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Moral Arguments for the Existence of God

First published Tue May 25, 2004; substantive revision Tue Dec 4, 2007

Moral arguments for God's existence may be defined as that family of arguments in the history of western philosophical theology having claims about the character of moral thought and experience in their premises and affirmations of the existence of God in their conclusions. Some of these arguments are on all fours with other theistic arguments, such as the design argument. They cite facts that are claimed to be evident to human experience. And they argue that such facts entail or are best explained by the hypothesis that there is a God with the attributes traditionally ascribed to him. Other moral proofs of God's existence take us away from the patterns of argument typical of natural theology. They deal in our ends and motives. These variants on the moral argument for God's existence describe some end that the moral life commits us to (such as the attainment of the perfect good) and contend that this end cannot be attained unless God as traditionally defined exists

1. Arguments from the Normativity of Morality

Many examples of theoretical arguments for God's existence start from the fact of ethical normativity. Human beings are aware of actions as being right and wrong, obligatory and forbidden. Such awareness carries with it the thought that they are “bound” to do some things and bound to avoid doing others. Moral qualities have a bindingness attached to them shown in the force of the moral “ought” and the moral “must”. If I make a promise, the promise creates (ceteris paribus) an obligation to deliver what is promised. The normative fact is, first, not dependent on my own goals and ends and, second, possessed of a universal force. The fact that I am bound by the normative truth “do what you promised” does not hold because I have ends which I cannot achieve unless I fulfill the promise. The imperative is not what Kant styled a “hypothetical” one. It is rather “categorical”. It binds no matter what my particular goals are (see Kant 1996/1973 67; 4/414). That is linked to its universal dimension. I have an obligation to deliver what I promised, because anyone who makes a promise thereby (ceteris paribus) obligates him- or herself. The obligation created by the promise holds independent of my particular goals because it reflects a universal rule, holding at all times and places and applying to any human being as such.

Now we have a fact from which moral arguments for God's existence can proceed: there appear to be morally normative facts/qualities in the world. Many of these arguments claim that the postulation of God provides the best explanation of this fact. We must use “appear” to record the fact, because there is a venerable line of thought in philosophy contending that moral bindingness is not real. It is a projection on the part of the human mind. It is no more “out there” in the world-minus-us than is (on some accounts) a secondary quality like taste. I say that the whisky tastes sweet, appearing to ascribe a quality to it. But in truth there is no sweetness in this mix of chemicals. I am projecting a reaction which I and others have toward it. So: we can be realists or anti-realists about the existence of moral normativity.

Such projective accounts of moral normativity, of moral qualities and facts, offer one naturalistic explanation of the appearance of normativity. A projective explanation thus avoids the need to posit God as the best explanation of the fact that moral normativity appears to exist. Proponents of theoretical moral arguments will contend that projectionism is false to our experience and gives rise to forms of moral skepticism that are corrosive of moral thought and action. We cannot rule on such issues here. (For a very clear form of moral projectionism see Mackie 1977.)

A template for a moral argument for God's existence can now be given.

Argument I:

  1. It appears to human beings that moral normativity exists.
  2. The best explanation of moral normativity is that it is grounded in God.
  3. Therefore God exists.

This schematic argument incorporates an inference to best explanation. We must now distinguish and set out Crude versus Sophisticated applications of this template.

1.1 Crude Arguments from Moral Normativity

Arguments styled thus depend on drawing a close analogy between moral requirements and human law.

It is tempting to say that the fact that my having made a promise creates an obligation because of the existence and authority of a corresponding moral rule: “Promises are to be kept (ceteris paribus)”. Human law has authority because of two things: promulgation and enforcement by an appropriate authority. Authoritative human law is decided upon and published by something in the community/state possessing sovereignty over the community. But it is not enough that sovereign authority decide upon law and publish what it decides. It must attach sanctions to infringement, and it must have the means of detecting infringement and applying the sanctions.

A crude moral argument can be constructed using the analogy between morality and human law.

Argument II:

  1. Moral normativity is best explained through the existence of authoritative moral rules.
  2. Authoritative moral rules must be promulgated and enforced by an appropriate moral authority.
  3. The only appropriate moral authority is God.
  4. Thus, given that there is moral normativity, there is a God.

