Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Aug 21, 2007

Loyalty is usually seen as a virtue, albeit a problematic one. It is constituted centrally by perseverance in an association to which a person has become intrinsically committed. Its paradigmatic expression is found in friendship, to which loyalty is integral, but many other relationships and associations seek to encourage it as an aspect of affiliation or membership: families expect it, organizations often demand it, and countries do what they can to foster it. May one also have loyalty to principles or other abstractions? Two key issues in the discussion of loyalty concern its status as a virtue and, if that status is granted, the limits to which loyalty ought to be subject.

1. Introduction

1.1 Background

Until recently, loyalty did not attract much philosophical attention. Most of the detailed engagement with loyalty came from creative writers (Aeschylus, Galsworthy, Conrad), business and marketing scholars (Goman; Jacoby & Chestnut), psychologists (Zdaniuk & Levine), psychiatrists (Böszörményi-Nagy), sociologists (Flap), religious scholars (Sakenfeld; Spiegel), political economists (Hirschman), and — pre-eminently — political theorists, who took a particular interest in patriotism and loyalty oaths (Grodzins, Schaar, Guetzkow). The grand philosophical exception was Josiah Royce, who created an ethical theory round “loyalty to loyalty.” Since the 1980s, though, some independent philosophical discussion has begun to emerge (Baron, Fletcher, Oldenquist, Keller), not only in the context of political theory, but also in those of professional ethics (McChrystal, Trotter), whistleblowing (Martin), friendship (Bennett), and virtue theory (Ewin).

1.2 Roots

Although the term “loyalty” has its immediate philological origins in Old French, its older and mostly abandoned linguistic roots are in the Latin lex. Nevertheless, dimensions of the phenomenon that we now recognize as loyalty are as ancient as human association, albeit often manifested in its breaches. The Old Testament writers were continually occupied with the fickleness of human commitments, whether to God or to each other. To characterize it they tended to use the language of (un)faithfulness, though nowadays we might be inclined to use the more restricted language of (in)fidelity, which has regard to specific commitments. In medieval to early modern uses of the term, loyalty came to be affirmed primarily in the oath or pledge of fealty or allegiance sworn by a vassal to his lord. That had an interesting offshoot as monarchical feudalism lost sway: loyal subjects who were torn by the venality of sitting sovereigns found it necessary — as part of their effort to avoid charges of treason — to distinguish their ongoing loyalty to the institution of kingship from their loyalty to a particular king.

2. The nature of loyalty

As a working definition, loyalty can be characterized as a practical disposition to persist in an intrinsically valued (though not necessarily valuable) associational attachment, where that involves a potentially costly commitment to secure or at least not to jeopardize the interests or well-being of the object of loyalty.

2.1 A practical disposition or only a sentiment?

The nature of loyal attachment is a matter of debate. The strong feelings and devotion often associated with loyalty have led some to assert that loyalty is only or primarily a feeling or sentiment — an affective bondedness that may express itself in deeds though more as an epiphenomenon than as its core. As Ewin puts it, it is an “instinct to sociability” (Ewin, 1990, 4). But feelings of loyalty are not constitutive of loyalty, even if it is unusual to find loyalty that is affectless. The test of loyalty is conduct rather than intensity of feeling, primarily a certain “stickingness” or perseverance — the loyal person acts for or stays with or remains committed to the object of loyalty even when it is likely to be disadvantageous or costly to the loyal person to do so.

Those who focus on loyalty as a sentiment also intend to deny that loyalty might be rationally motivated. But even though expressions of loyalty are not maximizing (in cost-benefit terms), the decision to commit oneself loyally may be rational, for one need not (indeed, ought not to) enter into associations blindly, or — even when they are unavoidable (as with familial or national ones) — accept their demands unthinkingly. Moreover, once made, such commitments may be forfeited by the objects of loyalty should there be serious failure on their part, or they may be overridden in the face of significantly greater claims. One loyalty may trump another.

Unsentimental loyalties, such as the zealous but unsentimental professional loyalty of a lawyer to a client, are not unthinking, but have their rationale in associational tele, such as that of the adversarial system (but see McConnell). It is to this that the lawyer is ultimately committed, not as a matter of sentiment but of deliberated choice.

Posing the issue as one of either “practical disposition” or “sentiment” is probably too stark. Some evolutionary biologists/psychologists see loyalty as a genetically transmitted adaptive mechanism, a felt attachment to others that has survival value (Wilson, 23). Given what is often seen as the self-sacrificial character of individual loyalty, such loyalty is taken to be directed primarily to group survival (West, 218). But it is not clear what such an explanatory account shows. What “loyalty” may have begun as and what it has come to be for reflective beings need not be the same. Nor would it impugn what loyalty has come to be that it began as a survival mechanism (presuming the adaptive account to be correct).

