Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Sep 4, 1996; substantive revision Fri Sep 16, 2005

Aquinas (Summa Contra Gentiles, III) says “those things are properly called miracles which are done by divine agency beyond the order commonly observed in nature (praeter ordinem communiter observatum in rebus).” A miracle, philosophically speaking, is never a mere coincidence no matter how extraordinary or significant. (If you miss a plane and the plane crashes, that is not a miracle unless God intervened in the natural course of events causing you to miss the flight.) A miracle is a supernaturally (divinely) caused event - an event (ordinarily) different from what would have occurred in the normal (“natural”) course of events. It is a divine overriding of, or interference with, the natural order. As such, it need not be extraordinary, marvelous or significant, and it must be something other than a coincidence, no matter how remarkable — unless the “coincidence” itself is caused by divine intervention (i.e., not really a coincidence at all). Miracles, however, are ordinarily understood to be not just products of divine intervention in the natural order, but extraordinary, marvelous and significant as well. Thus, Aquinas says a miracle is “beyond the order commonly observed;” and Dr. Eric Mascall says that the word “miracle” “signifies in Christian theology a striking interposition of divine power by which the operations of the ordinary course of nature are overruled, suspended, or modified” (Chamber's Encyclopaedia).

The locus classicus for modern and contemporary philosophical discussion of miracles is Chapter X (“Of Miracles”) of David Hume's Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding, first published in 1748. He says “A miracle may accurately be defined, a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the deity, or by the interposition of some invisible agent” ( Enquiries, p. 115n). His slightly different definition of a miracle as “a violation of the laws of nature” appears to be central to his argument against justified belief in miracles. “A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature; and as a firm and unalterable experience has established these laws, the proof against a miracle, from the very nature of the fact, is as entire as any argument from experience can possibly be imagined” (Enquiries, p. 114).

Miracles and Laws of Nature

Hume's argument against justified belief in miracles, as well as much subsequent discussion, appears to depend heavily upon the premise that “a miracle is a violation of the laws of nature.” However, the actual role such a premise plays in Hume's argument, and whether Hume meant to define a miracle as a violation of a law of nature, or merely to characterise a miracle as, in some epistemologically relevant sense, “contrary” to the ordinary course of nature is controversial. It is clear, however, that on most commonsense, philosophical, or “scientific” accounts of what a law of nature is, technically speaking miracles are not violations of such laws but instead are positive instances of those laws. This is because laws of nature do not, and are not meant to, account for or describe events with supernatural causes - but only those with natural causes. Once some event is assumed to have a supernatural cause it is, by that very fact, outside the scope of laws of nature altogether and so cannot violate them. Only if one disregards the possibility of supernatural causes can known exceptions to laws possibly be regarded as violations of laws. However, in such a case there might be better reason to suppose that the exception simply shows that what was taken to be a law is not really a law, rather than that the exception is a violation of a genuine law of nature.

If the explanation I offer of Hume's argument against justified belief in miracles is correct (see the section below “Hume's Argument Against Justified Belief In Miracles”), then the premise that “a miracle is a violation of a law of nature” plays no significant role in his argument. The premise is a gloss for the underlying supposition that one cannot have an “impression” of a supernatural event. Because no such impression can be had, any allegedly miraculous event, simply because it is allegedly miraculous, cannot ex hypothesis be judged relevantly similar to any other event in experience. And any event that cannot be judged relevantly similar to others in our collective experience, cannot justifiably be believed to have occurred in accordance with Hume's principles of a posteriori reasoning. (Nor, can one justifiably believe that such an event will occur with any degree of probability whatsoever.) Before examining Hume's argument it is worth examining in detail the view that a miracle is a violation of a law of nature — an issue that far too much has been written about.

Hume is the pre-eminent proponent of the “regularity theory of causation.” In characterizing regularity theories of causation, Tom Beauchamp (1974: 36) says,

The modern claim is that universality and not objective necessity is that which is central to the concept of cause and also that which is implicit in any use of causal terminology. The philosophical problem of causation has thus largely come to be interpreted in this regularity tradition as the problem of the proper analysis of causal laws. Regularity exponents analyze laws as true, contingent, universal generalizations which are omnispatially and omnitemporally unrestricted in scope. Purported necessary connections between the antecedent and consequent events described in the law are regarded as gratuitous.

In fact, Beauchamp's view of the “modern claim” is problematic and the problem concerning a proper analysis of causal laws has not been resolved. But let us suppose that on Hume's view the conditions Beauchamp cites are sufficient for a statement to be a law of nature. That is: A statement L is a law of nature only if (i) L is contingent, (ii) L is general, and (iii) L is true. Given these constraints, consider the following two questions.

  1. Is there a law such that there might have been an event contrary to it?
  2. Can there be a law L that is violated while a law?

