precise mechanics.

Cosmic action turns on gravitation, the reciprocal attraction of masses. When drawn together, masses collide, crash, and are laterally deflected. The angular momentum of deflections generates a counterforce to centripetal gravitation — centrifugal repulsion. Applying Newton to the bond, in his second book Universal Natural History and Theory of the Sky (1755), Kant sees that the pumps of the entelechy, its push and pull, are attraction and repulsion. Matter is then all you need, he says, and you can start building a world (1:229.10-11).

This is far more radical — and more consistent — than Newton's approach. Gravity will not do the trick of world building. But the cosmic harmony of dynamic opposites, attraction and repulsion, can do the conceptual work, provided one assumes a random distribution of particles. This proviso marks a step beyond the Living Forces. There, in the first book, Kant had explained space by the outward action of force, but had glossed over the individuation of multiple dynamic presences, necessary for cosmic evolution. Here, in the second book, he assumes an initial material chaos and explains its growth into ordered complexity by the interaction of forces.

Kant's two cosmological starting points — dynamic stretch into the void in the 1740s, and homogenous material chaos in the 1750's — are not contradictory. The reflections in his first book begin with the very beginning, with existence prior to extension. The reflections in his second book proceed from the next stage, existence in extension. Kant's initial cosmogony starts with force stretching out into a void, creating a field. His next theory begins with the extended field having curdled into a scattering of particles. He does not replace a dynamic by an atomistic theory, or switch from active monads to inert matter. Matter always remains the guise and result of energetic interactions. As he would stress in his professorial thesis, the Physical Monadology (1756), particles are force concentrations, whose solidity is due to dynamic interplay.

In light of present knowledge, his reflections were largely correct, and the gap in his cosmic history — the interval from dynamic extension to material particles — remains subject to debate today. Cosmologists are not unanimous on what happened in this period. Nonetheless, they have substantiated that force came first and that material chaos followed next. The universe did start dynamically as a singularity, whose first outward-bound and energetic action — the Big Bang — wove a dimensional structure in its wake. The continuum (the disentangling of space and time) emerged 10-51 years and the chaos (the formation of atomic nuclei) 10-5 years after the Big Bang — followed by the creation of atoms, of stars, the Sun, and the Earth. Within the expanding bubble of the Bang is the universe today.

As soon as material chaos is assumed, everything happens on its own. Kant contends in the Universal Natural History that nature's flourishing toward well-ordered complexity is explicable through an “essential striving” (1:226.8-12). No Newtonian “hand of God” needs to stave off perceived loss of motion (1:222-225); he had already stated earlier that appealing to lost motion is a “desperate excuse” (Living Forces # 50; 1:59). As he explains now — taking nothing back from the stance that cost him his graduation — God does not function in nature's development because creation is self-organization. Fully convinced of this, he warns fundamentalists against opposing science; if they did, they would be defeated (1:222.32-35; 225.2-5).

The push and pull of the bond explains cosmic self-organization, and in the Universal Natural History Kant shows how the chaos evolved to the starry skies visible now. It should be possible to do the same for organisms, but science (then) fails to explain the formation of life. How life unfolds we do not know (1:230.14-20); we only know that it does. Kant believes (science agrees) that star birth is easier to determine than the creation of life (1:230.20-26).

With his famous nebular hypothesis, Kant found out how planets, stars, and galaxies form. Their birth is a process of titanic power. Attractive forces contract particles into clouds, but repulsive forces deflect them up close. Continued accretion increases deflection, imparting angular momentum on the ever quicker rotating cloud. Rotation generates centrifugal forces, pulling the cloud's equators outwards, crushing the poles, until the out-bulging yet in-falling sphere, revolving ever faster around its center, flattens into a Frisbee. The bond, in Newton's handy model of universal gravitation, continues pumping up momentum and spin, until the center of the cosmic Frisbee is so energized that it lights up like a candle. Increased energy translates into increased structure, organizing the ecliptic plane into lumpy coalescence. When the Frisbee plane curdles into spinning bands, the lumps grow massive, while caroming along their orbits. The moving masses vacuum their paths and grow into planets strung along an ecliptic plane, orbiting a sun in now empty space — or, on a higher order of magnitude, into suns majestically revolving around a brightly lit galactic center. Whether suns in spiral galaxies, or planets in solar systems, the orbiting satellites sweep out equal areas in equal times, with their periods in sync with their distances from the gravitational centers.[16]

Kant did “out-Newton” Newton to the cutting edge of current knowledge. Nature, in the Universal Natural History, streams outward in a wavefront of organization (1:314.1-2), generating worlds (1:314.8), biospheres and sentience (1:317.5-13, 352-3), and finally reason, human and otherwise (1:351-66). Organization is fragile, and spontaneity, pushed far enough, invites chaos. Mature cosmic regions decay, chaos sets in, and entropy follows in the wake of complexity. But entropy provides the very conditions that allow the cosmic pulse to bounce material points back to order. Thus the expanding chaos curdles at its center into order, followed by chaos, by order, by chaos. Like a rising and burning phoenix, nature cycles between life and death (1:312.13).

