Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Models in Science

First published Mon Feb 27, 2006

Models are of central importance in many scientific contexts. The centrality of models such as the billiard ball model of a gas, the Bohr model of the atom, the MIT bag model of the nucleon, the Gaussian-chain model of a polymer, the Lorenz model of the atmosphere, the Lotka-Volterra model of predator-prey interaction, the double helix model of DNA, agent-based and evolutionary models in the social sciences, or general equilibrium models of markets in their respective domains are cases in point. Scientists spend a great deal of time building, testing, comparing and revising models, and much journal space is dedicated to introducing, applying and interpreting these valuable tools. In short, models are one of the principal instruments of modern science.

Philosophers are acknowledging the importance of models with increasing attention and are probing the assorted roles that models play in scientific practice. The result has been an incredible proliferation of model-types in the philosophical literature. Probing models, phenomenological models, computational models, developmental models, explanatory models, impoverished models, testing models, idealized models, theoretical models, scale models, heuristic models, caricature models, didactic models, fantasy models, toy models, imaginary models, mathematical models, substitute models, iconic models, formal models, analogue models and instrumental models are but some of the notions that are used to categorize models. While at first glance this abundance is overwhelming, it can quickly be brought under control by recognizing that these notions pertain to different problems that arise in connection with models. For example, models raise questions in semantics (what is the representational function that models perform?), ontology (what kind of things are models?), epistemology (how do we learn with models?), and, of course, in philosophy of science (how do models relate to theory?; what are the implications of a model based approach to science for the debates over scientific realism, reductionism, explanation and laws of nature?).

1. Semantics: Models and Representation

Models can perform two fundamentally different representational functions. On the one hand, a model can be a representation of a selected part of the world (the ‘target system’). Depending on the nature of the target, such models are either models of phenomena or models of data. On the other hand, a model can represent a theory in the sense that it interprets the laws and axioms of that theory. These two notions are not mutually exclusive as scientific models can be representations in both senses at the same time.

1.1 Representational models I: models of phenomena

Many scientific models represent a phenomenon, where ‘phenomenon’ is used as an umbrella term covering all relatively stable and general features of the world that are interesting from a scientific point of view. Empiricists like van Fraassen (1980) only allow for observables to qualify as such, while realists like Bogen and Woodward (1988) do not impose any such restrictions. The billiard ball model of a gas, the Bohr model of the atom, the double helix model of DNA, the scale model of a bridge, the Mundell-Fleming model of an open economy, or the Lorenz model of the atmosphere are well-known examples for models of this kind.

A first step towards a discussion of the issue of scientific representation is to realize that there is no such thing as the problem of scientific representation. Rather, there are different but related problems. It is not yet clear what specific set of questions a theory of representation has to come to terms with, but whatever list of questions one might put on the agenda of a theory of scientific representation, there are two problems that will occupy center stage in the discussion (Frigg 2006). The first problem is to explain in virtue of what a model is a representation of something else. To appreciate the thrust of this question we have to anticipate a position as regards the ontology of models (which we discuss in the next section). It is now common to construe models as non-linguistic entities rather than as descriptions. This approach has wide-ranging consequences. If we understand models as descriptions, the above question would be reduced to the time-honored problem of how language relates to reality and there would not be any problems over and above those already discussed in the philosophy of language. However, if we understand models as non-linguistic entities, we are faced with the new question of what it is for an object (that is not a word or a sentence) to scientifically represent a phenomenon.

Somewhat surprisingly, until recently this question has not attracted much attention in twentieth century philosophy of science, despite the fact that the corresponding problems in the philosophy of mind and in aesthetics have been discussed extensively for decades (there is a substantial body of literature dealing with the question of what it means for a mental state to represent a certain state of affairs; and the question of how a configuration of flat marks on a canvass can depict something beyond this canvass has puzzled aestheticians for a long time). However, some recent publications address this and other closely related problems (Bailer-Jones 2003, Frigg 2006, Giere 2004, Suárez 2004, van Fraassen 2004), while others dismiss it as a non-issue (Callender and Cohen 2006, Teller 2001).

The second problem is concerned with representational styles. It is a commonplace that one can represent the same subject matter in different ways. This pluralism does not seem to be a prerogative of the fine arts as the representations used in the sciences are not all of one kind either. Weizsäcker's liquid drop model represents the nucleus of an atom in a manner very different from the shell model, and a scale model of the wing of an air plane represents the wing in a way that is different from how a mathematical model of its shape does. What representational styles are there in the sciences?

Although this question is not explicitly addressed in the literature on the so-called semantic view of theories, some answers seem to emerge from its understanding of models. One version of the semantic view, one that builds on a mathematical notion of models (see Sec. 2), posits that a model and its target have to be isomorphic (van Fraassen 1980; Suppes 2002) or partially isomorphic (Da Costa and French 2003) to each other. Formal requirements weaker than these have been discussed by Mundy (1986) and Swoyer (1991). Another version of the semantic view drops formal requirements in favor of similarity (Giere 1988 and 2004, Teller 2001). This approach enjoys the advantage over the isomorphism view that it is less restrictive and also can account for cases of inexact and simplifying models. However, as Giere points out, this account remains empty as long as no relevant respects and degrees of similarity are specified. The specification of such respects and degrees depends on the problem at hand and the larger scientific context and cannot be made on the basis of purely philosophical considerations (Teller 2001).

