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Richard Kilvington

First published Tue Aug 7, 2001

Richard Kilvington (ca. 1302-1361), Master of Arts and Doctor of Theology at Oxford, was a member of the household of Richard de Bury, then Archdeacon of London, and finally Dean of Saint Paul's Cathedral in London. Along with Walter Burley and Thomas Bradwardine, he formed the first academic generation of the school known as the ‘Oxford Calculators’. Although he introduced a number of original ideas and methods in logic, natural philosophy, and theology, and influenced his contemporaries and followers, he has been little studied until recently.

1. Life and Works

Richard Kilvington (we know almost seventy different spellings of his name) was born at the beginning of the fourteenth century in the village of Kilvington in Yorkshire. He was the son of a priest from the diocese of York. He studied at Oxford, where he became Master of Arts (1324/1325) and then Doctor of Theology (ca. 1335). His academic career was followed by a diplomatic and ecclesiastical one. He was in the of service of Edward III and took part in diplomatic missions, culminating in his service as Dean of St. Paul's Cathedral in London. Along with Richard Fitzralph, Kilvington was involved in the battle against mendicant friars. It seems that Kilvington's argument with mendicants continued almost until his death in 1361.

Except for a few sermons, all of Kilvington's known works stem from his lectures at Oxford, and none of these uses the typical late-medieval style in question commentaries, which followed the order of books in the respective works of Aristotle. Rather, in accordance with the fourteenth century Oxford practice, Kilvington reduces the number of topics discussed to some central and probably most important subjects, each of which is constructed as a set of fully developed questions, no more than 10 in each set. This reduction in the range of topics is offset by a lengthier and much more detailed analysis of the particular questions chosen for treatment, some of which print to over 120 pages in modern editions. His philosophical works, the Sophismata and Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione, both composed before 1325, were the result of lectures as a Bachelor of Arts; his Quaestiones super Physicam (1325/26) and Quaestiones super Libros Ethicorum (1326/1332) come from his period as a Master of Arts; finally, he composed his ten questions on Peter Lombard's Sentences in the Faculty of Theology before 1334. (Only the Sophismata has been edited and translated, in Kretzmann 1990, 1991; for the titles of other questions and their manuscripts, see Jung-Palczewska 2000b.)

2. Method in Science

Like a great many Oxford thinkers of the period, Kilvington is convinced that mathematics is useful in any branch of scientific inquiry that deals with measurable subjects. His “measure mania” emerges in his special interest in the problem of change, and in the application of mathematics to determine, that is to “measure”, the phenomenon in question. He makes broad use of the most popular fourteenth-century calculative techniques to solve not only physical but also ethical and theological problems. Four types of calculations can be found in Kilvington's works. The first and most predominant measure, by limits -- i.e., by the first and last instants of the beginning and ending of a continuous process, and by the intrinsic and extrinsic limits of capacities of passive and active potencies -- is not obviously mathematical, but it does raise mathematical considerations insofar as it prescribes a measure for natural processes. The second type of calculation, by latitude of forms, covers processes in which accidental forms or qualities are intensified or diminished, e.g., in the distribution of such natural qualities as heat or whiteness. This is also applied to theology to measure the latitude of moral qualities such as love, grace, sin, will or desire, and to clarify the nature of communication between God and man in general, or between God and the blessed in particular. The third type of calculation is more properly mathematical, and employs a new calculus of compounding ratios in order to measure the speed of local motion. Finally, the fourth type of calculation involves a “rule” that allows one to compare infinities as infinite sets containing infinite subsets, and thereby to determine their relative size. Kilvington finds a way to apply these techniques of measurement in his logical, physical, ethical, and theological writings, and their presence is one of the most distinctive features of his work.

3. Logic

Kilvington's only logical work is the Sophismata. A sophisma is neither a standard paradox of disputation nor a sophistical argument but a sentence or proposition whose truth is at issue. The basic structure of the work involves the statement of a sophisma sentence, the presentation of a case or hypothesis, arguments for and against the sophisma sentence, and finally, the resolution or reply to the sophisma sentence and to the arguments on the opposing side.

Kilvington's sophisms are intended to be of logical interest, but they also pose some important physical questions. In constructing his sophisms, Kilvington sometimes appeals to observable physical motion, but just as often makes use of purely imaginary cases having no reference to external reality. Although such cases are physically impossible, they are theoretically possible since they do not involve a formal contradiction: “and for purpose of the sophisma, that is enough [unde licet casus idem positus sit impossibilis de facto...tamen per se possibilis est; et hoc sufficit pro sophismate]” (S 29, p. 69; see also Kretzmann 1990 p. 249).

