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Ernst Mally

First published Thu Oct 13, 2005

The Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879–1944) is one of the most important representatives of Meinong's School. Though he is best known for his work on Meinong's theory of objects (Gegenstandstheorie) and for his development of deontic logic, he has also gained some notoriety for his German-nationalist convictions and his support of National Socialist ideology. On the one hand, Mally's contribution to Meinong's theory of objects is not a mere extension of his teacher's work, but rather a real alternative that, in turn, influenced Meinong's own conceptions. Moreover, he was the first philosopher to establish a formal system of deontic logic (see the entry on Mally's deontic logic), and though it was seriously flawed, it was a major undertaking and only recently received the attention it was due. On the other hand, some of Mally's later writings were particularly influenced by his sympathies for National Socialism. In what follows, we will identify and outline the various strands of his thought, and also address the delicate question of whether and how his sympathies for National Socialism affected his later philosophical work.

1. Biographical Sketch

Ernst Mally was born October 11, 1879 in Krainburg. Krainburg was then a town of the Austro-Hungarian monarchy, and today is the town of Kranj in Slovenia. After the death of his father in 1888, the family moved to Laibach, today Lubljana, the capital of Slovenia. There, Mally attended the Gymnasium (high school) from 1890 to 1898. At this time, Mally already formed a nationalist attitude, becoming a supporter of Georg Ritter von Schönerer, the leader of the Austrian “deutschnationale Bewegung”, a German national, anti-semitic, anti-liberal and anti-catholic group that demanded the “Anschluss” (annexation) of Austria to Germany even before the First World War. During his high school years, Mally developed a serious interest in philosophy, and in 1898, he started studying philosophy with Alexius Meinong at the University of Graz, Austria. There he also studied mathematics and physics, for he felt that this would enable him to achieve greater precision in his philosophical thinking and writings. During this time, Mally developed a special interest in formal logic.

Mally earned his philosophical doctorate in 1903, with the dissertation Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie des Messens (Investigations in the Object Theory of Measurement), which was published in 1904. Alexius Meinong was his supervisor. In 1906, he started teaching at a Gymnasium in Graz, yet stayed in contact with the university, especially with Meinong and the then already famous Laboratory for Experimental Psychology, which had been founded by Meinong in 1894. In 1913, Mally became Dozent with his Habilitation thesis, which was titled Gegenstandstheoretische Grundlagen der Logik und Logistik (Object-theoretic Foundations for Logics and Logistics) and published in 1912. Again, Alexius Meinong was his supervisor. During World War I, Mally served in the Austrian Army from 1915 to 1918. After the end of the war, he started teaching at the University of Graz, where he eventually succeeded to Meinong's Chair in 1925. He stayed there until 1942.

After the end of the Austro-Hungarian monarchy 1918, Mally became a member of the Großdeutsche Volkspartei, a German national and mostly anti-semitic party in the Austrian parliament, which agitated, like Schönerer and his followers, for Austria's annexation to Germany. In February 1938 Mally joined the Volkspolitisches Referat, an organisation with the goal to unite all Austrian nationalist movements (including the National Socialists), he also entered the NS Lehrerbund (National Socialist Teachers' Association). Two months after the annexation of Austria in March 1938, Mally became a member of the NSDAP. After his retirement in 1942, he lived two more years and died rather unexpectedly March 8, 1944.

Mally's philosophical work can be grouped in three stages. In a first phase, Mally was influenced by Meinong's theory of objects, but he tried to confront Meinong's ideas with new philosophical and logical developments, especially with the new results in mathematical logic. He also applied modern logic to laws of ethics in his Grundgesetze des Sollens (Basic Laws of the Normative). In the second period, Mally criticized essential points of Meinong's philosophy, creating thereby his own “holistic-dynamic view” of reality and meaning; he developed this in his book Erlebnis und Wirklichkeit (Experience and Reality). Finally, in the third phase, he deepened his views on logic, philosophy of science and value theory, and mixed some of them with elements of German National Socialism. We will present the most important of these topics in the next three sections.

2. Ontology and Logic

Mally was trained not only in philosophy but also in mathematics, and was influenced by Ernst Schröder, and later, of course, by Whitehead and Russell. He therefore learned how to apply modern logical methods to philosophical theories, and in particular to the theory of objects (Gegenstandstheorie) developed by his teacher Alexius Meinong as well as to the theory of norms in his development of deontic logic. We start with Mally's theory of objects.