Further notions that can be understood as addressing the issue of representational styles have been introduced in the literature on models. Among them, scale models, idealized models, analogical models and phenomenological models play an important role. These categories are not mutually exclusive; for instance, some scale models would also qualify as idealized models and it is not clear where exactly to draw the line between idealized and analogue models.

Scale models. Some models are basically down-sized or enlarged copies of their target systems (Black 1962). Typical examples are wooden cars or model bridges. The leading intuition is that a scale model is a naturalistic replica or a truthful mirror image of the target; for this reason scale models are sometimes also referred to as ‘true models’ (Achinstein 1968, Ch. 7). However, there is no such thing as a perfectly faithful scale model; faithfulness is always restricted to some respects. The wooden model of the car, for instance, provides a faithful portrayal of the car's shape but not its material. Scale models seem to be a special case of a broader category of representations that Peirce dubbed icons: representations that stand for something else because they closely resemble it (Peirce 1931-1958 Vol. 3, Para. 362). This raises the question of what criteria a model has to satisfy in order to qualify as an icon. Although we seem to have strong intuitions about how to answer this question in particular cases, no theory of iconicity for models has been formulated yet.

Idealized models. An idealization is a deliberate simplification of something complicated with the objective of making it more tractable. Frictionless planes, point masses, infinite velocities, isolated systems, omniscient agents, or markets in perfect equilibrium are but some well-know examples. Philosophical debates over idealization have focused on two general kinds of idealizations: so-called Aristotelian and Galilean idealizations.

Aristotelian idealization amounts to ‘stripping away’, in our imagination, all properties from a concrete object that we believe are not relevant to the problem at hand. This allows us to focus on a limited set of properties in isolation. An example is a classical mechanics model of the planetary system, describing the planets as objects only having shape and mass, disregarding all other properties. Other labels for this kind of idealization include ‘abstraction’ (Cartwright 1989, Ch. 5), ‘negligibility assumptions’ (Musgrave 1981) and ‘method of isolation’ (Mäki 1994).

Galilean idealizations are ones that involve deliberate distortions. Physicists build models consisting of point masses moving on frictionless planes, economists assume that agents are omniscient, biologists study isolated populations, and so on. It was characteristic of Galileo's approach to science to use simplifications of this sort whenever a situation was too complicated to tackle. For this reason it is common to refer to this sort of idealizations as ‘Galilean idealizations’ (McMullin 1985); another common label is ‘distorted models’.

Galilean idealizations are beset with riddles. What does a model involving distortions of this kind tell us about reality? How can we test its accuracy? In reply to these questions Laymon (1991) has put forward a theory which understands idealizations as ideal limits: imagine a series of experimental refinements of the actual situation which approach the postulated limit and then require that the closer the properties of a system come to the ideal limit, the closer its behavior has to come to the behavior of the ideal limit (monotonicity). But these conditions need not always hold and it is not clear how to understand situations in which no ideal limit exists. We can, at least in principle, produce a series of table tops that are ever more slippery but we cannot possibly produce a series of systems in which Planck's constant approaches zero. This raises the question of whether one can always make an idealized model more realistic by de-idealizing it. We will come back to this issue in section 5.1.

Galilean and Aristotelian idealizations are not mutually exclusive. On the contrary, they often come together. Consider again the mechanical model of the planetary system: the model only takes into account a narrow set of properties and distorts these, for instance by describing planets as ideal spheres with a rotation-symmetric mass distribution.

Models that involve substantial Galilean as well as Aristotelian idealizations are sometimes referred to as ‘caricatures’ (Gibbard and Varian 1978). Caricature models isolate a small number of salient characteristics of a system and distort them into an extreme case. A classical example is Ackerlof's (1970) model of the car market, which explains the difference in price between new and used cars solely in terms of asymmetric information, thereby disregarding all other factors that may influence prices of cars. However, it is controversial whether such highly idealised models can still be regarded as informative representations of their target systems (for a discussion of caricature models, in particular in economics, see Reiss 2006).

At this point we would like to mention a notion that seems to be closely related to idealization, namely approximation. Although the terms are sometimes used interchangeably, there seems to be a substantial difference between the two. Approximations are introduced in a mathematical context. One mathematical item is an approximation of another one if it is close to it in some relevant sense. What this item is may vary. Sometimes we want to approximate one curve with another one. This happens when we expand a function into a power series and only keep the first two or three terms. In other situations we approximate an equation by another one by letting a control parameter tend towards zero (Redhead 1980). The salient point is that the issue of physical interpretation need not arise. Unlike Galilean idealization, which involves a distortion of a real system, approximation is a purely formal matter. This, of course, does not imply that there cannot be interesting relations between approximations and idealization. For instance, an approximation can be justified by pointing out that it is the ‘mathematical pendant’ to an acceptable idealization (e.g. when we neglect a dissipative term in an equation because we make the idealizing assumption that the system is frictionless).