Steps in this argument need filling out. A. E. Taylor relies on the analogy between human law and “moral law” when he notes that a law cannot be valid unless there is “an intelligence which recognizes and upholds it”. He goes on to note that it cannot be human intelligence that provides the needed recognition and upholding of moral law, since the moral law holds everywhen and everywhere whereas the human mind is limited in its comprehension and scope (Taylor 1945: 92-3). The appropriate promulgator and enforcer must have authority over all human beings at all times and places, indeed over the whole cosmos (on the assumption that the “moral law” applies to all personal, rational beings as such). Thus the only intelligence and will that can be the source of the moral law is that found in a sovereign God.

The analogy with human law behind the moral argument can proceed further to stress the role of sanction in giving force to law. Breaches of law must attract punishment if law is to have authority. In his Letter concerning Toleration, Locke contends that one of the few religious stances that the commonwealth cannot tolerate is atheism (see Locke 1993, 426) for non-theists have no motive to act upon their promises and oaths. So they cannot be fit participants in civil contracts or be trusted when they appear before courts of law. Minus a belief in God, there is no reason to suppose that ignoring moral norms will not pay. Indeed, there is every reason — given the way the world goes — to assume that it can often pay to take no account of moral norms. Of course, human communities try to attach sanctions to moral wrongdoing through the mechanisms of the human law and of social disapproval. But premise (6) above is true so far as the enforcement aspect of an authoritative source of rules is concerned. Only a God of the traditional kind who adjusts rewards and punishments in the long run can ensure that immoral conduct gets its due sanction. These points about sanction can provide a separate argument for God's existence, albeit it is implicit in Argument II.

Argument III:

  1. Moral norms have authority.
  2. If they have authority, there must be a reliable motive for human beings to be moral.
  3. No such motive could exist, unless there was an omniscient, omnipresent, wholly just agent to attach sanctions to behavior under moral norms.
  4. There is a God.

Criticism of these crude forms of the moral argument is well established in the literature. The work in Argument II is being done by the analogy between human law and moral norms. J.S. Mill famously criticized this analogy at the root. There are two possible aspects to those things we called laws, according to Mill. Law can exist first as deliverance from some person or body of persons. Law can secondly exist as a rule with authority. Many laws exist in the second mode without them being laws in the first mode (Mill 1957, 26). Here are some examples (not Mill's):

Both the above statements have normative force over our speech and thought. The non-theist will argue that it makes no sense to say that their authority derives from an act of legislation — not even if the legislator is God. This is because the notion of legislation implies choice: in an act of legislation someone or some body decides to promulgate this or that rule. But the “norms of reason” as illustrated above hold in the absence of any coherent alternatives to them. (NB: it is argued by some thinkers that even such “norms of reason” derive their authority from God in some fashion — see Devine 1989, 88-89.)

If we accept Mill's point that the one aspect of law does not entail the second, then premise (5) in Argument II is seen to rest on an assumption that is open to question, viz. “All authoritative norms are based on the acts of a legislator”. Agreeing with Mill means agreeing that what is true of some authoritative norms is not true of all; some can have authority without being promulgated and enforced by a sovereign will. The non-theist will then contend that moral norms are of this kind, thus rejecting premise (5). Independent argument can be offered for the conclusion that moral principles are necessarily true (see Swinburne 1976, 7-9). The non-theist will further contend that Mill's point and the examples of “norms of reason” also entail that Argument III has questionable steps. The so-called Law of Non-Contradiction above has authority, but its authority does not depend on their being a Great Logician in the sky ready to sanction infringements of it. Nor is it coherent to suppose that “norms of reason” are hypothetical, rather than categorical imperatives. The normative force of the Law of Non-Contradiction does not derive from something of the sort “If you want to think logically, you must abide by this rule”. In the sense relevant to this discussion, there is no choice between thinking logically and illogically (cf. Shafer-Landau 2005, 113).

Argument III is open to other, more obvious objections. It identifies motives with self-interested motives. Yet there are many different kinds of motives. Morality itself generates its own motives. Thus there can be motives operative in morality other than those of expediency and self-interest appealed to in Argument III. This can be seen more clearly when we amplify our picture of morality further by bringing in reference to the virtues. As well as morality containing knowledge of rules, it also promotes the virtues. Virtues are broad traits of character, habits of choice, which at once arise out of obeying moral norms and also lie behind such practice. The just person is not one who is merely aware of the norms that delineate justice. He or she is one who has a disposition to act in certain ways. This disposition is a compound of belief, emotion and perception. The emotion element means that one who is just will feel, for example, distaste at the contemplation of unjust acts and states of affairs.

