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Newton's Philosophy

First published Fri Oct 13, 2006

Since Isaac Newton never wrote a philosophical treatise such as Spinoza's Ethics or Descartes's Meditations — although he studied a number of such treatises — his status as a figure with philosophical views of significance merits comment. Fully understanding Newton means avoiding anachronistically substituting our conception of philosophy in the twenty-first century for what the early moderns called “natural philosophy.” To be sure, the latter includes much that we now call “science,” and yet it clearly includes much else besides. This remains true despite the fact that Newton's work in the Principia bequeathed to us a conception of science in which discussions of broad metaphysical questions play little if any role (cf. Cohen and Smith 2002, 1-4). If we interpret Newton solely as a “scientist” whose work spawned discussion by canonical philosophical figures, we run the risk of ignoring his own contributions to the philosophical conversation in England and the Continent in the late seventeenth and early eighteenth century. These contributions, in part, reflected the state of natural philosophy in Newton's era. We might put this point by considering Kuhn's well-known understanding of the development of a science: although Newton may have provided physics with its paradigm, he himself worked largely within its pre-paradigmatic context, and the latter, according to Kuhn, is typically characterized by extensive epistemological debates and controversies over the “foundations” or “first principles” of the science (Kuhn 1996, 88). Newton engaged in “foundational” discussions in his optical work from the 1670s, in the Principia, in his correspondence with numerous influential figures, and in the now famous — but only posthumously published — De Gravitatione, an untitled manuscript now known by its first line (Hall and Hall 1962). Much of this discussion involved Newton's attempt to loosen what he took to be the pernicious grip of Cartesian notions within natural philosophy (Stein 2002). Newton's scientific achievement was in part to have vanquished both Cartesian and Leibnizian physics; in the eighteenth century, and indeed much of the nineteenth, physics was largely a Newtonian enterprise. But this achievement also involved an extensive series of foundational debates.

1. Newton and Descartes

1.1 General issues

Recent scholarship has emphasized that when Newton published the Principia in 1687, Cartesianism remained the reigning view in natural philosophy and served as the backdrop for much ongoing research. We now recognize that Newton intended his Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy specifically to replace Descartes's own Principles of Philosophy, which was first published in Amsterdam in 1644.[1] As Cotes's famous and influential preface to the second edition of the Principia indicates, in 1713 the primary competitor to Newton's natural philosophy remained Cartesian in spirit if not in letter. Despite the astonishing impact that Newton's work had on various fields, including of course what we would call philosophy proper, it would be anachronistic to conclude that Newtonianism had replaced its primary competitor, for Cartesianism's influence did not dissipate until some time after Newton's death in 1727.

1.2 Criticisms of Descartes in De Gravitatione

This background is important for interpreting Newton's famous unpublished manuscript, De Gravitatione, for in that text, he patiently attempts to refute many of the central notions in Descartes's Principia Philosophiae. But to begin with, De Gravitatione raises a number of controversial interpretive issues, including first and foremost the provenance of the text itself. No consensus has emerged as to the dating of the manuscript — which remained unpublished until it appeared in 1962 under the editorship of A.R. and Marie Boas Hall — and there is insufficient evidence for that question to be answered as of now,[2] but two things remain clear. The text is largely focused on presenting an extended series of criticisms of Cartesian natural philosophy; and, it is significant for understanding Newton's thought, not least because it represents his most sustained known philosophical discussion.

Three aspects of De Gravitatione merit discussion here. The first two involve Newton's rejection of Cartesian views of space, time and motion, and the third centers on his rejection of a broadly Cartesian conception of body. To begin with the first point: in much of De Gravitatione, Newton is apparently concerned to emphasize a series of problems with Descartes's basic conception of space, time, and motion; some of these problems, in turn, stem from the fact — at least from Newton's point of view — that Descartes presents conceptions of space, time and motion that fail to reflect a proper understanding of the basic principles of physics. This is a particularly pressing matter, of course, since Descartes should be credited with one of the very first modern formulations of the principle of inertia, which was obviously central to the later development of Newtonian mechanics. Since the Stanford Encyclopedia includes an extensive entry on Newton's view of space, time and motion, suffice it to say here that Newton takes Descartes's relationalism to fail to account for the proper distinction between true and merely apparent motion. One of the primary goals of Newton's Principia is to make this distinction rigorous and clear.

This point about Descartes's relationalism might be considered an internal criticism of Descartes's system for two reasons. Descartes himself attempts to distinguish between true — or “proper” [proprie/propre] — motion and motion in a “vulgar” or “ordinary” sense [vulgarem/commun], and does so in what we might call a relationalist fashion. For Descartes, whereas motion in the vulgar sense is “the action by which a body travels from one place to another,” motion in the proper sense is “the transfer of one piece of matter, or one body, from the vicinity of the other bodies which immediately touch it, and which we consider to be at rest, to the vicinity of other bodies” (Principles of Philosophy, Part Two, sections 24-25| Descartes 1644/1982, 53-4). Indeed, in the Scholium to the Principia, it seems that Descartes's “proper” motion, defined in terms of the relations of bodies contiguous to a given body, becomes Newton's relative motion. That is, Newton remarkably refashions Descartes's own distinction between the “ordinary” and the “proper” definitions of motion by contending that the latter is sufficiently precise for ordinary affairs, but not for physics. The second reason is this: Newton takes the fashioning of the distinction between true and merely apparent motion to be one of the primary goals not just of his physics, but also of Cartesian physics. So in De Gravitatione, Newton seems to conclude that Cartesian physics fails on its own terms. (Whether this is a fair assessment, of course, is a separate issue.)

