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Portrait of Josiah Royce (1914)
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of The Johns Hopkins University

Josiah Royce

First published Tue Aug 3, 2004

Josiah Royce (1855-1916) was the leading American proponent of absolute idealism, the metaphysical view (also maintained by G. W. F. Hegel and F. H. Bradley) that all aspects of reality, including those we experience as disconnected or contradictory, are ultimately unified in the thought of a single all-encompassing consciousness. Royce also made original contributions in ethics, philosophy of community, philosophy of religion and logic. His major works include The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885), The World and the Individual (1899-1901), The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), and The Problem of Christianity (1913). Royce's friendly but longstanding dispute with William James, known as "The Battle of the Absolute," deeply influenced both philosophers' thought. In his later works, Royce reconceived his metaphysics as an "absolute pragmatism" grounded in semiotics. This view dispenses with the Absolute Mind of previous idealism and instead characterizes reality as a universe of ideas or signs which occur in a process of being interpreted by an infinite community of minds. These minds, and the community they constitute, may themselves be understood as signs. Royce's ethics, philosophy of community, philosophy of religion, and logic reflect this metaphysical position.

1. Life

Royce was born November 20, 1855, in the remote mining town of Grass Valley, California, to Josiah and Sarah Eleanor Bayliss Royce. Sarah Royce was a devout Christian who headed a primary school in Grass Valley. Royce's mother and older sisters directed his early education. At age 11 he entered school in San Francisco. He graduated from the newly established University of California in Oakland with a B. A. degree in Classics in 1875. Royce then traveled to Germany to study philosophy for one year, mastering the language and attending lectures in Heidelberg, Leipzig, and Göttingen. On his return, he entered the Johns Hopkins University in Baltimore, Maryland, where he earned a Ph. D. in 1878.

He taught composition and literature at the University of California, Berkeley from 1878-1882. During this time he published numerous philosophical articles, as well as his Primer of Logical Analysis. He married Katherine Head in 1880. The couple had three children (Christopher 1882; Edward 1886; Stephen 1889) and remained married until Josiah's death. Not content in California, so far from the intellectual life of the East Coast, Royce sought help in attaining a new post from his acquaintances there. In his later ethical writings Royce would stress the centrality of action intended to realize a sound ideal that one has freely embraced. When offered the opportunity to replace William James during a one year sabbatical at Harvard University, Royce acted: he accepted the offer of half of James's salary, resigned his California appointment altogether, and moved his wife and newborn son across the continent in the summer of 1882.

In Cambridge, Royce commenced to work doggedly and in diverse areas. In January 1883 he arrived at an insight that proved fundamental to his philosophy: in order for our ordinary concepts of truth and error to be meaningful, there must be an Absolute Knower, an actual infinite mind that encompasses the totality of all actual truths and possible errors. This insight formed the core of his first major philosophical publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, which appeared in 1885. Royce received a permanent appointment as assistant professor at Harvard in that same year. (During his three decades at Harvard Royce would teach such notable students as T. S. Eliot, George Santayana, and W. E. B. Du Bois.) He taught full time, gave many public lectures, published his History of California in 1886, and a novel in 1887. In 1888 he experienced a nervous breakdown, from which he recovered after a sea voyage of some months' duration.

Royce was appointed Professor of the History of Philosophy at Harvard in 1892 and served as Chair of the Department of Philosophy from 1894-98. During these years Royce established himself as a leading figure in American academic philosophy with his many reviews, lectures and books, including The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892) and The Conception of God (1895). In 1898 Royce attended a series of lectures by Charles S. Peirce, "Reasoning and the Logic of Things," which significantly influenced his understanding of the relation between logic and metaphysics.

Royce delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures at the University of Aberdeen in two series, the first in 1899 and the second the following year. He regarded this as the opportunity to consolidate his years of hard thought and study, so as to produce a definitive and original statement of his metaphysics. The result was his two volume opus The World and the Individual (1899-1901).

The Gifford Lectures marked a turning point in Royce's life and thought. He had worked out his philosophical theories in minute detail. His public reputation as a philosopher was sealed (Royce was elected president of the American Psychological Association in 1902 and of the American Philosophical Association in 1903). The year 1900 apparently represented the culmination of his life's work. Royce was only 45 years old, though, and this culmination proved also to be a starting point for significant growth.

Reviews of The World and the Individual praised Royce's philosophical acumen but raised significant objections to his conclusions. Peirce, in particular, pointedly criticized Royce's use of logic. Royce set out to reconsider his central arguments and, at the same time, undertook an ambitious program of study in mathematical logic. In his teaching and publications after 1900, two philosophical strains came to the forefront. One was a growing reliance on formal logical and mathematical concepts as the basis for his metaphysical speculation (the first hint of this appears in the "Supplementary Essay" to the first volume of The World and the Individual). The second was an emphasis on philosophy as a means to understand the concrete phenomena of life: the nature of human society, of religious experience, of ethical action, of suffering and the problem of evil.