If the acquisition of the virtues is given an important place in the moral life, the point that morality binds regardless of self-interest and expediency gains an extra dimension. Mention of the virtues brings with it the thought that morality is to be seen as the means whereby the human good is attained. The virtues have been thought of as the highest human excellences. To conceive of the virtues as the highest excellences, to be pursued above other human achievements and traits, is another way of making the point that morality binds. Given the notion that the virtues are the human excellences, a strong tradition dating from Greek philosophy has taught that possession of them constitutes the good for human beings. Moral thought and action is unified by a teleology in which the virtues are the constitutive means of attaining a good, perfected life. Morality, via the virtues, constitutively leads to the human good. One who has the virtues thus has a structure of motives that goes beyond mere self-interest and the desire for long-term reward. Such a person loves just (and other right) acts for their own sake. He or she has a conception of what is good for them of which the virtues are a constitutive part. They no longer have to be motivated in conduct by what the non-virtuous characterize as “self-interest” because that which is their self has been modified. They simply will not be happy breaking their promises. Thus the crude opposition between morality and self-interest breaks down.

The crude Argument III should be brought face to face with a final difficulty. The non-theist will claim that it denies one of the main features of moral normativity. Kant's distinction between hypothetical imperatives and the imperatives of morality entails that moral facts are intrinsically normative. Extrinsic normativity attaches to the rule “If you want to take your car on a long journey, fill the tank with petrol”. The normative force of this requirement derives from the desire it is predicated upon. However, the fact that I have promised to do something is intrinsically normative. It provides me with goals. Argument III, and its thought that God must exist to attach a fail-safe system of rewards and punishments to moral rules, is avowing that moral facts are not intrinsically normative. Bindingness does not attach to them per se. It attaches to them only in so far as they engage with my long-term desire to avoid punishment, and thus pain.

1.2 Sophisticated Arguments from Moral Normativity

Discussion of arguments I to III above does not deal with all attempts to show that the normativity of ethics provides grounds for thinking that God must exist. More sophisticated arguments do not (explicitly) trade on the analogies between moral law and human law to which significant objections have been made. Robert Adams provides an example of these more sophisticated arguments (Adams 1987, 144-163). His argument may be summarized as follows.

Argument IV:

  1. Moral facts exist.
  2. Moral facts have the properties of being objective and non-natural.
  3. The best explanation of there being objective and non-natural moral facts is provided by theism.
  4. Therefore the existence of moral facts provides good grounds for thinking theism is true.

Premise (13) refers to the fact that rightness and wrongness attaches to actions. These properties are recognized as objective in the sense that they hold or not regardless of human opinion. They are non-natural in the sense that “they cannot be stated entirely in the language of physics, chemistry, biology, and human or animal psychology” (Adams 1987, 145). Such facts could be accounted for from within non-theistic world views, such as Platonism. However, theism provides a much more intelligible explanation via the notion that rightness is one and the same property as the property of being commanded by God (wrongness consists in being forbidden by God). So the argument in essence states that we must have a metaphysics that accounts for the existence of objective, normative facts and that a theistic metaphysics fits the bill better than any alternative.

Arguments like IV, having eschewed the short cut of the simple analogical arguments considered above, are impossible to expound and appraise in short order. Complex metaphysical debate is needed to show that alternative, non-theistic, metaphysical systems cannot cope with objective normative facts, or if they can, are implausible on other grounds. Arguments like IV do suggest that the price of physicalism (as defined by Adams) is the abandonment of objective normativity. But the question at issue is whether a non-theistic moral realist has to be a physicalist. Proponents and opponents of the moral argument may agree that morality is one of those many phenomena which show that there is more to the real world than meets the physicalist's eye. This sets the non-theist the task of working out a metaphysics for morals (see Korsgaard 1996, McNaughton 1988 and Shafer-Landau 2005 for such attempts to account for the existence of objective normativity).

Direct objections to Argument IV flow from its appeal to a divine command theory of ethics. That God has commanded something is both an objective and non-natural fact and deemed to be creative of normativity. Objections to divine command theories of ethics are numerous. Most of these stem from forms of the Euthyphro dilemma. The debate about divine command theories of ethics cannot be explored here. Yet we should note an important implication of that debate for moral arguments for God's existence. These arguments invite a tu quoque that consists in contending that theism provides no better explanation of the facts of morality than non-theism.