This suggests, in turn, that a reading of De Gravitatione may help to dispel the easily formed impression that Newton sought, in the Scholium to the Principia, to undermine a Leibnizian conception of space and time, as Clarke would attempt to do years later in his correspondence with Leibniz. Although Leibniz later expressed the canonical formulation of early modern relationalism concerning space and time in his correspondence with Clarke, and although both Newton and Clarke were skeptical of this view, it is potentially misleading to read the Principia through the lens provided by the later controversy with the Leibnizians. Since the scholarly consensus takes De Gravitatione to have been written before the appearance of the Principia in 1687, Newton's extensive attempt in De Gravitatione to refute Descartes's broadly relationalist conception of space and time suggests that the Scholium should be read as providing a replacement for the Cartesian conception (see Stein 1970). Moreover, it is also unclear whether Newton was familiar with any of Leibniz's relevant writings when he wrote the Scholium. It may be thought a measure of Newton's success against his Cartesian predecessors that history records a debate between the Leibnizians and the Newtonians as influencing every subsequent discussion of space and time in the eighteenth century, including Kant's discussion in the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781.

This brings us to the second point mentioned above: Newton's discussion in De Gravitatione is also related to, and helps to illuminate, the more famous discussion of space and time in the General Scholium to the Principia. In each of these texts, Newton apparently transcends the narrow questions concerning space, time and motion raised by physics’ need to distinguish between true and apparent motion, tackling broader questions whose origin seems to lie in the seventeenth-century metaphysical tradition. If one rejects a Cartesian relationalist view, defending in its place some type of “absolutism” concerning space and time — that is, if one contends that space and time exist independently of all objects and even of all possible relations among objects — there arises a pressing question that Descartes himself considered: what is the relation between God and space and time? Before God created the universe of objects and relations, did space and time nonetheless exist, and if so, what was God's relation to them?

In answer to this question, Newton presents a position in the General Scholium that, as we will see, is greatly illuminated by the more extensive discussion in De Gravitatione. In a passage in the General Scholium, Newton argues that God is ubiquitous in both space and time: “He endures always and is present everywhere, and by existing always and everywhere he constitutes duration and space. Since each and every particle of space is always, and each and every indivisible moment of duration is everywhere, certainly the maker and lord of all things will not be never or nowhere” (Newton 1999, 941). On its own, this is an intriguing and puzzling view, but once we interpret it in the context of De Gravitatione, we see that it is actually an entailment of a broader conception of space and time. As we read in a now famous passage from De Gravitatione: “Space is an affection of a being just as a being. No being exists or can exist which is not related to space in some way. God is everywhere, created minds are somewhere, and body is in the space that it occupies; and whatever is neither everywhere nor anywhere does not exist. And hence it follows that space is an emanative effect of the first existing being, for if any being whatsoever is posited, space is posited … If ever space had not existed, God at that time would have been nowhere” (Janiak 2004, 25). So Newton's broader view has something like the following structure: (i) Spatiality is an affection of every kind of being; (ii) God exists necessarily, so (iii) there is no time at which God fails to exist; and, therefore, (iv) space exists, and there is no time at which space fails to exist (Stein 2002; Janiak 2000, 221-27). Notice that if Newton did not endorse the view that God created the universe, or if he were generally agnostic, his conception of space indicates that space would exist just in case any entity exists, for space is said to be an affection of any being whatever, and not just of a necessary being. That is to say, in De Gravitatione Newton does not articulate a conception of God's relation to space per se, but rather a conception of the relation between any entity whatever and space; his understanding of God's relation to space requires a further step. This episode illustrates how we can achieve a fuller understanding of Newton's view of space and time by reading De Gravitatione and the Principia in tandem.

The third aspect of De Gravitatione involves Newton's replacement of the Cartesian view that extension is the essence of body with the view that the property of impenetrability is equally crucial to our conception of material bodies. Newton presents this view by articulating what he takes to be a possible way in which God could create material bodies, or more precisely, could create entities that would be indistinguishable from material bodies from our point of view. Intriguingly, impenetrability plays a crucial role in this account, and Newton presents what we might call a dynamical account of impenetrability (one popularized in the eighteenth century by Kant and by Boscovich). From Newton's perspective, God could proceed as follows: identify some finite region of space — to simplify matters, make it a relatively small region, say the size of a desk, and make it close to some person — and then “endow” it with the properties of impenetrability and mobility. That is, God would render the region impenetrable to other objects, and to light, by endowing it with a repulsive force, and would render the region mobile in the sense that it could successively occupy distinct regions of space, impacting on any bodies, or light rays, in those regions. Hence in this account, Newton does not simply add a primitive quality such as Locke's solidity to the extension of a body; instead, he conceives impenetrability as involving the action of repulsive force. Finally, in a clever and crucial twist, Newton adds that the region's mobility would be lawlike; that is, it would be subject to the laws of motion, and therefore would undergo lawlike transfers through space. Hence there would be no disruption (for instance) of the laws of optics when the region of impenetrability reflects light, and no disruption of the laws of motion (for instance) when the region resists acceleration. In that regard, such regions would be entirely indistinguishable from ordinary material bodies; indeed, one might wonder whether they would simply be material bodies. In any case, the differences between this picture of what material bodies are essentially like, and a Cartesian conception of body, are clear: whereas Descartes takes the principal features of body — viz., size, shape and motion — to follow from the essential property of extension, Newton takes both impenetrability, and the lawlike behavior of bodies, to be essential features of our conception of body.