3. The structure of loyalty

3.1 Loyalty and loyalties

Although we often speak of loyalty as though it were a relatively free-floating practical disposition — which it can be — it is very common to associate loyalty with certain natural or conventional groupings. Our loyalty tends to be expressed in loyalties. That is, it is not just a general affiliational attachment, but one that tends to be tied to certain kinds of natural or conventional associations, such as friendships, families, organizations, professions, countries, and religions. There is a reason for this. Associations that evoke and exact our loyalty tend to be those with which we have become deeply involved or identified. This is implicit in the working definition's reference to “intrinsically valued associational attachments.” Intrinsically valued associational attachments are usually those to which we have developed a form of social identification. We have come to value the associational bond for its own sake (whatever may have originally motivated it). Our loyalties are not just to any groups that may exist, or even to any group with which we have some association, but only to those to which we are sufficiently closely bound to call ours. My loyalties are to my friends, my family, my profession, or our country, not yours, unless yours are also mine. In such identifications, the fate or well-being of the objects of loyalty become bound up with one's own. We feel shame or pride in their doings. We will take risks or bear burdens for them.

Although our primary loyalties tend to be associations or groupings that are socially valued, such that loyalty may seem to be an important practical disposition, this need not be the case. For in theory, any association can become intrinsically important to us, whether or not it is generally valued, and it may do so even if it is socially despised. Football teams and coffee chains, gangs and crime families, may become objects of loyalty no less than professional associations and siblings.

This raises the important question whether judgments about the worth of loyalty are reducible to judgments about the worth of the associations to which loyalty is given or the legitimacy of what is done as a result of them. Does loyalty have any value independent of the particular associational object with which it is connected or is its value bound up exclusively with the object of loyalty? There is disagreement on this (paralleling disagreements about the obligatoriness of promise keeping). Some would argue that loyalty is virtuous or vicious depending on what is done out of loyalty. Others would argue that loyalty is always virtuous, though overridden when associated with immoral conduct. Consider the complicated case of a loyal Nazi. Ewin would argue that because a Nazi can be loyal, loyalty could not be a virtue, for the virtues are internally linked to the idea of good judgment. But of course the loyal Nazi might express that loyalty in a number of ways (as a husband and father, as a compassionate co-worker, or as a scourge of Jews) and in at least some of these ways loyalty would appear to function as a virtue. In the more interesting last case, a loyal Nazi is likely to cause greater harm than one who is not; on the other hand, were such a Nazi to be disloyal by allowing Jews who bribed him to escape, we might see him as deficient in his capacity to form close bonds. A disloyal Nazi seems to be doubly deficient.

3.2 Is loyalty inherently exclusionary?

It has sometimes been suggested that “A can be loyal to B only if there is a third party C … who stands as a potential competitor to B” (Fletcher, 8). It is true that many, if not most, expressions of loyalty occur against the background of some challenge to B's interests whose protection by A will be at some cost to A. Failures of loyalty often result in betrayal (of B, sometimes to C). Defending one's spouse in the face of criticism may also subject oneself to vilification. Refusing to leave one's university for another may involve a sacrifice of pay and opportunities. Patriotic loyalty may involve volunteering for military service when one's country is attacked. Sometimes, though, the loyal friend will simply manifest the loyalty by being responsive to B's need at some inconvenience. The loyal A will get up at 2.00am to fetch B when B's car has broken down or will agree to be best man at B's wedding even though it will involve a long flight and great expense. No third party is involved, but there will be a cost to A.

Some defenders and critics of loyalty take the frequent presence of C as a reason for seeing loyalty as inherently exclusionary. To put it in the words of the political consultant, James Carville, “sticking with” B requires “sticking it to” C (Carville). No doubt some loyalties — especially political ones — frequently express themselves in such terms. But jingoism is not necessary to patriotic loyalty (pace Tolstoy), and in most contexts the privileging of an object of loyalty (B) does not require treating others (C) badly. Loyalty to one's children need not involve the disparagement of others' children.