Given the above criteria for laws of nature, the answer to question 2 is “no.” If an event occurred that fell within the scope of the laws of nature (i.e. was covered by those laws), but conflicted with the statement of the law, then either L would not be true, or else L would not be “general” — and therefore not a law of nature. The statement that the event occurred would be logically incompatible with the statement of the law of nature. Specifically it would be incompatible with the law whose status as a “law” is undermined because its truth or generality requirements are not met. If the event occurred, and we could know that it occurred and was “natural” (i.e. within the scope of the law), then we could no longer accept L as a genuine law. If laws of nature were descriptive of the scope and substance of everything that could logically happen, instead of their scope being limited to what can happen naturally (i.e., apart from supernatural interference), then of course miracles would not be possible. But that which is “physically impossible” — impossible within the constraints of the laws of nature — has a narrower scope than that which is logically possible. Apart from an argument to the contrary one need not assume that the logically and physically impossible are coextensive. To regard an event a natural is to regard it as falling within the scope of laws of nature, and anything that is covered by laws of nature cannot, ex hypothesis, violate them. Suppose an event assumed to be natural occurred, it really was natural and one could know that it did violate some alleged law of nature — no mistake was being made. Then this would show that the law it allegedly violated was in need of revision and was therefore not a genuine law at all.

However, suppose the laws of nature are regarded as non-universal or incomplete in the sense that while they cover natural events, they do not cover, and are not intended to cover, nonnatural events such as supernaturally caused events if there are or could be any. Then there is no contradiction in supposing that a physically impossible event could occur. A physically impossible occurrence would not violate a law of nature because it would not be covered by (i.e., within the scope of) such a law. So while the answer to question 2 is “no,” this does not rule out the possibility of supernatural interference with the natural — perhaps as Robert Young (1972) suggests, as one causal condition among many necessary for an event's occurrence. What it does rule out is understanding this interference as a violation of the laws of nature in a technical sense. But this does not undermine the possibility of a miracle since the crucial element in the notion of a miracle — a “a supernatural interference with the natural order” — is not ruled out in showing that a miracle cannot really (strictly) be a violation of a law of nature.

If a miracle is not a violation of a law of nature, then how is it to be defined in relation to laws of nature? Question 1 above suggests a solution. A miracle can be defined as an event contrary to, but not a violation of, a law of nature. If “violation” is not being used in a technical sense, then a miracle can still be described as a violation of a law of nature — where “violation” would mean something like “contrary to what could have happened had nature been the only force operative. ” An event may be contrary to a law of nature without thereby invalidating it if it is caused by nonnatural forces - or in epistemic terms, if its occurrence can only be correctly explained in terms of nonnatural forces. A positive answer to question 1 follows from the fact that laws of nature do not describe, nor are they intended to describe, the logically possible. They only describe the physically possible. There is also a sense in which the positive answer to question 1 follows from the contingency of laws of nature. But his is not the sense that interests us. Even if the laws of nature were logically necessary, there could be events contrary to those laws if it is assumed that the scope of those laws is limited.

A violation of a law of nature by natural means is what one wants, normatively, to hold as a contradiction in terms — assuming insistence on generality (i.e., nonlocal empirical terms) in the statement of the law. One does not want to hold the occurrence of an event contrary to a law of nature due to nonnatural means as a contradiction in terms — at least not on the basis of an analysis of laws of nature. To hold this position, an analysis of laws would have to be combined with an argument against the possibility of nonnaturally caused events. (This is more or less what occurs in Hume's argument. Hume's empiricism and his theory of meaning are the basis of at least an implicit argument, employed by Hume, against the possibility of the supernatural in his discussion of miracles.) To say that miracles are impossible because violations of laws of nature are impossible is to improperly assume either (1) that a miracle must involve a violation of a law; or (2) that nothing contrary to a law of nature can occur because laws of nature circumscribe the logically possible and not merely the physically possible. But apart from distinct arguments to the contrary neither assumption appears to be warranted — at least not prima facie warranted.

To say, “an event is physically impossible and a violation of laws of nature if a statement of its occurrence is logically incompatible with a statement of the laws of nature,” and then to assume that laws of nature circumscribe that which is logically, and not merely physically, impossible is to rule out the occurrence of the physically impossible on ill-conceived logical grounds. It is to deal with the possibility of miracles in the most superficial of ways by defining them out of existence using either an indefensible concept of a law of nature, or supposing a suppressed argument against the possibility of nonnatural interference.

A law of nature cannot be violated by natural forces. It can only be undermined as a genuine law. This happens if something natural occurs that the law was supposed to account but in fact could not. But neither can a law of nature be violated by a nonnatural force. Nor can it be undermined, assuming we can distinguish natural from nonnatural occurrences. A law of nature is, whatever else it may be, a true description of both the physically and logically possible occurrences within its scope, in the actual world only if it is assumed that no nonnatural forces could exist or interfere. Otherwise, a law describes only what can happen as a matter of physical possibility. Its presupposed scope is limited to what can happen given only natural forces. It allows for the possibility that the physically impossible remains logically possible, assuming the possibility of nonnatural forces capable of interaction in the actual world. Thus, nonnatural interventions are not, strictly speaking, violations of laws of nature. An intervention is, however, physically impossible, because (or so long as) that which is physically possible is defined in terms of the scope of laws of nature. An interference that is outside the scope of the laws of nature does not violate any laws of nature by doing that which is physically impossible — that is — in doing that which is not possible given only natural forces.

