Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Perfectionism in Moral and Political Philosophy

First published Tue Feb 13, 2007

Perfectionism has acquired a number of meanings in contemporary moral and political philosophy. The term is used to refer to an account of the good human life, an account of human well-being, a moral theory, and an approach to politics. Historically, perfectionism is associated with ethical theories that characterize the human good in terms of the development of human nature. Writers as diverse as Aristotle, Aquinas, Spinoza, Marx, and T.H. Green are perfectionists in this sense.

Speaking generally, perfectionist writers advance an objective account of the human good and then develop an account of ethics and/or politics that is informed by this account of the good. Different perfectionist writers propose different accounts of the human good and arrive at different ethical and political conclusions. But all perfectionists defend an account of the human good that is objective in the sense that it identifies states of affairs and/or activities as good in themselves and not good in virtue of the fact that they are desired or enjoyed by human beings.

1. Perfectionist Value

An objective account of the good need make no reference to the good of human beings. Works of art or aspects of the natural world might have value even if no human being existed. Perfectionist accounts of the good are accounts of the human good. They seek to identify the goods that contribute to the best or most perfect life for human beings.

The best life for human beings can be understood in at least two importantly different ways. On the first understanding, such a life is understood in terms of well-being. The best life for a human being is a life that goes maximally well for the person who leads it. On the second understanding, the best life for a human being is understood in terms of excellence or success. An excellent human life need not be one that is best in terms of well-being, for it is possible that the most excellent life that a human being can live requires him to make sacrifices in his own well-being for the sake of other persons or goods. Thus the notion of an excellent human life is broader than the notion of well-being. For this reason, a general characterization of perfectionism should employ it rather than well-being.[1]

Perfectionism, so understood, contrasts with both hedonism and desire satisfaction accounts of the human good. Let X refer to an object, an activity or a relationship. Then, for the perfectionist, if X is good, then it is not good in virtue of the fact that it is desired, or would be desired under appropriate conditions, by human beings. Likewise, for the perfectionist, if X is good, it does not follow that X must be a pleasant mental state or causally related to one. Perfectionist accounts of the human good can allow that some goods are experiential, but they reject the hedonistic thesis that all intrinsic human goods consist in pleasurable sensations or attitudes.

1.1 Two Versions of Perfectionism

Perfectionist goods contribute to or are components of an excellent human life. Historically, as noted above, perfectionists have related these goods to the development of human nature. For example, the development of rationality is often considered to be a perfectionist good because it is a capacity essential to and distinctive of human nature. Following Aristotle, a number of contemporary writers have sought to develop accounts of the human good along these lines (Hurka 1993; Foot 2003). We can use the term human nature perfectionism to refer generally to accounts of the human good that relate perfectionist goods to the development of human nature. Other writers, however, have characterized perfectionism without any reference to human nature. John Rawls, for example, characterizes perfectionism in terms of the maximum “achievement of human excellence in art, science and culture” (Rawls 1971, 325). Derek Parfit likewise characterizes perfectionism in terms of the achievement or realization of “the best things in life” (Parfit 1986, 162). Here it is the existence of the objective goods, and not their relation to the development of human nature, that is highlighted. Similarly, other writers have identified perfectionism with the realization of a specified list of objective goods (Finnis 1980; Griffin 1986; Arneson 2000). We can use the term objective goods perfectionism to refer generally to accounts of the human good that identify perfectionist goods without relating them to the development of human nature.[2]

Proponents of human nature perfectionism must defend an account of human nature. More precisely, they must give an account of the properties or capacities that are central to human nature and the development of which have value (Hurka 1993). By contrast, proponents of objective goods perfectionism must explain why some goods, and not others, are included. Objective goods perfectionists need not formulate an exhaustive list of objective goods. They may believe such an undertaking to be misguided. But they should have something to say about what makes an alleged good an objective good, one worthy of pursuit (Sumner 1996; Sher 1997).

1.2 Perfectionism and Pluralism

The distinction between human nature perfectionism and objective goods perfectionism helps us approach an important question in value theory. Must perfectionists be monists, holding that there is at bottom only one form of life that is best for all human beings; or can they hold that there exists a plurality of equally good forms of life for human beings? The question is important, since it is very plausible to think that the best life for one human being may differ from the best life for another.