For creatures, the cosmic phoenix is a problem. Humans are just feathers on its wings. Humans grow only to burn to ashes; they are not exempt from the cosmic law (1:318.17-18). As the pulsing cosmic vector governs everything, beats emerge on all orders of magnitude, from the Bangs of the phoenix to the flares of life to the jiggles of the elements. The force-space bond unfolds in the interactive harmony of dynamic opposites, an interaction governed by Newton's universal gravitation, pumping out galaxies, suns, planets, life, and minds. Thus, as Kant writes, a “single universal rule” guides natural evolution in an absolutely glorious way (1:306.18-23)

7. Systematic Cosmology: “All Things in the Universe Interactively Connect”

When Kant returned to Königsberg in early autumn 1754, his prospects had improved. King Friedrich II (Frederick the Great, reign 1740-86), like Kant a victim of a fundamentalist education, had instituted liberal policies in Prussia that were making themselves felt in the province. Kant's former advisor Knutzen had died (1751), and a freer atmosphere now pervaded the university. He had saved some money and was ready to put himself back into school. Now he would complete his studies and start his academic career.

He dedicated the Universal Natural History to Frederick the Great and published it in spring 1755. This time he played it safe and published anonymously. The problem, risking religious opposition, was not that he supported Newton (everyone did by now), but that he sharpened celestial mechanics to a secular and dynamic cosmology, while replacing Newton's Christian view of natural design with a non-anthropocentric and naturalistic teleology.

Newton had thought that cosmic organization required the hand of God, but Kant eliminated any need for divine interference. Newton had supposed that God regularly infuses nature with new motion to keep the world machine from running down; he had accepted the notion of final causes as ways in which God makes himself known; and he had appealed to God's miraculous adjustments whenever physical explanations failed him, as in the case of the ecliptic plane.[17] Newton could not explain the coplanar orbits of planets and surmised, “such a wonderful uniformity in the planetary system must be allowed the effect of choice” (1979, 402).

Kant discovered in the Universal Natural History that the planetary arrangement on the ecliptic plane results from forces acting on particles that accrete in a spinning cloud. Hence there was no need to follow Newton and appeal to God. Nor was there any compelling metaphysical reason to do so. Force is goal-directed and its energy unfolds the cosmos. The term Kant employs for this unfolding, Auswicklung der Natur (1:226.8), is the “out-wrapping” of nature, from primal force to complex structure. “Out-wrapping” is both process and purpose. Purpose is not imposed by a supernatural beyond but instead woven into the natural fabric. Teleological ends and means are natural; the interplay of forces is the vehicle of final causes, and the telos of nature is its own perfection (1:223, 263, 332). Even in its simplest state, matter has the urge to develop itself into a more perfect shape (1:228, 262-3, 314). The rise of order and abundance — or biological diversity, in our terms — marks nature's quest toward perfection, and this process, fueled by the incessant pulse of attraction and repulsion, generates harmony and beauty.

In this cosmic model, in which Kant rejects extrinsic teleology for an immanent version, everything is connected. Taking his cue from Pope's “chain of being”, Kant likens the universe to a Kette der Natur, the “chain of nature” (1: 308, 365).[18] Humans are links in the chain. There is nothing special about them. Dismissing the anthropocentric teleology of Wolff, Derham, and the physico-theologians, Kant finds the claim that the universe was created for human purposes exaggerated — and provincial.[19] An intelligent louse, he says, might as well imagine that the scalp it lives on and the forest of hair that surrounds it were created just for the sake of its happiness; from a louse's point of view, things surely look that way (1:353-4). In the chain of nature, all beings are equal. Nature does not play favorites, none of the organic links, whether it be an insect or a rational being, is more important than another (1:354). As the goal of nature is biodiversity, the purpose of planets is to sustain biospheres — the telos of planets is life (1:353).

What kind of life? Ultimately, Kant argues, planets aim to sustain intelligent life. Inspired by Fontenelle's vision of inhabited worlds, he conjectures that there may well be extraterrestrial life.[20] Really nothing guarantees that humans are the crowns of creation. People probably occupy a “middle rung” on the ladder of creatures (1:359.29) — and are possibly infinitely distant from the top tier of intelligent beings (1:353.35-6). A sober look at ourselves shows that we are on a risky course (gefährliche Mittelstrasse, 1:366.7) halfway between wisdom and irrationality. We are cosmically mediocre.