Analogical models. Standard examples of analogical models include the hydraulic model of an economic system, the billiard ball model of a gas, the computer model of the mind or the liquid drop model of the nucleus. At the most basic level, two things are analogous if there are certain relevant similarities between them. Hesse (1963) distinguishes different types of analogies according to the kinds of similarity relations in which two objects enter. A simple type of analogy is one that is based on shared properties. There is an analogy between the earth and the moon based on the fact that both are large, solid, opaque, spherical bodies, receiving heat and light from the sun, revolving around their axes, and gravitating towards other bodies. But sameness of properties is not a necessary condition. An analogy between two objects can also be based on relevant similarities between their properties. In this more liberal sense we can say that there is an analogy between sound and light because echoes are similar to reflections, loudness to brightness, pitch to color, detectability by the ear to detectability by the eye, and so on.

Analogies can also be based on the sameness or resemblance of relations between parts of two systems rather than on their monadic properties. It is this sense that some politicians assert that the relation of a father to his children is analogous to the relation of the state to the citizens. The analogies mentioned so far have been what Hesse calls ‘material analogies’. We obtain a more formal notion of analogy when we abstract from the concrete features the systems possess and only focus on their formal set-up. What the analogue model then shares with its target is not a set of features, but the same pattern of abstract relationships (i.e. the same structure, where structure is understood in the formal sense). This notion of analogy is closely related to what Hesse calls ‘formal analogy’. Two items are related by formal analogy if they are both interpretations of the same formal calculus. For instance, there is a formal analogy between a swinging pendulum and an oscillating electric circuit because they are both described by the same mathematical equation.

A further distinction due to Hesse is the one between positive, negative and neutral analogies. The positive analogy between two items consists in the properties or relations they share (both gas molecules and billiard balls have mass), the negative analogy in the ones they do not share (billiard balls are colored, gas molecules are not). The neutral analogy comprises the properties of which it is not known yet whether they belong to the positive or the negative analogy (do gas molecules obeying Newton's laws of collision exhibit an approach to equilibrium?). Neutral analogies play an important role in scientific research because they give rise to questions and suggest new hypotheses. In this vein, various authors have emphasized the heuristic role that analogies play in theory construction and in creative thought (Bailer-Jones and Bailer-Jones 2002; Hesse 1974, Holyoak and Thagard 1995, Kroes 1989, Psillos 1995, and the essays collected in Hellman 1988).

Phenomenological models. Phenomenological models have been defined in different, though related, ways. A traditional definition takes them to be models that only represent observable properties of their targets and refrain from postulating hidden mechanisms and the like. Another approach, due to McMullin (1968), defines phenomenological models as models that are independent of theories. This, however, seems to be too strong. Many phenomenological models, while failing to be derivable from a theory, incorporate principles and laws associated with theories. The liquid drop model of the atomic nucleus, for instance, portrays the nucleus as a liquid drop and describes it as having several properties (surface tension and charge, among others) originating in different theories (hydrodynamics and electrodynamics, respectively). Certain aspects of these theories—though usually not the complete theory—are then used to determine both the static and dynamical properties of the nucleus.

Concluding remarks. Each of these notions is still somewhat vague, suffering from internal problems, and much work needs to be done to tighten them. But more pressing than these is the question of how the different notions relate to each other. Are analogies fundamentally different from idealizations, or do they occupy different areas on a continuous scale? How do icons differ from idealizations and analogies? At the present stage we do not know how to answer these questions. What we need is a systematic account of the different ways in which models can relate to reality and of how these ways compare to each other.

1.2 Representational models II: models of data

Another kind of representational models are so-called ‘models of data’ (Suppes 1962). A model of data is a corrected, rectified, regimented, and in many instances idealized version of the data we gain from immediate observation, the so-called raw data. Characteristically, one first eliminates errors (e.g. removes points from the record that are due to faulty observation) and then present the data in a ‘neat’ way, for instance by drawing a smooth curve through a set of points. These two steps are commonly referred to as ‘data reduction’ and ‘curve fitting’. When we investigate the trajectory of a certain planet, for instance, we first eliminate points that are fallacious from the observation records and then fit a smooth curve to the remaining ones. Models of data play a crucial role in confirming theories because it is the model of data and not the often messy and complex raw data that we compare to a theoretical prediction.

The construction of a data model can be extremely complicated. It requires sophisticated statistical techniques and raises serious methodological as well as philosophical questions. How do we decide which points on the record need to be removed? And given a clean set of data, what curve do we fit to it? The first question has been dealt with mainly within the context of the philosophy of experiment (see for instance Galison 1997 and Staley 2004). At the heart of the latter question lies the so-called curve fitting problem, which is that the data themselves do not indicate what form the fitted curve should take. Traditional discussions of theory choice suggest that this issue is settled by background theory, considerations of simplicity, prior probabilities, or a combination of these. Forster and Sober (1994) point out that this formulation of the curve fitting problem is a slight overstatement because there is a theorem in statistics due to Akaike which shows (given certain assumptions) that the data themselves underwrite (though not determine) an inference concerning the curve's shape if we assume that the fitted curve has to be chosen such that it strikes a balance between simplicity and goodness of fit in a way that maximizes predictive accuracy. (Further discussions of data models can be found in Chin and Brewer 1994, Harris 2003, and Mayo 1996).

