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Molyneux's Problem

First published Thu Jun 30, 2005

On 7 July 1688 the Irish scientist and politician William Molyneux (1656-1698) sent a letter to John Locke in which he put forward a problem which was to awaken great interest among philosophers and other scientists throughout the Enlightenment and up until the present day. In brief, the question Molyneux asked was whether a man who has been born blind and who has learnt to distinguish and name a globe and a cube by touch, would be able to distinguish and name these objects simply by sight, once he had been enabled to see.

1. Molyneux's Formulation of the Problem

As is apparent from both his writings and his lectures, Molyneux was highly interested in optics and in the psychology of sight. To some extent this simply reflects the general attitude of his time: optics was a subject that was then engaging the attention of a number of leading scientists. His interest also had a more personal background, however, for his wife had lost her sight in the first year of their marriage. The immediate cause of his formulating the problem and sending it to Locke is to be found in Locke's French extract of An Essay Concerning Humane Understanding, published in 1688 in the Bibliothèque Universelle & Historique. In this extract Locke distinguished between ideas we acquire by means of one sense and those we acquire by means of more than one sense. He maintained that someone who lacks a sense will never be able to acquire the ideas pertaining to it. A blind man, for example, will never be able to have any idea of colour. Among the ideas we are able to acquire by means of a combination of senses, Locke reckoned those of space, rest, motion and figure. Molyneux's problem had to do with the last of these. Molyneux was probably inspired by Locke's exposition of the ideas of persons born blind and the ideas which can be acquired by means of both sight and touch. He was, moreover, a great admirer of Locke.

On Saturday 7 July 1688 William Molyneux wrote a letter to John Locke setting out for the first time his problem concerning the person born blind:

Dublin July. 7. 88

A Problem Proposed to the Author of the Essai Philosophique concernant L'Entendement

A Man, being born blind, and having a Globe and a Cube, nigh of the same bignes, Committed into his Hands, and being taught or Told, which is Called the Globe, and which the Cube, so as easily to distinguish them by his Touch or Feeling; Then both being taken from Him, and Laid on a Table, Let us Suppose his Sight Restored to Him; Whether he Could, by his Sight, and before he touch them, know which is the Globe and which the Cube? Or Whether he Could know by his Sight, before he stretch'd out his Hand, whether he Could not Reach them, tho they were Removed 20 or 1000 feet from Him?

If the Learned and Ingenious Author of the Forementiond Treatise think this Problem Worth his Consideration and Answer, He may at any time Direct it to One that Much Esteems him, and is,

His Humble Servant
William Molyneux
High Ormonds Gate in Dublin. Ireland

For reasons unknown Locke never replied to the letter. However, a couple of years later, after the two men had started an amicable correspondence, Molyneux returned to his problem. This time with success. In his letter, dated 2 March 1693, Molyneux presented Locke with his problem, though in a somewhat altered form, asking Locke if he could perhaps find some place in his Essay to say something about it. This time Locke reacted with enthusiasm: "Your ingenious problem will deserve to be published to the world." From the second edition of his Essay (that of 1694) Locke included Molyneux's problem in his work and thereby made it accessible to a wider audience:

Suppose a Man born blind, and now adult, and taught by his touch to distinguish between a Cube, and a Sphere of the same metal, and nighly of the same bigness, so as to tell, when he felt one and t'other; which is the Cube, which the Sphere. Suppose then the Cube and Sphere placed on a Table, and the Blind Man to be made to see. Qaere, Whether by his sight, before he touch'd them, he could now distinguish, and tell, which is the Globe, which the Cube.

In this formulation Molyneux's problem attracted the attention of lots of philosophers and other men of learning, such as Berkeley, Leibniz, Voltaire, Diderot, La Mettrie, Helmholtz and William James. In which ways did they approach the problem?

2. Eighteenth-Century Philosophical Discussions about Molyneux's Problem

In the first instance, philosophers considered it to be impossible that a man born blind should be able to acquire sight. They regarded Molyneux's problem as a kind of thought-experiment, which was to be dealt with by ratiocination alone. The arguments put forward were usually concerned with the relation between visual and tactual sensations or between visual and tactual notions of the form of objects.