After 1907 Royce's emphasis on the relevance of philosophy for living took on a clear personal dimension. In that year Christopher, who had come with Josiah and Katherine across the continent as a newborn 25 years earlier, and who had graduated from Harvard at age 18, showed symptoms of severe depression and psychotic delusions. In 1908 his parents committed him to a state mental hospital with little hope that he would recover. In August of 1910 William James died, leaving Royce without his closest friend, neighbor and colleague. In September of the same year Christopher Royce died of typhoid fever, leaving Josiah and Katherine without their firstborn child. Royce had earlier stated his philosophy in a somewhat abstract and formal way, so that it might help him discover metaphysical truth. Perhaps under the weight of these later sorrows, Royce returned to his system seeking wisdom and understanding in addition to truth.

However that may be, and though he by no means abandoned systematic and theoretical philosophy, Royce began to write more about what today would be called "practical" or "applied" philosophy. His major work on ethics, The Philosophy of Loyalty, appeared in 1908. Later he would address ethics in even more practical terms, not as a philosophy but as an "art" of loyalty. He published a collection of essays under the title Race Questions, Provincialism, and Other American Problems in 1908; another collection, entitled William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, appeared in 1911. Four of the six essays in The Hope of the Great Community, written in the last year of his life and published posthumously in 1916, directly concerned global politics and the Great War.

Royce and James had always disagreed deeply concerning the proper understanding of religious phenomena in human life. When James delivered the Gifford Lectures in 1901 and 1902, he directed many arguments against Royce's idealism, though he did not there target his friend by name. James's lectures, published as The Varieties of Religious Experience, were a popular and academic success . Royce believed that James, who had never been regularly affiliated with an established church or religious community, had in that work placed too much emphasis on the extraordinary religious experiences of extraordinary individuals. Royce's first education was into a strongly Protestant world view, he always retained a respect for the conventions of organized Christianity, and his writings exhibit a consistent and deep familiarity with Scripture. He sought a philosophy of religion that could help one understand and explain the phenomena of ordinary religious faith as experienced by communities of ordinary people. There was a deeper difference between them, as well, and it centered on a metaphysical point. Royce's 1883 insight concerning the Absolute was at bottom a religious insight. Contrary to the open-ended pluralism and pragmatism of James, Royce was convinced that the object and source of religious experience was an actual, infinite, and superhuman being. Royce did not attempt to work out his religious philosophy until after James's death, however. In 1911 Royce finally composed the lectures that responded to James. These were published in 1912 as The Sources of Religious Insight. It is here that the theoretical and practical threads of his late thought began to come together. Royce himself said of the Sources: "It contains the whole of me in a brief compass" (Clendenning 1970, 570).

In early 1912, Royce suffered a stroke. During his recovery, he continued to explore the philosophy of religion outlined in the Sources, with an eye toward adapting these ideas specifically to Christianity. He also returned to Peirce's writings, seeking the solution to certain nagging problems in his own metaphysics. He found in Peirce's semeiotic, or theory of signs, the technical tools he needed to address both issues at once. The Problem of Christianity presents, in place of the earlier Absolute Knower, the concept of an infinite community of interpretation guided by a shared spirit of truth-seeking. This Universal Community, which constitutes reality, develops greater understanding over time through its members' continual development of the meaning of signs. Within this framework Royce endeavored to reconcile and explain many key Christian doctrines and experiences.

Though Royce lived only a few years beyond this late philosophical breakthrough, his last period brought the true culmination and flowering of his life's work. Besides The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity, notable available works include The Hope of the Great Community, his last Harvard seminar on Metaphysics (1915-16) and a series of lectures given at the University of California at Berkeley. These lectures at his alma mater were to have ended with a talk entitled "The Spirit of the Community." When the Great War broke out, Royce set this manuscript aside and sketched a practical proposal to use the economic power of insurance to mediate hostilities among nations and hence reduce the attraction of war in the future. War and Insurance (1914) was a daring political and economic proposal on behalf of the Universal Community.

Royce died on September 14, 1916. Though scholars now recognize the originality and strength of his last works, he was unable to respond to critics or to press his case for the last crucial innovations to his philosophy. His reputation was eclipsed as other philosophers used Royce's earlier writings as a foil in developing their own doctrines of pragmatism, realism, empiricism, and logical analysis. While scholars of American intellectual life have always acknowledged the historical importance of Royce's influence, recent years have brought a revival of interest in Royce's thought on its own terms. Royce's work is proving especially fruitful for theologians and philosophers interested in speculative philosophy and metaphysics, practical and theoretical ethics, philosophy of religion, and the philosophy of community.

2. Philosophy

Royce's early studies in Germany and at the Johns Hopkins University concentrated on the development of post-Kantian idealism. His philosophical work as a whole may be regarded as a committed idealist's effort to understand the place of finite individuals in an infinite universe, a theme that Royce captured most succinctly in his Gifford Lectures title, "The World and the Individual." This theme will serve as a touchstone in the following survey of Royce's work in metaphysics and epistemology, ethics and practical philosophy, religious philosophy, and logic.

