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Samuel Clarke

First published Sat Apr 5, 2003; substantive revision Tue Jun 9, 2009

Samuel Clarke (1675–1729) was the most important British philosopher in the generation between Locke and Berkeley, at least in terms of influence on his contemporaries, and was a leading figure in Newton's circle. His philosophical interests were mostly in metaphysics, theology, and ethics; epistemology seems to have held little attraction for him. Although his philosophical vocabulary and some of his metaphysical ideas were influenced by Descartes, Clarke's overall judgment of Descartes was quite critical. He shared the view expressed by More, Pascal, Bayle, and Leibniz that Descartes' system could be, and had been, used to further irreligion and had naturally developed into Spinozism. In particular, he believed that Descartes' identification of matter with extension, and therefore space, entails making it eternal and infinite. Furthermore, he sided with Malebranche and Locke in denying that introspection lets us reach the substance of the soul. Indeed, like Locke and Newton he held that we just don't know the nature of substances, even though we can be sure that there are at least two substances (mental and material) because their properties (thinking and divisibility) are incompatible. He defended natural religion against naturalism (the view that nature constitutes a self-sufficient system of which we are but a part) and revealed religion against deism in two sets of Boyle Lectures and in exchanges with Anthony Collins and Leibniz. Clarke singled out Hobbes and Spinoza for criticism in metaphysics and ethics. His most notable influence is Isaac Newton, whose scientific views Clarke adopted very early. Through his association with Newton, Clarke became in the first half the eighteenth century the de facto spokesperson not only for explaining Newtonian natural science but also for the theological interpretation and metaphysical support of that philosophy.

In what follows, we use “W” as an abbreviation to cite passages from the four-volume The Works, and “D” as an abbreviation to cite passages in A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Other Writings. References to the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence include the letter and section number preceded by an “L” for Leibniz and “C” for Clarke (e.g., L1.4). For the full references, see the Bibliography.

1. Life and Works

Samuel Clarke was born at Norwich on October 11, 1675. He took his B.A. degree at Cambridge in 1695 by defending Newton's views, which then were still far from uncontroversial. His tutor apparently convinced him to provide a new annotated Latin translation of Rohault's Treatise of Physics. The translation was published in 1697 and Clarke's notes in effect criticized Cartesian physics in favor of Newton's. In that same year, Clarke befriended Whiston, who probably introduced him into the Newtonian circle, of which he soon became a leading figure. In these early years he also began a concentrated study of theology, leading to the publication of Three practical essays on baptism, confirmation, and repentance (1699), A Paraphrase on the Four Evangelists (1701–1702), and Amyntor (1699), a response to John Toland's critique of the New Testament canon.

The middle years of his career mark his greatest philosophical contributions, beginning with the Boyle lectures (delivered 1704 and 1705). The first, an attempt to prove the existence of God, along with all divine attributes, was published as A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God (1705) and the second, a continuation to establish all moral truths and most religious doctrine, A discourse concerning the unchangeable obligations of natural religion, and the truth and certainty of the Christian revelation (1706). They both went through many editions and were often published together. These lectures, established by Robert Boyle to promote natural religion based on the latest scientific developments, were closely watched, and Clarke instantly became one of the most well known philosophers in England. Also in 1706, his association with Newton became official when he translated the Opticks into Latin. In the meantime, he had been introduced to Queen Anne, who made him one of her chaplains in 1706, and three years later he was elevated to the rectory of St. James's, Westminster. After the Hanoverian accession, Clarke developed a close relationship with the Caroline of Anspach, the Princess of Wales and future queen. His prominence as a philosopher drew him into a series of very public exchanges of letters. The most notable of these were the letters to Anthony Collins regarding personal identity, immortality, and the soul and the letters to G.W. Leibniz (see below).

In the later years of his life, Clarke continued to write on theological matters, and also published a royally appointed translation of the Iliad, having already published notable translations of Caesar. Each of his major publications went through multiple editions, often with substantial revision. He died in 1729 after a very short illness, survived by his wife Katherine and five of his seven children. Clarke was a polite and courtly man, vivacious with his friends, and reportedly fond of playing cards.

1.1 Correspondence with Leibniz

Before Caroline of Anspach became the Princess of Wales, she was tutored by Leibniz. After Leibniz was not asked to join her in England, Leibniz corresponded with her. In one of these letters he attacked prominent views in England that Leibniz considered dangerous to natural religion. After mentioning materialism and Lockean skepticism about the soul, Leibniz chastises Newton twice. (Newton and Leibniz had sparred earlier over the priority of discovery of the calculus.) Clarke, who was ingratiating himself with Princess Caroline, came to Newton's defense. A series of five letters passed through Caroline between Leibniz and Clarke over a wide range of issues.

Today it is easily Clarke's most often read work. However, there has long been a dispute over Newton's role in the authorship of the letters. Leibniz suspected and Caroline confirmed that Newton at least read Clarke's letters before sending them. Since then, scholarly opinion has ranged from Newton's ghostwriting all the letters himself to Clarke writing the letters and merely showing them to Newton to make sure there was no disagreement over the scientific information. This point is not easily decidable, in part because Newton and Clarke were neighbors and thus almost no correspondence survives between them, presumably since they would more often meet in person. Current opinion has shifted toward attributing most of the writing to Clarke, a move sparked in part by greater appreciation in recent years of Clarke's status as an original philosopher.

In reading the letters to Leibniz, it is helpful to remember that the views being defended might not belong only to Clarke or only to Newton, so attribution to a single figure might be misguided. What we have might be the intersection of their views, or they might be views that Newton held privately but did not want to avow publicly, or they might be a mixture of some of Clarke's views and some of Newton's views. In some cases, we can see links to other publications by Newton and Clarke. For instance, space as a sensorium (organ of sensation) of God, which Leibniz ridiculed in his first letter to Caroline, appeared first in Newton's Principia and Opticks. Also, there are arguments based on the principle of sufficient reason, which Clarke employed in his Boyle lectures twelve years earlier. Other cases are more difficult to connect to Newton's and Clarke's other publications, such as the famous passage in which space is called “an immediate and necessary consequence of the existence of God,” since “consequence” is not a term usually used by either Clarke or Newton.

2. Major Themes in Clarke

Three major themes run through all of Clarke's works: Newtonianism, anti-naturalism, and rationalism.

2.1 Newtonianism and Anti-Naturalism

Clarke's thought was deeply indebted to Newtonian natural philosophy. His first notable publication was a translation of the Cartesian physics of Rohault, to which he appended notes describing the problems in the Cartesian physics and the superiority of the Newtonian. The book was soon adopted as the standard physics textbook in England, and went through multiple editions in Clarke's lifetime. His first Boyle lecture of 1704 relied on Newtonian ideas about space and matter to establish the existence of a God with a radically free will who is continually involved in the world, against both deists and atheists.