A theme of Kant's thought, dominant in the pre-critical period and returning in old age, is that humans are part of nature. He was too much of a pantheist to subscribe to a mind-body dualism of distinct substances, the one thinking, the other extended. Already in the Living Forces he had solved Descartes's puzzle of mind-body interaction by arguing that minds are spatially located within their bodies, and that both are energetic structures that influence each other (1:20-21). In the later Prize Essay (1764), he would judge the Christian notion of immaterial souls as indemonstrable (2:293). Although minds are not necessarily matter in a literal sense, he would argue there that they are probably some kind of energy-bundles commensurate with the material framework of nature. Here in the Universal Natural History, he describes humans as material beings; the makeup of rationality is linked to the constitution of matter (1:335).

Matter drags us down. All things interactively connect, and as minds shape matter, matter shapes minds. Coarse matter makes mental fibers inflexible (1:356). The IQ-constraining coarseness is proportional to density. In cosmic terms, this means that rational force depends on spatial location. In the stellar nebula (the embryonic solar system), matter, consisting of elements with varying density, was randomly distributed. But as soon as a gravity well pulls the cloud in and sets it spinning, denser particles will not be as easily pushed around than lighter ones; when unequal bits collide, lighter ones bounce off while denser ones remain on track. Denser elements, deflected later, cruise on lower orbits; lighter elements, deflected sooner, orbit higher up. Orbital height is inversely proportional to material density (1:270); hence orbital bands form planets the denser the closer they are to the Sun (1:277; Kant's “static law”). Kant speculates that really superior intelligence will only emerge in the rarefied matter of outer planets (1:359). The denser a planet is (as Earth, close to the Sun) the denser, unfortunately, are its inhabitants.

The anonymous publication of the Universal Natural History was prudent but not without risk. The dedication indicates Königsberg as place of composition; the publisher Petersen was a local company, and eventually the identity of the author would have come out.[21] Petersen went broke just when copies of the Universal Natural History were off the press and in a warehouse. The warehouse was sealed — and then mysteriously burned down, which allowed Petersen to collect insurance and pay off creditors. Bankruptcy and fire prevented the book's distribution (Rahts 1902, 545-6; Krafft 1971, 193). But this was lucky. As the fates of Spinoza, Tschirnhaus, or Toland illustrate, you cannot be a dynamic freethinker and a professor at the same time. Considering Kant's goals, the misfortune over the book was a blessing in disguise.

Undaunted, he set out to write his Master's thesis. According to the ideas articulated so far, Kant envisioned a radiating essence that organizes itself in cosmic expansion. The core stretches out as interactive complexity, emerging in biospheres populated by organisms, while eventually pulling back into itself, like a phoenix of nature, burning up only to rise from the ashes. The cyclic “out-wrapping of nature” generates structures, some of the animated, a few of them intelligent. By their harmonic development, the natural structures will eventually allocate force without lateral boundaries, setting the cosmic vector free. When this is a universal condition, the energy flow is uniform in reiterative patterns across magnitudes. It is then entropic. Overcoming the last boundary, the vertical order of magnitudes, force rushes into itself, concentrating its pulse once more to a singularity before the next cosmic Bang.

If one wanted to visualize this fluidly rising energy, then Kant's precursor Kepler would propose the use of light.[22] It is as hot as it gets when focused to a point, and it radiantly pulses upward toward complexity. Its shine flares out material dust, floods of particles, like streamers of smoke. Since it impels the dust as their vector, the blaze illuminates the particles. A suggestive image by Albrecht Altdorfer (1480-1538) is the sun at the fiery bottom of a tunnel of clouds, fleeing the slaughter of the East, on the canvas Alexanderschlacht (“Alexander's Battle,” 1529).[23]

The pulse of the bond, flaring out structure, is best imagined as fire. Fire is a token of nature's essence. It is no surprise that the author of Living Forces and Universal Natural History would want to investigate it, for doing so might lead to more insights about the cosmic matrix. He chose Johann Gottfried Teske (1704-72), a professor of physics interested in electricity and lightning, as his advisor and graduated with A Succinct Outline of Some Meditations on Fire.

Hence Kant, who would later soar to the heights of the Critiques and the Categorical Imperative, earned his philosophy degree with a Master's thesis on the structure of fire (1755).

On Fire is an elaboration of the energetic model of matter. Kant argues there that all bodies, solid, liquid, and gaseous types, consist of dynamic particles or molecules (moleculae, 1:372.24 and passim). (Kant's particle aggregates, visible in the engravings accompanying his thesis, are not as dated as they seem, not even for gas; today, the standard model treats gas as a collection of particles.) He contends that the particles cohere in an elastic medium. This medium, the ether, permeates the molecular interstices of bodies (prop. 3, 1: 372). He calls this ether “fire-matter” and identifies it as the carrier of warmth and light. Heat results from wave-like vibrations of this materia ignis among the molecules (prop. 8, 1:377). As it is known today, heat is a symptom of molecular vibration, which in turn depends on the energy-state of a body.