One ready response to divine command theories of ethics is that they would make moral norms arbitrary. If rightness just is what is commanded by God, then whatever God commands is right. If God chose to command murder it would be right. This criticism of divine command theory is related to another, generally accepted, claim about moral, normative facts: as well as being objective and non-natural they are supervenient on other facts. It is because of the nature of acts of murder in relation to their circumstances that they are wrong. What a divine command explanation of the wrongness of murder threatens to do is to cut the wrongness of murder off from its basis in the nature of murder. Hence it is a bad explanation and this form of moral argument cannot succeed.

Adams' moral argument comes with a refinement on the idea of divine commands creating rightness which avoids the immediate force of the above objection. It is the prescriptions and proscriptions of a loving God that create rightness and wrongness. This modified divine command theory has two important aspects to it. First it brings back a kind of supervenience. It is because God sees that certain acts are beneficial or harmful to those affected by them that he commands or forbids them. Second it effectively makes a distinction between the realms of axiology (concerned with the good, the valuable) and deontology (concerned with duty and obligation). There is moral value of a kind independent of God. There is good and bad, there is benefit and harm. But it is the notion that we are obliged or under a duty to realize good through action and avoid bringing about harms that is to be explained through the thought that these deontological properties are created by divine will (see Alston 1989, 253-273). “Right” and “wrong” signify these deontological properties.

Having got thus far into the territory surrounding Argument IV, we can show how a non-theist would respond to it. Premise (14)

  1. The best explanation of there being objective and non-natural moral facts is provided by theism.

will be questioned. Note first that the existence of the “norms of reason” (see above) provides a clear counter-example to this premise. There is a deontological property failing to affirm the consequent in a modus ponens with admitted true premises is wrong whose existence does not appear to the non-theist to be at all well explained via the commands of the God of theism. The non-theist will then ask why, if this is so, moral deontological properties cannot arise minus a divine command. Perhaps deontological properties such as requiredness, being obligatory and oughtness simply supervene on axiological properties of the kind Adams admits exist logically prior to God's commands. Why cannot the existence of axiological properties on their own give us good and often overwhelming reasons for doing this and avoiding the other? Hence obligations and duties arise out of the recognition of value. Goodness gives rise to rightness, badness to wrongness.

Despite the fact that we have moved to sophisticated arguments from normativity to God as the best explanation, we still seem to be stuck with the debate opened up by Mill: how reliable is the analogy with human law some moral arguments for God's existence rely on? Proponents of all forms of the moral argument considered so far appear to hold that there can be no deontological properties without some law making. And the only candidate for the source of that law making is God. Non-theists deny this. They will present the following dilemma. When God sees that some acts are highly beneficial and others highly harmful, is or is he not obliged to legislate for the former and against the latter? Take the first horn and we have an instance of a deontic property (God being bound to command or forbid this act) arising from axiological properties minus God's commands. Take the second horn and the non-theist will object that we are back to the arbitrariness afflicting non-modified divine command theories of ethics.

From the discussion of moral arguments for God's existence and the fact of normativity we can conclude two things: (i) that the merits of such arguments are bound up with the merits of divine command theories of ethics (see Sagi and Statman 1995 for a detailed survey of such theories); and (ii) that if such arguments are to succeed they may need to cast their nets wider. They may need to encompass best explanations for normativity in other areas, such as logic, and for the existence of axiological facts as well as normative facts.

2. Arguments From Moral Order

2.1 The Basic Argument and its Exemplification in Kant

Many forms of moral argument for God's existence are variations on the following format.

Argument V:

  1. Morality is a rational enterprise.
  2. Morality would not be a rational enterprise if there were no moral order in the world.
  3. Only the existence of God traditionally conceived could support the hypothesis that there is a moral order in the world.
  4. Therefore, there is a God.

The rationality of morality cited in (16) refers to the fact that the moral life generates certain ends, specifically the pursuit of the ethical perfection and happiness of moral agents. The moral order cited in (17) refers to the belief that the world is such that these ends can be realized. The most famous version of the argument from moral order is found in the writings of Kant (variously formulated in different texts post 1781). Kant's “moral proof” can be summarized thus.