Since many of the problems giving rise to the theories of objects are covered elsewhere in this encyclopedia, we restrict ourselves to a very short sketch of what led to Mally's contribution to that field. One of the main impulses for the development of theories of objects were the problems that arose in connection with intentionality. Mally's teacher Meinong followed Brentano in concluding that the distinctive and defining feature of intentional mental acts is that they are always directed towards something. That is, thinking, believing, intending, etc., all involved thinking, believing, or intending something. Meinong took this a step further by believing that we have to be ontologically generous when analyzing intentional mental acts: every such act is directed towards an object, even if sometimes that object does not or cannot exist. So, when we search for the fountain of youth or think about the round square (and conclude that the latter is impossible), Meinong required that there be such objects like the fountain of youth and the round square. According to Meinong, the former is an object (the waters of which confer everlasting life but) which doesn't exist, while the latter is an object which is round, square, and which couldn't exist. (For a more complete discussion of Meinong's theory of nonexistent objects, see the entry on nonexistent objects.)

This ontologically generous attitude seems to commit us to the acceptance of contradictory and incomplete objects: if we accept contradictory objects then we are at least dangerously close to tolerating contradictions (unless we take appropriate precautions), and if we accept incomplete objects, we deny the intuitively plausible Law of Excluded Middle, namely, that for any property P, an object either has P or fails to have P (tertium non datur). Meinong adopted one of Mally's distinctions for solving the first of these problems, namely, the distinction between nuclear (formal/konstitutorisch) and extra-nuclear (außerformal/außerkonstitutorisch) properties (cf., Meinong 1915, 176; Findlay 1963, 176). But later, Mally developed an even more profound distinction with which he was able to cope with the incompleteness problem as well.

Mally's first work on Meinong's theory of objects is the published version of his dissertation (Mally 1904). His own, mature theory of objects can be found in the published version of his Habilitation thesis (Mally 1912). (For a detailed comparison of the two theories, cf. Poli 1998.) Mally addressed the topic also in his later works, taking a critical point of view with respect to Meinong's as well as his own theory (Mally 1971). Mally's most important distinction was between an object's being determined (determiniert sein) by a property and an object's satisfying (erfüllen) a property. This distinction allowed Mally to speak of objects that are neither contradictory nor incomplete (with respect to satisfaction), although they may be contradictory or incomplete with respect to determination:

Every object satisfies a complete complex of objectives and is thus “complete” with respect to its actual determinations. But there are objects that are mere formdeterminates of certain (defining) objectives (without satisfying these objectives): such an object is only incompletely determined by its defining objective (which is an incomplete complex of objectives), and thus it has to be called “incomplete” with respect to its formal determination. Nevertheless, according to the first statement, it is complete with respect to the objectives it satisfies: since it satisfies the objective to be the formdeterminate of its definition, and it also satisfies everything implied by this objective. (Mally 1912, 76; this translation, and all subsequent translations, by the authors)

It would help to reread this passage with the following interpretative suggestions in mind. First, following Zalta (1983), it would help to to interpret Mally's notion of objectives (Objektive) in terms of the modern notion of a property, though the notion of attribute would also be appropriate. The linguistic expressions which signify objectives are just open formulas like ‘Px’, ‘Rxy’, etc. Therefore, in what follows, we use “property” instead of “objective”. Second, we can understand Mally's notion of satisfying an objective in terms of the modern notion of instantiating or exemplifying a property. Finally, let us replace Mally's talk of ‘formdeterminates’ by talk of ‘conceptual objects’. In contrast to ordinary objects, the essential form of conceptual objects is determined by certain properties rather than by the properties it may instantiate. Although we have made these terminological substitutions for interpreting Mally, we hope that the new terminology is close to Mally's original intent. So, using our modern terminology, we would say that conceptual objects are determined by properties and don't necessarily instantiate the properties that determine them. Each conceptual object is an object which is determined by a certain group of properties. Moreover, the property of being a conceptual object is one which implies that the objects which instantiate it are abstract in some important sense.