In Newtonianism, Clarke saw a world that could only exist by a free act of God. Matter is dispersed sparingly throughout empty space, gravity is universal to matter but not inherent in it, and the universe is ordered according to rules that are neither absolutely necessary nor chaotic. Strictly speaking the laws of nature do not describe the powers of matter, which is just dead mass constantly pushed around, but modalities of operation of the divine power; as in the case of occasionalism (the view that only God is the real cause of all events), the laws of nature describe the actions of the divine will, and only mediately describe the activities of bodies. Matter has no power of self-motion. To explain motion, one must appeal to immaterial souls (human and divine). Thus, nature is not a self-sufficient system, so much so that without direct and constant divine physical intervention planets would fly away from their orbits, atoms would break into their components and the machinery of the world literally grind to a halt.[1]

2.2 Rationalism

Clarke adopted some form of rationalism in metaphysics, ethics and theology, as exhibited in his methodology, his account of ethical truths, and in his acceptance of a fundamental rationalist principle, the principle of sufficient reason.

The Demonstration makes great use of the principle of sufficient reason, which motivates the cosmological argument. Were that the only appearance of the principle, it would be easy to conclude that Clarke saw the principle as having a limited application, perhaps the explanation of a contingently existing universe. However, Clarke explicitly avows the principle of sufficient reason in the correspondence with Leibniz and returns to it frequently (C3.2, W IV.606). It is not mentioned in the correspondence with Collins, but he there adopts principles which can be derived from it.

Clarke's understanding of the principle of sufficient reason differs notably from Leibniz's formulation, with whom it is more frequently associated. This was a major source of contention in their correspondence. Clarke asserts that the sufficient reason why something exists as it does may be due to the “mere Will” of God and nothing more (C3.2, W IV.606–607; C5.124–130, W IV.700). This involves two claims. First, in cases of complete indifference (such as God choosing where to place the world in the infinite expanse of absolute space), God is capable of acting even if there is no reason to prefer one option over another. Second, a free will is able to refrain from acting on what reason presents to it as best to do. As a consequence of this (and also as a result of his unusual treatment of the metaphysics of space), Clarke is forced to deny the identity of indiscernibles, a principle that Leibniz argued is entailed by the principle of sufficient reason. This is significant for Clarke's Newtonianism, because if space is real and absolute, then the identity of indiscernibles must be false because regions of space are indiscernible with respect to their intrinsic and (prior to the creation of the world) their extrinsic properties. Clarke may also have felt the need to accommodate indiscernible atoms, which Newton seemed to allow. (Clarke defends atomism in the letters to Leibniz, but in his other works he claims that all matter is infinitely divisible.) Because Clarke denies the identity of indiscernibles and affirms libertarianism, Leibniz claims that Clarke grants the principle of sufficient reason “only in Words, and in reality denies it. Which shews that he does not fully perceive the Strength of it” (L3.2, W IV.601). In response, Clarke argues that if Leibniz is right then an agent would be merely passive since determined to do what reason presents, but a “passive agent” is a contradiction since the concept of agency includes the concept of activity.

Clarke is an ethical rationalist. Ethical truths are discoverable through reason and correspond to necessary and eternal relations among things in the world. He also sometimes treats ethical truths as truths of reason. His theology is also rationalist. Through reason one can discover the many truths contained in natural religion. Furthermore, true Christian doctrines are neither mysterious nor self-contradictory, and nearly all can be comprehended by human beings.

3. Metaphysics

3.1 Space and Time

According to Clarke, the ideas of space and time are the two “first and most obvious simple Ideas, that every man has in his mind” (D 114; W II.752). Like many of the philosophers who investigated the nature of space and time, he tended to produce arguments with regard to space, leaving the reader to infer that parallel arguments could be drawn with respect to time. He argued that while matter can be thought of as non-existing, space exists necessarily because “to suppose any part of space removed, is to suppose it removed from and out of itself: and to suppose the whole to be taken away, is supposing it to be taken away from itself, that is, to be taken away while it still remains: which is a contradiction in terms” (D 13; W II.528).

Although space is not sensible, Clarke rejected its identification with nothingness, since space has some properties, for example, quantity and dimensions. One might add other properties he accepted, such as homogeneity, immutability, and continuity. Space, then, is an entity in which things are, and not mere absence of matter. Space is also not an aggregate of its parts but presumably an essential whole preceding all it parts, a view motivated at least in part by theological considerations.

Like Newton, Clarke adopted the view that space is necessarily infinite because “to set bounds to space, is to suppose it bounded by something which itself takes up space” or else that “it is bounded by nothing, and then the idea of that nothing will still be space,” and both suppositions are contradictory (D 115; W II.753). What Clarke had in mind here is rather unclear. He seemed to think that what has a boundary must be bounded by something else. If so, the argument was not well taken because a sphere, for example, has a boundary which stems from its own nature, not by the presence of something external bounding it. If he had a reason for thinking that nothing in the nature of space sets its limits, he does not provide it. One possible solution is to appeal to the principle of sufficient reason: any finite limit would be arbitrary, and thus in violation of the principle.

Since absolute space has an essential and invariable structure which is independent of the bodies in it and which is not altered by their presence, any possible world must conform to it, as creatures must be in space and God cannot alter essences because his power is limited to the metaphysically possible. The same is true of time, which flows independently of anything in it. Creatures occupy an absolute position in space and time that we may or may not be able to establish because we have no direct access to absolute space and time.

The introduction of absolute space, allegedly demanded by Newtonian physics, offered Clarke an immediate philosophical advantage in the fight against Spinoza. For it showed that the Cartesian identification of extension with matter, which had made possible Spinoza's excesses (such as the eternality of matter), was wrong, a consequence that Bayle and Colin McLaurin also decried. The existence of absolute space did introduce a new difficulty, that of its relation to God, which is addressed below.

3.2 Free Will

Clarke attached great importance to the issue of free will. Like many philosophers, he held that the highest form of freedom involves willing as one should, namely, having one's will in step with one's right values. He also believed that freedom of the will, or liberty, involves a libertarian power of self-determination and that it is a necessary condition both for that higher form of freedom and for religion. Hobbes' and Spinoza's views that everything happens deterministically or necessarily, he thought, destroys this power of self-determination. In what follows, we will examine Clarke's analysis of freedom, his argument that God has free will, and his reasons for thinking that humans have free will.

Clarke was committed to the existence of a self-determining will that could freely assent or refrain from assenting to the mind's judgments. This is a freedom of choosing, and not a freedom of acting, for a prisoner in chains “who chooses or endeavors to move out of his place is therein as much a free agent as he that actually moves out of his place” (D 75; W II.566). In order to will, one must have a judgment about what to do and the power to choose in accordance with that judgment. This power to choose is provided by the will; Clarke sometimes calls the will the cause of the choice because its power of activity provides the active component of the choice. At times, Clarke also identifies the power of the will with the ability to produce motion in the world.