Argument VI:

  1. It is rationally and morally necessary to attain the perfect good (happiness arising out of complete virtue).
  2. What we are obliged to attain, it must be possible for us to attain.
  3. Attaining the perfect good is only possible if natural order and causality are part of an overarching moral order and causality.
  4. Moral order and causality are only possible if we postulate a God as their source. (See Kant 1996/1962, 240; 5/124-5)

The perfect good in (20) incorporates two alleged central aims of the moral life. We are not merely obliged to perform individual acts of virtue but to become virtuous. For Kant that means becoming such that there will be a complete harmony between the maxims of our actions and the moral law. But human beings as finite rational beings are also “creatures of needs”. They have many non-moral goals and ends. The very respect for the moral law that is at the heart of the moral life bids us set store by the flourishing of these finite rational agents. So the complete good for the human moral agent must be happiness arising out of virtue. (21) tells us that “ought implies can”. It cannot be true that we ought to seek an end if there is no chance of our attaining it. (22) and (23) point to the fact that the world as it appears to us is governed by morally blind causes. These causes give no hope whatsoever that pursuit of moral virtue will lead to happiness. They do not even give hope that we can become morally virtuous. Human agency is beset by weaknesses that make the attainment of virtue — in the absence of external aid — seem impossible. Human agents are in addition subject to contingencies that can cut short attempts to grow to moral maturity and perfection. The being postulated in (23) has omniscience and omnipotence combined with perfect goodness. Thus it will ensure that the pursuit of a virtuous state is possible through external aid (as in grace) and will promise an immortality where the moral journey can be completed. It will also ensure that in the long run happiness will result from virtue. Its existence would mean that there is a perfect moral causality at work in the world.

Kant's argument turns around the contrast between the apparent lack of moral order in the world and the alleged need for a real moral order in the world if the necessary goals of the moral life are attainable. There are many other authors who have arguments from moral order turning around this same contrast and moving to the same conclusion (see Hare 1996, Sorely 1918, Taylor 1930, Zagzebski 1987).

The schematic argument from moral order (Argument V) has as its first premise the claim that morality is a rational enterprise. One way of interpreting Kant's version — Argument VI — is as claiming that human reason faces contradiction (the absurdum practicum — see Wood 1970, 100) unless it believes in the existence of God. Practical reason is committed as a matter of strict duty to realize the goal of moral perfection. It is also committed as a requirement of consistency in agency to seek the maximal satisfaction of its given ends. If there is no moral order in the world then it cannot pursue both of these commitments together.

Premises (16) and (17) in Argument V and (20) in Argument VI present the rationality of morality as dependent on it having the goal of seeking the human good. One line of response to the argument from moral order is to deny that morality does have that goal. The critic can make this point in respect of both parts of the goal: happiness and moral perfection.

Concerning happiness it can be argued that moral agents cannot be convicted of irrationality if they abandon pursuit of their own happiness upon the realization that their duties and obligations get in the way, for they are under no rational necessity to pursue their own happiness. If this point is sound, there is no absurdam practicum because practical reason is not committed to the pursuit of two ends that apparently conflict. Kant's definition of happiness as that “state of a rational being in the world in the whole of whose existence everything goes according to his wish and will” (Kant 1996/1962, 240; 5/124) might seem to clinch the matter. But the definition is ambiguous. Happiness could be the state where all my felt, personal desires are satisfied. Or it could be the state where all my intentions are fulfilled. While it is true that no one acts rationally who does not seek to maximally fulfill his or her intentions, a person may have lots of intentions not directed at fulfilling his or her personal desires. I may consciously forswear satisfaction of my personal desires by, for example, adopting a life of service to others. Kant's other definition of happiness, which he seems to take as equivalent to the first, then comes into play: happiness is a fulfilled, satisfied life (see Kant 1996/1973, 49; 4/393). I may not find such a life of self-sacrifice personally fulfilling, but then I did not adopt it in order to be happy. (For more on this reply to Kant see Byrne 1998, 70ff and Byrne 2007, 101ff.)

The critic may thus contend that we are not bound by practical reason itself to have a plan of life bent on pursuit of happiness. In reply, it has been stated that “If we are to endorse wholeheartedly the long-term shape of our lives, we have to see this shape as consistent with our happiness” (Hare 1996, 88). Let us assume that non-theists who realizes that moral demands restrict the pursuit of happiness in a world not under divine governance are unable to endorse wholeheartedly the long-term shape of their lives. On the face of it that does not entail that they act irrationally. Their world is not a perfect world and they might feel sad that it is not, but they will no doubt think that accepting such realism is a lower price to pay than believing in God.