In the most general terms, then, De Gravitatione helps to underscore the centrality of Cartesian natural philosophy for understanding the development of Newton's own philosophical orientation, and his treatment of many significant questions in published texts.

2. Newton and Cotes on occult qualities and the nature of matter

Although Samuel Clarke may be Newton's most famous defender and spokesperson in the eighteenth century, no understanding of Newtonianism would be complete without a discussion of the role of Roger Cotes, the Plumian Professor of Astronomy at Cambridge in the early eighteenth century and the editor of the second edition of the Principia. Although Cotes was one of Newton's ablest defenders, his role as what we might call a Newtonian spokesperson did not prevent him from challenging Newton on occasion, nor from interpreting the implications of Newton's theory of gravity in a way that may have been at odds with Newton's preferred interpretation. An important episode in Cotes's relation to Newton centers on their disagreement concerning the best rebuttal to the infamous charge — popularized by Leibniz, among others — that Newton, or at least his physical theory, treats gravity as an occult quality.

2.1 Occult qualities

Regarding the first episode, one should note that although Newton was criticized for invoking an occult quality, that fact did not prevent Cotes, in his defense of Newton, from employing this as a term of criticism against other philosophers. For instance, in his extensive and illuminating preface to the second edition — which consists of a lengthy polemic against various “Cartesian” views — he writes:

Those who have undertaken the study of natural science can be divided into roughly three classes. There have been those who have endowed the individual species of things with specific occult qualities, on which – they have then alleged – the operations of individual bodies depend in some unknown way. The whole of Scholastic doctrine derived from Aristotle and the Peripatetics is based on this. Although they affirm that individual effects arise from the specific natures of bodies, they do not tell us the causes of those natures, and therefore they tell us nothing. And since they are wholly concerned with the names of things rather than with the things themselves, they must be regarded as inventors of what might be called philosophical jargon, rather than as teachers of philosophy (Newton 1999, 385).

This passage from Cotes is apt because it illustrates a common problem with criticisms that reference occult qualities: the criticism seems so polemical that one often lacks a clear sense of why the quality in question is said to be occult in the first place.

To try to sharpen this notion up, then, we can treat a quality as occult if it meets three conditions (let's take these as sufficient, but perhaps not as necessary). First, the quality is exhaustively characterized by the effects that it generates in one or more other objects. Second, the quality itself is said to be distinct from the effects it is said to produce. Third, the quality is said to be distinct from each of — and indeed, from the conjunction of — the primary qualities that characterize the bearer of the quality. When it is employed as a term of abuse, as it typically is, two criticisms are typically leveled against a quality meeting this three-fold definition: (1) that it is unintelligible, or more specifically, that one cannot have an idea of it, and therefore, according to some, that one cannot have a thought about it, but can only talk about it; and, (2) that it fails to be explanatory.

One should acknowledge that (2) requires an immediate clarification: it may not be the case that any quality that meets the three — jointly sufficient — conditions listed above will fail to explain just any natural phenomenon or sensible effect. Rather, claim (2) should really be taken to mean: the quality cannot explain the sensible effects through which it is said to be exhaustively characterized. This of course is said to hold in the ubiquitous dormative virtue case. Some canonical critics of the Scholastics present claim (2) without this caveat, which may be unfair.

In his famous and influential preface to the second edition, Cotes attempts to defend Newton from the then-ubiquitous charge that he treats gravity as occult. In writing his defense, he can barely conceal his contempt for Newton's critics:

I can hear some people disagreeing with this conclusion and muttering something or other about occult qualities. They are always prattling on and on to the effect that gravity is something occult, and that occult causes are to be banished completely from philosophy. But it is easy to answer them: occult causes are not those causes whose existence is very clearly demonstrated by observations, but only those whose existence is occult, imagined, and not yet proved. Therefore gravity is not an occult cause of celestial motions, since it has been shown from phenomena that this force really exists. Rather, occult causes are the refuge of those who assign the governing of these motions to some sort of vortices of a certain matter utterly fictitious and completely imperceptible to the senses (Newton 1999, 392).

So from Cotes's point of view, gravity itself is not occult, only its cause is; and, according to Cotes, this is compatible with contending that gravity itself is a cause of phenomena. This indicates, first of all, an ambiguity in the term occult, for the term can apparently mean one of two things. In what we can call its non-technical sense — where one needn’t meet the three-fold definition above — saying that the cause of gravity is occult means simply that the cause is hidden or unknown. But in the technical sense above, the claim means that the cause of gravity is an unintelligible power of bodies.

If Cotes has the ordinary, rather than the technical, meaning in mind, then gravity's cause is something that we could, as far as his discussion is concerned, hope to discover, even if we do not yet know it in 1713. And it seems as clear as anything that in each edition of the Principia, Newton thinks that it is perfectly reasonable to search for a cause of gravity, which is to say, at the least, he certainly thinks that gravity does have some cause (Newton 1999, 943). If Cotes has the technical sense in mind, however, then gravity's cause is obviously not something that we could hope to discover, not because it is hidden or microscopic, but because it is not intelligible and therefore not the sort of thing that could be discovered. That is to say, if the cause of gravity is occult in the technical sense, then the proper response is presumably that we ought to reject this very idea, rather than to endorse a search for something answering to it. So Cotes's claim appears to be twofold: first, it is incorrect to contend that gravity itself is an occult quality — on the contrary, it is perfectly evident; and second, it is incorrect to contend that gravity's cause is an occult quality, if by that we mean more than the claim that gravity's cause is unknown.