Human nature perfectionism identifies the human good with the development of human nature. This looks like a monistic ideal, one that identifies a single form of life as best for all human beings. But, in fact, the ideal leaves many issues open. Let us stipulate that the best life for a human being is the life that maximizes the development of his nature. Then, it still could be true that for different human beings different activities and pursuits would best promote their good. This could be true, since different people may be able to best develop different aspects of human nature. Given their temperament and talents, some do well to concentrate on artistic pursuits, while others do well to focus on theoretical studies or athletic achievements. Moreover, even those who do well to focus on the same type of perfection, may find that some activities and goals serve this end better for them than for others. And, finally, it may not be true, as the above supposition holds, that the best life for a human being is one that maximizes the development of his nature. For the most perfect life for a human being may require him to sacrifice his own self-development to some extent for the self-development of others. Different tradeoffs between one's own perfection and the perfection of others may be rationally eligible; and this fact, if it is indeed a fact, also would contribute to the plurality and variety of modes of life consistent with the perfectionist ideal.

The compatibility of objective goods perfectionism and value pluralism also can be established. One need only assume that some perfectionist goods are either roughly equal or incommensurable in value (Finnis 1980; Raz 1986). Friendship and understanding, for example, may both be perfectionist goods, but they may not be comparable in a way that allows us to rank lives that realize these goods to different degrees. More generally, perfectionist goods may be combinable in different proportions, yielding a range of different types of life that are valuable and worthy of pursuit. The adjective “perfect” when applied to a human life suggests one that is maximally good or excellent, but if goods conflict and are incomparable, then a plurality of different types of life may have a title to that designation.

Nothing said here, of course, rules out the possibility that there really is only one way of life that is maximally best for human beings. The point pressed here is merely that perfectionism is consistent with value pluralism. Put otherwise, if objective values are plural and incomparable, as many recent writers maintain, then this fact about the nature of value does not undercut the plausibility of perfectionism, of either the human nature or objective goods variety. To be sure, a plausible perfectionism will recognize that pluralism has its limits. Some ways of life are not valuable for human beings. Perfectionist value theory is action guiding in the sense that it seeks to identify goods and activities that human beings ought to pursue, even if they do not desire or find pleasure in them.

2. Perfectionist Ethics

Perfectionism as a moral theory directs human beings to protect and promote objectively good human lives. As such, it can take an egoistic or non-egoistic form. Egoistic forms of perfectionism are well represented in the history of moral philosophy. These theories direct each human being to perfect himself as much as possible, or at least to some threshold level. Egoistic forms of perfectionism need not be narrowly self-interested. A number of perfectionist writers have held that the good of others is a derivative part of one's own good (Green 1986; Hobhouse 1911). On such views, there is no conflict between one's own perfection and the perfection of others. Non-egoistic forms of perfectionism, by contrast, allow for such conflicts. They hold that each human being has a non-derivative duty to perfect others as well as a duty to perfect himself. Such views, at least in principle, can direct human beings to sacrifice their own perfection for the sake of others.[3]

Whether it takes an egoistic or non-egoistic form, perfectionism is best understood as a moral theory that directs human beings to care about the perfection of others as well as themselves. This claim is consistent with recognizing, what is evidently true, that there are serious limits to our ability to bring about the perfection of others. These limits explain why some philosophers, most notably Kant, have held that we cannot have a duty to promote the perfection of others (Kant 1785). Many perfectionist goods require self-direction for their realization. We cannot compel another to develop her capacities, at least not all of them. Nor can we compel another to participate in valuable social relationships. This valid point, however, should not be overstated. We can work to ensure that others live under conditions that are conducive to their own self-development or their own realization of perfectionist goods. Indirect promotion may be possible where direct promotion is not. The fact that human beings cannot directly bring about the perfection of others is nonetheless important. It may explain why, in practice if not in principle, a plausible perfectionism would direct each human being to be more concerned with her own perfection than with the perfection of others.

2.1 Consequentialism and Deontology

The best life for a human being might be one that simultaneously best perfects himself and best perfects others. But this possibility is unlikely. Even if the conflict between one's own good and the good of others is not as sharp as it is often taken to be, there will, in all likelihood, be circumstances in which human beings must choose between their own perfection and the perfection of others.

How then should this conflict be adjudicated within perfectionist ethics? Egoistic forms of perfectionism have a ready answer to this question, but non-egoistic forms must find a way to balance the conflicting demands. One natural response to this problem is straightforwardly consequentialist. Perfectionism, it can be said, requires that we pursue the greatest development of all human beings at all times (Hurka 1993, 55-60). So understood, perfectionism gives each human being a shared comprehensive goal. This makes perfectionism a very demanding moral theory. It is demanding in two distinct respects. First, it demands, other things being the same, that we weigh the perfection of others equally with our own perfection. Second, it demands that, to the extent left open by the first demand, that we maximize our own perfection.

Perhaps this kind of consequentialist perfectionism asks too much of us. We can imagine forms of perfectionism that relax both of its demands.