2.1 Metaphysics and Epistemology: Idealism and Interpretation

Royce announced the beginning of his professional career with a novel defense of absolute idealism, "the argument from error." Kant had introduced the notion of a "transcendental argument" by asking what the world must be like in order for knowledge of the world to be possible. In The Religious Aspect of Philosophy Royce took the experience of error — a particularly compelling aspect of the phenomenon of knowing — as the starting point for his own transcendental argument. According to the correspondence theory of knowledge an idea (or judgment) is true if it correctly represents its object; error obtains when an idea does not correctly represent its object. It is indisputable that finite minds do sometimes entertain erroneous ideas. Royce pointed out that in such a case the mind must contain an (erroneous) idea and its (false) object, while simultaneously intending, or "pointing toward," the idea's true object. If the mind is able to intend the true object then that object is somehow available to the mind. How can it be that the true object is in this way available to the mind, but not known? Consider what happens in an ordinary example of error: if I think that my keys are on the table, but later discover that they are in my pocket, I do not conclude that my keys never existed as the object of my thought. Rather, I focus on an idea that I had all along — that my keys do definitely exist somewhere. The keys, their location, and all other facts about them are the true object of an idea. At the moment when I discover that my keys are not on the table, it becomes apparent that this true object was only imperfectly available to me. The fact that such error does occur indicated to Royce that the true object of any idea must exist, in a fully determinate or absolute state, in some actual mind with which my own mind is or may be connected. From the possibility of error, Royce concluded that there is an Absolute Knower, a mind for which all thoughts do correspond correctly and adequately to their true objects.

One objection to the argument from error is that another type of objective reality, some other sort of being external to one's finite mind, might explain the possibility of error just as well. Royce took up this objection in the first volume of The World and the Individual, which was subtitled "The Four Historical Conceptions of Being." In this extended argument Royce critiqued what he regarded as the main competing conceptions of objective reality so as to strengthen his case for idealism. The first conception of being Royce considered was realism, the view that the world exists entirely independently of our thoughts or ideas about it. The world is what it is, in short, without any reference to our thoughts. While this view has great common-sense appeal and does provide for an objectively existing sphere of being against which our ideas can apparently be measured, Royce pointed out a fundamental problem. Realism, so defined, introduces a radical metaphysical dualism. Between my ideas, and a sphere of being that by definition exists completely independent of those ideas, there is a gap that cannot be bridged. Realism posits an objective realm that is utterly independent and hence, strictly speaking, is utterly meaningless to thought. The theory of mysticism, the second conception of being Royce considers, likewise meets with problems. This view maintains that the real is the ineffable immediate fact that is present to the mind. Mysticism avoids the problem of an unbridgeable gap between idea and reality by completely denying any such gap. The difficulty here is that one cannot then distinguish between idea and reality. If reality is in the end the immediate content of my idea, then error in my idea of reality would simply appear to be impossible. The third conception of being, which Royce identifies with Kantian critical rationalism, is presented as a correct but incomplete view. Royce characterizes critical rationalism as the view that "What is, gives warrant to ideas, makes them true, and enables us to define determinate, or valid, possible experiences" (Royce 1976 [1899-1901], 266). The real is that which, in conforming to given universal structures or categories of experience, is capable of validating certain ideas. The connection between my ideas and an objectively existing sphere of being is clearly established: my ideas and that sphere both conform to the same categories of experience. The independence of objective reality, and hence the possibility of error, is likewise preserved: I may form an idea of a definite possible experience (e.g., that my keys are on the table) but then discover that reality does not validate my idea (I can in fact check the table surface and discover that my keys are not there). The critical rationalist conception is inadequate, in Royce's view, because it is restricted to describing the universal forms and possibilities of experienced reality. It cannot in Royce's view account for the concrete, actual individual facts that impose themselves in experience. These are simply and mysteriously "given" in the critical rationalist theory.

Royce endeavored to extend and complete critical rationalism in his explanation of the "fourth conception of being." To say that an idea intends its object means more than that the idea may be validated by a "possible experience." An idea in this respect embodies a purpose: that its meaning shall be fulfilled in experience. In Royce's view this requires a world that is more than the abstract or merely hypothetical content posited by the description of a possible experience. What is needed is a definite, actual individual being that exists "in an absolutely final form." Royce thus agrees with critical rationalism in saying that a true idea is one that may be fulfilled or validated by a possible experience. He argues further, though, that such a possible experience requires the existence of an actual being (e.g., the particular set of keys in my pocket) that is in principle capable of being experienced. It is this being, the actual individual, and not the mere possible experience of it, that is the object of knowledge and "the essential nature of Being" (Royce 1976 [1899-1901], 348). The "fourth conception of being" detailed in The World and the Individual provides the metaphysical background for the remainder of Royce's thought. It presents a view of the totality of Being as an actual Infinite Individual that is itself timeless, encompassing as it does all valid past, present, and future possible experience of fact. All finite beings, such as ourselves, are but fragments of this Absolute Mind or eternal truth.

In his last period Royce embraced what may be called a hermeneutic epistemology. While he still maintained the central notion that a true idea correctly represents its object, he arrived at a new understanding of the nature of representation. Earlier, he had rather uncritically taken "representation" to be a straightforward correspondence relation in which the idea merely copied its object. Under the influence of Peirce's theory of signs, however, Royce came to appreciate the creative, synthetic, and selective aspects of representation. The new semiotic conception is detailed in the chapter of The Problem of Christianity entitled "Perception, Conception and Interpretation." Knowledge is not at bottom merely the accurate and complete perception of an object, as empiricism would have it. Nor is it the accurate and complete conception of an idea, as rationalism maintains. Knowledge is instead a process of interpretation: the true idea selects, emphasizes, and re-presents those aspects of the object that will be meaningfully fulfilled in subsequent experience. Royce's "absolute pragmatism," like other versions of pragmatism, thus offers an alternative to rationalism and empiricism.