2.2 The nature of matter

But what does it mean to claim that gravity is evident? Cotes intends specifically that we should add gravity to the usual list of primary qualities. Of course, conceptions of the primary qualities differ, but for our purposes here, we might take such qualities to characterize all macroscopic bodies, along with all of their microscopic parts; there is a broad consensus in this period that certain qualities do in fact characterize all material bodies (and their parts), but considerable disagreement concerning the proper list of such qualities. Cotes writes:

The extension, mobility, and impenetrability of bodies are known only through experiments; it is in exactly the same way that the gravity of bodies is known…Thus all bodies for which we have observations are heavy; and from this we conclude that all bodies universally are heavy, even those for which we do not have observations… Among the primary qualities of all bodies universally, either gravity will have a place, or extension, mobility, and impenetrability will not (Newton 1999, 392).

It is quite natural for Cotes to make this point, for Newton himself employs the third of his Rules for the Study of Natural Philosophy, to which Cotes here alludes, to prove that gravity acts “universally” (Newton 1999, 795-96). In every other case, Rule Three is employed to show how we can justifiably infer that some quality found within the reach of our experiments is, given certain background conditions, a quality of all bodies universally. And so Cotes contends that gravity, too, is a quality of all bodies universally, and thereby attempts to block two criticisms: one, that gravity is a quality of bodies, but not of all bodies universally (that is a claim about the inference we can make from our empirical evidence); and two, that gravity must be considered an occult quality if it is a universal quality, a view he rebuts in the paragraph quoted above, which in fact follows the paragraph just quoted.

However, Cotes and Newton appear to differ on this crucial point. For his part, Newton denies that gravity is an occult quality not by insisting that we have sufficient evidence to consider it a “primary quality” of bodies, but by contending that it is not an “essential” quality. So Newton appears to shift the discussion from considering which properties are universal — or “primary” — to considering which are “essential” to material bodies. After reviewing the relevant empirical evidence in Book Three of the Principia, Newton concludes the discussion of Rule Three as follows: “it will have to be concluded by this third rule that all bodies gravitate toward one another” (Newton 1999, 796). If by that Newton means that gravity is a universal quality of bodies, he might be interpreted as agreeing with Cotes. But he then inserts a significant caveat: “Yet I am by no means affirming that gravity is essential to bodies. By inherent force I mean only the force of inertia. This is immutable. Gravity is diminished as bodies recede from the earth” (ibid.). This passage repeats a claim in one of Newton's letters to Richard Bentley from many years earlier, namely the denial that gravity is “essential” to matter (cf. the section on Bentley). He presents the denial, reasonably enough, on the grounds that the gravitational interaction between any two massive bodies is a function of their distance, so if their distance is increased, the strength of their interaction is diminished. The interaction, and therefore the (supposed) property, would seem to disappear entirely in the case of a lonely body. The implication seems to be as follows: since gravity fails to meet what is sometimes called the “lonely corpuscle” criterion, it cannot be an essential quality of bodies. A lonely body would lack gravitational interactions.

Gravity does not meet the “lonely corpuscle” criterion, but since Newton contends that all bodies gravitate toward one another, it may seem that gravity is a type of ubiquitous relational property, one that is instantiated when two or more bodies with mass exist in the same world. Perhaps this indicates that it is actually akin to a secondary quality, rather than to a primary quality, as Cotes alleges. The fact that, from Newton's point of view, this reading appears to fail might be illuminating here. Gravity conforms to the third law of motion, so if X and Y are two massive bodies, we should not infer that we can simply attribute to X a “power” to attract Y, or to Y a “power” to attract X. Rather, for X to be attracted to Y is precisely for Y to be attracted to X (and vice versa). To be any kind of quality of either body in the interaction, it must be a quality of both, and a quality of precisely the same type. Gravity therefore seems to lack what we might call the asymmetric character of ordinary secondary qualities, such as colors. These qualities seem to involve asymmetric interactions because they are said to dispose objects to appear a certain way to us, or to cause certain ideas in perceivers; gravity presumably cannot be fully understood on these models.

The question of whether gravity can be considered a type of quality can also be illuminated, from Newton's point of view, by contrasting it with the case of mass. Since Newton employs force of inertia as another name for (inertial) mass — it is a potentially misleading name, but we can bracket that here — the passage from the Principia above invites us to consider Newton's distinct treatment of mass and of gravity. Since mass cannot be diminished by a body's spatiotemporal position (unlike gravity), and since it remains a property even of a lonely corpuscle, Newton distinguishes it from gravity, taking it to be an essential quality of all material bodies. Thus if the theory in the Principia uncovers a new essential quality of material bodies, according to Newton, mass is actually the quality, rather than gravity. This indicates that although gravity is not essential to matter, what we might call the basis for gravitational interactions, namely mass, is in fact essential to material bodies. This highlights a subtlety in Newton's view often missed by his critics.