Regularity theorists sometimes say that causal statements entail implicit or explicit reference to causal laws (e.g. laws of nature) and are instances of those laws. This appears to be false, or at least suspect, for a variety of different types of singular causal statements, including those in which a sufficient condition of X causing Y is dependent upon some subjective (nonphysical) factor. “The joke I was told caused me to ...” would not ordinarily be thought of as referring, either explicitly or implicitly, to a law of nature, or a general causal law, unless one were a strict determinist or maintained a strong form of a “covering law model” as essential to all forms of explanation. Even if there are some psychophysical laws, it is counterintuitive to argue that the meaning of causal statements, like the one above, implies a causal generalization. (Similarly, even if there are covering-law models that imply historical explanation is generalizable, it does not seem to be part of the meaning of historical explanation in causal form that it be generalizable.) Even supposing that the causal statement has counterfactual force (e.g. “If I had not been told the joke I would not have . . .”), one would not intuitively argue that this statement is an instance of a causal generalization by virtue of its meaning.

Leaving these controversial cases aside, a statement that a miracle occurred, usually — as in the case of many of the biblical miracles - refers to God as causing something that is not the sort of occurrence that one would expect to be explainable in terms of laws of nature, if it could be explained at all. I am here supposing supernatural explanation to be a viable alternative and the one that might plausibly be chosen in a case like the Red Sea parting as depicted in the movie “The Ten Commandments” (i.e., not simply a low tide). If causal statements did require reference to laws of nature, then this would appear to rule out the possibility of miracles since a miracle refers to a type of causal statement whose nature rules out reference to laws of nature taken as generalized cases of which they are instances. (John Locke (1706) denies that miracles are not instances of laws. They are not, however, instances of laws of nature according to Locke. He thinks that to say they are not instances of any laws whatsoever (e.g. not even of supernatural laws) is to say that they are random occurrences, and he thinks that this is absurd.) Miracles are contrary to laws of nature, not “violations” of them and not instances of them. (Actually, miracles are vacuous instances of true laws of nature as I explain below.) Note that it is not simply a miracle's uniqueness that rules out such reference to laws of nature. It cannot be uniqueness since even miracles that are supposed to be repeatable, such as raising one from the dead, cannot in principle refer to laws of nature for a complete explanation of their occurrence. Presumably they must also refer to divine intervention.

A miracle's uniqueness presents only a preface difficulty for supposing miracles to be supernaturally “caused.” It is not difficult to show that causal terminology is applicable to statements about miracles. A regularity theory should be understood as requiring reference to laws of nature only when the causal statement is about natural events. More generally, a regularity theory requires reference to causal generalizations, but not necessarily to generalizations in terms of laws of nature. There is no reason to suppose that a miracle's uniqueness, if it is unique, cannot or does not carry with it implicit reference to a causal generalization. The counterfactual force that is constitutive of the meaning of some causal statements that specify necessary and sufficient material conditions for some event to occur may indicate the presence of an implicit generalization in the causal statement about a miracle. Generally, if we say “X caused Y” we mean, in part, that if X had not occurred, then Y would not have occurred in the circumstances. But also implicit in the meaning of this is that if X occurred again, in relevantly similar circumstances, then Y would also occur again. To say that God caused X is to say that X would not have come about apart from God's activity and also that X would again come about if God acted similarly in a relevantly similar situation. If there is a supernature, then it is reasonable to suppose, as Locke did, that there are “laws of supernature” and that singular causal statements concerning the supernatural may be understood as implicitly assuming the generalizability of such singular causal statements in terms of those laws.

Consider the following objection to the characterization of a miracle as being contrary to a law of nature and outside its scope. Suppose, as I have, that true laws of nature do not have the form:

(1) Whenever an event of type C occurs, an event of type E occurs.

Assume instead that they are of the form:

(2) If an event of type C occurs, and there is no supernatural intervention, then an event of type E occurs.

Or, schematically:

(3) (C & N) → E

Now consider a case where an event of type C occurs, there is supernatural intervention, and no event of type E occurs. From the truth table of the conditional function it follows that this case will be a positive instance of a true law, where such laws are of the form (C & N) → E. (“PQ” will be true if the first component is false or if the second component is true. In the case under consideration, the first component will be false if “N” is false — this is, if there is supernatural intervention as hypothesized.) Thus, a miracle is not contrary to, or a violation of, a law of nature, and it is not outside the scope of such a law.

My response to this objection is as follows. I agree that the case considered above (i.e., a miraculous event occurs due to supernatural intervention) is a positive instance of a true law of nature where such laws are schematically of the form (C & N) → E. Miracles do not violate true laws of nature because such laws contain the supposition, either explicit or implicit, that laws describe what will happen given the presence of only natural forces. However, once there is supernatural interference, then no matter what follows C (whether or not E occurs), (C & N) → E will be trivially true just because N is false. (It would be true even if C is false.)