The will is not to be identified with the last judgment of the understanding nor is it determined by that judgment. Those (like Hobbes) who thought so were guilty of basic philosophical errors. If they maintained that the content of the evaluation, the evaluative proposition, is identical with the volition or causes it, then they were confusing the “moral motive” with the “physical efficient,” the physical efficient being the element of the cause that provides the active power (D 73; W II.565). The understanding presents the agent with a value judgment, e.g., “doing X is better than doing Y,” which the agent has the power to follow or not. Since, as Clarke explained to Collins, the motive is simply an abstract object (a proposition), it cannot cause anything because abstract objects are causally inert. Holding the contrary is taking an abstract object for a substance.

On the other hand, if Clarke's opponents maintained that, not the evaluative proposition, but one's perceiving, judging or otherwise believing it is identical with or a partial cause of volition, then they were falling foul of a basic causal principle. Against Descartes, Clarke insisted that judging, i.e., assenting to what appears true and dissenting from what appears false, is not an action but a passion. But what is passive cannot cause anything active. So, there is no causal link between evaluation and volition, or as Clarke put it “approbation and action” (D 126; W IV.714). Nor is there any causal link between previous non-volitional mental states and any volition, all of which are passive.

Another objection Clarke considered is that a free agent cannot choose whether to have a will or not; “...but (the two contradictories of acting or not acting being always necessarily before him) he must of necessity, and essentially to his being a free agent, perpetually will one of these two things, either to act or to forbear acting,” a view that induced even “some considerate persons” to entertain “great doubts concerning the possibility of liberty” (D 74). Clarke did not identify the philosophers he had in mind, but probably one of his targets was Locke, who at Essay II.21.23–4 seemed to move from the claim that an action can take place or not only if the agent wills it or not and the claim that necessarily an action must take place or not, to the conclusion that the will of the agent is determined. Clarke pointed out that the argument was guilty of an ambiguity. It might be true that if I think about doing A, then it is necessary that either I will to do A or will not to do A. However, from this it does not follow that if I think about doing A, necessarily I will to do A. Nor does it follow that if I think about doing A, then necessarily I will not to do A. Clarke was careful to avoid this error, which seems to have ensnared Locke.

Clarke's view was criticized by Jonathan Edwards, who thought that Clarke was committed to an infinite regress of volitions. Since each volition is active, it must be caused by something active; but since every other purported motivation is passive, each volition is caused by a previous volition, and so on ad infinitum. However, Clarke did not believe that each volition was caused by a previous volition, but rather by the will itself. As Leibniz realized, this position leads to the denial of the principle of sufficient reason, which Clarke claimed to accept. Since the conditions for the will choosing in accordance with the judgment are exactly the same as when it refrains from choosing, there is no explanation for why it does one rather than the other. Clarke never provided a satisfactory response to this charge, but he thought that to deny it would lead to worse consequences.

Clarke tried to turn the tables on his opponents by using the principle of sufficient reason against necessitarians like Spinoza. He does this by employing the causal version of the principle of sufficient reason in the cosmological argument to show that the necessary being on which the contingent world depends must have in itself “a principle of acting, or power of beginning motion, which is the idea of liberty” (D 54; W II.553). Otherwise, the world would be necessary and not contingent, which is (Clarke thinks) obviously false. If God operated necessarily, things could not be different from how they are. But the number of planets, their orbits, indeed, the law of gravitation itself could have been different, as any reasonable person (except Spinoza) could plainly see. Further, the obvious presence of final causes indicates that divine activity follows not necessary but architectonic patterns. Additionally, if God acted necessarily, there could be no diversity of finite things in the world, because one who acts necessarily acts the same way at all times and in all places; if this were not so, then the principle of sufficient reason would not be satisfied. But the world does contain many finite and contingent things, so God does not act necessarily.

The issue of divine freedom raises a couple of problems for Clarke. For one, it is in tension with God's knowledge of future events. Against the claim that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free will, Clarke objected that since knowledge does not affect the thing known, our free choices are unaffected by divine omniscience, a move that has been used at least since Augustine. Furthermore, God always does what is best. It seems, then that God cannot refrain from acting on his judgment of what is best, and thus acts necessarily. Clarke can rely, again, on the passivity of judgment to block the move that God's judgment determines God's choice. Thus, even though we have complete certainty that God always does what is best, it does not follow that God doing the best is necessary. Furthermore, when God created the world, he did what was best to do, but had a choice among an infinite number of equally good ways of creating the world, since he could place the world anywhere in space and could create it at any time. Thus, it does not follow from God's perfect judgment combined with his infinite power to create that God must necessarily create a particular world in a particular place or at a particular time.

Having shown that God is endowed with liberty, Clarke tried to show that we are as well. His argument was based both on metaphysics and experience. It is clear that liberty is a communicable power because it does not entail such incommunicable qualities as total causal independence and self-existence. We do not know how the power of action can be transmitted, but considerations drawn from experience assure us that is has been, since our actions seem to us to be free, exactly as they would do on the supposition that we are really free agents. Of course this does not amount to a strict demonstration; but denying that we have free will is on a par with denying the existence of the external world, a coherent but unreasonable option. The burden of proof is not on the supporter of liberty, but on its denier.

3.3 Matter and the Laws of Nature

According to Clarke, “Modern Deists,” noticing that nature is regular and constant and that certain causes produce certain effects according to fixed laws, have come to the conclusion that “there are in matter certain laws or powers the result of which is...the course of nature; which they think is impossible to be changed or altered, and consequently that there can be no such things as miracles” (D 150; W II.698). The deistic view, Clarke argued, is completely wrong because “all things done in the world, are done either immediately by God himself, or by created intelligent beings: matter being evidently not at all capable of any laws or powers whatsoever” except for the negative power of inertia. Consequently, the so called “effects of the natural powers of matter, and laws of motion; of gravitation, attraction, or the like” properly speaking are but the “effects of God's acting upon matter continually and every moment, either immediately by himself, or mediately by some created intelligent beings.” The course of nature is “nothing else but the will of God producing certain effects in a continued, regular, constant and uniform manner which…being in every moment perfectly arbitrary, is as easy to be altered at any time, as to be preserved” (D 149; W II.698). So, the possibility of miracles for Clarke depends upon a form of theological voluntarism and the denial of the activity of matter.

Clarke's theological voluntarism was limited, since moral laws are independent of the divine will and even the absolute power of God is limited to what is logically possible. Furthermore, the divine will is not inscrutable, if that entails that divine attributes and powers are absolutely different from the human ones, since they have the same nature and differ only in degree. Moreover, the “arbitrariness” of God's will is not to be construed as irrationality; rather, the divine will infallibly follows his necessarily correct judgment, and consequently God always acts on the basis of rules of “uniformity and proportion.” However, true to his libertarian position, Clarke held that the will, in God as in us, is not causally determined by the understanding, and therefore the rules governing the ordinary power of God, a subset of which are the laws of nature, are freely self-imposed, and not the result of the necessarily correct divine understanding: they are a manifestation of God's moral, and therefore free, attributes, not of God's metaphysical, and therefore necessary, ones.