After his Master's, Kant wrote his dissertation, the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). At first glance, this work has little to do with his previous research on force, cosmos, and fire. It is about the principles of ontology, specifically the conceptual tools for metaphysical investigations. In fact, however, it was only a matter of time until he would write such a work. Now he would explore the cognitive access to dynamic interactivity and the causal structure of human integration into nature. With his doctoral dissertation, Kant hoped to get to the bottom of the things that interested him most.

Humans are parts of nature, but their actions are free, while natural processes are predictable. How do actions and processes relate? If nature is the out-wrapping of force, and intelligent beings are products of the cosmos, how is their free action possible in a lawful natural matrix? In the New Elucidation, Kant argues for a compatibilist view — both human freedom and natural necessity are real, and neither is reducible to the other. Their conflict finds a dynamic resolution. Everything in nature happens for a prior reason (1:396.8-9), and this rule applies to both necessary events and free actions. Both process-types share the fact of causal connectivity but they connect to causes in different ways (1:400.30-7). Causation types concern the degree of power, and this is what matters. The opposites of free acts and forced events harmonize over force. A free will is not something being pushed around, but instead a “determining power” (determinandi potestas; 1:404.8). By its power, a will can withstand impulses (motivi) without being always forced by them (1:404.10-14, 34-9). Thus spontaneity is naturally possible.

Later, in the Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Kant would distinguish between “things” and “persons” (4:428), describing the former as natural means and the latter as rational ends. Persons are free; what distinguishes them is their will, a faculty of determining oneself to action (4:427). Self-determination is the basis of freedom; necessitation is the mark of nature. The New Elucidation supplies the unified ground for this dichotomy. Autonomy and heteronomy are a matter of dynamic degree. Persons and things alike are energetic bundles, but the superior rational force of persons can resist others and is capable of autonomy.

As the title of the New Elucidation of the Principles of Metaphysical Cognition indicates, it is a new attempt to clarify the cognitive principles needed for the understanding the structure of reality. The force-space bond in Kant's first book, as well as the attractive-repulsive interplay in his second, reveal that dynamic interactivity is the generative matrix of nature. Interaction is not “one” thing but involves at least two poles that engage with one another. Because the dynamic “between” — their link — is fundamental, the cognitive tool for capturing the ultimate reality cannot be “one” principle. It cannot even be a basic principle of identity (a = a). Interaction is a relation of distinct items that grip one another — if they were not distinct, the event would be an action, not interaction. But it is dynamic interactivity that is the thing in itself.

Hence the New Elucidation does not begin with the principle of identity, like other ontological templates. Kant states that “there is no unique, absolutely first, universal principle of all truths” (prop. 1, 1:388.11-12). Instead, the identity-pair of opposites is absolutely primary (absolute prima): “whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not” (prop. 2, 1:389.3-6). Affirmative and negative identity, when juxtaposed, suggest contradiction. This means that contradiction is a derivative of the primary identity-pair. It also means that contradiction is governed by a prior (prae) identity (prop. 3, 1:390.30-2). Just consider any real knowledge: truth rests on an intuition of its ground (intuiti niti, 1:394.3-4), and if one wants to go beyond tautological transformations, ground of truth will differ from truth grounded. Analogously, actual states of affairs are grounded in other events (prop. 6, 1:394.10-11). Hence distinct antecedent reasons determine truths; distinct prior grounds determine things. At the same time, the truths determined give meaning to the antecedent as their reason, and the things determined give context to the prior as their ground. Reality emerges as soon as the dynamic center patterns alterity, while being placed and defined by the patterned alterity when doing so. The resulting interaction is essential. And it is accessible. Metaphysical cognition begins with communal identity (communiter principium identitatis) governing contradiction (prop. 2, 1:389.3-6).

Beyond access is the root of natural interactivity. A ground differs from the grounded. As the communal identity of opposites is the universal grounded, the ultimate ground must be identity as such. Now the simple unit appears. It is outside our grasp but absolutely necessary (prop. 7, 1:395.4-6). The necessary existing unit is called “God” (ibid.). From it everything follows (prop. 8, 1:396.8-9). Specifically, what follows, and now once more within cognitive reach, is change (mutatio, 1:410.18). Kant's Principle of Succession makes change intelligible: change occurs because of substantial connections ([substantiae] cum aliis connexae sunt); the mutual dependency of substances determines mutual alterations (prop. 12, 1:411.18-200). A bond governs change and thus reality. This dynamic-structural bond is a reciprocal, harmonious dependency. Metaphysical cognition ends with reciprocal commercium or interactivity, Kant's Principle of Coexistence (prop. 13, 1:412-13).