While it is true that a miraculous occurrence would be a positive instance of a true law, because true laws of the form (C & N) → E are never false if N is false (N is false if there is supernatural interference), I want to call attention to the fact that while miracles do not violate true laws (i.e., they are positive instances of them), they should not be thought of as “within the scope of the laws of nature.” This is because laws of nature are meant to account for, or describe, what occurs and what could possibly occur only apart from supernatural intervention. Laws describe what is naturally or physically possible. Because a positive instance of a true law of nature will be trivially true in cases of ∼N, it will not explain why E does not occur even though C does occur. It is the assertion of ∼N that does the explaining. Whether or not C occurred, or E occurs, (C & N) → E will be true when N is false. But if N is false (i.e., if there is supernatural interference), then the law of nature will not be able to explain either E or ∼E in terms of natural forces. Yet this is what one normally expects a law of nature to do.

By saying that cases of supernatural interference are outside the scope of laws of nature, one is thereby refusing to consider cases of (C & N) → E, when N is false, to be significant instantiations of laws of nature, even though they are formally expressible in terms of laws of nature. While laws of nature can, and do, formally account for such cases, there is no explanation of E's nonoccurrence in terms of the natural forces that it is usually assumed to be the concern of laws of nature to describe.

To think of miracles as positive instances of laws of nature is to trivialize what is interesting about them viz. their relationship to laws of nature, where such laws are understood as describing what will and can happen given the presence of only natural forces. Speaking of cases in which there is supernatural intervention as outside the scope of laws of nature is clearly truer to our concept of such laws as descriptive only of those things that occur due to natural forces alone. That is their scope. Therefore, even though miracles can formally be accounted for by laws of nature, materially speaking this inadequate. It is inadequate because this “accounting for” is really done by the supposition of the supernatural interference and not with the miraculous event being a positive instance of the true law (i.e., because ∼N results in (C & N) → E being true) as it would in cases where there was no supernatural intervention. Formally, even a positive instance of a true law can be “contrary” to a law of nature of which it is a positive instance. This will be the case in all instances of which an occurrence being a positive instance of a true law is due to supernatural intervention — that is, in all cases which make (C & N) → E trivially true in supposing ∼N. This is formally unobjectionable but awkward. In keeping with ordinary usage it is therefore preferable to consider such positive instances of true laws as outside the scope of laws of nature, and to consider only positive instances of laws to be within the scope of laws if (C & N) → E is not true because of the falsity of N.

Hume's Argument Against Justified Belief In Miracles

Remarkably, the discussion of Hume on miracles has not been confined to, or even principally concerned with, whether or not Hume was correct in his argument against justified belief in miracles — and/or the possibility of justified belief in miracles. Instead, philosophical discussion has focused on exegetical issues concerning exactly what Hume was arguing. There is, for example, still no generally accepted view on the fundamental points of whether his argument (Part I of his essay) against the justified belief in miracles on the basis of testimony is (i) meant as an a priori or a posteriori argument; (ii) if that argument can be, or is meant to be, generalized to include first-hand experience of an allegedly miraculous event; or indeed, (iii) if his argument, whether regarded as a priori or a posteriori, is meant to establish that one can never be justified in believing in a miracle on the basis of testimony. Hume does not appear to claim that miracles are impossible — only that justified belief in a miracle on the basis of testimony (may be) impossible. His argument is basically epistemological. There are, however, grounds for supposing that a miracle is not even possible on Hume's account — at least not given his wider empiricist views.

Hume's position on miracles cannot be properly understood apart from his analysis of causation, a posteriori reasoning, and indeed the most fundamental element of his empiricism — his analysis of “impressions” and “ideas” (Book I, A Treatise of Human Nature, pp. 1-7). In fact, Hume's position on miracles has never been properly understood because its connection to his views on causation has never been adequately examined. There is considerable controversy over what Hume's position actually was — let alone what his argument for that position is. I offer one highly abbreviated interpretation. (For a more complete account of this interpretation see Levine: 1989: 1-52.) The bibliography contains citations to other interpretations completely at odds with this one and with each other.

To understand Hume on miracles the following question must be answered. Why did Hume think that one could justifiably believe that an extraordinary event had occurred, under certain circumstances, but that one could never justifiably believe a miracle had occurred? The proposed interpretation of Hume's analysis of miracles in relation to his analysis of causation and his wider empiricism yields the only plausible answer to this question that I know of. This interpretation also shows why it makes no substantial difference whether we interpret Hume's argument in Part I “Of Miracles” against the possibility of justified belief in testimony to the miraculous as an a priori argument or an a posteriori argument since the arguments essentially coalesce.

Hume (Enquiries, p. 128) gives the following example of an extraordinary event that he thinks could be rendered credible on the basis of testimony.

...suppose, all authors, in all languages, agree, that from the first day of January 1600, there was a total darkness over the whole earth for eight days, suppose that the tradition of this extraordinary event is still strong and lively among the people: that all travelers, who return from foreign countries, bring us accounts of the same tradition, without the least variation or contradiction: it is evident, that our present philosophers, instead of doubting the fact, ought to receive it as certain, and ought to search for the causes whence it might be derived. The decay, corruption, and dissolution of nature, is an event rendered probable by so many analogies, that any phenomenon, which seems to have a tendency towards that catastrophe comes within the reach of human testimony, if that testimony be very extensive and uniform.