3.3 Universalism and particularism

Loyalty is generally seen as a particularistic virtue. That is, it privileges certain groups or individuals. Although Royce made “loyalty to loyalty” into a universalistic principle, there has been much debate concerning the relation between particularistic obligations, such as those associated with loyalty and gratitude, and universalistic obligations owed to all by virtue of their humanity. Are particularistic obligations subsumable under universalistic ones (honor your father and mother) or are they independently derived? If the latter, do they stand in permanent tension (obligations to the poor vs. obligations to one's children)? How, if at all, are conflicts to be resolved? The discussion has its modern roots in Enlightenment ideas of equal respect and of what is therefore owed to all by virtue of their common humanity. Both consequentialist and Kantian universalism have some difficulty in accommodating particularist virtues such as loyalty, and on occasion have eschewed the latter. As Godwin notoriously asked: “What magic is there in the pronoun ‘my,’ that should justify us in overturning the decisions of impartial truth?” (Godwin, vol. 1, 127).

Although most classical theorists have tended to accord moral priority to universalistic values, there have been important exceptions. Andrew Oldenquist has argued for the primacy of certain communal domains defined by our loyalties (“all morality is tribal morality”), within which considerations of impartiality may operate: “our wide and narrow loyalties define moral communities or domains within which we are willing to universalize moral judgments, treat equals equally, protect the common good, and in other ways adopt the familiar machinery of impersonal morality” (Oldenquist, 178, 177). Although Oldenquist denies that there is a nontribal, universalist morality, thus seeking to deprive the universalist of any independent traction, he does not do much to establish the primacy of the tribal apart from its temporal priority.

Bernard Williams has argued that if the claims of universalism (whether of the consequentialist or Kantian kind) are given pre-eminence, they will alienate people from their “ground projects,” where the latter include the deep attachments associated with loyalties. Williams obviously has a point, though even he concedes that such projects are not impervious to universalistic challenges (Williams, 17-18).

Many systematic moral theorists attempt to anchor particularistic virtues such as loyalty in larger universalistic premises. R.M. Hare, for example, adopts a two-tiered consequentialist position that seeks to justify the particularistic obligations of loyalty within a broader consequentialist schema: we contribute more effectively to overall well-being if we foster particularistic obligations. Reflecting on the particularism of mother love and loyalty, he writes: “If mothers had the propensity to care equally for all the children in the world, it is unlikely that children would be as well provided for even as they are. The dilution of the responsibility would weaken it out of existence” (Hare, 1981, 137). Unfortunately, simply being aware of the larger schema is sufficient to evacuate the particularistic obligation of much of its power — and, indeed, to call it into question. It misses, moreover, the distinctive source of the particularistic obligation — not in the needs of children so much as in their being one's own.

Peter Railton has attempted to find a place for loyalties within a broadly consequentialist framework that avoids both alienation and the problem confronting Hare's two-tiered system. According to Railton, there are good consequentialist reasons for particularistic preferences, consequentialist reasons that do not undercut but honor the particularism of those preferences. Railton's defense trades on a distinction between subjective and objective consequentialism, the objective consequentialist (whom he supports) being committed to the course of action available to an agent that would maximize the good (Railton, 152). That, he believes, does not require that the agent subjectively decide to maximize the good — indeed, it may require that the agent not make such calculations. Overall, then, a loyalty to friends and family, and commitment to ground projects may maximize good, even though, were one to make a subjective calculation, it would undermine the loyalty or commitment. Although there is some debate about the success of this strategy (Wilcox; Conee), it goes some way to countering the common perception that universalistic (or impersonal) theories can find no place for particularist obligations.

Another two-tiered system, but of a nonconsequentialist variety, is suggested by Alan Gewirth, who accords primacy to the principle that it is a necessary condition for human agency that all be accorded equal rights to freedom and well-being. That commitment, he believes, will also be sufficient to ground special obligations such as those finding expression in personal, familial, and national loyalties. It serves as such a ground because the commitment to individual freedom permits the formation of voluntary associations, including “exclusive” ones, as long as they do not interfere with others' basic freedom. Such voluntary associations are formed not merely for instrumental purposes, as contributions to our freedom, but are expressive of it. A persisting problem with this account concerns the resolution of conflicts between obligations that arise out our associational commitments (say, our families) and those that arise directly out of the general principle (say, to assist the world's needy). This is of course a general problem, and not just one for Gewirth; but it puts a question mark against the success of Gewirth's distinctive project, which was to develop a systematic alternative to the moral pluralism that he associates with Isaiah Berlin, Michael Walzer, and Thomas Nagel.