The first eleven sophisms use the process of whitening to consider the motion of alteration as a successive entity extrinsically limited at its beginning and end. There is no first instant of alteration, claims Kilvington, only a last instant before the alteration begins; likewise, there is no last instant of alteration, only a first instant marking the introduction of the final degree of the quality in question. Thus, motion yields no minimum degree of whiteness or speed, but rather smaller and smaller degrees ad infinitum down to zero, since the qualities change continuously. The set of integers is potentially infinite because one can always find a higher integer, but not actually infinite since there is no infinitely great number. Since, in Kilvington's opinion, any continuum of time, space, motion, heat, whiteness, etc., is infinitely divisible, it can be understood quantitatively and measured using infinite sets of integers. Sophisms 29-44 reveal Kilvington's special interest in the causes of local motion, i.e., active and passive potencies, and in effects such as time, distance traversed, and speed. He considers both uniform and difform motion caused by voluntary agents, and calls attention to the dubious measure of instantaneous speed through the comparison of speed in uniform and accelerated motion (see Kretzmann 1982).

The last four sophisms raise issues in epistemology and the logic of knowledge by means of propositions on knowing and doubting involving intentional contexts, e.g., in sophism 45, ‘You know this to be everything that is this’. One of the most interesting historically is sophism 47, ‘You know that the king is seated’, in which Kilvington departs from the usual format to call some of the rules of obligational disputation into question (for discussion, see Kretzmann and Stump 1985; Kretzmann 1990, pp. 330-347).

4. Natural Philosophy

Although Kilvington does not enjoy the reputation in natural philosophy that he does in logic, recent research has revealed that his questions on Aristotle's De generatione et corruptione and Physics influenced Thomas Bradwardine's theory of motion and rule concerning velocities in motion (see Jung-Palczewska 2000b). Both works were written before 1328, i.e., before Bradwardine's important treatise, On the Ratios of Velocities in Motions.

Like most medieval natural philosophers, Kilvington subscribes to the general Aristotelian principles of motion. He follows Ockham, however, in allowing substance and quality as the only two kinds of really existing thing. The reality of motion is explained in terms of the mobile subject and the places, qualities, and quantities it successively acquires. Consequently, Kilvington is mostly interested in measuring local motion in terms of its actions or causes, the distance traversed and time consumed, rather than the “intensity” of its speed. It is his analysis of local motion that places Kilvington among the 14th-century pioneers who considered the problem of motion with respect to its causes (tamquam penes causam), corresponding to modern dynamics, and with respect to its effects (tamquam penes effectum), corresponding to modern kinematics.

Unlike many later Oxford Calculators, Kilvington did not advance any clear rules concerning the different kinds of division when examining the dynamical aspect of motion in the problem of setting boundaries to capacities or potencies involved in active/passive processes. But he did articulate most of the issues which were at stake and pose the questions which influenced the solutions of later Calculators (see Wilson 1956, Jung-Palczewska 2000a). Like Heytesbury (for whom, see Longeway 1984) Kilvington pointed to two different considerations which have to be met: one which refers to the everyday use of language, describing real, physical phenomena; and another which refers to a formal, i.e. logico-mathematical, language dealing with the questions in the realm of speculative, i.e., mathematical physics.

Kilvington's belief in the power of mathematics in natural philosophy led him to a new theory of ratios. In order to produce a mathematically coherent theory, he insists (in keeping with Euclid's definition from the fifth book of the Elements) that a proper double proportion is the multiplication of a proportion by itself. Moreover, since, in the opinion of Averroes, “the ratio of speeds in motions follows the ratio of the power of the mover to the power of the thing moved”, variations in speed must be tied to variations in the proportion of forces and resistances. Consequently, the proper way of measuring the speed of motion is to describe its variations by the double ratio of motive force (F) and resistance (R), as defined by Euclid. The speed of motion thus varies arithmetically, whereas the proportion of force to resistance determining these speeds varies geometrically. Accordingly, when the proportion of force to resistance is squared, the speed will be doubled (for a comprehensive explanation of this new theory see Murdoch and Sylla 1976). Kilvington is aware that a proper understanding of Euclid's definition requires a new interpretation of Aristotle's principles of motion, and concludes that when he is talking about a power moving half of a mobile, Aristotle means precisely the subdouble ratio of F to R, and that when he is talking about power moving a mobile twice as heavy, he means the squaring of the ratio of F to R. Kilvington's function provides values of the ratio of F to R greater than 1:1 for any speed down to zero, since any root of the ratio greater than 1:1 is always a ratio greater than 1:1. Hence, he avoids a serious weakness of Aristotle's theory, which cannot explain the mathematical relationship of F and R in very slow motions.