Consider, for example, a perfectionist moral theory that includes an agent-centered prerogative. Such a theory could allow that persons can favor their own perfection, to some reasonable degree, over the perfection of others and that persons need only pursue their own perfection up to some threshold level. This relaxed perfectionism would depart from the main historical defenses of perfectionism (which emphasize maximization) and it would not well fit the term perfectionism (which connotes maximization). But the important question is whether a view of this type is nonetheless plausible.

The answer depends, in part, on whether human nature or objective goods perfectionism is the favored view. If perfection is understood in terms of the development of human nature, then a view that departs from the maximizing injunction will look less promising. A person who has extraordinary potential for excellence, but who only achieves a threshold level of development does not plausibly achieve perfection. Since she was capable of so much more, we should not be content with her modest achievements. Intuitively, we should judge that she has not fully lived up to the requirements of perfectionist morality (Hurka 1993, 56). Moreover, on this version of perfectionism, an agent's primary moral goal is to develop human nature. But if the development of human nature is the goal, then it is a bit of a mystery why each human being's own development should have special value for himself (Hurka 1993, 62-63).

Matters look different if perfection is understood in terms of the realization of objective goods. For, on this version of perfectionism, it is plausible to hold that each human being has an agent-relative interest in leading a successful life, where success is understood in terms of the pursuit of valuable goals and the realization of perfectionist goods. A successful life, so understood, plausibly requires only a threshold realization of certain perfectionist goods, such as friendship, knowledge, and aesthetic experience. For these reasons, a non-maximizing injunction fits better with objective goods perfectionism than with human nature perfectionism.

Whatever its merits, the introduction of an agent-centered prerogative into perfectionist morality would exacerbate a problem with standard consequentialist versions of perfectionism. It would appear to give human beings a moral liberty to harm others if doing so would promote their own perfection.[4] True, the problem is present even without the introduction of the agent-centered prerogative. A pure consequentialist perfectionism in principle could enjoin the sacrifice of those who had little potential for perfectionist achievement for those who had great potential. But such a view would at least have the virtue that those who were sacrificed would be contributing to the goal of maximum perfectionist achievement — a goal they should share if they are consequentialist perfectionists. The same is not guaranteed to hold true if the prerogative is introduced.

Since the worry here is one that confronts consequentialist accounts of morality in general, it might be thought that perfectionist morality should take a deontological structure instead. Deontological perfectionism would hold that the goal of promoting human perfection is constrained by the requirement to respect the perfection, or the capacity to achieve it, in each human being. The structure of such a view can be glimpsed by considering the objective goods version of perfectionism. For it is plausible that the achievement of certain objective goods, such as friendship or community with others, requires that we treat others with respect. Requirements of respect, it can be argued, are constitutively necessary conditions for the realization of many perfectionist goods.

This is not the place to explore the structure of such a view in detail. Nor is it the place to discuss the extent to which it represents a genuine departure from consequentialism (Pettit and Smith 2004). Instead, another possible response to the worry can be mentioned. As Rawls pointed out, perfectionism is often taken to be merely one element of a general moral theory (Rawls 1971, 325). The moral duty to maximize human perfection must be balanced against other moral principles. Deontological constraints and agent-centered prerogatives might limit the duty to promote human perfection, but they might do so because they are derived from independent moral principles. On this mixed view, in which perfectionism is understood as merely one element of a general moral theory, it is possible to recommend perfectionism as an agent-neutral maximizing doctrine and avoid the unwanted implications that morality is excessively demanding and that it endorses the sacrifice of some for the sake of greater overall human perfection.

2.2 Elitism and Inequality

Perfectionist ethics has long been associated with elitist doctrines. Whether it takes a consequentialist or deontological structure, perfectionism is compatible with assigning different weights to the perfection of different human beings. And a number of important perfectionist writers have maintained that the perfection that matters the most is the perfection of those who are capable of achieving the most. This “superman” version of perfectionism, a view famously associated with Nietzsche, gives absolute weight to the excellence achievable by certain great men, such as Socrates or Goethe and zero weight to the rest of humanity. (Nietzsche 1873/1876; Griffin 1986, 60-61)

The superman version of perfectionism is an extreme view. It holds that some human lives count for much and many human lives count for nothing. This view should not be confused with a different and less extreme view, one that can be termed the prioritarian version of perfectionism. This view holds that we should value the perfection of each and every human being, but in aggregating human perfection we should count the greater perfections more, by some multiplier, than the lesser perfections.[5] The prioritarian version of perfectionism is not elitist, since it does not imply that the lives of those who can achieve more count for more. It holds only that greater perfections — a greater development of human nature or a greater realization of objective goods — count for more in summing up overall human perfection. More precisely, it directs human beings to pursue the greatest overall human perfection, where this is determined by a weighted summing of the perfection of all human beings.