It may be that particularistic obligations such as those of loyalty have to be considered as sui generis, products not simply of our common humanity but of our sociality, of the self-realizing significance of associational bonds — most particularly friendships, but also various other associational connections that come to be constitutive of our identity and ingredients in our flourishing. That leaves, of course, the problem of resolving conflicts with universalistic obligations when they occur. We may, with Scheffler, wish to argue that the reasons generated by particularistic associations are “presumptively decisive” in cases in which conflict arises (Scheffler, 196).

3.4 The subjects of loyalty

The primary subjects of loyalty tend to be individual persons, but loyalty is not restricted to these. Mutuality is a feature of many loyalties, and it is often an expectation of the loyal individual that the collectivity to which the individual is loyal will also be loyal in return. Just as we personify organizations, regarding them as in some sense responsible actors, so we can attribute loyalty to them or — more often — bemoan their lack of loyalty to those who have been loyal to them.

May animals be loyal? Tales of canine loyalty are legion, and even among wild animals, especially those that move in social groups, loyalty is often said to be shown. To the extent that loyalty is seen as an adaptive sentiment, we may think that animals are capable of loyalty. That may be a convenient way of characterizing animal behavior, though, as Fletcher observes, the kind of loyalty shown is limited because the loyalty shown cannot be betrayed. The dog who is distracted by the burglar's steak does not betray its owner; its training has simply been inadequate. It is the kind of loyalty that, if displayed by humans would be characterized as “blind” and therefore likely to expose one to moral peril (Blamires, 24).

3.5 The objects of loyalty

There is no doubt that the primary objects of loyalty tend to be persons, personal collectivities, or quasi-persons such as organizations or social groups. Some argue that it is only to such that we can be loyal (Ladd; Baron). But that is at odds with the view that almost “anything to which one's heart can become attached or devoted” may also become an object of loyalty — principles, causes, brands, ideas, ideals, and ideologies (Konvitz, 108). Royce himself argued that loyalty is the “willing and practical and thoroughgoing devotion of a person to a cause” (Royce, 1908, 16-17). In response, those who personalize the objects of loyalty point out that we have equally available to us the language of commitment or devotion and, in the case of what is spoken of as “loyalty to one's principles,” we have the language of integrity.

There is some reason to favor the more restrictive focus for loyalty. Our core loyalties, which also happen to be those that are psychologically more powerful (Walzer, 5), tend to secure the integrity of our particular human associations. To the extent that our moral obligations encompass not only our relations with other human beings in general but also our relationships with particular others — our friends, families, fellow citizens, and so on — loyalty will be partially constitutive and sustaining of these particular others in contexts in which self-interest is likely to be better served by abandoning them. If we further argue that the core of morality is concerned with the quality of relationships that people have with each other, both as fellow humans and in the various associative groups that they form, then loyalty will constitute an important dimension of that relational network. Even the “cause” with which Royce associates loyalty is ultimately articulated in terms of devotion to a community (Royce, 1908, 20; 1913, vol. 1, xvii).

Although the particularism of loyalty is sometimes thought to be morally problematic, there is nothing in theory that prevents the particular group being the whole human race (pace Ladd). A universalist particularism can be found in some environmental contexts, when the future of humanity is up for consideration, or — as it was nicely illustrated in Mary Shelley's Frankenstein — when Victor Frankenstein decided not to jeopardize the human race by creating a companion for his monster (Shelley, 187). In contexts in which the human race can itself be viewed as a collectivity, loyalty to it may sometimes be attributed.

There is, perhaps, a deeper point to the view that the primary object of loyalty is “personal,” a point that may also help to explain why we are tempted to move from loyalty to people to loyalty to ideals. In identifying with the object of our loyalty, there is usually implicit in our loyalty a judgment that its object meshes with that for which we stand. That is, embedded in those associations to which our loyalty is given are certain presumptions about the compatibility of the basic values attributable to the object of loyalty with those for which we stand (not that the values themselves are what ground the loyalty, for that might suggest that the loyalty is to the values). To the extent that we discover it to be otherwise we have a reason for taking some action — either to try to bring about a change in the object of our loyalty (what Albert Hirschman calls giving voice) or to abandon it (Hirschman's exit option) on the ground that it has forfeited its claim to our loyalty. There may, of course, be some sort of persistence of loyalty despite a recognition that the object of loyalty is no longer worthy of it. In such cases, the loyalty seems to ride on some commitment to an associational ideal (“He will always be our son.”). Nevertheless, though it may sometimes appear to allow for attributions of loyalty to the supposedly embedded values, our loyalty is primarily to the affiliational object or person, and not to the particular values that it instantiates. The loyalty is to the object of an association or relationship, that is, the person or collectivity-in-relation.