This revised understanding of knowledge as interpretation prompted, if it did not exactly require, a corresponding change in Royce's notion of the Infinite Mind whose reality was established in the argument from error. As long as knowledge is regarded as possessing perceptions or conceptions that correspond to objects, the Infinite Mind is naturally envisioned as something that "contains" the totality of all perceptions or conceptions. If knowledge is instead regarded as a process of interpretation, though, the Infinite Mind may be regarded as the mind that carries this process forward. Royce had long sought an explicitly non-Hegelian account of Absolute Mind. In The Problem of Christianity he was finally able to replace the old terminology of the Absolute with a description of an infinite Community of Interpretation. This community is the totality of all those minds capable of representing aspects of Being to one another or to their future selves. Royce summarized the metaphysical implications of this new view by saying "the real world is the Community of Interpretation… If the interpretation is a reality, and if it truly interprets the whole of reality, then the community reaches its goal [i.e., a complete representation of Being], and the real world includes its own interpreter" (Royce 2001 [1913], 339). In this late period Royce remained firmly committed to idealism. He renounced the notion that the Absolute is complete at any actual time, thogh, and instead preferred to think of the possible totality of all truth simply as the eternal.

2.2 Logic

Royce maintained an interest in logic throughout his career. His first published book was a Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, written for his students in California in 1881. A long piece from 1899, entitled "Supplementary Essay: The One, the Many, and the Infinite" and appended to the first volume of The World and the Individual, marks his first effort to support his philosophical theses using ideas explicitly drawn from modern logic and mathematics. His own proposal for a system of formal logic was published as "The Relation of the Principles of Logic to the Foundations of Geometry" in 1905; this work was extended in "The Principles of Logic" in 1914 (reprinted in Robinson 1951, 379-441 and 310-378, respectively). Among his last writings were a series of encyclopedia articles on logical topics: "Axiom," "Error and Truth," "Mind," "Negation" and "Order" (reprinted in Robinson 1951). Besides these and other published works on logic, thousands of pages of his unpublished and largely unexplored logical writings are among the Royce Papers at the Harvard University Archives.

It is clear that after The World and the Individual Royce was ever more deeply interested in logic and mathematics. Precisely how and to what extent his philosophical work was based upon logical and mathematical concepts, or how his logical writings might clarify and extend ideas developed in his other works, will require a much more comprehensive examination and analysis of the logical writings than has yet been undertaken. At this point, scholars interested in Royce's logic may refer to the selection of original works published in Robinson (1951) and to chapters 9 through 11 of Kucklick (1985). Such a line of research appears promising, if only because of the assessment by C. I. Lewis that Royce's system of formal logic, conceived as a "general science of order," may be preferable, for some uses, to that developed by Bertrand Russell and Alfred North Whitehead in Principia Mathematica. (Lewis 1916, 419).

2.3 Ethics and Practical Philosophy

That Royce's metaphysical solution to the problem of error was of broad relevance for the rest of his philosophy is clear: "The existence of error…must be explained as due to the same conditions as those which make possible finite life, evil, individuality, and conflict in general" (Robinson 123). Error is possible, according to Royce, only if there is an infinite being for which all intended objects could be realized. This Being (whether conceived as Absolute Mind or the infinite Community of Interpretation) also makes individual human life comprehensible. Royce's considerable attention to speculative metaphysics is complemented by his concern for the practical implications of that metaphysics. The infinite manifests itself in the realm of individual beings bound within the constraints of time, space, and finitude. Ethics and religion have their basis in this relation of the individual to the infinite real world, a relation Royce characterized in terms of loyalty.

2.3.1 The Philosophy of Loyalty

Near the end of The Philosophy of Loyalty Royce wrote:

Human life taken merely as it flows, viewed merely as it passes by in time and is gone, is indeed a lost river of experience that plunges down the mountains of youth and sinks in the deserts of age. Its significance comes solely through its relations to the air and the ocean and the great deeps of universal experience. For by such poor figures I may, in passing, symbolize that really rational relation of our personal experience to universal conscious experience….(Royce 1995 [1908], 179-80)

Royce's ethics is rooted in his analysis of the conditions necessary for an individual life to be meaningful. It is not enough that one's actions merely conform to the strictures of conventional morality — a trained animal might well fulfill such minimal conditions of morality. To lead a morally significant life, one's actions must express a self-consciously asserted will. They must contribute toward realizing a plan of life, a plan that is itself unified by some freely chosen aim. Such an aim and its corresponding plan of life could not easily be created by an individual out of the chaos of conflicting personal desires and impulses that we all encounter. Rather, such aims and plans are found already largely formed in social experience: we come to consciousness in a world that proffers countless well-defined causes and programs for their accomplishment. These programs extend through time and require the contributions of many individuals for their advancement. When one judges a cause to be worthwhile and freely embraces such a program, several momentous things happen. The individual's will is focused and defined in terms of the shared cause. The individual becomes allied with a community of others who are also committed to the same cause. Finally, a morally significant commitment to the cause and to the community develops. This commitment is what Royce calls "loyalty." The moral life may be understood in terms of the multiple loyalties that a person exhibits.