According to Aristotle, a temporal motion can occur only if there is some resistance playing the role of a virtus impeditiva, together with an acting power greater than the resistance of the medium. Since there is no resistance in a vacuum, motion is impossible there. Although he holds that vacua do not exist in nature, he considers the possible temporal motion of both mixed and simple bodies in a vacuum. Kilvington's most interesting and original idea here concerns the possible temporal motion of a simple body. Such a motion could be caused only by internal resistance brought about by the unequal distance traversed by the different parts of a simple body unequally distant from the center of the Earth, relative to which they move. Since the question on motion in a vacuum is posed secundum imaginationem and deals with purely imaginable cases, it seems that Kilvington has here combined Aristotelian realism with Ockham's particularist ontology.

Local motion considered in its dynamic aspect, i.e., when speed is proportional to the ratios of Fs to Rs, describes only the value of speed measured at an instant and not successive changes of speed over time. In order to characterize changes of speed in motion, one must study the problem of local motion in its kinematic aspect. Like all of the later Calculators, Kilvington does not consider speed to be a quality, so there is no real, existential referent for instantaneous speed. Therefore, speed has to be measured by distances, i.e., latitudes of quality (formal distance) or quantity traversed, and such traversals take time unless the speed is infinitely great. In his questions on the Physics, Kilvington considers all sorts of motion: uniform, uniformly difform, and difformly difform local motion.

Besides the new function describing the speed of motion, which was eventually adopted and developed by Thomas Bradwardine, one of the most notable achievements of Kilvington's theory of local motion is its awareness of the different levels of abstraction involved in the problem. Although his account frequently proceeds secundum imaginationem in the direction of “speculative physics”, it never renounces empirical verification. Kilvington ponders questions which would never arise as a result of direct observation, since the structure of nature can only be uncovered by highly abstract analyses. Such abstractions, however, arise from genuine realities, and cannot contradict them. He saw physics and mathematics as complementary, i.e., as two different ways of describing natural phenomena. Reality provides the starting point for the more complicated mental constructions which in turn make it comprehensible. While mathematics is the proper way to solve these problems, logic remains the most convenient way to pose them. These different methods together guarantee the objective and demonstrative character of the natural sciences. Like other Oxford Calculators, Kilvington refrained from including God in his speculations on natural science, which remained focused on nature as the proper subject of physics. Since the laws of nature are a reflection of God's ordained power, he saw no need to recall this obvious fact while entertaining these laws or considering thought experiments.

On the one hand, Kilvington never abandons the realm of Aristotelian physics or rejects the principles laid down in his natural philosophy. But on the other, his tendency to combine mathematics and physics frequently led him beyond Aristotle's theories to seek solutions to the many paradoxes which resulted from his principles. Kilvington's Aristotelian principles hide essentially Ockhamist views. Despite the fact that he never explicitly mentions the name of Brother William, it is beyond doubt that he not only knew the opinions of the Venerable Inceptor but also accepted them as the natural way of understanding the works of the Philosopher.

5. Impact and Influence

Kilvington's teachings on logic were influential both in England and on the Continent. Richard Billingham, Roger Rosetus, William Heytesbury, Adam Wodeham, and Richard Swineshead were among those English scholars who benefited from Kilvington's Sophsimata. His Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione was quoted by Richard FitzRalph, Adam Wodeham, and Blasius of Parma. His Quaestiones super Physicam was well known to the next generation of Oxford Calculators: John Dumbleton and Richard Swineshead. It seems that the latter text also influenced Parisian masters such as Nicole Oresme and John Buridan. Thomas Bradwardine, however, was the most famous beneficiary of Kilvington's questions on motion. In his renowned treatise on the velocities of motion, Bradwardine included most of Kilvington's fundamental arguments for a new function describing the relation of motive powers and resistance. Kilvington's other questions on the Ethics and the Sentences enjoyed a reputation not only in Oxford but also in Paris, where they were frequently quoted by Adam Junior, John of Mirecourt, Johanes de Burgo, Thomas of Cracow (see Jung-Palczewska 2000b).

Kilvington played an important role in the diffusion of the ideas of early Oxford Calculators, even if Thomas Bradwardine eclipsed him. In his works on the philosophy of nature, he raised many fundamental questions, often solving them in an original and sophisticated manner.


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Related Entries

Albert of Saxony | Bradwardine, Thomas | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Heytesbury, William | Ockham [Occam], William