Clarke steadfastly maintained that matter has neither an essential nor an accidental power of self-motion. The first claim was very common among early modern philosophers, and held not only a fortiori by an occasionalist like Malebranche, but also by thinkers of different persuasions like Descartes, Locke and Boyle. In fact, even Gassendi, who had upheld the notion of an active matter by claiming that atoms have an internal corporeal principle of action, had fallen short of claiming that they possess it essentially.

Clarke's second claim, however, was more controversial. For although most early modern mechanists programmatically tried to substitute a nature made of inert particles for the living nature of Renaissance philosophy, the attempt soon ran into great difficulties. Strict mechanism proved inadequate to explain phenomena like exothermic reactions (where does the explosive motion of gunpowder come from?) or the spring of the air (why does a deflated closed balloon expand in a vacuum tube?). In order to explain such phenomena, mechanism was altered by philosopher-scientists like Boyle, Charleton, Petty, and Newton to include particles variously endowed with powers of motion, attraction and repulsion. Clarke's position on the issue was radical: the various non-mechanical powers of particles are the result of direct divine or spiritual activity. He could not bring himself to accept active matter because he thought of it as a prelude to atheism for, as we noticed above, Clarke believed that denying God's continuous direct intervention in nature in effect amounts to eliminating him, as John Toland had done by endowing matter with essential “autokynesis.”

Although at war with mechanists and any philosopher who accepted active matter, Clarke was not a full-blown occasionalist. Unlike the occasionalists, Clarke did not think that God was the real cause of interactions between finite minds and matter. Unlike Malebranche, Clarke did not think that the God's sustaining the world in existence is equivalent to God's recreating it at each moment, which was one argument Malebranche used to motivate occasionalism. Malebranche's other notable argument for occasionalism, that causation requires a necessary connection between the cause and the effect, is also not found in Clarke. Rather, Clarke argued for God's constant activity in the world from matter's passivity and from the contingency (“arbitrariness”) of the laws of nature.

Clarke's views, however, had their own problems. A God who is actually extended and constantly operates physically on matter looked suspiciously like the soul of the world, as Leibniz charged using Newton's identification (in the Opticks) of space as the sensorium of God. Similarly, the placement of gravitational forces within the purview of ordinary divine activity drew from Leibniz the accusation of obscurantism.

3.4 Soul

In 1706, Henry Dodwell published a book in which he defended conditional immortality: our souls are naturally mortal and upon the death of the body can be kept in existence only by divine supernatural intervention. Clarke wrote an open letter to Dodwell complaining that he had opened wide the floodgates to libertinism by providing an excuse for the wicked not to fear eternal punishment. He then argued that the soul, being immaterial, is naturally immortal and gave his own version of the traditional argument for the immateriality of the soul from the alleged unity of consciousness, insisting that not even God could endow matter with consciousness.

Clarke's argument failed to convince Anthony Collins, who made no bones about his materialist leanings and intervened in defense of Dodwell. Clarke told Collins that if thinking in humans were a mode of matter, then “it [would] be but too natural a consequence, to conceive that it may be only the same thing in all other rational beings likewise; and even in God himself. And what a notion of God this would give us, is not difficult to imagine.” For then, Clarke continued, every thinking being, including God, would be governed by “absolute necessity, such as the motion of a clock or a watch is determined by” (W III.851). The result would be the destruction of every possibility of self-determination and the undermining of the very foundations of religion.

The exchange with Collins makes clear that Clarke's argument for the immateriality of the soul revolved around three basic claims, namely:

  1. Necessarily consciousness is an individual power.
  2. An individual power cannot result from or inhere in a divisible substance; or, alternatively, an individual power can only be produced by or inhere in an individual being.
  3. Matter is not, and cannot possibly be, an individual being.

The conclusion is that consciousness cannot possibly be the product of or inhere in matter (D 153; W III.795).

The first premise, Clarke explained, must be understood as expressing the obvious truth that consciousness is “truly one undivided consciousness, and not a multitude of distinct consciousnesses added together” (W III.784). Collins accepted Clarke's first premise and was also ready to accept the third premise, not with respect to matter per se, but with respect to systems of matter such as the brain. However, he disagreed with Clarke's claim that an individual power such as consciousness can inhere only in an individual subject, namely a being which, as Clarke put it, is “perfectly and essentially one so that to suppose any division of it shall necessarily infer a destruction of the essence of that substance” (D 152; W III.795). Consequently, he disagreed with Clarke's contention that only an individual substance like an immaterial soul can be the subject of consciousness. Clarke's attempts to meet Collins' objections generated an interesting and protracted controversy.

For Clarke, although the soul is necessarily immaterial, it can causally affect the body because material qualities such as figure and mobility are “negative qualities, deficiencies or imperfections” which can be brought about by consciousness, which is a positive quality (D 41; W II.545). One can appreciate the theological, moral, and broadly philosophical motivations for such a position. He clearly wanted to leave the door open for arguing that God, the maker of matter, is immaterial, and the claim that a thinking immaterial substance can produce material modifications is an essential component of his argument. Moreover, for Clarke the capacity of the soul to affect the body causally is a consequence of our being endowed with liberty. In addition, Clarke was convinced that we experience the causal power by which we move our body. However, his position on whether the body causally affects the soul was less than clear. At times, he leaned towards the view that it does, and at others that it does not.

Collins not only rejected Clarke's argument from the unitary nature of consciousness to the immateriality of its subject, but also wondered how an immaterial substance like the soul can be indivisible if one assumes, as Clarke had obliquely intimated, that it is extended. To Collins' apparent surprise, instead of rejecting the view that the soul is extended, Clarke replied that whether the soul is extended was immaterial to the issue at hand. Moreover, “as the parts of space or expansion itself can demonstrably be proved to be absolutely indiscerpible [indivisible], so it ought not to be reckoned an insuperable difficulty to imagine that all immaterial thinking substances (upon supposition that expansion is not excluded out of their idea) may be so likewise” (W III.763). The point is that for Clarke space is extended and yet indivisible because of the interdependence of its parts. All one has to do is to think of the soul as a substance whose parts depend on each other, like those of space.

Clarke's reply to Collins is guarded, as he tries to separate the issue of immateriality from that of extension. He elsewhere is a bit more forthcoming about the existence of extended, immaterial souls. As he eventually told Leibniz, the soul is in a particular place. This is because he was committed to two independent premises: first, that something can act only where it is substantially, and second, that the soul interacts with the body. The conclusion is that the soul is substantially present where (at least) a part of the body is.