Just as the truth value of an idea is a matter of whether its intended object is fulfilled in reality, the moral value of actions is a matter of whether they are loyal, whether they tend to fulfill the community's intended aim. Loyalty is a necessary condition for moral validity; defined narrowly, as Royce prefers, loyalty may even be a sufficient condition for moral validity. Royce's narrow definition of loyalty, of "true loyalty," is intended to rule out loyalty to morally evil causes and the communities that serve them. Royce observes that the highest moral achievements throughout history have involved individuals' loyalty to ideals that promote the formation and expansion of communities of loyalty. Many of the worst deeds have also involved a high degree of loyalty, but this loyalty is directed exclusively to a particular group and is expressed in the destruction of the conditions for others' loyal actions, of those other persons, and even of one's own community and cause. Royce generalized the difference between true loyalty and vicious or "predatory" loyalty as follows:

a cause is good, not only for me, but for mankind, in so far as it is essentially a loyalty to loyalty, that is, an aid and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows. It is an evil cause in so far as, despite the loyalty that it arouses in me, it is destructive of loyalty in the world of my fellows. (Royce 1995 [1908], 56)

While every community hopes for the accomplishment of its central cause, and sees that cause's fulfillment as its highest achievement, Royce places particularly high emphasis on the phenomenon of loyalty to a lost cause. A lost cause is not in Royce's view a hopeless cause, but rather one that cannot be fulfilled within the actual lifetime of the community or any of its members. Many lost causes are rightly lost, of course: Royce would have recognized the Confederate States' defense of slavery during the U.S. Civil War as such a case. Besides such misguided causes, though, there are a number of legitimate causes that are, by this definition, "lost" simply in virtue of their scope and magnitude. Such causes are not hopeless, however. It is precisely these causes that establish ideals capable of evoking our highest hope and moral commitment.

Chief among these are the universal causes of the full attainment of truth, the complete determination of the nature of reality through inquiry and interpretation, and of the establishment of universal loyalty to loyalty itself. In practice, the formula of "loyalty to loyalty" demands that one's moral and intellectual sphere become ever broader and remain critical at all levels. All the communities we actually know, those we inhabit and identify with, are finite and to some degree "predatory" in Royce's sense. This is clearly true of small social cliques, isolated intellectual communities, parochial religious groups, self-interested unions and corporations, local political movements, and other such groups. Roycean loyalty requires one to scrutinze the aims and actions of such communities and to work to reform their disloyal aspects. The philosophy of loyalty calls us first of all, then, to create and embrace more cosmopolitan and inclusionary communities. It should be clear that this is only the first important step of an infinite process aimed at realizing the ideal of universal loyalty. Any actual community, whether it be the United Nations or a bickering family, will in fact fall short of perfect loyalty. When it does so, each must answer to the same critical scrutiny and calls for reform. There is no expectation that these high ideals of perfect loyalty, truth and reality will ever be fully realized. These "lost causes" are indispensible, in Royce's view, as the source of absolute norms for any community and its members.

Royce maintained that the logic of volition, pursued far enough, compels us to embrace precisely these lost causes as our own. In the course of his extended debate with James over the adequacy of pragmatism as a doctrine, Royce came to accept many of James's principles. One, inspired by James's well-known essay "The Will to Believe," is that any philosophical view is at bottom an expression of individual volition. Given the fact of our existence in the world, we must first decide how we are to approach that world, and then develop our philosophical theories accordingly. A second principle that Royce adopted is the pragmatist view of truth: truth is the property possessed by those ideas that succeed in the long run. Royce's main disagreements with pragmatism concern the way these two principles are typically understood. Royce maintains that although there are several possible attitudes of the will that one might adopt toward the world (including Schopenhauer's "will to live" and its opposite, resignation) only one — loyalty to the ideal of an ultimate truth — is correct. The other possible attitudes of the will are self-refuting. He accordingly refers to his own position as "Absolute Voluntarism" (Royce 2001 [1913], 349). Royce offers a similar argument concerning the pragmatist notion of truth (Royce 2001 [1913], 279). Explicitly adopting one of Peirce's concepts, Royce argues that to define truth using any conception of "the long run" — short of the ideal end of inquiry — is self-refuting. Given the apparent finality of this argument (which is, again, a variation of the Argument from Error) Royce calls his position "Absolute Pragmatism."

Royce's philosophy of loyalty resembles existentialism in certain respects. Notable among these are the notions that we come to moral awareness in a world of already established aims and social projects, that moral responsibility requires a self-conscious and deliberate individual choice to embrace particular causes, and that the highest forms of ethical conduct involve dedication and effort in service of a cause that offers no promise of final success. Royce differs from later existentialists such as Camus and Sartre, however, in several important respects. Royce would not accept their notion that human efforts are finally absurd, unfolding against a backdrop of a meaningless and indifferent universe. On the contrary, Royce maintains that the concepts of ultimate meaning and reality are powerful and legitimate forces in our lives. With existentialism, Royce recognizes the very real chasms that separate one person's feelings, thoughts, and will from another: the experience of another may be inscrutable. At the same time, though, he insists that we acknowledge the equally important fact that in ordinary social life minds frequently do work in concert. Groups of people often are unified in feeling, thought, and will by something that transcends any of the individuals present (Royce 2001 [1913], 239).