4. Loyalty as a virtue

Mark Twain and Graham Greene (“the virtue of disloyalty”) notwithstanding, there is greater agreement that disloyalty is a vice than that loyalty is a virtue. Perhaps the frequency with which the demand for loyalty is used to “justify” engagement in unethical conduct has led to cynicism about its value. There is a certain resonance to the saying that “when an organization wants you to do right, it asks for your integrity; when it wants you to do wrong, it demands your loyalty.” What might it be about loyalty that makes it vulnerable to such uses?

There are those who, on the basis of their particular theory of virtue, deny that loyalty could be a virtue. Ewin, for example, argues that because loyalty can be badly placed and because, once formed, it requires us not merely to suspend our own judgment about its object but even to set aside good judgment (Ewin, 1992, 403, 411), its pretensions to the status of a virtue are undermined, for the virtues are, he argues, internally linked to some idea of good judgment.

There are two problems with this account. First, the understanding of the virtues is too restrictive. As with loyalty, conscientiousness and sincerity may be directed to unworthy objects, but conscientiousness and sincerity do not for that reason fail as virtues. Had Ewin given consideration to the view that virtues are not just practical dispositions that make possible and tolerable some form of common life, but that they do so in a particular way — by operating “at a point at which there is some temptation to be resisted or deficiency of motivation to be made good” (Foot, 8) — he might have been able to see how they could be accommodated within the catalogue of virtues.

The second problem has to do with the idea that loyalty may require us to set aside good judgment. No doubt something of that kind is attempted by those who seek to exploit loyalty (and other virtues such as generosity and kindness). But the well-established idea of a “loyal opposition” should give pause to the suggestion that loyalty requires complaisance or servility. Certainly, the loyal person does not normally address radical questions to the object of loyalty, but limits them instead to what is seen as compatible with that object's interests. But the radical questions need not be foreclosed, even if a well-formulated challenge is needed to generate them. If the setting aside of good judgment is sought, there is nothing to stop a person — albeit with a heavy heart — from questioning whether the object of loyalty may have forfeited claims to it. The trust that tends to accompany loyalty need not encompass gullibility and credulity.

The virtues are a mixed bag. Loyalty, like sincerity, conscientiousness, and courage, is better seen as an executive than as a substantive virtue. Executive virtues, “virtues of the will,” are those that assist us in carrying out our projects or what we may have a duty to do. We need them, even though they can come to be associated with inappropriate objects. Not only that, even when they are associated with appropriate objects they can go astray. Thus we can enter into bad relationships of a “legitimate” kind (such as friendships and marriages), and our continued loyalty to a once-worthy object may come to be unjustified.

There is sometimes a further question about whether loyalty, even if a virtue, should be seen as a moral virtue. Loyalty may be thought excellent to have — even a component of a good life — but is it essentially a moral disposition? The divisions among virtues (say, intellectual, moral, personal, and social) are, however, at best unclear and probably overlapping. Kindness is almost always morally commendable, but imaginativeness (often said to be an intellectual virtue), courage (usually categorized as a personal virtue) and reliability (sometimes called a social virtue) may be shown on the sports field or by enemy soldiers as well as in contexts that render them morally commendable. There may be no great value in attempts to differentiate loyalty (and other virtues) into firm categories. What is almost certainly arguable is that a person who is completely devoid of loyalties would be deficient as a person understood inter alia as a moral agent.

5. Justifying loyalty

There is a great deal of contingency to the development of loyalties. The loyalties we develop to family, tribe, country, and religion often emerge almost naturally out of the process of nurture as we become increasingly aware of the environmental factors that have formed us. Our identifications can be very deep, and are often unquestioning. For some writers, this unchosenness is what distinguishes loyalty from other commitments such as fidelity (Allen). But usually loyalty can be extended to consciously acquired commitments, as we choose to associate with particular people, groups, and institutions. Here again, the loyalties may or may not develop, depending on the extent to which those associations acquire some intrinsic significance for us beyond any instrumental value that may have first attracted us to them. Such explanatory accounts, however, do not justify the loyalties we form or may be inclined to form. Yet, because loyalties privilege their objects, the provision of a justification is important.

For some writers, the distinction between chosen and unchosen loyalties is critical. Simon Keller, for example, considers that our general unwillingness to question unchosen loyalties exhibits the lack of integrity often referred to as bad faith. Once we have such loyalties — he focuses on patriotic loyalties — we are resistant to their scrutiny and self-defensively discount challenges to them (Keller, 2005). There may be some truth to the view that we are more likely to show bad faith as far as our unchosen loyalties are concerned, but it may be difficult to offer that as a general comment on unchosen loyalties. There is no more reason not to call our patriotism into question when we see how our country is behaving than there is not to call a friendship into question when we see how our friend is behaving. It may be psychologically a bit harder, but that does not sustain a general judgment about unchosen loyalties.