In contending that inertial mass is — whereas gravity is not — to be considered an essential property of matter, and in listing inertial mass alongside extension, impenetrability and other ordinary “primary” qualities, we might read Newton as aligning himself with a broader tradition identified by Margaret Wilson. She helpfully distinguishes the view that the primary qualities must be accessible to ordinary perceptual experience from the view that the qualities ought to be defined by the latest scientific theory, regardless of our perceptual access to them (Wilson 1999, 455-94). Whereas some of the “mechanists” defended the first view, Newton appears to be allied with the second tradition. The inertial mass of a given body does not appear to be directly perceptible in ordinary experience, and it does not appear to be perceptible through the perception of other primary qualities, such as extension, or of other properties, such as weight. And even if one thinks that inertial mass is perceptible in one of these ways, it is nonetheless distinct from other primary qualities at least in the sense that it is perceptually unavailable to perceivers who lack an acquaintance with the relevant theory. It would seem that one cannot perceive inertial mass independently of gaining the relevant concept from Newton's theory: independently of the theory, one would presumably not know that in certain cases, one perceives a body's resistance to acceleration. More generally, then, Newton seems to think that we cannot generate a comprehensive list of the primary qualities independently of our physical theory concerning the interactions of bodies. On that point, perhaps Cotes would agree, despite his disagreements with Newton.

More generally, it should be noted that Cotes's interpretation — according to which gravity is a universal quality of all bodies, and possibly an essential quality — gained considerable support as the eighteenth century progressed. For instance, the view that gravity ought to be understood as essential to matter, even on the basis of evidence available to Newton himself, was defended at length in Kant's Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (Friedman 1990). In that regard, we might think of Cotes and Kant as falling into the same post-Newtonian interpretive tradition, one whose proponents took a step that Newton himself seemed unwilling to take.

3. Exchange with Bentley

3.1 General issues

In addition to his published works and unpublished manuscripts, Newton's correspondence was extensive. Of course, in Newton's day intellectual correspondence was not seen solely, or perhaps even primarily, as a private affair between two individuals. It was viewed in much less constrained terms as a type of text that had an important public dimension, not least because it served as the primary vehicle of communication for writers separated by what were then considered to be great distances. As the thousands of letters sent to and from the Royal Society in Newton's day testify, natural philosophy would have largely ceased without this means of communicating ideas, results and questions. It was therefore not at all unusual for letters between famous writers to be published essentially unedited. For instance, the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence was published almost immediately after Leibniz's death in 1716 (see below); Newton's famous 1679 letter to Robert Boyle, in which Newton discusses a possible “physical” explanation for gravity, was published in 1744 in Thomas Birch's edition of Boyle's works (Janiak 2004, 1-11); and, Newton's late-seventeenth-century correspondence with the Reverend Richard Bentley was published in 1756 as Four Letters from Sir Isaac Newton to Doctor Bentley concerning Some Arguments in Proof of a Deity.

When Bentley, a theologian by training, was asked to deliver the Boyle lectures in London — the lectures were endowed by a bequest in Robert Boyle's will and were focused on the defense of Christianity against atheism and other scourges — he wrote Newton a series of letters in the early 1690s requesting assistance in understanding the Principia. Newton's responses are justly famous not simply because they contain extensive remarks illuminating his own views, but because they are deliberately written for a lay reader (unlike the Principia!).

In the broadest terms, Newton's four letters to Bentley indicate the extent to which Newton took his theory of gravity in the Principia to support certain theologically salient conceptions of the solar system and its origins. For instance, in the first letter Newton famously contends that the motions of the planetary bodies around the sun could not have arisen through a natural cause, but rather must have been established through the intervention of an “intelligent agent.” Among other reasons, Newton notes that the planetary orbits could not have been arranged in their “concentric circles” through natural causes such as gravitational attraction between massive bodies; instead, the orbits would have been parabolas or very eccentric ellipses. So the arrangement of the solar system tends to confirm the existence of a deity, in Newton's eyes.

3.2 Action at a distance

In the letters, Newton also responds to certain prominent reactions to the theory of gravity in the Principia. One of the most vexing issues raised by the theory is obviously the problem of action at a distance (Hesse 1961), and any interpretation of Newton's own understanding of this problem must account for his correspondence with Bentley. For instance, in a letter to Bentley from 1693, we find the following stark rejection of action at a distance, one that may be Newton's most famous pronouncement on the subject:

It is inconceivable that inanimate brute matter should, without the mediation of something else which is not material, operate upon and affect other matter without mutual contact…That gravity should be innate, inherent, and essential to matter, so that one body may act upon another at a distance through a vacuum, without the mediation of anything else, by and through which their action and force may be conveyed from one to another, is to me so great an absurdity that I believe no man who has in philosophical matters a competent faculty of thinking can ever fall into it (Janiak 2004, 102).

It appears that if accepting Newton's theory of gravity commits one to accepting action at a distance, Newton's sense of what counts as an intelligible cause of motion would be violated by his own theory.

It is crucial, moreover, that Newton connected his understanding of the notion that all material bodies — or all bodies with mass — bear “gravity” as an essential property with the question of how to avoid invoking distant action when characterizing gravitational attraction. Notice that in the passage above, in the course of denying that one material body can act at a distance on another material body, Newton also denies that gravity is “innate” or “inherent” in matter, or that it is part of the “essence” of matter (see section 2.2 above), a point Newton had already emphasized in a previous letter to Bentley (Janiak 2004, 100). He apparently thinks that to conceive of gravity as “innate” or “inherent” in matter is to think of it as due to no other physical process, entity, or medium between material bodies. Hence the claim about innateness or inherence amounts to the claim that there is action at a distance. Since Newton takes the latter to be simply unintelligible, it stands to reason that he rejects the claim concerning its inherence in matter. One way of avoiding the invocation of distant action, along with the claim about gravity's innateness or inherence in matter, is to leave open the possibility that gravity is due to an aetherial medium that acts on, and even penetrates, all matter. The aether's ubiquity throughout space would presumably ensure its action is only local in character.[3] And Newton attempts to account for the fact that the force of gravity is inversely proportional to the square of the distance between any two bodies by proposing that the density of the aether increases as one's distance from a given body increases. According to this hypothesis, the aether “impels” bodies to move toward one another; this action appears to earth-bound observers as that of an attractive force. The connection and import of these claims remains of continuing scholarly interest.