2.3.2 Theory of Community

Royce was one of the first American philosophers to recognize the important challenge of Nietzsche's moral vision, which celebrates those individuals who seek to exercise their autonomous will to a "socially idealized" power. Such heroic individualism, also associated with Walt Whitman, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and William James, proves unsatisfactory in Royce's view (Royce 1995 [1908], 41). Their inspiring ethical visions are doomed to ineffectiveness precisely because of their extreme individualism. "There is only one way to be an ethical individual. That is to choose your cause, and then to serve it, as the Samurai his feudal chief, as the ideal knight of romantic story his lady, — in the spirit of all the loyal" (Royce 1995 [1908], 47). These particular examples are meant to illustrate the essentially social character of loyalty in general: "My life means nothing, either theoretically or practically, unless I am a member of a community" (Royce 2001 [1913], 357).

One of the more striking features of Royce's philosophy is its emphasis on communities as being logically prior to individuals. As we have seen, Royce considers the notions of truth and knowledge unintelligible for the individual unless we posit an ultimate knower of objective truth, the infinite community of minds. The notions of personal identity and purpose are likewise unintelligible unless we posit a community of persons that defines causes and establishes social roles for those individuals to embrace. The concept of community is thus central both to Royce's ethics and his metaphysics. Not just any association or collection of individuals is a community. Community can only exist where individual members are in communication with one another so that there is, to some extent and in some relevant respect, a congruence of feeling, thought, and will among them. It is also necessary to consider the temporal dimensions of community. "A community constituted by the fact that each of its members accepts as a part of his own individual life and self the same past events that each of his fellow-members accepts, may be called a community of memory." Similarly, "A community constituted by the fact that each of its members accepts, as part of his own individual life and self, the same expected future events that each of his fellows accepts, may be called a community of expectation or…a community of hope" (PC 248). These common past and future events, which all members hold as identical parts of their own lives, are the basis of their loyalty to the community.

As discussed in connection with Royce's ethical theory, some communities are defined by true loyalty, or adherence to a cause that harmonizes with the universal ideal of "loyalty to loyalty." He refers to such communities as "genuine communities" or "communities of grace." Other communities are defined by a vicious or predatory loyalty. These degenerate "natural communities" tend toward the destruction of others' causes and possibilities of loyalty. Finally, beyond the actual communities that we directly encounter in life there is the ideal "Beloved Community" of all those who would be fully dedicated to the cause of loyalty, truth and reality itself.

Royce stresses that the sharing of individuals' feelings, thoughts, and wills that occurs in any community (including the Beloved Community) should not be taken to imply a mystical blurring or annihilation of personal identities. Individuals remain individuals, but in forming a community they attain to a kind of second-order life that extends beyond any of their individual lives. Where a number of individuals' loyalty to a cause is coordinated in community over time, Royce speaks non-figuratively of a super-human personality at work: a genuine community is united by a guiding or "interpreting spirit." The interpreting spirit may on occasion be embodied by a single person such as a leader or other exemplar, but this is not always the case.

2.4 Philosophy of Religion

Though his writings contain a great deal of insight that is relevant for a strictly naturalistic philosophy, religious concerns figure prominently from Royce's first major publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, to his last two, The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity. As has been indicated, the main focus of Royce's early work was metaphysical. In The World and the Individual he plainly identified the object of his inquiry as "the Individual of Individuals, namely the Absolute, or God himself" (Royce 1899-1901, 1:40). Critics of Royce's early works admired his metaphysical argumentation but found his conception of God wanting. Peirce observed that the Absolute Mind bore little resemblance to the God that people seek in churches — it is not the kind of being anyone would worship. James objected that if all our errors and sorrows are in fact reconciled in the Absolute, then finite persons would seem to be exonerated from ultimate responsibility for their actions: they might as well enjoy a lifelong "moral holiday." With The Philosophy of Loyalty Royce began to devote more attention to the practical questions of ethics and the philosophy of community. In his last works he drew upon the notion of loyalty to explain the nature of religious experience in human communities.

Royce states that "the central and essential postulate" of every religion is that "man needs to be saved" (Royce 2001 [1912], 8-9). Salvation is necessary because of a combination of two factors. The first is "the idea that there is some aim or end of human life which is more important than all other aims." The second is that "man as he now is, or as he naturally is, is in great danger of so missing this highest aim as to render his whole life a senseless failure" (Royce 2001 [1912], 12). Salvation comes in the form of guidance toward understanding and accomplishing the highest aim of life, so far as we are able. Given the limitations and fallibility of the human perspective, Royce maintains that this guidance must come from some super-human or divine source. Religion is the sphere of life in which finite human beings are able to get into touch with this divine source of wisdom and guidance.