Some have treated arguments for associational loyalty as though they were cut from the same cloth as general arguments for associational obligations. They have, therefore, embedded claims for loyalty in “fair-play” or “natural duty to support just institutions” arguments for associational obligations. But whatever the merits of such arguments as grounds for general institutional obligations, they do not provide grounds for the particularistic obligations that we associate with loyalty. They do not capture the particularity of such obligations. Even consent-based arguments are insufficiently particularistic. Leaving aside the possibility that our basic political or parental or other associational obligations may also include an obligation to be loyal, we may usually fulfil what we take those obligations to be without any sense of loyalty to their objects. Obligations of loyalty presuppose an associational identification that more general institutional or membership obligations do not.

  1. Of the various instrumental justifications of loyalty, the most credible is that developed by Hirschman. Hirschman assumes, along with many other institutional theorists, that valued social institutions have an endemic tendency to decline. He claims, however, that social life would be seriously impoverished were we self-advantageously to shift our associational affiliations whenever a particular social institution failed to deliver the goods for which we were connected to it, or whenever a more successful provider of that good came along. On this account, loyalty can be seen as a mechanism whereby we (at least temporarily) persist in our association with the institution (or affiliation) while efforts are made (through giving voice) to bring it back on track. Loyalty gives us a commitment to securing or restoring the productivity of socially valuable institutions or affiliations. To the extent, then, that an institution or affiliation provides highly desired or needed goods for people, they have reason to be loyal to it and, ceteris paribus, their loyalty should be given to the point at which it becomes clear that the institution is no longer capable of being recuperated.

But as valuable as loyalty may be for associational recuperation, it is not clear that we can link its justification only to its recuperative potential. For even within a generally consequentialist framework loyalty may play a more positive role. The loyal alumnus who donates $100 million to an already healthy endowment fund is contributing to institutional advancement rather than stemming institutional decline. In such a case the loyalty expresses a desire to further institutional interests rather than restore them. The donation is seen as an expression of loyalty because it expresses a commitment to the institution in the face of (presumably) more self-serving alternatives available to the donor. An outside philanthropist might, however, choose to donate the same amount, though not out of loyalty to the institution.

More critically, if loyalty is viewed simply in terms of the goods that it is able to secure or produce, the intrinsic value that the association has come to have for the loyal person is ignored, along with the sense of identification that it expresses. It is out of that sense of identification that loyalty arises. We return to this in (c) below.

  1. An alternative account is that loyalty is owed to various associations as a debt of gratitude. Although gratitude as a ground of obligation also stands in need of justification (McConnell), it tends to be more widely acceptable as a justifying reason than loyalty. The fact that we are the nonvoluntary beneficiaries of some of the associative relations to which we are said to owe some of our primary loyalties — say, familial, ethnic, or political — has provided some writers with a reason to think that it is gratitude that grounds such loyalties (cf. Walker, Jecker). But obligations of gratitude are not ipso facto obligations of loyalty: the brutalized Jew who was rescued by the Good Samaritan may have had a debt of gratitude but he had no debt of loyalty. Loyalty, moreover, may be owed where there is no reason for gratitude: as may be the case between friends. Obligations of gratitude are recompensive, whereas obligations of loyalty are associational.
  2. There may be a deeper reason for thinking that — in some associative relations — loyalty ought to be fostered and shown. It resides in the conception of ourselves as social beings. We do not develop into the persons we are and aspire to be in the same fashion as a tree develops from a seedling into its mature form. Our genetic substratum is not as determinative of our final form as a tree's. Nor do we (generally) flourish as the persons we become and aspire to remain in the manner of a tree. We are social creatures who are what we are because of our embeddedness in and ongoing involvement with relations and groups and communities of various kinds. Though these evolve over time, such social affiliations (or at least some of them) become part of who we are — and, moreover, our association with such, individuals, groups and communities (though instrumentally valuable as well) becomes part of what we conceive a good life to be for us. Our loyal obligation to them arises out of the value that our association with them has for us.

A broad justification such as this leaves unstated what associations might be constitutive of human flourishing. Perhaps there is no definitive list. But most would include friendships, familial relationships, and some of the social institutions that foster, sustain, and secure the social life in which we engage as part of our flourishing. To the extent that we accept that engagement with or in a particular form of association or relation is constitutive of our flourishing, to that extent we will consider loyalty to it to be justified — even required.