That such a dynamic harmony can exist is so amazing that it has to be divinely sustained (1:413.10-15). Thus the New Elucidation ends with the marvel over interaction. He writes:

… Since we find all things in the universe to be interactively connected … we must admit that this relation depends on a joint cause, on God, the universal principle of beings. …The same pattern of the divine understanding, which generates existence, also establishes the relations of things to each other, by conceiving their existences as correlated with each other. From this it is evident that the universal interaction of all things must be due to this … divine idea. (1:413.13-20)

Kant confidently concludes that his system of universal interaction is certainly (certe) better than the pedestrian theory of physical influence (formerly defended by ex-advisor Knutzen; may he rest in peace). The reason, he explains, is that universal interactivity (systema universalis substantiarum commercium, 1:415.40) reveals the origin of the connection governing things, an origin that completely escapes ordinary physical influence because this theory looks at substances in isolation (1:416) — ignoring what happens among them, the dynamic “between”.

Kant was on a roll. He turned to writing his professorial thesis or habilitationsschrift, the Physical Monadology (1756). What does the “between” mean with regard to the structure of matter? Obviously, material things are extended — they take up space. Equally obviously, the terminal units of nature must be point-entities, for if they weren't, they would be further divisible and not be the final constituents. Ontology suggests that spatial objects consist of final elements. Logic requires that final elements are indivisible, hence points. Geometry warns that points never fill a volume, regardless how many are used. So how can points make up the spatial things in nature? On the matrix-level, what happens “between” the points?

Force is prior to extension; everything comes about through pushes and pulls; and even on the smallest scale the attractive-repulsive interplay must structure space (determinata volumina, 1:484.10-12). Bodies are coherent webs of force-points. The dynamic point-entities are intelligible as mathematical centers, but dynamically, they are centers of active radiation fields that mutually confine each other. Physical monads are thus elementary energy spheres (sphaera activatis or ambitum activitatis; 1 481.9-10, 37). They are points and, as such, indivisible — but they radiate and in doing so create extension. Hence non-extended points constitute extended composites. We must think in dynamic terms, because corpuscular interpretations of nature do not work, not even for the ether (1:486.5-35). As he writes at the end of the Physical Monadology, the ether is energetically structured space or “fire matter” (aether seu materia ignis; 1:487.18), woven by elastic bonds (iunctae elasticitates; 1:487.12).

The professorial thesis has the full title, “the use in natural philosophy of the synthesis of metaphysics and geometry, whose first sample contains the physical monadology.” Kant argues that the combination of metaphysics and geometry can produce good philosophy (1:473). It seems easier to mate griffins with horses than to join exact science and conjecture (1:473.22-4), but truth is found in the harmony of opposites, and the “physical monadology” is a case in point.

The ultimate units, Kant's sphaera activatis, are terminal concentrations of energy that stretch out as active dimensional spheres. This is theoretically up to date. In current particle physics, string theory conceives of force-points as closed vibrating loops that whip their exteriors into dimensional shape. Force generates extension — even on the level of elements. From what science can tell today, the resulting dynamic spacelets, so-called Calabi-Yau spaces, are the smallest bubbles of reality.

Geometry and conjecture lead to the matrix. Calabi-Yau spaces, the modern-day correlates to Kant's spheres, are approximated through quantum geometry. The units, superstrings (the branes of M-theory seen on edge), are smaller than the empirical threshold, the Planck length. Kant contended that the units are beyond the measure of the sensible. Modern cosmologists would agree, both in that investigating the absolutely large, the cosmos, necessarily leads to the investigation of the absolutely small, and in that this path leads from the empirical to the rational. The quest has become formal, and its physical pioneers are mathematicians. Beyond the bane of experiments, the explorers of strings and branes today do conceptual work. And like Kant, they stress the intelligible beauty of nature.

Conceptual work is guided by logical and aesthetic criteria. By Kant's own testimony, the contemplation of nature was for him an intensely aesthetic encounter. In the Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and the Sublime (1764), his greatest public success before the Critiques, he would develop a phenomenology of beauty. Depending on the intensity of the experience, an aesthetic encounter can be either with beauty, exciting pleasure — or with the sublime, striking awe, sensual overload, even terror (2:208-9). Later, in the Critique of Judgment (1790), he would argue for the heuristic value of aesthetic notions such as design and unity.