The postulation of the aether, in turn, raises the question of how to understand Newton's considered attitude toward hypotheses (see also section 6 below). In the General Scholium, hypotheses non fingo concerns the postulation of a cause for gravity. It is sometimes claimed that Newton took any “physical” characterization of gravity — any characterization of its cause — to involve hypotheses, the very type of assumption Newton strove so stridently to expunge from physics. However, it seems that Newton does not rule out causal explanations of gravity because they necessarily involve hypotheses. Rather, when Newton wrote the General Scholium there was no independent empirical evidence to support the relevant causal explanations of gravity, so they remained merely hypothetical. Hence “hypotheses non fingo” might be interpreted to mean that we have insufficient data to characterize gravity physically; it means neither that we have grounds for ending the search for such data, nor that attempts to use new data to produce a physical characterization would involve a sullying of physics by hypotheses.

4. Newton and Leibniz

From our vantage point, the relation between Leibniz and Newton was marked primarily by mutual misunderstanding and a fiery debate — concerning the question of priority in the discovery of the calculus — with little intellectual substance. But the controversy concerning priority did not seriously flare up until the English Newtonian John Keill claimed in 1710 that Leibniz had stolen the calculus from Newton, having seen a copy of Newton's notes during a visit to London in 1672. This controversy, with all its nationalist undertones and hyperbolic rhetoric, would taint much of the famous correspondence between Leibniz and Clarke (see below), and would eventually see Newton write and publish a supposedly anonymous response to a supposedly impartial review of the calculus affair by a committee convened under the auspices of the Royal Society (the so-called “Account”). These aspects of the relation between Leibniz and Newton — which have been exhaustively discussed by Bertoloni Meli (1993) — are obviously crucial for historical reasons, but they have tended to obscure some of the more intellectually substantive and philosophically salient aspects of their debates concerning Newton's Principia and the proper methods of scientific inquiry.

4.1 Newton and the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence

Despite the importance of Newton's correspondence with Bentley, it was certainly overshadowed by the astonishingly influential series of letters that passed between Leibniz and Samuel Clarke in 1715 and 1716. There are probably several reasons for this, including the obvious fact that Leibniz was vastly more important for the development of philosophy in the eighteenth century than Bentley was. In addition, the heated debate on the Continent and in England regarding the priority in the discovery of the calculus certainly piqued the interest of many readers of the correspondence. More substantively, Leibniz and Clarke discuss many crucial philosophical matters — concerning, for instance, the nature of space and time, God's relation to space and time and to the universe as a whole, the proper interpretation of the basic principles of metaphysics, especially the principle of sufficient reason, and so on — that are largely ignored in the correspondence with Bentley.

There are at least two distinct and overarching ways of approaching Newton's place within the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence. On the one hand, one can investigate historical sources to determine the extent to which Clarke relied on Newton's interventions when drafting his responses to Leibniz's letters (which reached him through the hands of Princess Caroline). On the other, one can consider the extent to which Clarke's arguments and views in the correspondence appear to reflect Newton's own.

Regarding the first approach, some recent historical work — especially that by Bertoloni Meli (1999 and 2002) — indicates that we should not consider the fact that there is no extant correspondence between Clarke and Newton regarding the latter's exchanges with Leibniz to be decisive: Clarke was Newton's parish priest, and the two were neighbors in London in the relevant period. In that sense, one would expect them simply to have chatted together rather than to have written official correspondence.

But perhaps the second approach is more salient here, for even if Clarke had ample opportunity to discuss Leibniz's criticisms with Newton personally, we are still left with the question of whether he faithfully represented Newton's views in his responses to Leibniz's letters. Of course, readers of the correspondence will differ on this question, not least because they will differ on the proper interpretation of Newton's views! But in an entry such as this, we can at least indicate some of the relevant issues.

There are some respects in which Newton's views may differ from Clarke's representation of them. Consider the following two matters. First, in his fifth letter, when discussing (yet again) the crucial issue of how to understand God's relation to absolute space, Clarke seems to contend that space can be conceived of as a property of God — a view to which Leibniz, of course, would strenuously object — and it remains unclear whether this fits with Newton's published views concerning space in the Scholium and the General Scholium. As noted above, Newton does contend in the latter text that God is ubiquitous throughout space, but the notion of a property is obviously a technical one in this discussion, and it seems to imply more than Newton is willing to allow. Its usage by Clarke may also conflict with Newton's view in De Gravitatione that space is an affection of a being just as a being, for Newton denies that space is either a property or a substance, arguing that it is an affection instead (of course, that text was unknown to Clarke).[4] Second, Clarke's understanding of whether gravity is a “real” force may differ from Newton's understanding: whereas Clarke seems consistently to present an instrumentalist interpretation of gravity, in part in an attempt to avoid Leibniz's charge that gravity is an occult quality on a Newtonian conception of it, Newton famously contends in the General Scholium that gravity “really exists” [he writes: “et satis est quod gravitas revera existat”]; this was published two years before Clarke began corresponding with Leibniz.[5] Whether this statement is consistent with an instrumentalist construal of gravity à la Clarke remains to be seen. There are obviously myriad other aspects of the correspondence that raise similar issues, but these two cases illustrate the difficulties in taking Clarke to represent Newton's own considered views.