In The Sources of Religious Insight Royce considers and rejects several common conceptions of religion before making his case for a religion of loyalty. His discussion of natural social life as a source of religious insight may be read as a critique of the "Social Gospel" movement. His consideration of reason is notable not for its familiar observation that reason is inadequate to religious knowledge, but for his pragmatist critique of the adequacy of mere reason even for scientific knowledge. Finally, his careful consideration and rejection of individualism in religion is a direct critique of the Jamesean view of religious experience. Royce employs his familiar dialectical method to make his case for religious insight through participation in the loyal community, the "invisible church" guided by a divine spirit and devoted to the highest ideals of goodness. In the Sources Royce offers a view of religion as common experience. It is "common" both in the sense that it does not primarily consist of the kind of extraordinary experiences that James emphasized, and in the sense that it is a fundamentally social rather than individual experience of reality.

2.4.1 Christianity

While the Sources concerns the nature of religious experience in general, The Problem of Christianity focuses on the question "In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?" (Royce 2001 [1913], 62). Royce's answer actually rejects the sort of static concepts and beliefs usually implied by devotion to specific creeds, including those identified with Christianity. While his view pivots on the Christian notion of divine incarnation, it is not the incarnation of God in Jesus but rather the incarnation of the Spirit in the living church that Royce emphasizes: "the Church, rather than the person of the founder, ought to be viewed as the central idea of Christianity" (Royce 2001 [1913], 43). The Christian church's primary importance, for Royce, is as a paradigm of community. He regards the Pauline church as the best exemplar of a graced community: at its best, the church strives to embody the guiding Interpreter Spirit, so as to become a Universal Community of Interpretation "whose life comprises and unifies all the social varieties and all the social communities which…we know to be real" (Royce 2001 [1913], 340). Doctrines and creeds may change; the particular institutions that identify themselves as churches may or may not actually be communities of grace. What matters in the end is the process of interpretation — the process of communicating and understanding one another in actual, imperfect, finite communities of grace bound together by loyalty and striving toward the ultimate and ideal Beloved Community.

Royce is critical of many historical churches because they have in his view lost sight of the spirit that ought to guide them. At the same time he would identify grace at work in many communities that are not self-consciously religious. He had great respect for non-Christian religions, paying especially careful attention to Buddhism (Royce took the trouble to learn Sanskrit, and The Problem of Christianity includes a very sympathetic presentation of Buddhism). In the end, however, Royce was a philosopher who worked within the intellectual context of Western Christianity. He maintains that only the Christian model of the loyal community successfully combines the true spirit of universal interpretation with an appreciation of the "infinite worth" of the individual as a unique member of the ideal Beloved Community, the Kingdom of Heaven (Royce 2001 [1913], 193).

2.4.2 The Problem of Evil

The problem of evil is a persistent theme throughout Royce's writings. He struggled with tragedy in his personal life and sought to understand it better through philosophy. As an idealist he also had to struggle with evil as a problem of metaphysics. Idealism maintains that all deeds and events are ultimately taken up and reconciled in a final perspective. This seems to suggest that the evil, sorrow, and pain that run through human life are illusory — or what seems even less comprehensible, that our experience of suffering is somehow good, that it is "all for the best." While some idealists have accepted these apparent implications of their metaphysics, Royce maintained that evil is a real fact of the world. He insisted that we confront evil as evil and not regard it as a means to attain a preordained but inscrutable Divine purpose. He sought to understand evil philosophically. In seeking that understanding he was not content to explain it away or to salve its effects by appealing to a clever theodicy.

Royce embraced a theistic process metaphysics that recognizes evil as a real force and suffering as an irreducible fact of experience. In "The Problem of Job" Royce addressed the traditional problem of evil: "Grant Job's own presupposition that God is a being other than this world, that he is its external creator and ruler, and then all solutions fail. God is either then cruel or helpless, as regards all finite ill of the sort that Job endures." If we consider that God is not a separate being, then "When you suffer, your sufferings are God's sufferings, not his external work, not his external penalty, not the fruit of his neglect, but identically his own personal woe. In you God himself suffers, precisely as you do, and has all your concern in overcoming this grief." Grief is not "a physical means to an external end," but rather "a logically necessary and eternal constituent of the divine life" (McDermott 1969, 843). Though Royce believed that events are collectively tending toward an ultimate reconciliation in the eternal perspective of the Beloved Community, they are not erased even in that ideal perspective. The events of life (joyful and sorrowful alike) persist, both as experiences of the individuals who undergo them and also as God's own experiences.

Royce does not seek to explain away or lessen the reality of evil: it is in his view a brute fact of being, an inevitable result of the world's existence in time. Given the fact of evil, the most important question concerns how we finite beings ought to respond to it. His answer is that we should adopt the attitude of loyalty to goodness and truth, which as real forces in the world are the metaphysical opposite of evil. The loyal member of a genuine community confronts evil and wills to overcome it through the very fact of loyalty to its opposite. Evil can never be eradicated — this is another way of saying that loyalty to loyalty is a lost cause. Though the success of this high cause lies in the unreachable future, the meaning of our response is manifest in our present lives.