Compared with the superman version, the prioritarian version of perfectionism is vastly more plausible. It captures the thought that greater achievements are more valuable than lesser achievements without denying value to the latter. It recognizes the claims of greatness without excluding some persons from moral concern. Still, while not elitist, prioritarian perfectionism will likely have inegalitarian implications for the distribution of resources. Thomas Nagel explains:

A society should try to foster the creation and preservation of what is best, or as good as it possibly can be, and this is just as important as the widespread dissemination of what is merely good enough. Such an aim can be pursued only by recognizing and exploiting the natural inequalities between persons, encouraging specialization and distinction of levels in education, and accepting the variation in accomplishment which results (Nagel 1991, 135).

One might object to these claims by holding that a sufficient amount of goods that are “merely good enough” should be able to outweigh a small number of truly excellent goods. But if the excellent goods are weighted more heavily, as recommended by the prioritarian version of perfectionism, then in practice this possibility may be unlikely. (Much depends here on the strength of the prioritarian multiplier.) Nagel appears to accept the prioritarian view, for he concludes that “no egalitarianism can be right which would permit haute cuisine, haute couture, and exquisite houses to disappear just because not everyone can have them.” (Nagel 1991, 138)

The prioritarian version of perfectionism, then, may license significant inequality in the distribution of resources. The inegalitarian character of the view has some attractive consequences, however. When applied to population ethics, it has the potential to avoid Parfit's “Repugnant Conclusion”. As Parfit explains:

We might claim that, even if some change brings a great net benefit to those who are affected, it is a change for the worse if it involves the loss of one of the best things in life (Parfit 1986, 163).

The focus here, as with Nagel's remarks, is on perfectionist goods rather than on the welfare of human beings. To avoid the repugnant conclusion, it must be claimed that these goods — “the kinds of experience and activity which do most to make life most worth living” — take absolute priority over less valuable experiences and activities.

This claim, as Parfit allows, is vulnerable to counterexample. It is very hard to believe that the best artistic experience is infinitely better than a slightly less good, but still excellent, artistic experience. Viewing a Picasso might be better than viewing a Braque, but not infinitely better. It is more plausible, then, to construe the prioritarian version of perfectionism as just assigning some finite positive multiplier to the greater perfections. But while such a view would not be vulnerable to the kind of counterexample just adduced, it would disable it from answering the Repugnant Conclusion (Hurka 1993, 81-82).

The discussion so far has emphasized the perfectionist concern with creating and preserving the best human experiences and activities. This concern inclines perfectionism toward inequality. But it is possible to defend an egalitarian version of the view; and the history of perfectionist ethics contains a number of such examples. Here four possibilities for developing an egalitarian version of perfectionism briefly can be mentioned.

(1) One can hold, as Spinoza did, that the most important perfectionist goods, such as understanding, are non-competitive. Their realization by one human being does not impede, and may advance, their realization in others. Maximum perfection, so understood, is compatible with equality of material condition (Spinoza Ethics).

(2) One can hold, as some writers like T. H. Green did, that inequality in the distribution of resources impedes the perfection of all, the rich as well as the poor. Perfectionist values, on this view, can be fully realized only in a society in which each member is roughly equal in power and status (Green 1986; Brink 2003, 77-88).

(3) One can hold that the perfection of each human being matters equally and that the distribution of resources most likely to promote the greatest overall human perfection is not one that contains great inequalities. Such a view would reject the prioritarian weighting function discussed above, holding instead that the perfection attained by each human being should count equally.

(4) One can hold that perfectionism inclines toward inequality, but that other non-perfectionist principles impose an egalitarian constraint on the pursuit of perfectionist values.

These possibilities show that there is no tight connection between perfectionism and inequality. The degree to which perfectionism licenses inequality will depend on answers to a number of difficult questions, e.g. which version of perfectionism is best?, how great are the natural differences between human beings?, to what extent are perfectionist goods competitive?, and what, if any, non-perfectionist moral principles limit the pursuit of perfectionist values? The answers to these questions are very much in dispute within perfectionist morality. Without firm answers to them, no one should reject perfectionist ethics out of hand because of a commitment to egalitarian values.

2.3 Self-Regarding Duties

Human beings should care about their own perfection as well as the perfection of others. As we have seen, the standard of perfection is objective in the sense that it guides, or should guide, human action, even if it what it recommends is not desired. These claims explain why perfectionism assigns an important place to self-regarding duties. A self-regarding duty to develop one's talents, if there is such a duty, is categorical. One has the duty whether or not one has a desire to fulfill it.