In this case not only is the testimony to the alleged event very extensive and uniform, but Hume also thinks it necessary that our past experience does not render the event completely unlikely. He argues that the eight day darkness can be “rendered probable by so many analogies,” assuming it is testified to extensively and uniformly. In such a case Hume assumes that the event is natural and that “we ought to search for the causes.” Hume compares this with another imaginary case (Enquiries, p. 128).

...suppose, that all historians who treat of England, should agree, that, on the first of January 1600, Queen Elizabeth died...and that, after being interred a month, she again appeared, resumed the throne, and governed England for three years: I must confess that I should be surprised at the concurrence of so many odd circumstances, but should not have the least inclination to believe so miraculous event.

Since both events are assumed to be equally well testified to, the reason that Hume thinks the former can be judged credible but not the latter is that in the former case the “event is rendered probable by so many analogies.” One can object and say that this appears to be nothing more than a subjective judgement on the part of Hume. His experience suggests analogies for the former type of event but not the latter. The eight day darkness “sufficiently resembles” events that Hume has experienced, or believes in on the basis of experience, to warrant belief in the eight day darkness given that the event is extraordinarily well attested to. In the latter case Hume can find no analogies to draw upon from experience. Given the similarity, in relevant respects, of most peoples' experience (i.e., the experience of Scots at the time of Hume), Hume thinks that if people base their judgments on their experience (in accordance with the principles of a posteriori reasoning (Levine 1989: 5-12) extrapolated from his analysis of causation) they will agree that the former (extraordinary) event can be judged credible but not the (miraculous) latter. Hume would agree that if an individual's experience were very different from his own in relevant respects, than that individual could justifiably believe many things that he himself could not.

So despite Hume's a priori arguments against justified belief in miracles he argues that under certain circumstances the “evidence” may justify belief in the occurrence of an extraordinary event as long as we have experienced events analogous in type. However, an extraordinary event is not necessarily a miraculous one. In the case of extraordinary events that are well attested to and for which we have suitable experiential analogies, Hume thinks that the most we are justified in believing is that the event did occur — not that the event is a miracle. We are to “search for the [natural] causes whence it might be derived.” Such cases may even require us to reassess, to some extent, our estimation of what nature is capable of doing on her own, so to speak. Sometimes statements of laws of nature must be reassessed and altered in light of new experience. Also, we must be careful not to extend our judgments as to what to believe or expect of nature to situations in which all of the relevant circumstances are not the same. This requires explanation.

Hume relates the case of the Indian who refused to believe that water turned to ice. According to Hume, the Indian “reasoned justly” on the basis of his past experience. He refused, at first, to believe that water turned to ice, despite the fact that it was well attested to, because the event not only had the Indian's constant and uniform experience to count against it, but also because the event “bore so little analogy” to that experience (Enquiries, pp. 11-15). The Indian “reasoned justly” but he extended his judgments about the properties of water to cases where all the circumstances were not the same (i.e., the relevant circumstance here being temperature). In certain situations in which we hear testimony to extraordinary events we may be in situations similar to that of the Indian. Indeed, according to Hume, if we justifiably believe that an extraordinary event did occur, then we should assume that we are in a situation just like that of the Indian. We should assume this because, as I shall show, there are logically compelling reasons why the consistent Humean, in accordance with the principles of a posteriori reasoning based on Hume's analysis of causation and his empiricism, can do nothing else. The extraordinary event should be judged “[not] contrary to uniform experience of the course of nature in cases where all the circumstances are the same” (Enquiries, p. 114n).

Why should we judge our situation to be like that of the Indian's? Are there logically compelling reasons for doing so? Hume does not explicitly say why, but it must be because our experience has shown us that situations like the Indian's do arise. On the basis of experience, when we are justified in believing in the occurrence of an extraordinary event, we should liken ourselves to the Indian. That is why, in a case like the eight days of darkness, “we ought to search for the [natural] causes whence it might be derived.” Experience demands it. It seems then, that according to Hume, when an extraordinary event is extraordinarily well attested to we have only two options. One is to accept the testimony and look for the event's natural causes. The other is to reject the testimony on the grounds that the event testified to bears no significant analogy to events we have experienced. Hume thinks that testimony, no matter how reliable, can never establish the occurrence of a miraculous event, in accordance with the principles of a posteriori reasoning — reasoning that is a type of causal reasoning according to Hume. He says (Enquiries, pp. 111-112),

It being a general maxim, that no objects have any discoverable connection together, and that all the inferences, which we can draw from one to another, are founded merely on our experience of their constant and regular conjunction; it is evident that we ought not to make an exception to this maxim in favor of human testimony.... This species of reasoning, perhaps, one may deny to be founded on the relation of cause and effect. I shall not dispute about a word.

Thus, Hume thinks that if we justifiably accept testimony to an extraordinary event, then on the basis of past experience, we must liken ourselves to the Indian and search for natural causes of which we are unaware. This would be for us the equivalent of the Indian moving north to “Muscovy during the winter” (Enquiries, p. 114n). (Think about the last astonishing thing you learned that nature could accomplish as a matter of course and you have a basic part of Hume's argument.)