Royce's powerful and original explanation of the doctrine of atonement in The Problem of Christianity details how the loyal community can best respond to human evil. The highest kind of transgression in an ethics of loyalty is treason, or the willful betrayal of one's own cause and the community of people who serve it. The traitor is one who has freely embraced a cause and joined with a community of grace in service of that cause, but who then culpably commits some act that undermines the cause and the community. Such a betrayal is but one step away from moral suicide: it threatens to destroy the network of purposes and concrete social relationships that define the traitor's self (Royce 2001 [1913], 162). Atonement occurs when the traitor and the community are reconciled, when they are both saved from the evil deed through some act of the will.

Royce finds traditional Christian accounts of atonement unsatisfactory. They do not adequately explain how both the traitor and the community are reconciled and saved in the human sphere. Much less do they explain the mysterious details of how atonement reconciles the sinner with God. The traitor who recognizes the magnitude of what has been lost through the act of betrayal lives in a state that Royce calls "the hell of the irrevocable" (Royce 2001 [1913], 162). Royce seeks an explanation of atonement that acknowledges the irrevocable nature of a deed that has been done, and which changes everything for the sinner and the community that has been harmed. "Penal satisfaction" theories of atonement simply do not speak to the sinner's situation: to be told that an angry God demands repayment or retribution for the betrayal, and that this price has been paid (by the violent death of Jesus Christ, or by any other sacrifice) does not repair the sinner's own devastated moral universe. The sinner "is dealing, not with the ‘angry God’ of a well-known theological tradition, but with himself" (Royce 2001 [1913], 170-71). Royce seeks a theory that first makes sense of the immediate human aspect of atonement. If one can be found, it may then be considered theologically. A theory of "penal satisfaction," which claims to answer theological questions but remains meaningless or mysterious in human terms, is simply unsatisfactory.

The concrete human evil of treason is that the traitor's loyalty to the cause, and with it the moral relations that bound the community together, have been broken and cannot be restored to their previous state. "Moral theories" of atonement account for change in the traitor's person but fail to explain how the "wounded or shattered community" can be repaired (Royce 2001 [1913], 175). Such theories, in Royce's account, explain that in contemplating Christ's willing sacrifice of his own life for the sake of the human community, the sinner experiences deep repentance and develops a new capacity for love of the betrayed community. The sinner's soul is purified and made better (Royce 2001 [1913], 172). Such a process may bring the sinner to realize the hellish magnitude of irrevocable treason. Royce points out, though, that such a process by itself does nothing to reconcile the sinner to the community or to repair that community. Such reconciliation and healing requires something more than a change in the individual's heart.

This brings Royce to consider theories of atonement that center upon the community's act of forgiveness. Forgiveness, as an act of the community and not the sinner, is clearly essential to atonement. Moreover, it involves a recognition of human frailty — not just the moral frailty of the sinner in question, but that of all humans. Forgiveness involves a recognition that anyone might commit such an act, that the cause of perfect loyalty is a lost cause. Even when it can occur, though, forgiveness does not restore the community to the innocent state of harmony and "unscarred love" that existed before the betrayal (Royce 2001 [1913], 177-78). Atonement moves the community and the traitor beyond the irrevocable deed of betrayal. This cannot be done by an act of forgiveness that returns the community and its relations to the way things were before. "The way things were" is irrevocably gone.

In its human aspect atonement occurs through an interpretive act that creates new relationships among the members, including the traitor, together with a new understanding and fresh embracing of their unifying cause. The act of atonement "can only be accomplished by the community, or on behalf of the community, through some steadfastly loyal servant who acts, so to speak, as the incarnation of the spirit of the community itself" (Royce 2001 [1913], 180). This person acts as a mediating third party between the traitor and the betrayed community. Things are not made the same as they were before through atonement, but are in an important respect made better — precisely because of the unique circumstances created by the original act of treason. Through the atoning act genuine community is restored and all the individuals involved may emerge as wiser, more resolved servants of their common cause. In this sense, Royce writes, "The world, as transformed by this creative deed, is better than it would have been had all else remained the same, but had that deed of treason not been done at all" (Royce 2001 [1913], 180).

Royce indicates that this insight about the human aspect of atonement provides the basis for a theological understanding of the atonement involved in Christ's teachings and death. He does not himself articulate the details of a theological doctrine of atonement, however. He states "the central postulate" of "the highest form of human spirituality" as follows: "No baseness or cruelty of treason so deep or so tragic shall enter our human world, but that loyal love shall be able in due time to oppose to just that deed of treason its fitting deed of atonement" (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). This postulate cannot be proved true, of course, but human communities can assert it and act upon it as if it were true. Christian doctrine, as Royce presents it, takes this same postulate as "a report concerning the supernatural works of Christ" (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). In The Problem of Christianity Royce had set out to answer the question "In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?" One form of his answer, based on this theory of atonement, is that communities can and should act upon the faith that, through the spirit of genuine community, atonement is always possible as a response to human sin and evil.


The most complete bibliography of Royce's writings is:

Works by Royce

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Related Entries

Bradley, Francis Herbert | Emerson, Ralph Waldo | evil, problem of | existentialism | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | idealism | James, William | Kant, Immanuel | Nietzsche, Friedrich | Peirce, Charles Sanders | pragmatism | process philosophy | rationalism vs. empiricism | realism | Russell, Bertrand | Sartre, Jean-Paul | Whitehead, Alfred North