The other half of the absurdum practicum is the duty to become morally perfect. In Kantian terms, moral perfection for finite creatures is a state of complete virtue. Our wills will be irreversibly set on a policy of acting on maxims dictated by the demands of impartial right. The Kantian claim is that as well as having obligations to do this or that act of virtue, we have an overarching obligation to achieve a state of virtue through acting on specific obligations. To those who affirm that we have no such obligation, the response from proponents of the argument from moral order is that this is an unacceptable lowering of the moral demand (see Hare 1996, 29-30). This part of the argument from moral order has separate force from that dealing with the inability of a secular world-view to guarantee happiness for the virtuous. If morality's rationality depends on our being able to fulfill the aim of being virtuous, then — given undeniable facts about the contingency and frailty of the human condition — no naturalistic outlook can establish morality's rationality.

One response to this strand of the Kantian argument consists in stressing the way the human institution of morality can strengthen human character and promote the living of virtuous lives (see Kekes 1990). Another response depends on the distinction between becoming virtuous as an end and becoming virtuous as a duty. A non-theist may argue as follows. There is an overarching end to morality: achieving a state of virtue. We are not under an obligation to achieve that end in itself. We have obligations to do particular acts of virtue. If we fail to do those particular acts, we do fail to meet our obligations. But we do not fail in a further obligation to become virtuous. Becoming virtuous is an asymptotic goal. It is one that arises from more specific goals, and is thus necessary but this does not mean that we are guilty if we fail to meet it. Asymptotic goals can function as goals even though we know full well that they can never be met. They regulate our lives, while they do not create duties to attain them. The non-theist thus draws a distinction between Kantian virtue as a necessary end of the moral life and as a duty (see Byrne 2007, 110ff).

The above response relates to the famous “ought implies can” principle in step (21) of Argument VI above. Adams suggests that a viable riposte to this part of the moral argument is “In any reasonable morality we will be obligated to promote only the best attainable approximation of the highest good” (Adams 1987, 152). Thus our duty is merely to do our best to be virtuous. There is no question that proponents of the argument from moral order will again categorize this as an unacceptable lowering of the moral demand. Adams' point can, however, be strengthened by the distinction between ends and obligations above. We do not need to give up the goal of being virtuous if we recognize only the obligation to achieve the best available approximation to a state of complete virtue. We can have a regulative end without a corresponding obligation.

2.2 The Secular Problem of Evil

Variants of Argument V in Kant and other sources exemplify the secular problem of evil. The facts that make the realization of the ends of morality impossible are reflections of the underlying truth that our world is beset by evil. Evil is present in the human will and character. It is present in the course of events that distributes happiness and misery without regard to the claims of justice. The core of Argument V is that morality is irrational or pointless given evil unless we posit an agency capable of defeating evil. That agency has to be trans-human because it is one of the facts about evil that it manifests itself in weaknesses which beset the human character and will at root, thus making our agency imperfect.

The argument from moral order hereby throws up a striking paradox. On the one hand, evil in the world serves as the ground for an argument for God's existence. On the other, that same evil serves as a ground for thinking that there is no God. The evil pointed to in the moral argument highlights the evil that is the basis of the more famous problem of evil in arguments for God's non-existence. In particular, the fact of evil provides an interesting tu quoque to any version of Argument V. Such arguments point to evil and state that, on the premise that morality is a rational enterprise, there must be a God whose providence shows that such evil is but a temporary or surface feature of our world. But if there is such a God, why is there this evil in the first place? If there was a God, there would be a moral order and a vital premise of the argument from moral order would be false. The God of theism, if actual, is working now to remedy the defects in the human will and ensure that the course of events supports the goals of virtue. So how can it be that this God appears to be doing no such thing? (See Kekes 1990, 27-8.)

Attempts to rebut this counter to the moral argument would take us too deep into the structure of theodicies (accounts from within theism of how evil exists within a divinely providential world). A good example of how such a rebuttal goes can be found in ch. 18 of W.P. Sorely's Moral Values and the Idea of God. A divine power to support morality's ends is linked to the need to allow human beings freedom in an imperfect-seeming world to confront evil via their own free choices, with the assurance that an omniscient, omnipotent and omnibenevolent agency will bring those choices to fruition.