The possibility of self-regarding duties of this kind is sometimes rejected on conceptual grounds. Moral duties concern one's treatment of others, and so a moral duty to oneself is a confused notion. But this worry should not detain us for long. The key point is that we can have categorical reasons to develop our nature or to engage in valuable, as opposed to worthless, activities. It is a secondary issue whether we should classify a self-regarding duty as a moral duty or as (merely) a categorical non-moral duty (Raz 1994, 40). But while the worry should not detain us, it does point to an attractive feature of perfectionist ethics. Much contemporary moral theory ignores duties to oneself, whether understood as moral duties or not, and focuses exclusively on our duties toward others. Perfectionist ethics is an important corrective to this tendency. By expanding the domain of ethical concern, it has the potential to enrich contemporary moral philosophy (Hurka 1993, 5).

Different perfectionist theories offer different accounts of the content of self-regarding duties. Generally speaking, it is useful to distinguish negative from positive duties to oneself. Negative duties are duties to refrain from damaging or destroying one's capacity to lead a good life. For example, barring exceptional circumstances, one has duties to refrain from suicide and self-mutilation. Positive duties, by contrast, are duties to exercise one's capacity to develop one's nature and/or to realize perfectionist goods. For example, one has a duty to develop one's talents and not to devote one's life entirely to idleness and pleasure (Kant 1785).

Specific negative and positive self-regarding duties are derived from the more comprehensive duty to oneself to do what one can to lead a good life. It is probably true, as Aristotle pointed out, that the success of one's life depends on factors outside of one's control. If so, then no one can have a duty to have a good life. Still, excluding the effects of luck, we can say that each human being will have a more or less successful life depending on the decisions they make and the options they pursue. And we can add that each human being has a comprehensive duty to lead a successful life, to the extent that it is within his or her power to do so.

Stated at this level of abstraction, the perfectionist case for affirming self-regarding duties does not look particularly controversial. Resistance to it will likely derive from one of two quarters. Some will reject the very possibility of categorical duties, whether to oneself or to others. Others will accept the possibility of categorical duties, but insist that they are limited to the treatment of others. This latter view, on its face, looks unstable. It is likely motivated by the worry that if self-regarding duties are acknowledged, then the door is open for paternalistic interference. To address this concern, we must turn now from perfectionist ethics to perfectionist politics.

3. Perfectionism and Politics

The transition from perfectionist ethics to perfectionist politics is a natural one to make. Political institutions can be arranged, and state policies can be adopted, that promote or impede perfectionist values in various ways and to varying degrees. If one is committed to perfectionist ethics, then this commitment establishes a presumption in favor of perfectionism in politics. Other things being equal, one should favor political institutions and state policies that do the best job of promoting good human lives in the circumstances in which they function. Importantly, this natural presumption can be defeated. For one thing, the political pursuit of perfectionist ends might be self-defeating. This possibility is considered below. But it will be useful to begin by assuming that perfectionist state policies can be effective in achieving their aims.

Critics of perfectionist politics often reject the idea that there are objectively better and worse ways of living. Subjectivism or nihilism about the good often stands behind anti-perfectionist commitments. But the most influential recent philosophical criticisms of perfectionist politics do not stem from this quarter. Sophisticated critics of perfectionism grant, if only for the sake of argument, the claims of perfectionist value theory. They then seek to show that perfectionist state policies, even if informed by a sound understanding of the good, nonetheless would be illegitimate. The character of perfectionist politics is best appreciated by considering these arguments and their limitations.

3.1 The Doctrine of State Neutrality

Many contemporary writers on politics reject perfectionism and hold that the state should be neutral between rival understandings of the good life (Dworkin 1978; Ackerman 1980; Larmore 1987; Rawls 1993). The doctrine of state neutrality, as it can be called, articulates a principled constraint on permissible or legitimate state action. The constraint can, and has been, formulated in different ways.[6] Three formulations of the constraint have attracted support of late, and can be mentioned briefly here.[7]

(1) The state should not promote the good, either coercively or non-coercively, unless those who are subject to the state's authority consent to its doing so.

(2) The state should not aim to promote the good unless there is a societal consensus in support of its doing so.

(3) The state should not justify what it does by appealing to conceptions of the good that are subject to reasonable disagreement.

As these formulations bring out, the idea of state neutrality has been understood broadly in recent political philosophy.[8] A natural interpretation of the doctrine would allow the state to promote the good, so long as it did so in an even-handed manner. But most proponents of state neutrality wish to keep the state out of the business of promoting the good altogether, at least if the good to be promoted is controversial or subject to reasonable disagreement.

A perfectionist approach to politics rejects the doctrine of state neutrality on all these formulations. For perfectionists, there is no general principle in political morality that forbids the state from directly promoting the good, even when the good is subject to reasonable disagreement. It will be helpful to spell out in a little more detail the implications of this rejection of state neutrality.