1.3 Models of theory

In modern logic, a model is a structure that makes all sentences of a theory true, where a theory is taken to be a (usually deductively closed) set of sentences in a formal language (see Bell and Machover 1977 or Hodges 1997 for details). The structure is a ‘model’ in the sense that it is what the theory represents. As a simple example consider Euclidean geometry, which consists of axioms—e.g. ‘any two points can be joined by a straight line’—and the theorems that can be derived from these axioms. Any structure of which all these statements are true is a model of Euclidean geometry.

A structure S = <U, O, R> is a composite entity consisting of (i) a non-empty set U of individuals called the domain (or universe) of S, (ii) an indexed set O (i.e. an ordered list) of operations on U (which may be empty), and (iii) a non-empty indexed set R of relations on U. It is important to note that nothing about what the objects are matters for the definition of a structure—they are mere dummies. Similarly, operations and functions are specified purely extensionally; that is, n-place relations are defined as classes of n-tuples, and functions taking n arguments are defined as classes of (n+1)-tuples. If all sentences of a theory are true when its symbols are interpreted as referring to either objects, relations, or functions of a structure S, then S is a model of this theory.

Many models in science carry over from logic the idea of being the interpretation of an abstract calculus. This is particularly pertinent in physics, where general laws—such as Newton's equation of motion—lie at the heart of a theory. These laws are applied to a particular system—e.g. a pendulum—by choosing a special force function, making assumptions about the mass distribution of the pendulum etc. The resulting model then is an interpretation (or realization) of the general law.

2. Ontology: What Are Models?

There is a variety of things that are commonly referred to as models: physical objects, fictional objects, set-theoretic structures, descriptions, equations, or combinations of some of these. However, these categories are neither mutually exclusive nor jointly exhaustive. Where one draws the line between, say, fictional objects and set-theoretical structures may well depend on one's metaphysical convictions, and some models may fall into yet another class of things. What models are is, of course, an interesting question in its own right, but, as briefly indicated in the last section, it has also important implications for semantics and, as we will see below, for epistemology.

2.1 Physical objects

Some models are straightforward physical objects. These are commonly referred to as ‘material models’. The class of material models comprises anything that is a physical entity and that serves as a scientific representation of something else. Among the members of this class we find stock examples like wooden models of bridges, planes, or ships, analogue models like electric circuit models of neural systems or pipe models of an economy, or Watson and Crick's model of DNA. But also more cutting edge cases, especially from the life sciences, where certain organisms are studied as stand-ins for others, belong to this category.

Material models do not give rise to any ontological difficulties over and above the well-known quibbles in connection with objects, which metaphysicians deal with (e.g. the nature of properties, the identity of objects, parts and wholes, and so on).

2.2 Fictional objects

Many models are not material models. The Bohr model of the atom, a frictionless pendulum, or isolated populations, for instance, are in the scientist's mind rather than in the laboratory and they do not have to be physically realized and experimented upon to perform their representational function. It seems natural to view them as fictional entities. This position can be traced back to the German neo-Kantian Vaihinger (1911), who emphasized the importance of fictions for scientific reasoning. Giere has recently advocated the view that models are abstract entities (1988, 81). It is not entirely clear what Giere means by ‘abstract entities’, but his discussion of mechanical models seems to suggest that he uses the term to designate fictional entities.

This view squares well with scientific practice, where scientists often talk about models as if they were objects, as well as with philosophical views that see the manipulation of models as an essential part of the process of scientific investigation (Morgan 1999). It is natural to assume that one can manipulate something only if it exists. Furthermore, models often have more properties than we explicitly attribute to them when we construct them, which is why they are interesting vehicles of research. A view that regards models as objects can easily explain this without further ado: when we introduce a model we use an identifying description, but the object itself is not exhaustively characterized by this description. Research then simply amounts to finding out more about the object thus identified.

The drawback of this suggestion is that fictional entities are notoriously beset with ontological riddles. This has led many philosophers to argue that there are no such things as fictional entities and that apparent ontological commitments to them must be renounced. The most influential of these deflationary accounts goes back to Quine (1953). Building on Russell's discussion of definite descriptions, Quine argues that it is an illusion that we refer to fictional entities when we talk about them. Instead, we can dispose of these alleged objects by turning the terms that refer to them into predicates and analyse sentences like ‘Pegasus does not exist’ as ‘nothing pegasizes’. By eliminating the troublesome term we eschew the ontological commitment they seem to carry. This has resulted in a glaring neglect of fictional entities, in particular among philosophers of science. Fine (1993), in a programmatic essay, draws attention to this neglect but does not offer a systematic account of how fictions are put to use in science.

2.3 Set-theoretic structures

An influential point of view takes models to be set-theoretic structures. This position can be traced back to Suppes (1960) and is now, with slight variants, held by most proponents of the semantic view of theories. Needless to say, there are differences between different versions of the semantic view (van Fraassen, for instance, emphasizes that models are state-space structures); a survey of the different positions can be found in Suppe (1989, Ch. 1). However, on all these accounts models are structures of one sort or another (Da Costa and French 2000). As models of this kind are often closely tied to mathematized sciences, they are sometimes also referred to as ‘mathematical models’. (For a discussion of such models in biology see Lloyd 1984 and 1994.)

This view of models has been criticized on different grounds. One pervasive criticism is that many types of models that play an important role in science are not structures and cannot be accommodated within the structuralist view of models, which can neither account for how these models are constructed nor for how they work in the context of investigation (Cartwright 1999, Downes 1992, Morrison 1999). Another charge held against the set-theoretic approach is that it is not possible to explain how structures represent a target system which forms part of the physical world without making assumptions that go beyond what the approach can afford (Frigg 2006).