4.2 Newton and Leibniz on gravity

Because of the historical importance of the calculus dispute, and because the correspondence between Leibniz and Clarke in 1715-1716 was certainly one of the most influential philosophical exchanges in the eighteenth century, an exchange between Leibniz and Newton from 1693 has tended to be ignored. Although rather brief, the 1693 exchange is nonetheless quite illuminating, especially because Newton attempts to defend his treatment of gravity in the face of Leibniz's well-known criticisms. In his letter to Newton, Leibniz praises the tremendous accomplishment of the Principia; he then contends, unsurprisingly, that Newton's theory of gravity fails to indicate not only the cause of gravity, as was later acknowledged by Newton himself in the General Scholium — which appeared in the second edition of the Principia in 1713 — but also the cause of the phenomena treated by Newton's theory, especially the planetary orbits. Leibniz of course argued that the phenomena in question must ultimately be understood as following from some cause that meets what he took to be the strictures of the mechanical philosophy. That is, they must follow from the action of bits of matter that transfer motion only through impact on other bits of matter. Hence Leibniz writes: “You have made the astonishing discovery that Kepler's Ellipses result simply from the conception of attraction or gravitation and passage in a planet. And yet I would incline to believe that all these are caused or regulated by the motion of a fluid medium, on the analogy of gravity and magnetism as we know it here. Yet this solution would not at all detract from the value and truth of your discovery” (Janiak 2004, 106-7). Here Leibniz signals his allegiance to the broadly Cartesian view that fluid vortices maintain the planetary orbits.

To describe Leibniz's point of view in a bit more depth, we might — very briefly — consider his argument in the Tentamen of 1689, which was written after the publication of the first edition of the Principia, but before the exchange in question (Leibniz 1849; Bertoloni Meli 1993). According to Leibniz's argument in this text, it seems that prior to any empirical research in physics, we know both the nature of motion and the nature of bodies; these not only constrain any empirical research, they help us to understand (e.g.) basic astronomical data as being evidence for certain conclusions rather than others. In particular, the “nature of motion” is expressed by the principle of inertia; that is to say, it is an aspect of the nature of motion that unimpeded bodies will recede along the tangent to any curve. It is the “nature of bodies” to be such that the motion of any body can be altered only by something “contiguous” to that body. Hence it is part of the nature of bodies that there can be no action at a distance, at least, if that action is to alter the motion of any body, which might be of a piece with calling it “action” at all. If we begin from the assumption that the planets follow curvilinear paths around the sun, it follows from the nature of motion, according to Leibniz, that something must intervene to prevent them from following the tangents to their orbits, and it follows from the nature of bodies that whatever alters their motion in this respect must be “contiguous” to the bodies (Leibniz 1849, 148-9; Bertoloni Meli 1993, 128-29).

So if we are to understand the orbital path of a planet, we must know what, physically speaking, keeps it from following the tangent to that path, which would be its inertial trajectory. Gravity as Newton understands it in the Principia is not a viable possibility because there is no indication as to how it could operate through impact and is therefore not, from Leibniz's perspective, even a candidate for a physical actor. Instead, as Leibniz contends in his letter to Newton, we ought to attribute the planetary orbit to the motion of swirling vortices that are contiguous with the planets. In that regard, of course, Leibniz wants his explanation of the planetary orbits to meet the explanatory strictures of the mechanical philosophy, as we saw above, and it is those strictures that justify the inference to a swirling fluid surrounding the planets. Hence Leibniz does not provide independent empirical evidence to justify the contention that vortices surround the planets (cf. section 6 below).

The most illuminating aspect of the 1693 exchange is Newton's response to Leibniz's charge, one unfortunately not taken up by Clarke in his later correspondence with Leibniz. In his rebuttal to Leibniz, Newton contends that although he has indeed failed to uncover the cause of gravity, he nonetheless has established that gravity itself is causal. That is, from Newton's point of view, gravity has been successfully identified as the cause of the celestial phenomena in question, particularly the planetary orbits (Janiak 2004, 108-9); hence this letter represents Newton's attempt to convince Leibniz that the theory of gravity in the Principia is sufficient to replace the vortex theory favored in the Tentamen. Judging from Leibniz's insistent criticism of the Newtonians in his correspondence with Clarke, one might conclude that Leibniz understood Newton's rebuttal to involve an endorsement of action at a distance (whether he was right about that, of course, is a separate issue). That is, Leibniz may have thought that Newton's rebuttal in this exchange indicated that Newton took gravity itself, independent of any physical medium, to maintain the planetary orbits.