All these philosophers assumed that the visual and tactual sensations of an object differ from each other, but there was no agreement concerning the relation between the two. Some, Berkeley for instance, believed that this relation is arbitrary and based only on experience. Others, such as Lee and Synge, thought that it is necessary and perceived directly, while yet others, such as Molyneux and Locke, thought that it is necessary and learned by experience. Opinions were also divided concerning the relation between visual and tactual notions of objects. Some philosophers defended the position that the visual and tactual notions of a globe differ from one another, and can only be related by either experience or reason (the latter view was defended by Reid). Others believed that the visual and the tactual notion of a globe are actually the same, or have something in common which is either observed directly (Boullier and Hutcheson) or inferred by reason (Leibniz).

Investigating how the different positions correlate with the answers given to Molyneux's question, one can conclude as follows. Empiricists such as Molyneux, Locke and Berkeley answered in the negative. More rationalist philosophers such as Synge, Lee and Leibniz gave an affirmative answer. There was no unanimous solution, amongst others because Molyneux's problem was interpreted in different ways. Some philosophers thought that the man born blind had to answer directly, while others were of the opinion that he should be able to make use of his memory and reason, and that he should be at liberty to view all sides of the objects by walking around them. Some philosophers believed that the question implied that the man should be told in advance that he would be presented with a globe and cube, whereas others thought that he should not be provided with this information.

3. The First Experimental Data

Discussion concerning Molyneux's problem took a new turn once the English surgeon and anatomist William Cheselden (1688-1752) published an account of what a congenitally blind person had seen after his cataracts had been removed (1728). The publication led philosophers to regard the Molyneux problem no longer as a simple thought-experiment, but as a question which could be answered by experimentation.

In his account, Cheselden noted that when the boy was first able to see, he did not know the shape of a thing and could not recognize one thing from another, regardless of how different in shape or magnitude they were. Some philosophers thought that Cheselden's observations were unequivocal and that they confirmed the hypothesis that a blind man restored to sight would not be able to distinguish objects and would have to learn to see. Most of these philosophers, we might mention Voltaire, Camper and the elder Condillac as examples, were adherents of Berkeley's theory of vision, which had predicted a similar outcome.

Others, however, such as La Mettrie and Diderot, regarded Cheselden's account as wholly ambiguous in its implications. They pointed out that it was possible that the boy had been unable to make valid perceptual judgments because his eyes had not been functioning properly. They suggested that this could have been due to the fact that his eyes had not been used for a long time, or to their not having had enough time to recover from the operation. They pointed out that Cheselden had, perhaps, asked the boy leading questions. Some philosophers also believed that the results of the inquiry depended on the intelligence of the patient.

Those who criticised the significance of Cheselden's account in this way (most of them were French philosophes) made proposals as to how to avoid the problems mentioned. They suggested that one should prepare the patient carefully for the operation and for the interrogation, that one should allow his eyes time to recover from the operation and that one should give him the opportunity to exercise his eyes in darkness. What is more, one should avoid asking leading questions.

Some philosophers were even more radically critical of operations like that performed by Cheselden. Mérian, for example, noticed that Cheselden's observations, like all observations of blind people whose cataracts have been extracted, present difficulties because cataracts do not cause complete blindness and complete blindness cannot be cured. It could not be concluded from this that Molyneux's problem could not be solved experimentally, however, for it could be maintained that patients operated upon for cataracts are directly relevant to the solution of it. They are unable to perceive form before they are operated upon, and the essential issue at stake when posing Molyneux's problem is the ability to distinguish and name forms. This is a point of view which was taken by many philosophers.

4. Empirical Approaches in the Nineteenth Century

About 1800 several developments occurred which justify the speaking of a new period in the history of Molyneux's problem. New accounts of patients operated on for cataracts were published, and shed fresh light on the issue. Whereas Cheselden had only noticed what his patient observed in more or less natural circumstances, later ophthalmologists performed experiments which showed whether their patients were able to see form, size, distance, etc. Some, such as Franz and Nunneley, were especially interested in Molyneux's problem as such, and performed experiments with the prescribed globe and cube. Some of the reports were in agreement with that of Cheselden, others conflicted with it. The cases could not easily be compared, however, since the pre- and post-operative circumstances differed to such a great extent. As one might have expected, an extended scale of possible solutions to the Molyneux problem was brought under consideration.