When Kant was still working on the Physical Monadology, a tsunami shattered the coastal city Lisbon (1 November 1755). Fires broke out in the chaos that merged into a firestorm incinerating the rubble. It was the worst earthquake (actually a seaquake) recorded in Western history; 70,000 people died. It struck on Sunday, which happened to be a holiday (All Saints Day, Allerheiligen for Kant). The twelve-meter (40 ft) high waves slammed at the city churches just when the flocks had gathered. The impact destabilized the towers, which collapsed backwards for static reasons, crashing through roofs and crushing whoever prayed below. The whorehouses up in the hills were spared. The faithful died, and the sinners survived. This posed a theological challenge.

Kant wrote three papers on the catastrophe. The first, On the Causes of the Terrestrial Convulsions (1756), was an essay on the physical dynamics of earthquakes; Kant speculated that there are giant caves underneath mountain ridges (1:419-20). Sometimes gases in the caves form combustible mixtures. When they blow up, the caves collapse, shaking the earth (1:422). Although Kant's conjecture is false (quakes are usually due to plate tectonics), it is methodologically beyond reproach, employing known data (mining explosions) to formulate a testable hypothesis. The second tract, History and Natural Description of the Most Curious Occurrences associated with the Quake (1756), is a report on what happened in Lisbon. The third, Further Observation on the Terrestrial Convulsions (1756), is a refutation of superstitious causes such as invidious astrological conjunctions.

In all three essays, Kant insists on secular explanations. Earthquakes are terrible, but they are accidents (1:420). We do not know what they mean in the larger frame of things, and to interpret the Lisbon earthquake as a divine punishment is naïve anthropocentrism.

Kant was interested in earthquakes not only because of the singular event in Portugal, but also for the reason he wrote on winds, the Theory of Winds (1756), and the West-Wind essay (1757). The most dramatic human encounters with natural forces are fire, storms, and earthquakes. Anyone intrigued by force would want to study these phenomena. Fire is pure energy. Earthquakes are the brutal action of force. And winds are the best examples of force moving through space. Meteorological phenomena in particular were an opportunity to apply the hypothesis of the force-space bond, the idea that active pulses modify each other and that external modifications of a radiation will affect the internal constitution of the pulse. Air masses can be modeled as pulses, and weather involves a clear instantiation of dynamic interactivity.

Kant discovered that the direction-patterns of coastal winds are the result of rhythmic thermal expansions and contractions of air columns over coastal and marine surfaces (1:223-4; 1:492-4). But weather is not only due to the push and pull of energies, the interaction of force (thermal radiation) and space (air columns over surface). As winds are motions in space, other motions may drive them on. Rotational forces — investigated in the earlier Spin-Cycle essay — are especially important. They were Kant's key for his discoveries, later confirmed, of the dynamic weather pumps responsible for trade winds, equatorial winds, and the monsoon.

After a hiatus of several years, in which high teaching loads permitted him to write only little, Kant turned to what would be the culmination of his systematic cosmology. As already the New Elucidation had shown, the analysis of the interactive natural community points to an absolute and transcendent ground. The contemplation of nature inexorably leads to a reflection over the absolute. Kant examined the perfection of dynamic interactivity and its sustaining divine unit in the Essay on Optimism (1759), arguing that relative natural perfection amounts to the harmony of a manifold with a rule, and that absolute divine perfection is such that its manifold contains within itself the ground of reality (2:30-31note). Their difference, in terms of reality or perfection, is just a matter of degree (2:31.16) — the thrust and limit of the cosmic vector. In 1762, now pushing forty, Kant resumed this line of inquiry and wrote what would be his third book, Only Possible Ground of a Demonstration of God's Existence (1763). Kant explores there the divine limit of the natural vector. “God” is defined as the necessary, unified, and constant being.

The first part of the Only Possible Ground contains an ontological argument of the divine bond. Instead of regarding existence as a predicate (2:70-4), Kant derives necessary existence from possibility (2:77-84).[24] The bond governing nature is derivable from its intelligible possibility.

The second part contains a teleological argument. Here Kant restates parts of the Universal Natural History (2:93-100, 123-51). Since few copies of that book had survived the publisher's bankruptcy, he wanted to repeat once more its salient points — while toning down, or omitting altogether, its more provocative insights (he was, after all, already a lecturer with designs for a professorship, and this time, he did not publish anonymously). Relevant for the topic was the immanent teleology of nature. In virtue of its own forces acting on matter, nature emerges as a uniform system that evolves to ever increasing order, diversity, and complexity. The divine and active bond is the cosmic vector, and we can observe its design in nature's evolution. And since the design derives from the “inner possibility” of objects (2:91-2), both conceptual and teleological arguments share the same ground.