2.3 Moral Order and Moral Skepticism

The Kantian argument from moral order has been seen to be full of complexities. A simpler version of a moral order argument (see Zagzebski 1987, 299-300) goes thus.

Argument VII:

  1. Morality is a rational enterprise.
  2. Morality would not be a rational enterprise unless good actions increase the amount of good in the world. (Morality has to be efficacious if it is to be rational.)
  3. There is no evidence that the amount of good in the world is increasing through our good acts.
  4. Therefore we must assume that there is extra-human agency on the side of the good.

Argument VII is more negative than positive. It attempts to reduce a naturalistic outlook to absurdity (the absurdity of moral skepticism). Other steps are needed to get to the conclusion that the most plausible non-naturalistic world view is theism.

Argument VII can be strengthened by the following fact. In acting upon obligation I will frequently be giving up the chance to fulfill my personal preferences. This means that some good will be foregone in a typical moral action. If moral action is not efficacious in the production of moral good, then it may decrease the net amount of potential good. Thus it may be irrational (see Zagzebski 1987, 300 and Layman 2002, 304 and passim).

The argument for (26) is empirical: looking around the world there is no evidence that the amount of good is increasing and the amount of evil decreasing. Since it must be on premise (24), there is need to suppose that the world as we see it is not the sum of it as it really is. Good will eventually arise from moral acts but will only be visible when divine agency brings it about in the future.

Let us assume that defenders of a secular, naturalistic world view will not question (26) so far as it concerns the effects of virtuous action. In that case, they must either concede that morality is irrational (part, perhaps, of the absurdity of life in a universe without God) or argue that the good produced by virtuous action is not wholly or mainly in its effects. They may note in this regard important consequences of Aristotle's account of virtuous actions. Virtuous actions are not merely the means to the good, as plugging in the kettle is the means to heating the water. The good for a human being is a kind of living and acting: it is in part constituted by acts we perform and the dispositions behind them. Virtuous, good actions are worthwhile for the sake of the activity involved in doing them. They will have ends beyond themselves. Thus an act of generosity will seek the improvement of another's lot. But such an act also constitutes its own end. It is worthwhile doing it even if it fails in its external end. So, if a naturalist follows Aristotle, she or he can say that right action is a manifestation of the human good and as such the human good will in part exist regardless of the consequences of right action. (See Sherman 1989, 114 ff for these arguments.)

Zagzebski's version of the moral order argument is supplemented by the following proof based on the idea that naturalism entails moral skepticism.

Argument VIII:

  1. Morality is a rational enterprise.
  2. Morality would not be a rational if moral skepticism were true.
  3. There is much too much unresolved moral disagreement for us to suppose that moral skepticism can be avoided if human sources of moral knowledge are all that we have.
  4. Therefore we must assume that there is an extra-human, divine source of moral wisdom. (Zagzebski 1987, 295-299)

The naturalist can do two things with this argument. One is to question (30) and the other is to question whether the remedy in (31) works. As to (30), it is true that we can cite many long-standing moral disagreements in a society at any one time (as witness abortion, capital punishment and the like). But it may be claimed that over most of their daily decisions human beings know what the morally correct thing to do is. A common list of fundamental moral rules (forbidding lying, stealing etc, commanding honesty, the honoring of promises etc) will be acknowledged by most moral agents. The same is true for a common list of higher moral principles (give to each their due, respect persons as ends in themselves etc). It is not, the critic will say, that we cannot act because we are surrounded by so much moral uncertainty. As to (31), how are we to take the idea that a providential God will solve moral skepticism? The theist's God aids us through “moral knowledge in divine revelation and the teachings of the Church” (Zagzebski 1987, 302). But the naturalist will say that theists differ over where revelation is to be found and how to interpret it. They differ over what is the true church and then over how to interpret what their chosen church says. Religious division seems as rife as moral. And we need moral knowledge in order to make cogent judgments as to the location and teaching of the divine word.