Saying that the soul must be substantially present where a part of the brain is does not fully determine how the soul is present. It certainly rules out mere Cartesian operational presence, but it fails to determine whether the soul's presence is to be understood in terms of holenmerism or in terms of mere extension. (“Holenmerism,” coined by Henry More, is the view that the divine substance is wholly in the whole of space and wholly in each and every place, in a way analogous to the presence in space of an instant of time.) However, there is cumulative evidence that for Clarke the soul is merely coextended with a part of the brain. Clarke used an analogy with space, which he took to be both extended and indivisible, to explain how the soul could be extended and indivisible; but certainly holenmerism does not apply to space. He did not address More's critique of holenmerism, as one would expect him to do had he adopted it. He did not address Leibniz's accusation that the extension of the soul destroys its unity by appealing to holenmerism; rather, he defended the claim that, as he put is, the soul “fills the sensorium.” In sum, Clarke's views on freedom, with their ties to morality and religion, together with his views on causality, pushed him towards the thesis that the soul is extended.

4. Philosophical Theology

This section reviews Clarke's key arguments in philosophy of religion and philosophical theology. The topic of divine freedom was covered in the earlier section on free will, as well as in another entry in this encyclopedia.

4.1 Arguments for the Existence of God

Clarke was interested in two general forms of argument for the existence of God. He thought highly of the argument from design, largely because it is widely accessible and easily grasped. However, due to the rise of atheistic systems of philosophy (which Clarke attributed to the materialist tendency in philosophy and physics that Descartes had helped to create, and which he most closely identified with Hobbes and Spinoza), it was necessary to give an argument that would satisfy his fellow metaphysicians. This argument, which was known in Clarke's time as “the argument a priori,” occupies most of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, Clarke's first set of Boyle Lectures. It is often classified today as a cosmological argument, but it should not be confused with the kalam cosmological argument (which takes as a premise that the world has a finite history). Clarke's version belongs to another tradition of cosmological argument that employs the principle of sufficient reason. The main lines of Clarke's “argument a priori” are as follows. (Note that Clarke's use of the term a priori is not that which has been standard since Kant. Clarke considers his argument a priori not primarily because it is available independent of experience, but because it argues from the nature of the cause to the nature of the effect; this is in contrast with the argument a posteriori which works from the effects — e.g., the design of the world — to the cause — e.g., the designer.)

Since something now exists, something always was. Otherwise nothing would exist now because it is impossible for something to be produced by nothing. (Clarke does not explicitly acknowledge that “something always was” is ambiguous between a stronger, de re reading and a weaker, de dicto reading. Since the stronger, de re claim seems unwarranted by the argument thus far and the next step of the argument is to establish that there is a single independent being, the more plausible and weaker de dicto claim can be assumed.) What has existed from eternity can only be either an independent being, that is, one having in itself the reason of its existence, or an infinite series of dependent beings. However, such a series cannot be the being that has existed from eternity because by hypothesis it can have no external cause, and no internal cause (no dependent being in it) can cause the whole series. Hence, an independent being exists. (As a side argument in the Demonstration, Clarke also argued that since space and time cannot be conceived not to exist and they are obviously not self-subsistent, the substance on which they depend, God, must exist necessarily as well.)

This is as far as the argument can go by examining the nature of necessity and positing the contingency of the world. To reach the personal and moral attributes of God, it is necessary to draw upon further features of the world. One real feature of the world is that there are intelligent beings in it. But intelligence, being a perfection, must exist to at least as great a degree in the cause as in the effect. So God must be intelligent (D38–39; W IV.543). This intelligence can also be established from the order and beauty of the world, so a teleological argument can reach this conclusion as well.

Clarke attempted a variety of arguments to establish that God is an agent (that is, that God is not only intelligent but has a will that is free in a libertarian sense). First, Clarke claimed that “intelligence without liberty … is really (in respect of any power, excellence, or perfection) no intelligence at all,” so therefore God must be an agent. Second, if God does not have a free will then God is a “necessary agent,” which is a contradiction (an argument examined in our section on free will). The person positing a God without freedom (Clarke specifically mentions Spinoza) is positing a contradiction and has failed to explain the source of activity in the world (D46–47; W IV.548–549). Furthermore, the necessitarian (like Spinoza) is forced to deny a number of (to Clarke) obvious points, including that things could be different than they are, that there are final causes in the universe, and that there is any variety of finite things in the universe (because an infinite, unfree cause can produce only infinite effects).

Clarke offered arguments both a priori (e.g., God comprehends all necessary relations between possible beings, and ethical truths are necessary relations between beings) and a posteriori (e.g., the body is wonderfully made) to establish the wisdom of God. Since God knows what is best and can do what is best, it follows that God is good and just and has all the other moral perfections, which again can be established both a priori (by considering what a wise, omnipotent being would do) and a posteriori (by consulting our experience of the world).

Ultimately, Clarke rejected both the view that a word can refer both to human and divine properties only equivocally, and also the position that it can do so only analogically. Instead, he adopted the Latitudinarian view that human and divine attributes, especially the moral ones, have the same nature, although God's are infinite.

4.2 God, Space, and Time

Clarke's most characteristic and controversial views about God concerned divine eternity and immensity. According to traditional Christian theology, God is eternal and immense (omnipresent). The claim that God is eternal can be taken to mean two different things. In one sense, it means that God is a timeless being whose duration is not successive, with no before or after. In another sense, it means that God is sempiternal, namely, a being existing throughout time but whose duration is successive and for whom there is a before and an after. Similarly, divine immensity or omnipresence can be understood in different ways. God can be taken to be present everywhere by operation but not by situation; in other words, God is present by being in a place not as a human would be, but by acting there: God fills a room by being the cause of the room and its contents in a way remotely analogous to that in which I can fill a glass by pouring water in it. By contrast, one could claim that divine operational presence requires situational presence and hold that the divine substance is, in some sense to be specified, coextended with what it fills. However, divine extension can itself be taken in two ways. It can be understood in terms of local extension; God, then, would be extended like, say, a stone or perhaps space are, with the proviso that God, unlike a stone, could penetrate all other extended things. Or, it can be understood in non-local terms, in accordance with what More dubbed “holenmerism.”

Clarke was clear in making a few claims regarding God's relation to space and time, but less clear in explaining what those basic claims amounted to. Clarke's four central tenets are: (1) God is substantially present in space and time. Therefore, the Scholastic view of divine eternity and immensity is false. (2) By being substantially present, God is able to act at all times and in all places. (3) God is not identical to space or time; although necessary, they depend for their existence upon God. (4) God's immensity and sempiternality are consistent with God's unity. We will unpack these ideas below.

God is substantially present in space and time. Therefore, the Scholastic view of divine eternity and immensity is false. Clarke rejected the view of God as substantially removed from space and time. Divine eternity involves both necessary existence and infinite duration which, however, could not be identified with the traditional notion of the eternal present (nunc stans) according to which God exists in an unchanging permanent present without any successive duration since, like Newton, he considered such a view unintelligible at best and contradictory at worst. The attribution of successive duration to God might suggest that God, like us, is in time but, unlike us, does not change. However, this was not Clarke's view. For he made clear in his exchanges with Butler that God is not technically in space and time (because God is prior to time whereas things “in time” are metaphysically subsequent to the existence of time). Moreover, he attributed distinct and successive thoughts to God, otherwise God could not “vary his will, nor diversify his works, nor act successively, nor govern the world, nor indeed have any power to will or do anything at all” (W III.897). Hence, God is immutable with respect to his will and his general and particular decrees only in the sense that he does not change his mind.