The divine bond is the unified and indispensable dynamis. The corresponding traits of cosmic structure — unity and harmony — make Kant's argument from design possible. The third and final part of the Only Possible Ground contains his assessment of the ontological and teleological arguments. Only the former qualifies, strictly speaking, as a proof (2:161-1). A comparison reveals their differences. The one is a rigorous and conceptual demonstration, while the other is its probabilistic and empirical application. But truth is to be found in their harmony; both are rooted in the same key notion, possibility. Since empirical design is built into the intelligible dynamis of objects, both arguments harmonize over the essence of the bond. This is why the book has its peculiar structure: two arguments (Beweise) but one ground (Beweisgrund), which is possibility, Kant's Möglichkeit or Aristotle's dynamis.

8. Crisis and Critique: “Groping Among Mere Concepts”

But when Kant was reflecting on the divine ground of nature, he was assailed by doubts. Studying force in nature is one thing — but deducing God's existence? Can one identify God in the rigorous and comprehensive way suggested in his third book? Here ultimate task clashes with ultimate method. Determining the absolute by means of formal demonstration and empirical evidence is too bold. How could Kant be certain that he was not kidding himself?

The preface of the Only Possible Ground reveals his inner torment. Providence, he writes there, already imparted to common sense the notion that God exists, hence the project of a demonstration is redundant (2:65). The insight that God exists does not need “the sophistry of subtle inferences” (ibid.). In theory, such a demonstration might illuminate much else in this object, but “to achieve this purpose, however, one must venture into the bottomless abyss of metaphysics” (2:65.25-66.1). And what is metaphysics? A dark ocean without shore and lighthouse, Kant says, on which it is all too easy to lose one's way (2:66.1-6).

This is followed by a startling retraction: he writes that his ontological proof, of all things, should not be mistaken for a demonstration (2:66.12-13). But if it were not a demonstration, what else could it be? What he wanted to do, he says, was to supply “just an argument in support of a demonstration”; a construction kit (Baugerät) for a future proof (2:66.9-10). This kit has been assembled with “great difficulty” (ibid.), and even so, he owes the reader an apology, for the kit is incomplete — frankly, it is bad (schlecht; 2:66.28).

Two years before Kant's loss of heart, in 1761, the Prussian Academy had announced a question for the public competition of 1763. The question was whether metaphysical principles, specifically the principles of natural theology and morals, could be proven with the same clarity and precision as the truths of geometry. King Frederick II had invited foreign intellectuals and scientists, such as Maupertuis, d'Alembert, La Mettrie, Voltaire, Lagrange, and Euler to the academy, and they had little patience with their speculative German colleagues. Newton's star kept rising, and the tough-minded foreigners put the metaphysicians in Berlin on the spot. The prize question was the result.

While Kant was writing the Only Possible Ground, he prepared a submission to the contest, the Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morals (1764). The treatise is known as the Prize Essay, although it was only the runner-up (which was printed with Mendelssohn's winning entry in an official volume.) Work on the Prize Essay put Kant in a stressful situation, not only because he had to meet the contest deadline, but also because he forced himself to engage with metaphysics on two levels — in the book, he pursued a first-order question on God's existence, and in the essay, he examined the second-order question of whether such a pursuit is actually feasible. He forced himself to question himself.

The Prize Essay was a step toward the issue that would later acquire obsessive importance for Kant, the problem of the possibility of metaphysics as a system of conceptual (a priori) judgments that are synthetic — that really add knowledge up, instead of just paraphrasing what is known. But in contrast to the Critique of Pure Reason (1781), the Prize Essay contains still a modicum of hope. Its concern was not whether, but how metaphysics can be possible. Asking “how” suggests that metaphysics is feasible, and that the task is only a matter of determining its right method.

As a model of method, the Principia suggested itself. No other work in recent history had had such an impact on knowledge; no other book had revolutionized the understanding of nature as much as Newton's masterpiece; and no other book contained so many discoveries in such rigorous form. The rigor of the form, it appeared, was the key to the extraordinary quality of its contents. Kant, who had studied Newton's insights a decade earlier, now studied his guidelines, spelled out not only in the “Rules of Philosophy” of the Principia but also in the queries of the Opticks. In the final query (1979, 404-5), Newton suggests the research strategy of an analysis of wholes into parts, followed by a synthesis of the identified causes into explanatory principles.

Accordingly Kant's methodological proposal, in the Prize Essay, is a case for a conceptual analysis as the starting point of metaphysics. Synthetic reasoning is premature as long as the concepts involved are ambiguous. Eventually metaphysics should turn into a synthetic discipline, but its current limitations require a mandatory analytic phase first (2:290).

This proposal allowed Kant to present himself as a thinker with exacting standards, and his Prize Essay was a reality-check on the overly optimistic winner, Mendelssohn's Treatise on the Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences (1764). The Prize Essay was a critique: metaphysics can be salvaged, but only by rebuilding it from scratch.