The arguments that justify loyalty do not ipso facto justify absolute loyalty, though they do not rule out the possibility that, for example, a person might legitimately, out of loyalty, lay down his life for another. That is often the case in wartime and may also be true of some friendships. The strength of the claims of loyalty will depend on the importance of the association to the person who has the association and, of course, on the legitimacy of the association in question. Not only may some associative relations be illegitimate, but the expectations of one association may come into conflict with those of another: we may have conflicts of loyalty. If the conflict is resolved by giving one loyalty precedence over another, it does not necessarily follow that loyalty to the one is disloyalty to the other. It is no disloyalty to a friend who is counting on me if instead I attend to my dying mother's needs. Sometimes such priorities will be straightforward; at other times not. Even if we decide unwisely (as did Robert E. Lee), our decision will not ipso facto count as disloyalty. Disloyalty is more often associated with the self-serving or hypocritical abandonment of loyalty.

Royce, who sometimes appears absolutist about loyalty, seeks to avoid the problems of absolutism in two ways. First, he construes the loyalty that he considers central to the possession of a life over which one is sovereign as some reasonably chosen cause: unchosen causes do not qualify as causes in Royce's sense. And second, he thinks that his overarching ethical principle, “loyalty to loyalty,” will exclude the formation of loyalties that manifest themselves in the invasion of other loyalties. But the formality of Royce's position gives little guidance as to the content of loyalties that won't interfere with other loyalties or even to some lexical ordering that would resolve potential conflicts.

6. Limiting loyalty

It has already been noted that it is not part of loyalty to be complaisant or servile, though loyalty may be corrupted into such. In any plausible account of loyalty as a virtue there must be openness to corrective criticism on the part of both the subject and object of loyalty. The “corrective” qualification is important. Not any opposition is permissible. A loyal opponent is not just an opponent, but one who remains loyal. What that entails is that the opposition stays within bounds that are compatible with the well-being or best interests or flourishing of the object of loyalty. Generally speaking a loyal opposition will not advocate (the equivalent of) rebellion or revolution for the latter would endanger the object of loyalty (and perhaps replace it with an alternative object of loyalty).

It is the commitment to opposition within (what are judged to be) the prevailing structures that has led some radical critics of loyalty (e.g., Agassi, Greene) to see it as — at bottom — a conservative virtue. It is conservative, though in a positive sense of that word: it involves a commitment to securing or preserving the interests of its object, an object that is or has come to be valued for its own sake (whatever else it may be valued for). Nevertheless, the existence of a loyal opposition does not preclude the possibility that a more radical opposition might and indeed should subsequently be mounted. If the loyal opposition proves incapable of “reforming” the object of loyalty, the exit option (or something stronger) might be taken. In such cases it could be argued that the object of loyalty was no longer worthy of it or had forfeited its claim to it. It is only if we mistakenly or misguidedly think of loyalty as making an absolute claim on us that a derogatory charge of conservatism against a loyal opposition will have any traction.

For heuristic purposes, we can probably distinguish a double focus for loyalty — on either a type of association (such as a state) or a particular instantiation of the type (such as the United States). Strictly, loyalty will be only to the latter, though it assists in understanding the limits of loyalty if we make the distinction. If the type of institution is thought to be critical to human flourishing, then loyalty to it will be expected. But if the institution is of relatively minor significance, the development of instantiations of it, along with loyalty to them, will be relatively unimportant (though not necessarily to those who develop such loyalties). Whether, for example, patriotism (that is, patriotic loyalty) is justified will depend in part on the importance to be accorded to a state or country. If we are social contractarians, then the state (broadly conceived) offers a significant solution to some of the problems of human association as well as an arena for social identification. We might think that both a state and loyalty to it are important. That, however, needs to be embodied in a particular state, and that state may be such that the loyalty it should garner is forfeited by how it acts.

Loyalty to a particular object is forfeited — that is, its claims for the protection and reinforcement of associative identity and commitment run out — when the object shows itself to be no longer capable of being a source of associational satisfaction or identity-giving significance. That is, the claims run out for the once-loyal associate. (Others, of course, may dispute this.) But whether or not loyalty is thought to be justifiably forfeited, the breakpoint may differ for different people. Consider the case of infidelity. For one woman, a husband's infidelity may be a challenge to the future of the relationship but not automatically destructive of it. The relationship will be considered reparable. The issues of trust that are involved may be addressed and the relationship repaired. But for another, such infidelity may collapse the structure in which the relationship has been housed. Essential trust will have been smashed like Humpty Dumpty.