3. Practical Arguments: Moral Despair and Moral Discouragement

The various arguments from moral order considered so far have begun from the premise

  1. Morality is a rational enterprise.

The aim of such arguments is to show that if there is no source of moral order morality will collapse. It will cease to be a sustainable enterprise. Kant himself states at one point that if the highest good cannot be attained then the moral law, which bids us to seek it “must be fantastic and directed to imaginary ends and must therefore in itself be false” (Kant 1996/1962, 231; 5/114). This suggests that, if the ends of morality cannot be attained, there would no longer be any obligations and duties (Kant in fact denies this inference in other places: see Kant 2000/1962, 316-317; 5/450-2). But it is possible to frame a moral argument with a more modest conclusion: there is a moral advantage in accepting theism. Adams has a version of this argument.

Argument IX:

  1. It would be demoralizing not to believe there is a moral order to the universe.
  2. Demoralization is morally undesirable.
  3. There is a moral advantage in believing that there is a moral order in the universe.
  4. Theism provides the best theory of the source of moral order.
  5. Therefore there is a moral advantage in accepting theism. (Adams 1987, 151)

Douglas Drabkin has a “moral argument for undertaking theism” which moves along similar lines.

Argument X:

  1. Morality demands that we ought to aspire to become as good as we can be.
  2. If there is no source of moral order in the world, then the project of becoming as good as we can be is fraught with difficulties.
  3. These difficulties would be taken away if we were assured of the truth of theism.
  4. Therefore we have a moral reason for getting ourselves in a state whereby we can come to be believe in the truth of theism. (Drabkin 1994, 169)

Let us assume that a non-theist will accept the general premise that it would be better for human beings if there was a divine source of moral order. Thus the non-theist could accept the premise that it would be to our practical and moral advantage to believe in a divine source of moral order. To some degree or other, atheism is demoralizing.

The above concession allows the airing of a major issue in considering moral proofs of God's existence of the kind that appeal to the need for moral order. They may be charged with arguing from premises about what we need or would like to be true to conclusions about the likelihood of the reality being thus and so. That a truth is demoralizing is no reason to think it is false. That it would be good if a claim is true is no reason to believe that claim. These conclusions follow from the transparency of belief. Believing p is transparent in the first person case. The following three questions are equivalent — that is, a yes or no answer to any one entails the same answer to any of the other two:

  1. p? [Is there a God?]
  2. Do I believe that p? [Do I believe that there is a God?]
  3. Ought I believe that p? [Ought I to believe that there is a God?]

In particular there cannot be reasons for giving a yes answer to (42) that are not reasons for thinking that p, that are not reasons for thinking that there is a God. Now the reasons for thinking that there is a God in Adams' argument do not bear upon the likelihood that there is a God, so cannot be reasons for thinking that I should adopt this belief. That the world would otherwise make some of our goals harder to obtain, would otherwise leave some of our deepest needs unmet, is not a reason for believing that it is not as it appears to be — devoid of moral order.

These versions of moral argument partake of the flavor, and thus of the difficulties, that surround the pragmatic arguments for religious belief found in writers such as Pascal and James. They will meet with the same response: this is wishful thinking dressed up as argument. The non-theist may press this specific point: only if one is convinced prior to these arguments of the premise that

  1. The world is likely to be organized so as to meet our deepest human needs

will one find them cogent. But (44) is just the kind of hypothesis that would be false if there is no God. Arguments such as IX and X thus look circular.

It should be noted that Kant considers and rejects this kind of criticism of arguments from moral order. He admits that argument forms of this type are generally fallacious, while claiming that his argument is different in a relevant respect. He appeals to needs to fuel belief that there is a God but they are “needs of reason”. They are not grounded on “inclination” but on “an objective ground of the will” (Kant 1996/1962, 255n; 5/143n).

Drabkin's argument in fact escapes the above objections. It claims that the moral ills that would afflict us if there were no God give us ground, not for the belief that there is a God, but for undertaking “the project of coming to believe that there is a God” (Drabkin 1994: 171). This involves things like going over one's reasons for rejecting belief in God to see if they hold up and checking most carefully reasons for thinking there is a God.

Perhaps this is a point at which proponents and opponents of moral arguments for God's existence might agree on. Moral considerations give all a reason to examine the proposition that there is a God very seriously. For if there is no God, morality is a more perilous enterprise than if there is.


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Aristotle | ethics: virtue | evil, problem of | God: concepts of | Kant, Immanuel | Locke, John | metaethics | Mill, John Stuart | moral anti-realism | moral realism | motivation: moral | Plato | skepticism: moral