Another often ignored — and in this case, potential — exchange between Leibniz and Newton from nearly twenty years later (1712) indicates the extent to which Newton was willing to maintain his conclusion that the force of gravity itself is the cause of the phenomena that Leibniz and others attributed to the motion of swirling vortices. In May of 1712, Leibniz wrote a letter to Hartsoeker that was highly critical of the Newtonians; it was later published in the Memoirs of Literature, a British journal to which Roger Cotes, the editor of the Principia's second edition, held a subscription. After Cotes brought Leibniz's criticisms to Newton's attention — especially the claim that the Principia renders gravitation a “perpetual miracle” because it does not specify the physical mechanism underlying it — Newton wrote an intriguing, but only posthumously published, rebuttal. Here is part of Newton's paraphrase of Leibniz's original letter: “But he [i.e., Leibniz] goes on and tells us that God could not create Planets that should move round of themselves without any cause that should prevent their removing through the tangent. For a miracle at least must keep the Planet in” (Janiak 2004, 117). Newton's response to this Leibnizian charge is illuminating: “But certainly God could create planets that should move round of themselves without any other cause than gravity that should prevent their removing through the tangent. For gravity without a miracle may keep the planets in (ibid.).” The crux of the retort, then, is that gravity causes the planets to follow their orbital paths, rather than their inertial trajectories along the tangents to those orbits. Given the similar pronouncement in the 1693 correspondence, Newton apparently held this conception of gravity throughout much of his life. Any interpretation of Newton's understanding of gravity, and of his considered attitude toward action at a distance, that ignores this exchange does so at its peril.[6]

By the time Newton wrote his “Account” of the Royal Society report concerning the calculus affair, the controversy between Newton and Leibniz had created a significant rift between their followers in England and on the Continent. Not surprisingly, therefore, Newton's “Account” is highly polemical and includes many incendiary remarks. But it also includes several intriguing comparisons between what he takes to be the Newtonian “experimental philosophy” and the “metaphysicks” promoted by Leibniz. The text indicates, among other things, that Newton was acquainted not just with Leibniz's contributions to mathematics and physics, but with at least some of his more narrowly metaphysical work, including his view of the pre-established harmony. It reworks familiar themes from the 1693 correspondence with Leibniz, and from Leibniz's exchange with Clarke, such as their differing attitudes toward the mechanical philosophy, but it also highlights Newton's own conception of the important philosophical elements of the Principia and of the Opticks through extensive quotation from those texts. Most importantly, it indicates Newton's willingness to charge Leibniz with introducing hypotheses into physics on metaphysical grounds; this is discussed in the next section.

5. “Hypotheses non fingo

One of the recurring themes in Newton's discussions of his predecessors’ and interlocutors’ strategies in natural philosophy — especially those of Descartes and Leibniz — is the question of the proper role of “hypotheses” in systematic enquiries into nature (see Cohen 1966). Indeed, one of Newton's most famous pronouncements in the Principia is: hypotheses non fingo, that is, “I feign no hypotheses.”[7] This phrase, which was added to the second edition of the text, is sometimes taken to mean that Newton eschews all hypothetical reasoning in natural philosophy. It may be more accurate to say that Newton does not systematically avoid hypotheses; rather, he believes that within the boundaries of experimental philosophy — the Principia and the Opticks (excepting the queries) can be considered works in this area — one may not hypothesize, but it is not improper to propose hypotheses to prod future experimental research. Such hypothetical speculations are either reserved for the queries to the Opticks, or are more or less explicitly labeled as such in the optics papers from the 1670s and in the Principia. For instance, in the Scholium to Proposition 96 of Book I of the Principia, Newton discusses hypotheses concerning light rays. Similarly, in query 21 of the Opticks, he suggests that there might be an aether whose differential density accounts for the gravitational force between bodies, as noted above.

Why, then, is a given proposition characterized as a hypothesis, and how does this illuminate Newton's attitude toward Leibniz? The case of the postulated aether in query 21 indicates a potential answer, for the most salient fact about the aether is that Newton lacks independent experimental evidence indicating its existence. This coheres with Cotes's rejection, in his preface to the Principia's second edition, of the common hypothesis that planetary motion can be explained via vortices on the grounds that their existence does not enjoy independent empirical confirmation (Newton 1999, 393). So it seems reasonable to conclude that hypotheses make essential reference to entities whose existence lacks independent empirical support. With such support, one's explanation would successfully shake off the mantel of “hypothesis.” Newton's contention, then, is that both Descartes and Leibniz proceed in a “hypothetical” manner by attempting to explain phenomena through invoking the existence of entities for which there is no independent empirical evidence. This may fit an important aspect of Leibniz's procedure in the Tentamen, which was briefly discussed above. For instance, in an attempt to account for the motions of the planetary bodies in that text, Leibniz introduces ex hypothesi the premise that a fluid surrounds, and is contiguous to, the various planetary bodies, and then argues that this fluid must be in motion (Leibniz 1849, 149; Bertoloni Meli 1993, 128-29). That is to say, as far as Leibniz's understanding of the planetary orbits is concerned, there is no independent empirical evidence indicating the existence of the fluid in question.

Newton's attitude toward hypotheses is connected in another way to his skepticism concerning Cartesian and Leibnizian natural philosophy. In the General Scholium, he contends: “For whatever is not deduced from the phenomena must be called a hypothesis; and hypotheses, whether metaphysical or physical, or based on occult qualities, or mechanical, have no place in experimental philosophy” (Newton 1999, 943). It therefore appears that hypotheses may be generated from various sorts of metaphysical principle or view, and so the exclusion of hypotheses may also represent a way of distinguishing “experimental philosophy” from metaphysics. Indeed, one of Newton's primary complaints against both the Cartesians and Leibniz seems to be that they mix metaphysical with experimental concerns — that they infuse metaphysical views, which he thinks are always questionable and highly disputable, into their experimental philosophy, thereby preventing the latter from proceeding on a secure empirical footing. His discussion of hypotheses is one of several ways in which Newton raises this concern about his predecessors’ methods.


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Clarke, Samuel | Descartes, René | form vs. matter | Hume, David: Newtonianism and Anti-Newtonianism | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Newton, Isaac | Newton, Isaac: Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica | Newton, Isaac: views on space, time, and motion