Clarke's criticism of the Scholastic view of divine immensity or omnipresence was analogous to that of eternity: the claim that the immensity of God is a point, as his eternity is an instant is, he held, unintelligible. However, while for Clarke God's temporal presence is analogous to ours by involving temporal succession, his views about God's spatial presence were somewhat less clear because he did not explicitly state whether he adopted holenmerism or not. Nevertheless, there are good reasons for holding he did not. Clarke, without making any reference to holenmerism, vigorously denied Leibniz's charge that extension is incompatible with divine simplicity because it introduces parts in God, and this intimates that he thought of divine omnipresence in terms of local extension and dimensionality. Nor did he attempt any defense of holenmerism from More's famous critique, and in addition there is some indirect contemporary evidence that Clarke took God to be literally dimensional.[2]

By being substantially present, God is able to act at all times and in all places. To deny this would entail accepting action at a distance, which Clarke, like most of his contemporaries, found mysterious or impossible.

God is not identical to space or time; although necessary, they depend for their existence upon God. A common worry about absolute space in the eighteenth century was that if space is an infinite, necessary being then either God is not the only infinite, necessary, and independent being or God is identical to space, both of which were theologically unacceptable. Clarke rejected both of these implications. Clarke's position in the Demonstration and the letters to Butler is that space and time are divine properties or modes. Since they depend on the only self-subsisting being, they are not independent beings. In the letter to an anonymous author (almost certainly Daniel Waterland) and in the Avertissement to Pierre Des Maizeaux (the latter of which Newton had more than a hand in), he held that they are not, strictly speaking, attributes but they are modes, to be identified with God's immensity and eternality (D 122–123, W IV.758).[3] (Clarke is not clear on the difference between attributes and modes, but he seems to reserve the term “attribute” for that which picks out the essential nature of a thing.) He told Leibniz that immensity and eternality are necessary effects of God's existence, without supplying any argument to show that being an effect is equivalent to or compatible with being a mode.

God's immensity and sempiternality are consistent with God's unity. As Leibniz and Waterland readily noted, the identification of divine immensity with space endangers the simplicity of the divine being because space has parts, albeit not separable ones. The objection, though formidable, was not new; Bayle in the Dictionnaire (entry “Leucippus,” remark G) had chided the Newtonians for identifying space with divine immensity in order to solve the ontological problem created by the positing of an infinite space, and had compared this solution to Malebranche's placement of “intelligible extension” in God, a move which, he claimed, Arnauld had shown to lead to the destruction of divine simplicity. As a further point, Waterland suggests that since Clarke accepts that nothing with parts can be the subject of consciousness, God's immensity also undermines divine intelligence and consciousness.

Clarke offered two solutions. First, not everything extended has parts. Since space is extended, but its “parts” cannot be removed, they are not truly parts. Second, Clarke claimed parity between spatial and temporal extendedness: since the former is compatible with the simplicity of what “stretches” temporally, the latter is compatible with the simplicity of what stretches spatially. But the parity between space and time, were it to be granted, rather than showing that spatial extendedness is not detrimental to a thing's simplicity because temporal extendedness is not, could be taken to show that the latter is detrimental to a thing's simplicity because the former is.

4.3 Trinitarian Views

In his lifetime, Clarke was infamous for his heterodox view of the Trinity. In Christian theology, God is represented as tripartite, three persons but one God. In the 1662 Book of Common Prayer, in use in England during Clarke's lifetime, one of the liturgies draws from the Athanasian Creed, which includes the following discussion of the Trinity: “For there is one Person of the Father, another of the Son : and another of the Holy Ghost. But the Godhead of the Father, of the Son, and of the Holy Ghost, is all one… So the Father is God, the Son is God : and the Holy Ghost is God. And yet they are not three Gods: but one God.” In his position as a cleric, Clarke was required to subscribe to this formulation. In 1712, apparently against the advice of his friends, he published The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity, in which he diverged from what his opponents considered the plain sense of this formulation. The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity begins by collecting all the passages of the New Testament that relate to the Trinity. It then sets out a series of 55 propositions regarding the Trinity, each supported by references to the texts collected in the first section. The third section relates these propositions to the Anglican liturgy. This approach reflects Clarke's general expectation that the correct theological doctrines are found in the Bible and are compatible with reason. Through hundreds of years of what he considered bad metaphysics, the correct and intelligible doctrine of the trinity had become obscured, and Clarke hoped to return to a pre-Athanasian understanding of the trinity.

Clarke's position in The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity was labeled by his opponents as “Arian,” “Socinian,” and “Sabellian.” Although they were commonly used as abusive terms for anyone holding non-traditional or anti-trinitarian views, they also have more precise meanings. An Arian holds that the Son (the second person of the Trinity) is divine but not eternal; he was created by God the Father out of nothing before the beginning of the world. A Socinian holds that the Son is merely human and was created at or after the conception of Jesus. A Sabellian holds that the Son is a mode of God. In the precise use of the terms, Clarke is none of these. Unlike the Arians, Clarke affirmed that the Son is co-eternal with the Father and not created (W IV.141). From this it also follows that, contra the Socinians, the Son existed before the conception of Jesus. Unlike the Sabellians, Clarke denied that the Son was a mode of the Father. (This would have been very problematic given his insistence that space is a mode of God.) Clarke's claimed ignorance about substance made him reluctant to declare that the Father and the Son were the same divine substance, but the Son is endowed by the Father with all of the power and authority of the Father. He also called the manner of the Son's generation from the father to be “ineffable.”[4] What Clarke affirmed was that each member of the trinity was a person (which for Clarke always means “intelligent agent”), but that only the Father had the attribute of being self-existent. His views might best be described as subordinationist.

Clarke's publication of The Scripture Doctrine produced a flood of responses. Clarke was not officially censured (but nearly so), and it surely prevented his rising to higher office. (For a summary of the responses, see Ferguson 1974. For more on Clarke's trinitarian views, see Pfizenmaier 1997.)

4.4 Miracles

Like Joseph Glanville, Thomas Sprat, Boyle, and Locke, he belonged to that group of English intellectuals associated with the Royal Society who thought that miracles could be used as evidence for the claim that Christianity is the true religion. However, given that matter is inactive, God is actively involved in all or nearly all events in the world. What then could separate out a particular action of God as miraculous? According to Clarke, a miracle is a “work effected in a manner unusual…by the interposition either of God himself, or of some intelligent agent superior to man, for the proof or evidence of some particular doctrine, or in attestation to the authority of some particular person” (W II.701). It is the unusualness of God's acting in a certain way rather than the way God typically acts that separates out an event as miraculous for Clarke.