With this interpretation in mind, we can understand the above passage from Mally as follows. According to Mally, a group (complex) of properties determines a conceptual object and thereby ensures that there is such an object. E.g., the property of being triangular (alone) determines the conceptual object we might identify as the triangle. This object is conceptual because it is not the case that it is a specific triangle in the ordinary sense of the verb ‘to be’ (understood as a copula). Mally would say the triangle does not instantiate the property of being triangular. But since every object is complete with respect to instantiation, the triangle instantiates the property of being non-triangular. Indeed, this latter property is implied by the property of being a conceptual object. Or, to put it in a different way: the property of being triangular is excluded by the property of being a conceptual object — conceptual objects have no shape at all. (For the concept of inclusion (Einschließung), cf. Mally 1912, 4ff.) This results in the claim that the triangle is non-triangular, which is perfectly understandable if we understand ‘is’ in the sense of ‘instantiates’. Additionally, Mally offers us an algebra of properties that ensures that for each given property F there is an property non-F, i.e., its negation, which behaves in the usual manner (cf. Mally 1912, 14ff). For example, he implicitly assumes that instantiating non-F is materially equivalent to not instantiating F:

x instantiates non-F iff x does not instantiate F.

Now, if there were objects incomplete with respect to instantiation problems would arise, since the law tertium non datur would be violated. For example, if we ask the question, is the triangle right-angled, then the law of excluded middle tells us that either it is right-angled or it is not. Although the conceptual object identified above as the triangle neither is determined by being right-angled nor is it determined by being non-right-angled, it nevertheless instantiates the property of being non-right-angled. So, according to Mally, for every property F and every object x, the following holds:

x instantiates F or x instantiates non-F.

Each object, whether it is conceptual or not, either instantiates a property or its negation. The triangle instantiates the property of being abstract, but not its negation; it does not instantiate the property of being triangular, but it instantiates its negation. There is, of course, no object that instantiates both a property F and its negation non-F, since this would clearly be a contradiction.

On the other hand, there are objects, namely, conceptual ones, that are incomplete with respect to determination. So the following is a consequence of Mally's theory:

There is an x and there is an F such that x is not determined by F and x is not determined by non-F.

Note that this consequence of Mally's theory does not violate any logical principle because (a) being determined by F does not imply instantiating F, and (b) not being determined by F does not imply being determined by non-F. There are objects that are not determined by an objective F, but which are also not determined by non-F; as noted above, the triangle is not determined by being right-angled, but it is also not determined by being non-right-angled; the triangle is only determined by being triangular.

There are even objects that are determined by contradictory properties; Mally would assert the following:

There is an x and there is an F such that x is determined by F and x is determined by non-F.

The non-square square may be seen as such an object. But, again, no logical principles are being violated, because being determined by non-F does not imply not being determined by F, nor does its being determined by these properties imply that it instantiates them.

Conceptual objects can be incomplete and even contradictory with respect to the properties that determine them, but neither of these circumstances violates a logical law. Like ordinary objects, conceptual objects are always complete and consistent with respect to instantiation, and thus the laws of logic are respected. Now, these conceptual objects serve as the content of intentionally directed acts. Mally says that there may be no object that is instantiated by the properties we posit (setzen) in our judgments, but there is always a conceptual object that is determined by these properties. Intentional acts will never be deprived of their content.

We want to stress that ordinary concrete objects are not determined by any property, they merely instantiate properties. So, the current Pope, e.g., instantiates the properties of being human, being Catholic etc., but there is no property that determines the current Pope. On the other hand, there is the conceptual object which we could call ‘the Pope’ which is determined by being Pope. Indeed, Mally's view also allows us to talk about the Pope*, which is determined by all the properties implied by being the Pope. Understood this way, the Pope and the Pope* are neither human nor Catholic nor do they instantiate any other “ordinary” property. These conceptual objects are abstract, and are determined by being Pope, being human, and being Catholic, etc. The Pope is, like the triangle, a conceptual object (Begriffsgegenstand), while the (current) Pope is concrete and a living human being. (Note that we use the verb ‘to be’ in the sense of ‘to instantiate’, because we think that this suits best the everyday intuitions about the meaning of ‘to be’, understood as a copula.) Mally says “we grasp through the conceptual object at the object which instantiates a set of determinations” (Findlay 1963, 183). In our example, we apprehend the current Pope by way of the abstract conceptual object the Pope*, which is determined by all the properties implied by being the current Pope.