2.4 Descriptions

A time-honored position has it that what scientists display in scientific papers and textbooks when they present a model are more or less stylized descriptions of the relevant target systems (Achinstein 1968, Black 1962).

This view has not been subject to explicit criticism. However, some of the criticisms that have been marshaled against the syntactic view of theories equally threaten a linguistic understanding of models. First, it is a commonplace that we can describe the same thing in different ways. But if we identify a model with its description, then each new description yields a new model, which seems to be counterintuitive. One can translate a description into other languages (formal or natural), but one would not say that one hereby obtains a different model. Second, models have different properties than descriptions. On the one hand, we say that the model of the solar system consists of spheres orbiting around a big mass or that the population in the model is isolated from its environment, but it does not seem to make sense to say this about a description. On the other hand, descriptions have properties that models do not have. A description can be written in English, consist of 517 words, be printed in red ink, and so on. None of this makes any sense when said about a model. The descriptivist faces the challenge to either make a case that these arguments are mistaken or to show how to get around these difficulties.

2.5 Equations

Another group of things that is habitually referred to as ‘models’, in particular in economics, is equations (which are then also termed ‘mathematical models’). The Black-Scholes model of the stock market or the Mundell-Fleming model of an open economy are cases in point.

The problem with this suggestion is that equations are syntactic items and as such they face objections similar to the ones put forward against descriptions. First, one can describe the same situation using different co-ordinates and as a result obtain different equations; but we do not seem to obtain a different model. Second, the model has properties different from the equation. An oscillator is three-dimensional but the equation describing its motion is not. Equally, an equation may be inhomogeneous but the system it describes is not.

2.6 Gerrymandered ontologies

The proposals discussed so far have tacitly assumed that a model belongs to one particular class of objects. But this assumption is not necessary. It might be the case that models are a mixture of elements belonging to different ontological categories. In this vein Morgan (2001) suggests that models involve structural as well as narrative elements (‘stories’, as she calls them).

3. Epistemology: Learning with Models

Models are vehicles for learning about the world. Significant parts of scientific investigation are carried out on models rather than on reality itself because by studying a model we can discover features of and ascertain facts about the system the model stands for; in brief, models allow for surrogative reasoning (Swoyer 1991). For instance, we study the nature of the hydrogen atom, the dynamics of populations, or the behavior of polymers by studying their respective models. This cognitive function of models has been widely acknowledged in the literature, and some even suggest that models give rise to a new style of reasoning, so-called ‘model based reasoning’ (Magnani and Nersessian 2002, Magnani, Nersessian and Thagard 1999). This leaves us with the question of how learning with a model is possible.

Hughes (1997) provides a general framework for discussing this question. According to his so-called DDI account, learning takes place in three stages: denotation, demonstration, and interpretation. We begin by establishing a representation relation (‘denotation’) between the model and the target. Then we investigate the features of the model in order to demonstrate certain theoretical claims about its internal constitution or mechanism; i.e. we learn about the model (‘demonstration’). Finally, these findings have to be converted into claims about the target system; Hughes refers to this step as ‘interpretation’. It is the latter two notions that are at stake here.

3.1 Learning about the model: experiments, thought experiments and simulation

Learning about a model happens at two places, in the construction and the manipulation of the model (Morgan 1999). There are no fixed rules or recipes for model building and so the very activity of figuring out what fits together and how it does so affords an opportunity to learn about the model. Once the model is built, we do not learn about its properties by looking at it; we have to use and manipulate the model in order to elicit its secrets.

Depending on what kind of model we are dealing with, building and manipulating a model amounts to different activities demanding a different methodology. Material models seem to be unproblematic as they are commonly used in the kind of experimental contexts that have been discussed extensively by philosophers of science (e.g. we put the model of a car in the wind tunnel and measure its air resistance).

Not so with fictional models. What constraints are there to the construction of fictional models and how do we manipulate them? The natural response seems to be that we answer these questions by performing a thought experiment. Different authors (e.g. Brown 1991, Gendler 2000, Norton 1991, Reiss 2003, Sorensen 1992) have explored this line of argument but they have reached very different and often conflicting conclusions as to how thought experiments are performed and what the status of their outcomes is (for details see the entry on thought experiments).

An important class of models is of mathematical nature. In some cases it is possible to derive results or solve equations analytically. But quite often this is not the case. It is at this point where the invention of the computer had a great impact, as it allows us to solve equations which are otherwise intractable by making a computer simulation. Many parts of current research in both the natural and social sciences rely on computer simulations. The formation and development of stars and galaxies, the detailed dynamics of high-energy heavy ion reactions, aspects of the intricate process of the evolution of life as well as the outbreak of wars, the progression of an economy, decision procedures in an organization and moral behavior are explored with computer simulations, to mention only a few examples (Hegselmann et al. 1996, Skyrms 1996).

What is a simulation? Simulations characteristically are used in connection with dynamic models, i.e. models that involve time. The aim of a simulation is to solve the equations of motion of such a model, which is designed to represent the time-evolution of its target system. So one can say that a simulation imitates a (usually real) process by another process (Hartmann 1996, Humphreys 2004).