By drawing this conclusion Kant sawed off the branch he had been sitting on since 1745. Is conceptual philosophical inquiry into reality capable of certainty? Kant's answer was “not yet.” But conceptual inquiry had been his work to date, from the Living Forces to the Only Possible Ground. Hence everything he had done suddenly appeared to him as terribly premature. Now he was in a crisis.

Things came to a head a year later, in 1765, when he, now forty-one, read the Swedish mystic Emmanuel Swedenborg (1688-1772). In Heavenly Secrets (8 vol., 1749-56), Swedenborg relates his visions of angels, describing their spiritual world in detail. Kant had been intrigued by the hearsay of the clairvoyant's exploits, but when he read the work, he recognized it as a fraud.

Kant wrote a scathing satire, the Dreams of a Spirit-Seer (1766). He denounces there Swedenborg as the “arch-spirit-seer of all spirit-seers” (2:354.20), whose works are “fantasies” (2:363.36), “wild figments of the imagination” (2:366.11), “eight tomes of nonsense” (2:360.15), and the results of “hypochondrial winds” that result in farts when raging in the guts, and in heavenly visions when raging in the mind (2:348.25-9).

What ticked Kant off was that he saw in the farting mystic a parody of himself (Laywine 1993, 71). The visionary's world of angels is the reductio of dynamic cosmology — the absurd final consequence of Kant's own pantheistic contentions. He had always assumed that reality is radically coherent. Science and metaphysics join hands in its investigation because the cosmos involves an intelligible as well as an empirical side: humans are unqualified parts of nature; mind and body are energetic interacting presences; rationality depends on matter; freedom in nature is just a question of resisting force; and so forth. There is only force, and its product, nature. Kant's ideas had amounted to a dynamic parallelism of the corporeal and the mental — just like Swedenborg's philosophy of heaven.

The Dreams of the Spirit-Seer was thus also self-critique. He wrote Mendelssohn (who was confused by the satire) that to preempt the mockery of others, he found it wisest to mock himself, which was honest and something he had to do because his mind “is really in conflict on this issue” (10:70.2-5). The problem, he explains, is the presence of the mind in the material world, and that analogies between spiritual and material substances are flights of fancy unhindered by data (10:71-2). With this admission, in the letter on April 8, 1766, before his forty-second birthday, the entire pre-critical project Kant had worked on since he was twenty had come to a crashing halt.

Kant's first response to this devastating outcome was that he overreacted. When a position as a professor at Königsberg University was available, he had to write yet another thesis for the application portfolio, On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World (1770), the so-called Inaugural Dissertation. Since the problem handed to him by the mystic had been the dynamic unity of a jointly sensible and intelligible reality, the solution must be, well, their divorce. In the Inaugural Dissertation, he slashed through the Gordian knot by cutting nature into two halves, the mundus intelligibilis of metaphysics and the mundus sensibilis of science.

His second response was more considered and very courageous. He confronted his long-held convictions and examined them on possible flaws, which meant to determine which of the claims previously advanced hold up and which ones do not. This soul-searching amounted to a second-order investigation — not an examination of the conceptual contentions as such, but an examination of their knowability. This turned out to be an intense task that consumed more than a decade of his life, and which resulted in his greatest work, the Critique of Pure Reason (1781).

Among its findings, which historically changed the face of philosophy, are that traditional metaphysics is over (Aviii-x, Axix-xx, Bxiv-xv), and that proofs for God's existence are done with (A631-42/B659-70). Apercus later successful in the brain sciences are its conclusions that perception results from interaction, whereby invariant pathways organize affecting data (B1, A15/B29, A50-51/B74-5, B113, B148-9), and that the subject of organized experience — the synthetic unity of apperception — poses the hard problem of consciousness (B154-9).

At the same time, Kant qualified there his previous split of the sensible from the intelligible; and it was good that he did, because as his early apercus illustrate, his dynamic ontology, albeit premature, had been all along on the right track. Thus interactivity entered the Critique as a cognitive device for ordering data (the disjunctive relation or community; A70/B95 and A80/B106) and for perceiving spatial objects (the principle of coexistence; A211/B256-A215/B262). The energy field (force stretched out as space) returns there as well, as the only exception to Kant's critical rule not to talk about the intelligible features of mind-independent nature. But the rule had to be broken, he realized, because the energy-field sustains the interactive experience of spatial things (A211/B257-A213/B260).

Later, there would be even more qualifications of the split, and Kant's return to his original themes with the Opus Postumum would turn the former divorce of intelligible and sensible into an episode. But by 1781, he had found his way: the continued quest for the Big Questions, but now tempered by critical caution.


References to Kant's texts follow the Academy edition (Gesammelte Schriften, ed. Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin: Reimer, later DeGruyter, 1910ff.) by volume, page, and, if useful, by line. References to the Critique of Pure Reason are to the first (A) and second (B) editions.

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