We see from the above that the existence of conceptual objects depends on which properties are accepted. If we assume with Mally that we have a full Boolean Algebra of properties then the only question left to be answered, is: what are the primitive properties? We can only make a suggestion inspired by the theory of intentionality here: the primitive properties are all the non-complex properties that can be posited by the subject(s). (For other English translations of crucial passages of Mally's work on his theory of objects, as well as a summary of Mally's theory of conceptual objects, see Zalta 1998.)

Mally's theory of objects has been acknowledged and validated in Zalta 1983 and 1988 (see also Rapaport 1978, for an informal development of something like Mally's view, though the ideas developed there are traced to Meinong, not Mally). Zalta utilizes Mally's ideas and conceptions in order to establish a full-fledged axiomatic theory of abstract objects that ensures the existence of these objects with the help of comprehension principles. Zalta also translated Mally's terminology into modern terms by formulating the distinction between an object x instantiating and being determined by a property F in terms of the distinction between x's exemplifying property F (‘Fx’) and x's encoding property F (‘xF’). Zalta calls exemplifying and encoding two (different) “modes of predication”. But there is some controversy as to whether Mally's distinction in two modes of predication can be reduced to the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties (recall, this is a distinction introduced by Mally but adopted by Meinong in his work). Dale Jacquette calls Mally's introduction of these two modes of predication “Mally's heresy” (cf. Jacquette 1989, 3). He tried to show that the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties is “more fundamental” than the distinction between two modes of predication in the sense that there is a reduction of the latter to the former but not vice versa (cf. Jacquette 1989, 5). However, Zalta showed (1992) that a reduction of two modes of predication to two kinds of property has not yet been developed. Moreover, Mally's theory (in modern guise) can cope at least with all the problems Meinong's theory can solve. Along these lines, Mally's student Findlay wrote, “[Mally's theory] removes many difficulties in Meinong's theory, without abandoning the general standpoint of the theory of objects” (Findlay 1963, 110).

Mally therefore established a real alternative to Meinong's theory of objects; his theory avoided different modes of being (such as Meinong's famous Außersein) as well as the duplication required by the distinction between nuclear and extranuclear properties. (In reconstructions of Meinong's theory, e.g., Parsons 1980, every predicate has both a nuclear and an extranuclear version, and this is avoided in Mally's theory.) Mally's theory, however, requires an ontology with a sufficient number of properties — enough to jointly determine all the conceptual objects we might use to cognize and conceptualize ordinary everyday objects.

In his later works, Mally criticized Meinong's “static conception” of objects (Mally 1935, Mally 1938b and Mally 1971). Meinong and many other philosophers shared and still share the belief that the world is constituted by completely determined elements or completely determined individual things and processes which taken together make up the universe. Christian von Ehrenfels (1859–1932), a student and friend of Meinong, doubted this view by pointing to the Gestaltproblem: when we consider a definite shape or Gestalt, the parts of the shape are determined by the whole. For example, the colored parts of the shape, when considered in their environment, differ from what they appear to be when each single part is presented to a spectator in isolation. Mally was influenced by this observation and added that such colored parts, in isolation, are no longer genuine elements of the whole, no longer determined objects. Thus, whatever we can experience is — as a whole — only vaguely determined: the borderlines of things become more or less blurred; sometimes they appear sharper as in the case of tools, sometimes more hazy as in the case of clouds.

According to Mally, reality objectively tends to a separation of individual things, but this separation can or will never fully be reached, but only approximated. In other words, ours is a world without exact individual things; instead it is a world with a dynamic nature, with many tendencies or strivings (Strebungen). In Mally 1935, there are many examples from everyday life which show that subjects do not primarily apprehend rigid or static individual things, but rather tendencies of events. For example, a portrait painting does not show how a person looks at a given point of time and place, it rather expresses a certain tendency by indicating a direction to which the painting “idealizes” the given status. Or, a plane surface of a lake reminds us of the geometrical concept of a plane figure, but actually the lake is only approximatively plane. In this sense, even the so-called natural laws are precise expressions of natural tendencies which are never fully realized. Mally writes, “No longer material elements, but probabilities (this is the tendency) of describable forms of happenings are the final apprehensible which can be met by researching reality” (Mally 1938b, 11; translation by the authors). This turn in Mally's thought is difficult to analyze, and we postpone further discussion of it until Section 3, where it plays a role in Mally's moral philosophy.