Contrary to Hume one might try to argue as follows:

Is it inconceivable that we experience events for which no explanation like that suitable for the Indian has been forthcoming? It may be true that in some situations a seemingly naturally inexplicable event was later learned to have natural causes, but it is at least conceivable that there may be other inexplicable events for which no natural causes can be found. If experience can show that we are unable to find natural causes for certain events — though these events are every bit as well attested to as other events only some of which we have discovered natural causes for — then why must we liken ourselves to the Indian in cases where we justifiably believe in the occurrence of an extraordinary event? Why does experience demand that we either reject belief in the event's occurrence or believe it but posit natural causes for the event? Justified belief does not entail belief in a natural cause. Experientially you have not shown that it does. Moreover, if we had independent reasons for thinking that no cause of some extraordinary event could be found (e g., on the basis of prophecy), then it is conceivable that we could be justified in believing that an extraordinary event occurred without thereby likening ourselves to the Indian. The grounds on which we might reject the supposition of a natural cause could themselves be experiential (e.g., a prophet's track record). It does seem to be the case that we can always posit a natural explanation for an extraordinary event and base that supposition on experience. On the other hand, we may reject such a supposition, not only on the basis of a priori arguments of natural theology, but also on the basis of experience. For example, suppose that an extraordinary event that had some religious significance was prophesied, testimony justified belief in the event's occurrence, the prophet had been right about certain predictions made in the past, and no immediate natural explanation for the event that had the least bit of plausibility was forthcoming. The option of positing a natural explanation remains open, but experience does not necessarily demand that we avail ourselves of that option. Hume thinks that the most that testimony can establish is that an extraordinary event has occurred, not that a miracle has occurred. To support this one must establish the suppressed premise that we can have no good reasons on the basis of experience, for identifying an event as miraculous. Though Hume employs this premise he does not support it, and the example just given suggests a reason for believing the premise to be invalid.

Hume has not specified adequate criteria for determining when an event can be judged suitably analogous to past experience as to warrant belief when adequately testified to. (This is probably because he thought no such criteria could be given — each extraordinary case having to be considered on its own merits.) Experientially, there are no clear cut criteria enabling us to determine, with any degree of assurance, that an eight day darkness is analogous to past experience while a resurrection does not, in the least, bear any resemblance to aspects of our past experience that could make it at least as likely an event to be believed in as the eight day darkness. Could not a resurrection be found analogous to past experience in precisely the same way that an eight day darkness could (i.e., experience of the “decay, corruption, and dissolution of nature”)? In the absence of such criteria there is no logically compelling reason, and not even necessarily compelling experiential reasons, for assuming that the extraordinary event occurred (naturally) but a resurrection did not occur (miraculously). If the darkness can be justifiably believed in then so too can a resurrection. Furthermore, under the appropriate circumstances, not only could the resurrection be judged miraculous and not merely extraordinary, but so could the eight day darkness. The thing that would determine whether or not the event was to be judged miraculous would be whether we had reason to believe that God or God's agents caused the event — better reasons than for thinking that the event was caused naturally. It is conceivable that a judgment that God caused a particular event can be experientially warranted. Again, imagine a prophet who is known to predict future events accurately. The prophet has a track record of empirically verifiable prophecies concerning events of a most extraordinary nature. Or, imagine a case in which every time a “holy-person” pointed at someone that person lay down dead. An explanation of such goings-on can be sought in terms of natural (e.g., parapsychical) causes and abilities. However, would experience necessitate the acceptance of this explanation over the supernatural one? Hume has not shown that it would.

Hume would reject this argument — and therein lies the entire tale of his argument against justified belief in miracles — whether on the basis of testimony or first-hand experience. He would insist that his principles of reasoning about empirical matters, and his philosophical empiricism (i.e., his theory of “impressions” and “ideas”) show that supernatural explanation cannot be justified experientially. In the case of a prophet accurately predicting events, or the “holy-person” pointing their finger and people falling dead, Hume would say that experience justifies us in believing that the event prophesied will come to pass and that if the holy-person lifts their finger in our direction we are justified in running away — and foolish if we do not. But we are not justified in believing such events to be miracles.

We need to ask “What is it about experience, in the sense of expectations about future events or judgments about past events, that could justify the positing of a supernatural cause?” For positing such a cause is necessary if one is to justifiably believe some event to be a miracle. Hume would say that positing such a cause is speculative. It can have no basis in experience. Even if some event really were a miracle, whether it be a resurrection, or “the raising of a feather, when the wind wants ever so little of a force requisite for that purpose” (Enquiries, p. 115n), we would not be justified in believing that it was anything more than an extraordinary event. Extraordinary events are at the limits of (our) experience, the supernatural is beyond it. Hume (Enquiries, p. 129) says:

Though the Being to whom the miracle is ascribed, be Almighty, it [the miracle] does not, upon that account, become a whit more probable, since it is impossible for us to know the attributes or actions of such a Being, otherwise than from the experience of his productions, in the usual course of nature. This still reduces us to past observations, and obliges us to compare the instances of the violation of truth in the testimony of men, with those of the violations of the laws of nature by miracles, in order to judge which of them is most likely and probable.