It has been claimed that computer simulations constitute a genuinely new methodology of science or even a new scientific paradigm (Humphreys 2004, Rohrlich 1991, Winsberg 2001 and 2003, and various contributions to Sismondo and Gissis 1999). Although this contention may not meet with univocal consent, there is no doubt about the practical significance of computer simulations. When standard methods fail, computer simulations are often the only way to learn something about a dynamical model; they help us to ‘extend ourselves’ (Humphreys 2004), as it were. In situations in which the underlying model is well confirmed and understood, computer experiments may even replace real experiments, which has economic advantages and minimizes risk (as, for example, in the case of the simulation of atomic explosions). Computer simulations are also heuristically important. They may suggest new theories, models and hypotheses, for example based on a systematic exploration of a model's parameter space (Hartmann 1996).

But computer simulations also bear methodological perils. They may provide misleading results because due to the discrete nature of the calculations carried out on a digital computer they only allow for the exploration of a part of the full parameter space; and this subspace may not reveal certain important features of the model. The severity of this problem is somehow mitigated by the increasing power of modern computers. But the availability of more computational power also may have adverse effects. It may encourage scientists to swiftly come up with increasingly complex but conceptually premature models, involving poorly understood assumptions or mechanisms and too many additional adjustable parameters (for a discussion of a related problem in the context of individual actor models in the social sciences see Schnell 1990). This may lead to an increase in empirical adequacy—which may be welcome when it comes, for example, to forecasting the weather—but not necessarily to a better understanding of the underlying mechanisms. As a result, the use of computer simulations may change the weight we assign to the various goals of science. So it is important not to be carried away with the means that new powerful computers offer and to thereby place out of sight the actual goals of research.

3.2 Converting knowledge about the model into knowledge about the target

Once we have knowledge about the model, this knowledge has to be ‘translated’ into knowledge about the target system. It is at this point that the representational function of models becomes important again. Models can instruct us about the nature of reality only if we assume that (at least some of) the model's aspects have counterparts in the world. But if learning is tied to representation and if there are different kinds of representation (analogies, idealizations, etc.), then there are also different kinds of learning. If, for instance, we have a model we take to be a realistic depiction, the transfer of knowledge from the model to the target is accomplished in a different manner than when we deal with an analogue, or a model that involves idealizing assumptions.

What are these different ways of learning? Although numerous case studies have been made of how certain specific models work, there do not seem to be any general accounts of how the transfer of knowledge from a model to its target is achieved (this with the possible exception of theories of analogical reasoning, see references above). This is a difficult question, but it is one that deserves more attention than it has gotten so far.

4. Models and Theory

One of the most perplexing questions in connection with models is how they relate to theories. The separation between models and theory is a very hazy one and in the jargon of many scientists it is often difficult, if not impossible, to draw a line. So the question is: is there a distinction between models and theories and if so how do they relate to one another?

In common parlance, the terms ‘model’ and ‘theory’ are sometimes used to express someone's attitude towards a particular piece of science. The phrase ‘it's just a model’ indicates that the hypothesis at stake is asserted only tentatively or is even known to be false, while something is awarded the label ‘theory’ if it has acquired some degree of general acceptance. However, this way of drawing a line between models and theories is of no use to a systematic understanding of models.

4.1 The two extremes: the syntactic and the semantic view of theories

The syntactic view of theories, which is an integral part of the logical positivist picture of science, construes a theory as a set of sentences in an axiomatized system of first order logic. Within this approach, the term model is used in a wider and in a narrower sense. In the wider sense, a model is just a system of semantic rules that interpret the abstract calculus and the study of a model amounts to scrutinizing the semantics of a scientific language. In the narrower sense, a model is an alternative interpretation of a certain calculus (Braithwaite 1953, Campbell 1920, Nagel 1961, Spector 1965). If, for instance, we take the mathematics used in the kinetic theory of gases and reinterpret the terms of this calculus in a way that they refer to billiard balls, the billiard balls are a model of the kinetic theory of gases. Proponents of the syntactic view believe such models to be irrelevant to science. Models, they hold, are superfluous additions that are at best of pedagogical, aesthetical or psychological value (Carnap 1938, Hempel 1965; see also Bailer-Jones 1999).

The semantic view of theories (see e.g. van Fraassen 1980, Giere 1988, Suppe 1989, and Suppes 2002) reverses this standpoint and declares that we should dispense with a formal calculus altogether and view a theory as a family of models. Although different version of the semantic view assume a different notion of model (see above) they all agree that models are the central unit of scientific theorizing.

4.2 Models as independent of theories

One of the most perspicuous criticisms of the semantic view is that it mislocates the place of models in the scientific edifice. Models are relatively independent from theory, rather than being constitutive of them; or to use Morrison's (1998) slogan, they are ‘autonomous agents’. This independence has two aspects: construction and functioning (Morgan and Morrison 1999).

A look at how models are constructed in actual science shows that they are neither derived entirely from data nor from theory. Theories do not provide us with algorithms for the construction a model; they are not ‘vending machines’ into which one can insert a problem and a models pops out (Cartwright 1999, Ch. 8). Model building is an art and not a mechanical procedure. The London model of superconductivity affords us with a good example of this relationship. The model's principal equation has no theoretical justification (in the sense that it could be derived from electromagnetic or any other fundamental theory) and is motivated solely on the basis of phenomenological considerations (Cartwright et al. 1995). Or, to put it another way, the model has been constructed ‘bottom up’ and not ‘top down’ and therefore enjoys a great deal of independence from theory.