We conclude this section by noting again that Mally developed the first formal logical system of deontic logic, in Mally 1926. This system is described and analyzed in some detail in the entry Mally's deontic logic. This entry explains how Mally introduced an operator (!) to form statements of the form “It ought to be the case that A” (‘!A’), and how the logical axioms of his system implied the following, problematic claim:

!A ↔ A

This scheme states that something is obligatory if and only if it is the case. In other words, in Mally's system, the obligatory and the factual collapse. This, of course, is totally unacceptable. The first one to show this was Karl Menger in 1939. Further discussion of Mally's deontic logic can be found in Morscher 1998, as well as in the entry cited above, i.e., Lokhorst 2004. We would like to reiterate Lokhorst's claim that despite the flaw in Mally's deontic logic, his “pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt”.

3. Ethics: Norms and Values

In Mally's post-Meinongian philosophy, which he called ‘Sinnphilosophie’, he finds a moral meaning in all the strivings that take place in the world and concludes that these meanings can be experienced by a certain faculty which each person possesses, namely, her moral will. Like every object in reality, every act strives to realize its inherent meaning. Every striving contains a meaning and is therefore meaning-directed. For Mally, there is intrinsic value in whatever fulfills or fosters a striving (Mally 1938a, 29). These strivings are part of the dynamic structure of the universe that modern science cannot grasp with its methods, categories, and concepts. However, in early cultures, where mythology and magic played an important role, as well as in early childhood, nature and morals are experienced as a unified whole: natural law and moral law are one and the same (Mally 1935, 57, also 74). Given that the intrinsic values of the various strivings are not all equal in weight, a (partial) order on strivings emerges when we consider the overall fabric of strivings in the world, namely, the partial order determined by their intrinsic values. Thus, e.g., fostering the common welfare is always more valuable than supporting the individual good. So, we see that Mally believes in an objectively given order of values in this dynamic-holistic structure. Yet he does not believe in a metaphysical realm of values like Max Scheler or Nicolai Hartmann, and he rejects “ideal forms” or Platonic “ideas”.

Moral philosophers have always been trying to find a formula that expresses the universal law of morality. Yet it is not at all clear that such a principle exists. Mally identifies two main obstacles to this endeavor in the history of moral thinking: (1) the subjectivist view of morality, and (2) the formalist-intellectualist perspective of a universal moral formula (Mally 1938a, 27). According to Mally, (1) is in fact a denial of morality, because the subjectivist mistakenly identifies what is ethically right with what is subjectively useful. However, what appears to be useful may vary from person to person and must therefore not be confused with the genuine moral will, which is supposed to be the same for everyone. This genuine moral will may be expressed by “Follow your conscience”, which is not subjectivist, Mally claims, because it does not rely on what is subjectively useful. Moreover, reliance on one's own conscience does not diminish the personal responsibility of the agent, since each decision that is guided by the conscience is a personal one. However, the guideline ‘Follow your own conscience’ is not a moral rule from which we can infer the correct action in specific situations. (2) There is in fact no single rule that could do that. Morality essentially consists in personal, independent and autonomous decisions, guided by our individual conscience, and so there is no formula by which we can rationally calculate in advance what we ought to do in a given situation of a specific type. Even if there were such a formula, it would not make individual decisions superfluous, since we would still have to follow our conscience.

We are not allowed to shift last decisions on to a universal principle, this is not even possible. (Mally 1935, 75).

Morality is always the striving after the most perfect meaning and its best exemplification. (Mally 1935, 77).

Therefore, Mally's view is that we are responsible for each intentional act, and that in each intentional act, we must evaluate the situation anew and act in such a way so as to preserve and enhance the whole fabric of meaning (das Sinnganze). We take on this responsibility, to act in accordance with the dynamic structure of the world, each time we are faced with a moral decision. Thus, according to Mally, there are no universally valid principles of morality, but nevertheless there is an objective moral duty. (It is of interest that Mally asserts that there is a parallel between knowledge and morals: just as there are no universally valid moral principles, he thinks there is no non-empty criterion of truth [Mally 1935, 75].)

Mally reads the dictum, “Follow your conscience” as “Act in the way that you recognize as right according to the best of your knowledge and conscience” (Mally 1938a, 27). Our conscience is our best guide to the objective ordering of values on the strivings in dynamic reality. Human willing and acting in the factual world is, again, a kind of striving, meaning-directed and individually exemplified. Since reality is conceived of as a meaningful structured world order, a moral rule or norm refers to that whole of meaning. The above quoted general moral duty is nothing more than a reminder that humans have to apprehend what is essentially required by the meaning of a certain situation and decide accordingly.