What is more, specialists also began to consider observations concerning the sight of newly born animals and babies when discussing Molyneux's problem. Some of those doing research in the field, such as Adam Smith and Johannes Müller, supposed that the sight of young animals could be compared with that of a person who had been made to see. The fact that certain animals see objects at a distance as soon as they are born suggested that Molyneux's question could be answered affirmatively. This turned out to be a strong argument against Berkeley's theory of vision. Others, Thomas Brown for instance, were of the opinion that the visual behaviour of babies could be compared with that of a blind person who had been operated upon and made to see. They were convinced that in both cases seeing has to be learned, and that Molyneux's question had, therefore, to be answered in the negative.

Wheatstone's discovery that the perception by sight of the third dimension of space is immediate, was used as a reason for answering Molyneux's question affirmatively. The discovery was also regarded as disproving Berkeley's theory of vision.

The data concerning the sight of patients who had been operated upon for cataracts, and of young animals and infants, were used as evidence in the debate concerning the question of whether the perception of space is innate or acquired. Although Molyneux's problem was frequently discussed in this debate, there was still no agreement on the right solution to it.

5. Modern Approaches

During the course of the twentieth century, the main interest in Molyneux's problem has been historical. Biographers and commentators dealing with well-known philosophers have analysed the solutions they proposed for it. Molyneux's problem has also turned up frequently in textbooks and general histories of psychology, ophthalmology, neurophysiology, etc. A few authors have written brief and incomplete histories of the problem. Degenaar (1996) has written a comprehensive survey of the history of the discussion about Molyneux's problem. Riskin (2002) described Molyneux's problem in the wider context of the Enlightenment.

Philosophers, psychologists and other scientists have also tried to solve the Molyneux problem by making use of alternative approaches, both old and new. They have, for example, made use of various accounts of recovery from early blindness. As was to be expected, these proved to be as problematic and inconclusive as were their predecessors in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries.

The Molyneux problem has also been tackled by methods more amenable to experimental control than is possible in clinical studies, namely by rearing animals in darkness. Visual deprivation experiments have shown that during the development of the visual system there is a certain critical period in connection with the presentation of light patterns. During this period, changes brought about by deprivation can be reversed. If exposure to light is postponed for too long, however, the development of normal visual mechanisms will be extremely difficult, if not impossible. Although the results of deprivation experiments are not relevant to the solution of Molyneux's problem—Molyneux supposed that his blind man had a good visual system, whereas that of deprived animals is abnormal—they have been used as evidence for Locke's position.

A recent approach to Molyneux's problem involves the use of sensory substitution devices, developed in the context of corporeal mobility or reading (Morgan, 1977). Learning how to use sensory substitution systems has been considered a good approximation to Molyneux's problem, since such systems present information normally handled by one modality, such as vision, to another sense, typically audition or touch, using forms of coding novel to the user. Experiments with sensory substitution systems show that subjects need some time to learn to distinguish and identify objects, and this has been interpreted as a confirmation of the position of Molyneux and Locke. Some researchers have stressed the fact that a sensory aid is not, strictly speaking, a new modality, and that to learn to use such devices is only an approximation to Molyneux's problem, depending as it does upon the raising of similar issues.

Another variation of Molyneux's problem was suggested by Evans (1985). He wondered whether the visual cortex of a patient with congenital blindness could be electrically stimulated in such a way that the patient experiences a pattern of light flashes (phosphenes) in the shape of a square or circle. This question has been investigated experimentally, but the results do not provide a final answer to Molyneux's question (see Jacomuzzi, Kobau and Bruno 2003 for discussion).

There is one author who believes that no new approach is necessary: Gallagher (2005, ch. 7) argues that developmental psychology and neurophysiology have progressed sufficiently far to enable us to answer Molyneux's question once and for all. He claims that Locke was right, but for the wrong reasons. However, it remains to be seen whether this will be the last word.

6. Conclusion

The history of the issues surrounding Molyneux's question shows that the question was not as easy to answer as Molyneux himself may have assumed. On the contrary, there is no problem in the history of the philosophy of perception that has provoked more thought than the problem that Molyneux raised in 1688. In this sense, Molyneux's problem is one the most fruitful thought-experiments ever proposed in the history of philosophy, which is still as intriguing today as when Molyneux first formulated it more than three centuries ago.


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Related Entries

Berkeley, George | Condillac, Étienne Bonnot de | Diderot, Denis | Helmholtz, Hermann von | James, William | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Locke, John | perception: the problem of | Reid, Thomas | Smith, Adam: moral philosophy | thought experiments | Voltaire