The second aspect of the independence of models is that they perform functions which they could not perform if they were a part of, or strongly dependent on, theories.

Models as complements of theories. A theory may be incompletely specified in the sense that it imposes certain general constraints but remains silent about the details of concrete situations, which are provided by a model (Redhead 1980). A special case of this situation is when a qualitative theory is known and the model introduces quantitative measures (Apostel 1961). Redhead's example for a theory that is underdetermined in this way is axiomatic quantum field theory, which only imposes certain general constraints on quantum fields but does not provide an account of particular fields.

While Redhead and others seem to think of cases of this sort as somehow special, Cartwright (1983) has argued that they are the rule rather than the exception. On her view, fundamental theories such as classical mechanics and quantum mechanics do not represent anything at all as they do not describe any real world situation. Laws in such theories are schemata that need to be concretized and filled with the details of a specific situation, which is a task that is accomplished by a model.

Models stepping in when theories are too complex to handle. Theories may be too complicated to handle. In such a case a simplified model may be employed that allows for a solution (Apostel 1961, Redhead 1980). Quantum chromodynamics, for instance, cannot easily be used to study the hadron structure of a nucleus, although it is the fundamental theory for this problem. To get around this difficulty physicists construct tractable phenomenological models (e.g. the MIT bag model) that effectively describes the relevant degrees of freedom of the system under consideration (Hartmann 1999). The advantage of these models is that they yield results where theories remain silent. Their drawback is that it is often not clear how to understand the relationship between the theory and the model as the two are, strictly speaking, contradictory.

A more extreme case is the use of a model when there are no theories at all available. We encounter this situation in all domains, but it is particularly rampant in biology and economics where overarching theories are often not to be had. The models that scientists then construct to tackle the situation are sometimes referred to as ‘substitute models’ (Groenewold 1961).

Models as preliminary theories. The notion of models as substitutes for theories is closely related to the notion of a developmental model. This term has been coined by Leplin (1980), who pointed out how useful models were in the development of early quantum theory and is now used as an umbrella notion covering cases in which models are some sort of a preliminary exercises to theory.

A closely related notion is the one of probing models (also ‘study models’ or ‘toy models’). These are models which do not perform a representational function and which are not expected to instruct us about anything beyond the model itself. The purpose of these models is to test new theoretical tools that are used later on to build representational models. In field theory, for instance, the so-called φ4-model has been studied extensively not because it represents anything real (it is well-known that it doesn't) but because it serves several heuristic functions. The simplicity of the φ4-model allows physicist to ‘get a feeling’ for what quantum field theories are like and to extract some general features that this simple model shares with more complicated ones. One can try complicated techniques such as renormalization in a simple setting and it is possible to get acquainted with mechanisms—in this case symmetry breaking—that can be used later on (Hartmann 1995). This is true not only for physics. As Wimsatt (1987) points out, false models in genetics can perform many useful functions, among them the following: the false model can help to answer questions about more realistic models, provide an arena for answering questions about properties of more complex models, ‘factor out’ phenomena that would not otherwise be seen, serve as a limiting case of a more general model (or two false models may define the extreme of a continuum of cases in which the real case is supposed to lie), or it can lead to the identification of relevant variables and the estimation of their values.

5. Models and Other Debates in the Philosophy of Science

The debate over scientific models has important repercussions for other debates in the philosophy of science. The reason for this is that traditionally the debates over scientific realism, reductionism, explanation, and laws of nature were couched in terms of theories, because only theories were acknowledged as carriers of scientific knowledge. So the question is whether, and if so how, discussions of these matters change when we shift the focus from theories to models. Up to now, no comprehensive model-based accounts of any of these issues have been developed; but models did leave some traces in the discussions of these topics.

5.1 Models and the realism versus antirealism debate

It has been claimed that the practice of model building favors antirealism over realism. Antirealists point out that truth is not the main goal of scientific modeling. Cartwright (1983), for instance, presents several case studies illustrating that good models are often false and that supposedly true theories might not help much when it comes to understanding, say, the working of a laser.

Realists deny that the falsity of models renders a realist approach to science impossible by pointing out that a good model, thought not literally true, is usually at least approximately true. Laymon (1985) argues that the predictions of a model typically become better when we relax idealizations (i.e. de-idealize the model), which he takes to support realism (see also McMullin 1985, Nowak 1979 and Brzezinski and Nowak 1992).

Apart from the usual complaints about the elusiveness of the notion of approximate truth, antirealists have taken issue with this reply for two (related) reasons. First, as Cartwright (1989) points out, there is no reason to assume that one can always improve a model by adding de-idealizing corrections. Second, it seems that the outlined procedure is not in accordance with scientific practice. It is unusual that scientists invest work in repeatedly de-idealizing an existing model. Rather, they shift to a completely different modeling framework once the adjustments to be made get too involved (Hartmann 1998). The various models of the atomic nucleus are a case in point. Once it has been realized that shell effects are important to understand various phenomena, the (collective) liquid drop model has been put aside and the (single-particle) shell model has been developed to account for these findings. A further difficulty with de-idealization is that most idealizations are not ‘controlled’. It is, for example, not clear in what way one has to de-idealize the MIT-Bag Model to eventually arrive at quantum chromodynamics, the supposedly correct underlying theory.