For Hume, a “cause,” insofar as it can be used as an item in reasoning from experience, can only be something that we can have an “impression” of. The cause of a miracle would have to be identified as something we could perceive, even if we were to posit some metaphysical “power” of this cause and attribute it speculatively to God. The “cause” of Lazarus's coming forth from the grave would have to be identified with Christ's beckoning — either his voice or some physical gesture — both of which we have “impressions” of and both of which are events “in the usual course of nature.”

If a resurrection were well enough attested to that it warranted belief, then that event could still only be assigned status as an extraordinary event with a natural explanation. Hume is thus constrained by his empiricism. He is constrained in such a way that had he been at the shore of the Red Sea with Moses when they were being chased (as in the movie version); and had Moses raised his staff and the Red Sea split up the middle (i.e., no low tide but raging waters on both sides); and had the Red Sea crashed to a close the moment the last Israelite was safe — killing those in pursuit; and had Hume himself lacked grounds for assuming he was hallucinating or perceiving events in any way other than as they were actually happening — Hume would still be constrained by his principles to deny that what he was witnessing was a miracle. This example suffices to show the unacceptability of Hume's argument. Indeed, assuming Hume would have agreed that had he been there with Moses, and had events transpired in a manner suitably similar to the way they are depicted in the film, he would have (readily) agreed that he was justified in believing that a miracle occurred; then his argument against justified belief in miracles can be used as a reductio ad absurdum. Flew (1967: 349) is mistaken in his claim that “it be neither arbitrary nor irrational to insist on a definition of a ‘law of nature’ such that the idea of a miracle as an exception to a law of nature is ruled out as self-contradictory.”

A resurrection could only be well enough attested to to be justifiably believed if it could be judged as somehow analogous with something in our past experience. If it is, then it must be considered a natural event because, for Hume, anything analogous to our experience is at least analogous in the sense of suggesting that it too has a natural cause. We experience only that which occurs in nature and judgments based on that experience will not warrant positing causes outside of that experience. Suppose that some event actually was supernaturally caused. (Let us suppose Hume recognizes this as a logical possibility in his essay, though I do not think it is given his analysis of causation and his empiricism.) Hume would say that we could not, on the basis of experience, attribute a supernatural cause to the event because we experience only natural causes (i.e., events occurring in the usual course of nature). If an event were supernaturally caused we could legitimately say that we “experienced” some supernatural event, but the sense of experience used here would be an equivocation on Hume's usage This “cause,” being transcendent, and not discernible by means of “sense impressions,” “internal impressions,” or “impressions of reflexion” could not be an item of experience at all as Hume sees it. Thus, because Hume thinks that every cause must be regarded as natural, he is committed to the view that one could justifiably believe that an extraordinary event had occurred, but never a miracle.

Hume's a priori argument against justified belief in miracles actually coalesces with his a posteriori argument against such justified belief. On a posteriori grounds we could never justifiably believe testimony to the miraculous because we could never judge the occurrence of such an event to be similar, in relevant respects, to anything we have experienced. However, that a miraculous occurrence could never be judged relevantly similar to anything in experience (i.e., that there must be “a firm and unalterable experience” counting against belief in it) is something that we can know a priori, since a priori we can know that we cannot have an “ impression” of a supernatural cause. It follows from this that on a priori grounds we can also rule out the possibility of justified belief in testimony to the miraculous.

It follows from what has been said that unless one accepts Hume's analysis of a posteriori reasoning as a type of causal reasoning, and also accepts his analysis of causation, which ultimately rests on his theory of impressions and ideas — a theory that even staunch empiricists should reject as simplistic — then there is no reason to accept his argument against the possibility of justified belief in miracles.

Of course, nothing in this critique of Hume's argument should be taken to suggest, in any way, that miracles have ever occurred, or that we are justified in believing that any have occurred. But it would be most surprising if some people at some time and in certain circumstances have not been, and will not again be, justified in believing in the occurrence of a miracle. However, nothing I have said suggests that that the evidence available for the occurrence of any alleged miracle warrants justified belief in miracles for most people - including those who really do believe in them.

Bayesian Analyses of Hume's Argument Concerning Miracles

There are various versions of Bayes's theorem. For example, John Earman (1993:307n4) employs the following:

Pr(H/E&K) =
Pr(H/K) × Pr(E/H&K)

“The reader is invited to think of H as a hypothesis at issue; K as the background knowledge; and E as the additional evidence. Pr(H/E&K) is called the posterior probability of H. Pr(H/K) and Pr(E/H&K) are respectively called the prior probability of H and the (posterior) likelihood of E.”

Bayesian analyses are prominent among the several recent and allegedly novel interpretations of Hume's argument against the justified belief in miracles. However, since there is no consensus on just what Hume's argument is, or exactly what he is trying to establish, it is impossible that any Bayesian analysis, let alone a “Bayesian proof” of that argument, or a recasting of the argument in terms of some version of Bayes's theorem, will not beg crucial issues of interpretation. In so doing, such analyses, in and of themselves, will also beg fundamental epistemological issues concerning, for example, evidence. Furthermore, it is difficult to see how recasting Hume's argument in a Bayesian form can clarify the structure or substance of the argument without presupposing what the argument is.