Miracles became a point of controversy in the letters that passed between Clarke and Leibniz. (Leibniz lists it as one of their five points of contention in his third letter [W IV.605].) One focus of the debate is which would be greater: a world so perfectly crafted that God does not need to intervene to keep it running (Leibniz), or a world so dependent on God that one cannot understand the world without recognizing its continual dependence on the operations of God (Clarke). A second focus of the debate is the proper understanding of a miracle: something that exceeds the natural power of created things (Leibniz), or something that seems different from our human expectation of how things operate (Clarke).

What follows is a summary of the Leibniz-Clarke dialectic regarding miracles as it transpired in their correspondence. Leibniz's first letter accuses Newton of making an imperfect machine that requires tuning to keep it running, like a watch that requires winding; but this is unfitting a perfect God. In Newton's world, miracles are required “in order to supply the Wants of Nature” (L1.4, W IV.588). In Newton's defense, Clarke argues there is a disanalogy between the watch and the world. The watch requires winding because a human watchmaker can only compose parts and put them in motion, whereas God is both the creator and preserver of forces and powers. On the offensive, Clarke charges those who deny God's constant involvement in the world to be allowing a mechanical world, a world of “Materialism and Fate,” where God is not needed at all (C1.4, W IV.590) In response, Leibniz makes the interesting objection that Clarke is either explaining natural things by the supernatural, which is an absurdity, or else God is a part of nature (specifically, the soul of the world) (L2.12, W IV.596). In his second reply, Clarke argues that miracles are miraculous only from a human perspective. Since God's wisdom and goodness are unchanging, if God chooses to act differently in the world at a certain time (e.g., by changing the laws of motion), it is only because it was always good to do so and was part of God's plan from eternity. Because it requires no more power for God to do the miraculous-to-us as to do the natural-to-us, neither one is “with Respect to God, more or less Natural or Supernatural than the other.” From our perspective, God is changing the order of things. From God's perspective, everything is equally a part of God's design. A miracle, then, is only a miracle “with Regard to our Conceptions” (C2.6–12, W IV.598–601). In his final letter, Clarke elaborates on this, suggesting that we only call the sun stopping in the sky miraculous because it is unusual; if it was always at the same point in the sky, then that would be natural, and its motion miraculous. Similarly, raising a dead body from the ground is miraculous, but only because God does not usually act that way (C5.107–109, W IV.693)

Leibniz's unhelpful response in his third letter is that theologians will side with him and not Clarke. Leibniz does present his own position on miracles; they are that which exceed all the powers of creatures or cannot be explained by the nature of bodies (L3.17, W IV.606). In his third reply, Clarke clarifies that something's being a miracle is not connected to being immediately effected by God rather than through body, but that it is merely unusual. (C3.17, W IV.611–612). In his fourth reply, he clarifies that unusualness is a necessary but not sufficient condition for being a miracle. He does not say what else is needed to qualify something as a miracle (C4.43, W IV.629–630). In his final letter, Leibniz connects two of his criticisms of Clarke and Newton: if everything God does is equally miraculous or natural, then God's operations on the world are like the soul's upon the body; so God is the soul of the world (L4.110–11, W IV.666). Perhaps the criticism that goes deepest in explaining what troubles Leibniz's philosophical sensibilities in Newton and Clarke's proposal is in section 121 of Leibniz's fifth letter (W IV.668–669). “But it is regular, (says the Author,) it is constant, and consequently natural. I answer; it cannot be regular, without being reasonable; nor natural, unless it can be explained by the Natures of creatures.” Regularities require explanations, and to be natural, these explanations must come from the natures of the creatures. The Clarkean picture, in which matter is completely passive, is incapable of explaining the regularities exhibited in the interaction of material bodies in terms of those bodies. Whereas Clarke saw this as the pinnacle of what natural science contributes to natural theology, Leibniz saw it as a failure to exhibit a fully rational world suited to being created by a perfectly good God.

4.5 Revelation and the Four Categories of Deism

Clarke is very confident in the prospects of general revelation; that is, he thinks that human reason (if it is not corrupted by vicious habits) is capable of discovering the existence of God as well as the attributes of God from the evidence of nature and the capacity of reason. Indeed, Christianity presupposes natural religion (W IV.582). Many theological and ethical truths (e.g., there is a God, that God is to be worshiped, it is good to be just and righteous) are plainly understandable to everyone, and if one is mistaken in these matters “'tis not by his Understanding, but by his Will that he is deceived.” Every person has a conscience that discerns the truths of morality. Truths that are important are easily known, and require “only an unprejudiced apprehension, and an uncorrupt Will.” Yet it is very common to oppose these truths; the most common causes are “a presumptuous Ignorance, which despises Knowledge”; carelessness, which leads to blindly following local customs; prejudice, which is relying implicitly on others and traditions rather than an examination of the evidence; and vice, a willful opposition to the truth due to the love of wickedness, debauchery, and power (W II.147–160). The reasoned defense of natural religion, although perhaps unable to sway the prejudiced, was central to Clarke's project.

Clarke's goal in the Boyle lectures was to carry those who were open to reason through the process of reasoning to the proper conclusions. Of particular interest to him were the deists, whom he thought could be convinced to abandon their position, because deism is unstable. In Clarke's taxonomy, there are four categories of deists (W II.600ff). If they were to follow their position to its logical conclusion, three kinds of deists end up as atheists and the fourth end up as Christians.

The first category of deist say they believe in “an Eternal, Infinite, Independent, Intelligent Being” that made the world, but this God is not involved in the governing of the world nor does God care for what happens in it. This falls into atheism because the best science of the day has shown that the nature of matter is insufficient to ground the laws by which matter acts and thus requires the continuous dependence upon its Creator, and also because a God that isn't concerned for what happens in the world must be lacking in knowledge of what is happening, power to affect what is happening, ability to act in the world, or wisdom to know that intervention is needed, and thus is not the God that the deist claimed to accept. The second category accept the role of providence in the world, but deny that God has moral attributes; ethics is a matter of human construction. They fail to see, thinks Clarke, that ethics is a matter of eternal, fixed relations and that to deny the moral attributes of God entails the denial of either God's wisdom or power. The third category affirm God's moral attributes but deny the immortality of the human soul and deny that moral terms apply univocally between God and humans, which in practice leads to the denial of a future state after death. Clarke claims that this explodes all the attributes of God so that we no longer know what we are saying when we talk about God. Finally, some deists hold all the right theological and ethical doctrines, but claim that they know this solely on the basis of general revelation and thus have no need of a special, Christian revelation. Clarke suspects that this fourth category of deists no longer exist, at least in lands where Christianity has reached, but includes those who lived prior to Jesus and were hopeful of such a revelation.