A further antirealist argument, the ‘incompatible models argument’, takes as its starting point the observation that scientists often successfully use several incompatible models of one and the same target system for predictive purposes (Morrison 2000). These models seemingly contradict each other as they ascribe different properties to the same target system. In nuclear physics, for instance, the liquid drop model explores the analogy of the atomic nucleus with a (charged) fluid drop, while the shell model describes nuclear properties in terms of the properties of protons and neutrons, the constituents of an atomic nucleus. This practice appears to cause a problem for scientific realism. Realists typically hold that there is a close connection between the predictive success of a theory and its being at least approximately true. But if several theories of the same system are predictively successful and if these theories are mutually inconsistent, they cannot all be true, not even approximately.

Realists can react to this argument in various ways. First, they can challenge the claim that the models in question are indeed predictively successful. If the models aren't good predictors, the argument is blocked. Second, they can defend a version of perspectival realism (Giere 1999, Rueger 2005) according to which each model reveals one aspect of the phenomenno in question, and when taken together a full (or fuller) account emerges. Third, realists can deny that there is a problem in the first place because scientific models, which are always idealized in one way or another and therefore strictly speaking false, are just the wrong vehicle to make a point about realism. Finally, one can urge that all representation, the everyday no less than the scientific, involves idealization so that trading in suitable idealizations is what it is to know about an independent objective world (Teller 2004).

5.2 Model and reductionism

The multiple-models problem mentioned in the last section raises the question of how different models are related. Evidently, multiple models for the same target system do not generally stand in a deductive relation as they often contradict each other. Given that most of these models seem to be indispensable to the practice of science, a simple picture of the organization of science along the lines of Nagel's (1961) model of reduction or Oppenheim and Putnam's (1958) pyramid picture does not seem plausible.

Some have suggested (Cartwright 1999, Hacking 1983) a picture of science according to which there are no systematic relations that hold between different models. Some models are tied together because they represent the same target system, but this does not imply that they enter into any further relationships (deductive or otherwise). We are confronted with a patchwork of models, all of which hold ceteris paribus in their specific domains of applicability (see also the papers collected in Falkenburg and Muschik 1998).

Some argue that this picture is at least partially incorrect because there are various interesting relations that hold between different models or theories. These relations range from controlled approximations over singular limit relations (Batterman 2004) to structural relations (Gähde 1997) and rather loose relations called stories (Hartmann 1999; see also Bokulich 2003). These suggestions have been made on the basis of cases studies (for instance of so-called effective quantum field theories, see Hartmann 2001) and it remains to be seen whether a more general account of these relations can be given and whether a deeper justification for them can be provided (e.g. within a Bayesian framework).

5.3 Models and laws of nature

It is widely held that science aims at discovering laws of nature. Philosophers, in turn, have been faced with the challenge of explicating what laws of nature are. According to the two currently dominant accounts, the best systems approach and the universals approach, laws of nature are understood to be universal in scope, meaning that they apply to everything that there is in the world. This take on laws does not seem to square with a view that assigns models a center stage in scientific theorizing. What role do general laws play in science if it is models that represent what is happening in the world and how are models and laws related?

One possible response is to argue that laws of nature govern entities and processes in a model rather than in the world. Fundamental laws, on this approach, do not state facts about the world but hold true of entities and processes in the model. Different variants of this view have been advocated by Cartwright (1983, 1999), Giere (1999), and van Fraassen (1989). Surprisingly, realists about laws do not seem to have responded to this challenge and so it remains an open question whether (and if so how) a realistic understanding of laws and a model-based approach to science can be made compatible.

5.4 Models and scientific explanation

Laws of nature play an important role in many accounts of explanation, most prominently in the deductive-nomological model and the unification approach. Unfortunately, these accounts inherit the problems that beset the relationship between models and laws. This leaves us with two options. Either one can argue that laws can be dispensed with in explanations, an idea which is employed in both van Fraassen's (1980) pragmatic theory of explanation and approaches to causal explanation such as Woodward's (2003). According to the latter, models are tools to find out about the causal relations that hold between certain facts or processes and it is these relations that do the explanatory job. Or one can shift the explanatory burden on models. A positive suggestion along these lines is Cartwright's so-called ‘simulacrum account of explanation’, which suggests that we explain a phenomenon by constructing a model that fits the phenomenon into the basic framework of a grand theory (1983, Ch. 8). On this account, the model itself is the explanation we seek. This squares well with basic scientific intuitions but leaves us with the question of what notion of explanation is at work (see also Elgin and Sober 2002).

6. Conclusion

Models play an important role in science. But despite the fact that they have generated considerable interest among philosophers, there remain significant lacunas in our understanding of what models are and of how they work.


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laws of nature | scientific explanation | scientific realism | scientific unity | thought experiments


We would like to thank Nancy Cartwright, Paul Humphreys, Julian Reiss, Elliott Sober, Chris Swoyer, and Paul Teller for helpful comments and suggestions on a draft of this entry.