On the interpretation of Hume's argument given above, a Bayesian analysis sheds no light whatsoever on the structure or substance of the argument, and can do nothing by way of either supporting or refuting the argument. Indeed, any Bayesian analysis of the question of justified belief in miracles must be otiose until the difficult and essential questions concerning “evidence” in relation to an allegedly miraculous occurrence are resolved — at which point any Bayesian analysis will add little except the technical complexity of a formal apparatus that may or may not “clarify” the structure of Hume's argument.

The balancing of probabilities is of no use until it is decided what goes into the balance — that is, what constitutes the evidence that is to be subject to the balancing of probabilities. The point is this; apart from independent philosophical arguments — arguments that would in effect undermine the relevance of a Bayesian analysis to the question of the credibility of reports of the miraculous — no such analysis can, in principle, prove that no testimony can (or cannot) establish the credibility of a miracle. So-called Bayesian analyses of Hume's argument are not analyses of Hume's argument at all — but superfluous representations of it.

Are Miracles Religiously Significant?

Some contemporary theologians have claimed that the issue of miracles has been largely misunderstood and co-opted by philosophers and critics of religion for their own purposes — specifically in order to deny that certain central events the Bible alleges to have occur did occur. Thus, David Strauss (1835) claims that reports of miracles can be rejected “as simply impossible and irreconcilable with the known and universal laws which govern the course of events.” Theologians sometimes claim, for example, that there is no word for “miracle,” in the Old or New Testament. What are described there as “prodigies” or “wonders” or “effects of powers,” are interpreted by philosophers, but not by the Biblical writers, as “miracles.” Antony Flew (1967:347) says that according to Spinoza, as well as some contemporary theologians, “conventional interpreters of the Bible read far more miracles into it than it contains, because they constantly read poetic Hebrew idioms literally.” This may be true but it is also inconsequential. No matter how events such as a parting of the sea or a resurrection are described, whether as “wonders” or as “miracles,” it is clear that they were understood in Biblical times, as well as in contemporary times, to be in some remarkable sense “contrary to the normal course of nature.” People living at the time of Moses or Christ knew just as well as we do that seas do not “normally” part and that people are not, in the normal course of nature, resurrected. What is required for a notion of the miraculous is not some sophisticated notion of what a law of nature is, but just a strong sense of what constitutes the normal, natural course of events. And this is something the ancients had just as much as those living in a scientific age have.

Many people regard the philosophical dimension, the epistemological one in particular, of the issue of miracles as insignificant. Indeed, philosophy of religion, or at least natural theology and the analytic philosophy of religion is regarded as inconsequential by believers as well as some involved in the academic study of religion.

Nevertheless, I think that the philosopher's concerns are more closely allied with those of religious people than, for example, are those of the social scientist. This does not make them more important - just more closely allied. The philosopher is interested in the truth about religious truth-claims and (though many would disagree on philosophical grounds) can pursue that interest more or less independent of dogma, tradition, and what socio-scientific study tells us about the various functions of religion. Philosophical issues in religion are fundamental in a way that other areas of investigation are not. A system of beliefs may serve a variety of functions, personally and socially, but for the religious person these are consequences of the system of beliefs itself. They believe their systems of belief, their religion, to be more or less coherent and true. It makes a great difference to most believers who are traditional theists whether or not miracles could occur, and whether one could justifiably believe they did occur. One does not have to be a fundamentalist Christian, for example, to believe with Paul that the Christian faith is, in an important sense, a vain pursuit if the central miracles associated with Christianity did not occur. Indeed, one can assume that David Hume, Bertrand Russell and Richard Swinburne would concur. The same point can of course be made,mutatis mutandis, for Islam and Judaism or any tradition fundamentally connected to miraculous claims.

Apart from belief in miracles, one is left with a system of beliefs that has had and will continue to have enormous significance — good and bad — for people's lives. However, for the majority of persons for whom these beliefs have that significance, religion could no longer function in the way it does if they became convinced of the falsity of their beliefs. That seems to be verifiable. There is a sense, albeit perhaps not a very important one, in which one is involved in pretense if one practices a system of beliefs whose central tenets one denies. What one is practicing may be similar in significant respects to the religious tradition in question, but one will not be practicing that religion, nor will one properly be regarded as a believer.

Having said that, it should also be said that the issue of miracles is regarded as overly important by contemporary analytic philosophers of religion. Some 19th and 20th century philosophical theologians, as well as those in various disciplines within the academic study of religion, including the philosophy of religion, no longer regard the issue of miracles as central or crucial, either to various religious traditions, to the religious life per se, and definitely not to the more fundamental questions of God and meaning in the traditional domain of philosophical theology. Philosophers of religion, even if sophisticated in terms of their analyses, naively attribute an importance to the issue that may not be altogether warranted.


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Bayes' Theorem | causation: probabilistic | causation: the metaphysics of | Hume, David | induction: problem of | religion: epistemology of