For Mally, morality can be connected with the divine, where this can be understood either in a religious or secular way. For the religious person, morality is a matter of religion, because religion is necessarily linked to morality. For the secular person, morality requires as its supreme task that one care for others rather than think of oneself. This striving beyond one's own person is again a part of the meaning inherent in the dynamic structure of reality. Moral behavior is always related to fellow humans. Doing the right thing is not just a private matter for oneself or one's immediate circle of family, friends and neighbors. No human belongs to himself or to just the people surrounding him in life. He belongs to everyone, foremost to the community, Mally asserts, and to the reality of the world: “The world is beautiful in him, just like a tree blossoms in each of its flowers” (Mally 1935, 77). Pursuing this responsibility makes the person a microcosmos, and by discharging this responsibility humans can be partially connected with the divine. “The most original feature of a human being and her deepest personality shine magically through in the case of love, a loved person is always experienced as a miracle” (Mally 1935, 62).

This is a rough sketch of Mally's Sinnphilosophie and its ethical implications. It should be noted that parts of the above doctrine can be exploited and misused by ideologies. In Mally's case, it is fairly obvious that the holistic idea of a structured world order can be misapplied to the “Aryan race”, which was seen as the salient community by Nazi ideology. As his pupil Karl Wolf noted already, a clearer picture of the doctrine could be worked out from Mally's unpublished work. But Wolf himself pursued some of his teacher's thoughts on moral norms and values and published them after the Second World War — stripped from all of Mally's misguided ideological intentions (Wolf 1947).

Karl Wolf attempts to explicate Mally's dynamic-holistic world view and its central notion of strivings, so as to avoid its possible misinterpretations. In his book Ethische Naturbetrachtung: eine Philosophie modernen Naturgefühls (An ethicist looks at nature: A philosophy of a modern experience of nature), Wolf applies a modified and extended version of Mally's view to a number of moral issues (Wolf 1947, 74–87, chapter 11: Realistic Ethics). Wolf emphasizes the fact that humans are driven to develop themselves in certain directions (= Mally's strivings or tendencies). As each individual pursues his own course in life, the diverse tendencies among different individuals may easily cause serious conflicts. Compromise is therefore in order, because our individual pursuits can be harmonized in many ways. For example, when person A maintains a standard of living that is far above the community, then two things often happen: the members of the community become envious (and may develop animosity towards A), and at the same time, it A's ability to resist the community's attempt to obtain a share of A's resources is weakened. A historical example can be found with the ancient Romans. When Rome defeated Carthage in 216 BCE, a compromise in the form of a peace treaty would have been helpful for both sides: “Compromise is the motto of nature” (Wolf 1947, 76). The lack of such a compromise engendered animosity on the part of the Carthaginians and this eventually helped create the conditions which led the decline of the Roman empire. Wolf suggests that Mally takes the following to be a law of morality, namely, that the harmonization of different human pursuits will always, in the end, be balanced. Though we may be tempted to resist the harmonization processes leading to a balance, those in a position of power have an obligation and responsibility to see to it that balance is achieved between the strong and the weak, the rich and the poor, the educated and uneducated, etc.

On Wolf's analysis of Mally's view, ethics does not deal with either altruism or egoism. “Act always altruistically” is not a morally correct rule (Wolf 1947, 75) because anyone repeatedly acting altruistically become less able to do so over time. Such a course of action would weaken the individual and, in the end, it would become impossible for that individual to help others. Nor is unchecked egoism correct, because it is traditionally thought that the egoist ultimately harms himself; if you fail to take into account the circumstances of the people around you, you make it more likely that your actions will harm yourself as well as your neighbors. Moral rules which are in conflict with the moral rules of one's neighbor make it impossible for the community to live in harmony. Thus, a balance is demanded as a rule of nature, and in particular, a compromise is needed between one's own development and the strivings of the surroundings. This idea is also applicable to education: the stronger parent helps the weaker child, thereby creating a balance within the whole of strivings of both involved. “Every tendency is basically good when it remains within the order of the whole, and every tendency, even the most ideal, becomes evil, when it transgresses the order” (Wolf 1947, 78). For this reason, many exaggerated forms of morally good tendencies like altruism, courage, compassion, even of truthfulness, also exaggerations in the sexual realm or in the arts, can sometimes rise to the level of perversions. Thus, a balance is morally required with a view to the dynamic order of the whole. (For further discussion of Wolf's adaption of Mally's views, see Zecha 2001.)