The first formulation presented above follows from a consent-based account of political legitimacy. Perfectionist political theory rejects consent theory and so rejects this formulation of the neutrality constraint. The second formulation appeals to societal consensus, rather than actual consent. It holds that in large pluralistic societies, the state should not aim to promote the good, since what is considered good often will be subject to controversy. This formulation of the constraint is not extensionally equivalent to the first one, since there can be a societal consensus that an institution or practice is good and ought to be supported by the state even when there is not universal agreement on the matter.

The second formulation targets the aims of state officials. These aims are not always open to view, and state officials may have a variety of motives in mind when they make political decisions. For this reason, some have thought that it is more promising to apply the neutrality constraint not to the aims of state officials, but rather to the justifications they give in public for the decisions they make. This yields the third formulation of the neutrality constraint. Defenders of state neutrality often defend the doctrine by appealing to the ideal of public reason. Public reasons, they argue, must be shareable in a way that excludes appeal to controversial ideals of the good. State neutrality and public justification in politics thus emerge as different sides of the same coin.

The second and third formulations of the neutrality constraint figure in recent influential versions of social contract theory, most notably that of Rawls and his followers (Nagel 1991; Rawls 1993; Barry 1995). These views represent the chief contemporary rival to perfectionist political theory. In developing an account of political morality, these modern day contractualists instruct us to bracket our full understanding of the human good. Only by so doing, is it possible to present an account of political morality that has a hope of securing the allegiance of citizens who hold very different conceptions of the good.

The plausibility of the doctrine of state neutrality remains very much in dispute in contemporary political philosophy. Proponents of the doctrine maintain that state neutrality is necessary if the state is to respect persons who hold reasonable, but conflicting, conceptions of the good life. They also hold that state neutrality is vital to ensuring stable and mutually beneficial social cooperation in modern democratic societies. Those sympathetic to perfectionist politics counter: (1) That support for valuable forms of life requires political action and that strict adherence to the doctrine of state neutrality “would undermine the chances of survival of many cherished aspects of our culture” (Raz 1986, 162); (2) That it is possible to reject state neutrality and embrace value pluralism and hold that there are a plurality of good, but incompatible, forms of life fully worthy of respect (Raz 1986); (3) That proponents of state neutrality overvalue the goods associated with agreement and undervalue other goods (Wall 1998); and (4) That state neutrality is not necessary for stable social cooperation and for preventing the abuse of state power (Sher 1997).

3.2 The Harm Principle

Those who reject the doctrine of state neutrality entrust the state with the task of promoting the good. This can give rise to the worry that a perfectionist account of politics is insufficiently sensitive to the harm of coercion and to the value of liberty. If the state need not be neutral between rival understandings of the good, then is the door not open for the coercive imposition of state policies designed to promote the good? In fact, many versions of perfectionism drawn from the history of political thought have paid little heed to the value of individual liberty. It is an important matter, then, to what extent perfectionist politics can be reconciled with a proper regard for individual liberty.

To approach this issue, it will be helpful to consider the so called harm principle. The harm principle, as articulated by writers in the liberal political tradition from Mill to Feinberg, is often taken to be an essential safeguard for individual freedom in political society. At least at first blush, the harm principle substantially restricts the power of governments to promote the good. It holds that governments cannot coercively interfere with persons unless doing so is necessary to prevent them from causing clear and direct harm to others. The harm principle requires interpretation and can be understood in different ways. But for present purposes our question is whether the harm principle is best understood to be an anti-perfectionist principle — a principle that provides reasons for rejecting or limiting perfectionist politics.

The first thing to say is that not all perfectionist policies are coercive. Governments can and do promote the good noncoercively. A government may promote the good, for example, when it intelligently subsidizes art. This perfectionist policy need involve no coercive interference whatsoever.[9] So the harm principle, even if sound, would not bar all perfectionist policies. It would rule out only coercive governmental policies designed to favor some options and discourage others. The question then is whether this restriction is itself anti-perfectionist.

Here we need to proceed with caution. The extent to which perfectionism licenses the coercive promotion of the good depends, among other things, on the degree to which autonomy or liberty is itself recognized to be a perfectionist good. On some versions of perfectionism the harm principle would be an anti-perfectionist principle, while on others it would not be. Consider, in this regard, Mill's own defense of the harm principle. For Mill “individuality” is an essential component of a good human life. Mill's notion of individuality can be understood to be a conception of autonomy. A person is autonomous for Mill if he leads his life on his own terms and develops his capacities and faculties according to “his own mode of laying out his existence” (Mill 1859, 64). The important point for present purposes is not Mill's particular characterization of autonomy, but rather the structure of his view. Autonomy is understood to be an essential aspect of a good human life, not a separate ideal. And the value of autonomy explains, at least in part, why Mill recommends the harm principle.