5. Ethics

Although some of his sermons contain interesting analyses of individual Christian virtues, the most sustained exposition of Clarke's ethics is contained in A Discourse concerning the Unalterable Obligations of Natural Religion and the Truth and Certainty of the Christian Revelation, his second set of Boyle Lectures. Clarke started by stating that clearly there are different relations among persons and that from these relations there arise a “fitness” or “unfitness” of behavior among persons. So, for example, given the relation of infinite disproportion between humans and God, it is fit that we honor, worship, and imitate the Lord. In other words, from certain eternal and immutable factual relations among persons there arise certain eternal and immutable obligations, which in their broad features can be rationally apprehended by anyone with a sound mind, although in some entangled cases we may be at a loss in clearly demarcating right from wrong. Being grounded in necessary relations, morality, like geometry, is universal and necessary. As such, it is independent of any will, be it divine or human, and of any consideration of punishment or reward. Clarke's view thus far can be characterized as a variety of rationalist deontology.

Morality has three main branches dealing with duties toward God, other humans, and oneself. Duties toward others are governed by equity, which demands that one deal with other persons as one can reasonably expect others to deal with one, and by love, which demands that one further the happiness of all persons. Duties towards oneself demand that one preserve one's life and spiritual well being so as to be able to perform one's duties. Since God's will is uncorrupted by self-interest or passion, divine volitions and moral commands are extensionally equivalent. Hence, God wants us to follow morality, and such a desire is manifested in laws God has set up. But since laws require sanctions, and since such sanctions are not uniformly present in this life, moral laws are associated with reward and punishment in the next life. Moreover, human depravity makes the prospect of future sanctions a necessary incentive for proper behavior.

However, Clarke seemed prepared to go further, claiming against the Stoics and Cicero that in our present state virtue is not the highest good (this being happiness), and that consequently it would be unreasonable, not just psychologically difficult, to lay down one's life for the sake of duty. Virtue, Clarke claimed, is not happiness but only a means to it, as in a race running is not itself the prize but the way to obtain it. The present sorry state of mankind, beset by ignorance, prejudice, and corrupt passions renders divine revelation necessary, contrary to what deists think, and therefore the remaining lectures are mainly devoted to establishing the reliability of the Gospels.

Clarke's theory has been criticized on several grounds. He never quite explained what is the nature of the relations among persons that ground morality, leaving his followers and detractors to argue inconclusively about it. Nor is it clear how moral obligation arises from such de facto, albeit eternal, relations, although Clarke is hardly alone in facing this problem. Hume famously charged Clarke's theory with motivational impotence because the intellectual perception of “fitness” cannot, by itself, move the will. However, as we saw, Clarke denied that evaluation is causally linked to motivation, although he clearly thought that evaluation provides the agent, who ultimately causes the volition, with reasons for action.

Additionally, Clarke's theory suffers from structural problems. Firstly, it is not very clear what it is in the “Nature and Reason of Things” that is necessary. Is it that good is necessarily not evil? (Which seems to be an analytic truth.) Is it that one thing cannot be both good from one perspective and evil from another? (In which case, Clarke would be responding to Hobbes or maybe Spinoza.) Is it that whatever is good is necessarily good? (In which case, he is perhaps restating his opposition to divine command theory.) Is it something else? Clarke's position is not clear, but he does seem to affirm each of these interpretations at different times. Secondly, Clarke moves back and forth between the claim that ethical truths are relations between mind-independent objects in the world, and that they are grounded in the nature of rationality itself. Finally, as Tindal noted, Clarke's rationalist strand hardly fits with his insistence on the need for Christian revelation, since his arguments establishing the reliability of scripture seem to require much more intellectual effort than the apprehension of our moral duties. Indeed, as Tindal reasonably claimed by approvingly quoting Leibniz's claim that the Chinese should send us missionaries in natural theology and its subsequent morality, revelation is neither necessary nor sufficient for proper moral behavior even for common people. Hence, how the obligations stemming from natural religion prepare the way for revelation is, to put it mildly, unclear.

Clarke's negative assessment of Hobbes' account of political and moral obligation is more promising. Among his many criticisms, he argues that a contract cannot be obligatory unless there were already an obligation to obey contracts; if a contract benefits the community then there are real benefits prior to the contract so the contract does not generate benefits and harms; it is a contradiction for everyone to have a right to the same thing in the state of nature; and if power is to be obeyed then an all-powerful devil should be obeyed, which is absurd (W II.609-616, 631–638).

6. Influence

Clarke's influence on his contemporaries and the generation that followed was immense, but it had diminished significantly by the dawn of the nineteenth century. One important aspect of his immediate influence was that as the translator of the standard textbook in physics in England in the early eighteenth century, as the defender of absolute space and atomism in the correspondence with Leibniz, as the translator of Newton's Opticks into Latin, and as a recognized close friend of Newton, Clarke was perhaps the most significant spokesperson for the Newtonian natural philosophy, and a primary interpreter of its implications for metaphysics, philosophy of science, and theology. In particular, his use of the passivity and scarcity of matter in his argument for the existence of God was noted by his contemporaries internationally. Voltaire declared, “Among these philosophers [the last generation of British philosophers], Clarke is perhaps altogether the clearest, the most profound, the most methodical, and the strongest of all those who have spoken of the Supreme Being” (Philosophical Dictionary, “Plato,” Sect. 17]. Voltaire as a young man seems to have been particularly impressed with Clarke. Later in life, Voltaire seems to have been less convinced by Clarke's argument for the existence of God on the basis of Newton's philosophy. This same path seems to have been followed by Rousseau.

Clarke's influence was greatest in England and Scotland, where all of his works were widely read and propagated by many writers and university instructors. Among those who approved of Clarke's methodology and adopted many of his positions, Joseph Butler and Thomas Reid are the most well known today. Clarke's ethics were defended by Catharine Trotter Cockburn and attacked by Hutcheson and Hume. Hume clearly has Clarke in mind in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, where Demea recites the argument a priori and both Cleanthes and Philo offer critiques. It has also been proposed that Clarke is a major target of Book I of Hume's Treatise, but this is less widely held.

Clarke continued to influence philosophers in the eighteenth and nineteenth century that had interests in the intersection of theology and philosophy, particularly in the issue of the freedom of the will. Jonathan Edwards singled out Clarke as a major opponent in his Freedom of the Will, where Edwards runs together libertarianism with Arminian theology. This same libertarianism made Clarke popular among the German Pietists. Among them, Crusius is the most notable, both for his work and for his importance to Kant.


Primary Literature

W Clarke, S., 1738, The Works, London 1738; reprint New York: Garland Publishing Co.
D Vailati, E., (ed.), 1998, Samuel Clarke. A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God And Other Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

See also:

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Collins, Anthony | cosmological argument | deism | eternity | freedom: divine | free will | God: concepts of | Hobbes, Thomas | Hume, David: on free will | Hume, David: on religion | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Locke, John | miracles | naturalism | Newton, Isaac | Newton, Isaac: philosophy | Spinoza, Baruch | trinity