4. Philosophy and National Socialist Ideology

Though Mally was an analytic, scientifically oriented philosopher who produced original contributions in various fields of philosophy, it is a fact that National Socialist ideas and principles inspired some of his later philosophical works. He presents us with a case where, in certain parts of his work, it is not easy to separate his private political convictions from the content. Nevertheless, it is important to stress that many of Mally's works are free from any untoward political influences, and their philosophical value should in no way be diminished by his political views. But, of course, there are works that do contain National Socialist ideology. We will outline the grades of National Socialist involvement in Mally's work below, but first we present a short sketch of Mally's central Nationalist Socialist (‘NS’) theses.

In NS ideology, the concept of das Volk (the people), especially das deutsche Volk (the German people) plays a central role. From the early 1930s on, Mally tried to provide a philosophical justification for the value judgments (1) that das Volk is more important than its individual members, and (2) that the Germans constitute the dominant people. He further stated an Anti-Reduction Thesis, namely, that das Volk cannot be reduced to its members (the individual persons). He thus wanted to “fight against subjectivist, Jewish-positivist and related doctrines … and replace them by something healthier” (from Mally's curriculum vitæ, dated September 23, 1938, six months after the Anschluss; unpublished, University of Graz Library/Nachlass-Sammlung). This fact also explains why Mally saw himself in opposition to the Vienna Circle and the logical positivists, who he thought of as being the prime exponents of the “individualist ideology” — an ideology which (according to Mally) tries to deprive the world of its meaning (Sinn). Mally saw das Volk as a “quasi-person”, having a body, a mind, and a soul; das Volk can not be completely rationally comprehended, it rather has to be experienced (erlebt). He maintains that the “essential reality” of das Volk is revealed through this experience, i.e., its meaning, and thus, the meaning of its “dynamic development” is revealed. Furthermore, different Völker (peoples) have different properties, depending on their origin, their development, culture, etc. These properties allegedly yield a significantly moral difference: the German people are supposed to rank among the peoples with the highest value and have therefore to be kept “pure”. External influences have to be eliminated, so that das deutsche Volk can be “bred” to even higher states of development, and thus gradually strive towards a state where its meaning can be totally fulfilled (cf. Mally 1934, 1935 and 1938a).

From any reasonable perspective today, these claims are either barely understandable, or simply false. His theses, or rather their consequences, reflect Nazi ideology. In any case, much of what we find in the writings just described has nothing to do with serious and solid philosophy. For a detailed presentation of Mally's NS views, consult Sauer 1998; it describes other NS theses occurring in Mally's work. Sauer provides a number of quotes from, and references to, Mally's writings and private correspondence, as well as a critical evaluation. Sauer condemns Mally's entire later philosophical work as not being worthy of any further investigation. While this is true of the theses mentioned above, we want to stress that several of Mally's later works do contain valuable philosophical contributions, despite the fact that some of them also contain sections that can easily be interpreted in terms of NS ideology.

If we summarize the NS involvement in Mally's writings between 1904 and 1944, we may distinguish three different grades, not in chronological order. Grade 1 is “NS-ideology free”. These are purely philosophical writings such as Mally 1904, Mally 1912, Mally 1923 and Mally 1926. In grade 2, we count philosophical writings partially interpretable by, and applicable to, Nazi ideology, such as Mally 1935 and Mally 1940. Finally, we can count as grade 3 the pure Nazi propaganda in articles or pamphlets such as Mally 1934 and 1938a.

As we have shown above, Mally's ideas, concepts and theories are still being discussed in contemporary philosophical research. This short overview should make clear that there are many parts in Mally's writings that deserve serious further philosophical investigation.


For a complete bibliography of Mally's writings, see Wolf/Weingartner 1971, pp. 325–331. All quotations originally in German were translated by the authors.

A Selection of Mally's Writings

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Brentano, Franz | existence | intentionality | logic: deontic | Mally, Ernst: deontic logic | Meinong, Alexius | nonexistent objects | possible objects