The Millian defense of the harm principle sits well with the perfectionist focus on good human lives. Its availability nicely illustrates how perfectionist politics can be consistent with a strong rejection of state coercion. But it is natural to suspect that Mill overstates his case. Even granting that “individuality” is an aspect of a good human life, we should wonder why it takes priority over all other aspects. If a governmental policy, say a policy that criminalizes the sell and use of dangerous recreational drugs, would prevent many from ruining their lives while infringing the individuality of only a few, then, contrary to Mill, the government may do better in discharging its duty to promote good human lives by adopting the policy than by not adopting it.

This point can be pushed further. Autonomy, it can be argued, requires that one have access to an adequate range of valuable or worthwhile options (Raz 1986). This adequacy requirement does not imply that every time an option is closed off one's autonomy will be set back. Moreover, what may be of value is not autonomous agency per se, but valuable autonomous agency. Joseph Raz explains: “Since our concern for autonomy is a concern to enable people to have a good life it furnishes us with reason to secure that autonomy which could be valuable. Providing, preserving or protecting bad options does not enable one to enjoy valuable autonomy” (Raz 1986, 412). If valuable autonomy, and not autonomy per se, is what has perfectionist value, then when governments eliminate, or make it more costly for persons to pursue, worthless options, then they may do no perfectionist harm and much perfectionist good.

On Raz's view, the harm principle is superceded by an autonomy principle that captures the truth in it while avoiding its exaggerations. The autonomy principle holds that the state has negative duties to respect the autonomy of its citizens as well as positive duties to promote and sustain social conditions that contribute to its realization. The harm principle, to the extent that it is sound, is vindicated because it follows, given certain contingent facts, from the autonomy principle. This leads Raz to reformulate the harm principle as a principle “that regards the prevention of harm to anyone (himself included) as the only justifiable ground for coercive interference with a person” (Raz 1986, 412-13). So construed, the harm principle would permit the coercive enforcement of at least some self-regarding duties.

Both Mill and Raz accept versions of the harm principle. But they accept it not as a limit on perfectionist politics, but rather as a principle that guides the proper promotion of the good. Their political theories are examples of perfectionist liberalism and their discussions of the harm principle show how perfectionist politics can be supportive of individual liberty. It can be objected, however, that the defense of individual liberty provided by perfectionist liberalism is insufficient. Recall that on the perfectionist view discussed here autonomy is an aspect of a good human life. It is not a separate ideal. A strong and uncompromising defense of the harm principle, it may be thought, must be based on a different understanding of the value of autonomy, one that holds that the autonomy of persons cannot be infringed even when doing so is, all things considered, in their best interests. Autonomy, on this view, is a right, not an ideal to be promoted (Feinberg 1989). The nature and plausibility of this alternative view of autonomy, however, are not matters that can be taken up here.

3.3 Indirect Arguments

Both the doctrine of state neutrality and the harm principle impose moral limits on the power of governments to promote the good or the means by which they can use to promote the good. But sometimes it is claimed not that perfectionist politics are in principle illegitimate, but rather that they are or would be self-defeating. The best way for the state to promote the good, it is sometimes claimed, is for it to refrain scrupulously from all direct efforts at promoting the good (Kymlicka 1990, 199-205). An indirect argument against perfectionist politics thus grants that it is permissible for the state to promote good human lives, but seeks to shows that efforts by the state to do so will fail. Indirect arguments of this kind take different forms. Some arguments appeal to the nature of the human good, while others point to the incompetence of modern governments.

The most influential argument that appeals to the nature of the human good holds that for an activity or relationship to improve a person's life he or she must endorse its value. This argument, which is often referred to as the endorsement constraint, holds that political measures that compel or manipulate people into activities or pursuits that they do not value will be counterproductive. These measures will not improve the lives of anyone; and they may do harm by directing people away from activities and pursuits that would add value to their lives.

The endorsement constraint is based on a simple idea. To add value to a human life, an activity or relationship must be affirmed from the inside. “No life goes better by being led from the outside according to values the person does not endorse” (Kymlicka 1990, 203). Questions can be raised about what constitutes endorsement of an activity. For example, does endorsement require a positive affirmation of the value of an activity or does it merely require that one not be alienated from it? Different versions of the endorsement constraint can be distinguished depending on how the motive that is taken to condition the value of activities is characterized. And different versions of the endorsement constraint will have different implications for state policies. Suppose, for example, that many citizens have no opinion whatsoever on the value of art and that they are induced to attend art museums because their government gives them a tax break for doing so. Here they do not endorse the activity in the strong sense of positively affirming its value. Nevertheless, the government policy of giving tax breaks to citizens who attend art museums may do some good if endorsement does not require positive affirmation. If the citizens are not alienated from the activity, then they may derive value from it.