Is there a right and a wrong in such cases? Does the first woman lack an appreciation of the “sanctity” of marriage/intimacy? Does the second fail to appreciate our shared frailty and the possibilities for redemption and renewal? We should probably not acquiesce in the relativistic view that what is right for one is wrong for the other. At the same time, however, there may be no easy answer. The two positions constitute the beginnings of a consideration of the nature of intimacy, what it reasonably demands of us, and how we should respond to transgressions of its expectations. The same may be true of other loyalties.

6.1 Whistle blowing

The issue of loyalty's limits is usefully illustrated by the phenomenon of “whistle blowing.” Although there is some debate about its scope, whistle blowing can be helpfully (if not fully) characterized as the activity of an employee within an organization — public or private — who alerts a wider group to setbacks to their interests as a result of waste, corruption, fraud, or profit-seeking (Westin; Bowman; Miethe). Because such employees are generally considered disloyal, it has been common to characterize them as traitors, snitches, weasels, squealers, or rats. “Whistle blower” offers a more neutral way of referring to such people, and permits an inquiry into the proper limits of employee loyalty.

The normative background to whistle blowing is a belief that employees owe loyalty to their employing organizations. Such loyalty will include an expectation that employees not jeopardize their organization's interests by revealing certain kinds of information to people outside it. If employees have grievances, they should be dealt with within the organization (“we wash our own laundry”). The case for whistle blowing, then, is driven by the recognition, first of all, that internal mechanisms often fail to deal adequately with an organization's failures, and second, that because the interests jeopardized by those failures often include those outside the organization, a wider group has a prima facie right to know of the costs that it faces or that have been imposed on it.

Blowing the whistle frequently creates significant disruption within an organization — it may lose control of its affairs as it is subjected to external inquiries and constraints; it may find itself crippled by costs or other restrictions; and many within it who are little more than innocent bystanders may suffer from the repercussions of an externally mounted investigation. Because the whistle blowing jeopardizes the organization's interests (at least as they are understood within the organization), whistle blowing is therefore seen as a significant act of disloyalty. Whistle blowers themselves will often argue that owed loyalty has been forfeited (or at least overridden), so that no disloyalty has been perpetrated.

A resolution to such conflicting assessments must address the issue of loyalty's limits and, in the case of whistle blowing, it must take cognizance of several considerations: (i) Because of the disruption it threatens, the whistle should be blown only as a matter of last resort. (ii) For the same reason the organizational wrongdoing should be sufficiently serious. (iii) The public complaint should be well-grounded — the reasons that support it should be strong enough to publicly defensible. (iv) A potential whistleblower should consider whether he or she has a special role-related obligation to take some action. Although any member of an organization might have some responsibility for what is done in its name, some members will be better placed to make appropriate assessments of seriousness and may be more responsible for the way in which the organization conducts its activities. (v) Because the purpose of blowing the whistle is to bring about change, the potential for the whistle blowing to be effective ought to be considered. (vi) It is sometimes argued that the act of whistle blowing needs to be appropriately motivated — it must at least be done out of concern for those whose interests are being jeopardized. This consideration, however, may have more to do with the whistle blower's praiseworthiness than with the justifiability of blowing the whistle. A morally compromised whistleblower, however, may find his or her credibility undermined and the exposé rendered ineffective.

Even if the foregoing considerations are satisfactorily addressed, there remains a question whether blowing the whistle is obligatory or merely permissible. As omissions, failures to blow the whistle must engage with debates about the moral obligatoriness of our acting to prevent harm. Even if it is morally obligatory, though, there may be reasons for not making whistle blowing legally mandatory. In addition, the potential costs to a whistleblower may excuse even legally mandated reporting of organizational wrongdoing (Glazer & Glazer; Martin). Even though legal protections for whistle blowers have been instituted in some jurisdictions, they have often proved inadequate (Glazer & Glazer).

Anonymous whistle blowing represents a possible solution; it opens the door, however, to whistles being blown for the wrong reasons or after careless investigation (cf. Elliston; Coulson).

In sum, the case of whistle blowing illustrates not only the importance of loyalty to many organizations but also the care that needs to be exercised when it is claimed that obligations of loyalty are justifiably overridden or forfeited.


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friendship | legal obligation and authority | Royce, Josiah


I thank Julia Driver and Thomas Pogge for their comments on a draft of this essay.