The endorsement constraint looks particularly compelling when certain examples are considered. To take one such example: it is widely thought that for religious worship to add value to a life it must be true that the person actually sees the value of religious worship from “the inside.” Critics of the endorsement constraint contend that the argument overgeneralizes from these plausible examples (Wall 1998). Critics also contend that the endorsement constraint has real force when directed at state efforts to compel people to pursue particular activities, but much less force when directed at state efforts to discourage, or forbid, certain worthless activities (Hurka 1995, 47-48). For example, if the state criminalizes prostitution, then it need not compel anyone to pursue an activity that he or she judges to be of no value. Closing off a worthless option can leave many worthwhile options open for people to pursue according to their own judgments about the value of these options.

The endorsement constraint can be bolstered so that it speaks against state efforts to screen off bad options, even when these efforts leave citizens free to pursue valuable options according to their own judgments. The endorsement constraint, it is sometimes claimed, is necessary to ensure that people lead lives of ethical integrity. To lead a life of ethical integrity one must respond well to the challenge one's life presents one with. And such a challenge, or so it may be argued, cannot be made better when “it has been narrowed, simplified, and bowdlerized by others in advance.” (Dworkin 1995, 271)

This defense of the endorsement constraint grounds it in a background conception of a good human life, one that holds that the goodness of a human life lies in “the inherent value of a skilled performance of living” (Dworkin 1995, 244). This background conception of a good human life (a conception Ronald Dworkin refers to as “the challenge model”) has been subject to telling criticism (Arneson 2003); but its availability nicely illustrates how an ethical concern for promoting good human lives can ground resistance to perfectionist state policies designed to promote such lives.

Rather than appealing to a background conception of a good human life, indirect arguments more frequently appeal to more mundane facts about the competence of modern governments. For a variety of reasons, it is often thought that modern governments simply are not up to the task of promoting the good. It will be helpful to distinguish local from global versions of this objection. It might be true that a particular state should not directly promote the good. Those in power in this state might hold false beliefs about the good, for example. In addition, it might be true that states in general should not directly promote certain objective goods. Friendship is a good that plausibly contributes to the objective value of human lives, but if states try to promote it directly they may do more harm than good. These are both instances of local worries about perfectionist politics.

The global objection generalizes from either or both of these worries. It holds either that all states lack the competence to promote the good or that all (or perhaps most) goods are such that it would be counterproductive for the state directly to promote them. Local worries about the effectiveness of perfectionist politics present no deep problem for perfectionist political theory. No serious writer on politics does not share them to some extent. Global distrust of perfectionist politics, however, may seem to present a genuine objection. If global distrust of the competence of modern governments to promote the good were warranted, then the best policy for states to adopt might be state neutrality. For consequentialist reasons, a perfectionist approach to politics could recommend that the state never aim to promote the good.

The global objection rests on very strong claims. Perfectionists can reply that those who advance them exaggerate valid worries about the potential for states to abuse their power. In addition, they can argue that the global objection threatens more than perfectionist politics. If states cannot competently promote the good, then, for the same reasons, they may not be able to enforce justice competently either (Caney 1991). Finally, perfectionists can argue that institutional safeguards, such as legally codified rights, can be effective in preventing the abuse of state power, including state power that promotes perfectionist goods (Sher 1997).

Be this as it may, it is important not to confuse means with ends. The end of perfectionist politics is the protection and promotion of objectively valuable human lives. The question of where and how often the state should rely on indirect, rather than direct, measures to promote the good is a question within perfectionist political theory.[10] Though nothing of much importance turns on it, one could categorize a view that holds that perfectionist political ends are, for contingent reasons, always best pursued indirectly as a genuine instance of perfectionism. Indeed, one can imagine a view that holds that perfectionist political ends will be best achieved if no state official accepts the perfectionist approach to politics. This would be an extreme limiting case — a self-effacing perfectionism, but (perhaps) a perfectionist theory of politics nonetheless.

4. Conclusion

Perfectionism has a distinguished pedigree in the history of ideas, but like many theories in moral and political philosophy it remains very much a work in progress. The topics discussed in this entry — perfectionist value theory, perfectionist ethics and perfectionism as an approach to politics — are subject to on-going controversy and development. Moreover, these topics, while complementary, remain independent of one another. It is possible, for example, to affirm perfectionist ethics and reject perfectionism as an approach to politics. Likewise, it is possible to accept a perfectionist account of a good human life and reject perfectionist ethics.


References Cited

Other Works

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotle | autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | consequentialism | doing vs. allowing harm | egalitarianism | liberalism | Nietzsche, Friedrich: moral and political philosophy | value: pluralism | well-being


The author thanks David Sobel for commenting on an earlier draft and for many helpful conversations on the topics discussed in this entry.