Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Oct 4, 2006

The notion of preference has a central role in many disciplines, including moral philosophy and decision theory. Preferences and their logical properties also have a central role in rational choice theory, a subject that in its turn permeates modern economics, as well as other branches of formalized social science. The notion of preference and the way it is analysed vary between these disciplines. A treatment is still lacking that takes into account the needs of all usages and tries to combine them in a unified approach. This entry surveys the most important philosophical uses of the preference concept and investigates their compatibilities and conflicts.

1. Preference logic

Although not all philosophical references to preference make use of formal tools, preferences are almost always assumed to have structural properties of a type that is best described in a formalized language. The logic of preference is therefore a suitable starting point of this entry. The study of the structural properties of preferences can be traced back to Book III of Aristotle's Topics. Since the early twentieth century several philosophers have studied the structure of preferences with logical tools. In 1957 and in 1963, respectively, Sören Halldén and Georg Henrik von Wright proposed the first complete systems of preference logic (Halldén 1957, von Wright 1963). The subject also has important roots in utility theory and in the theory of games and decisions. The preferences studied in preference logic are usually the preferences of rational individuals, but preference logic is also used in psychological research where the emphasis is on actual preferences as revealed in behaviour.

1.1 Concepts and notation

There are two fundamental comparative value concepts, namely “better” (strict preference) and “equal in value to” (indifference) (Halldén 1957, 10). The relations of preference and indifference between alternatives are usually denoted by the symbols ≻ and ∼ or alternatively by P and I. In accordance with a long-standing philosophical tradition, AB is taken to represent “B is worse than A”, as well as “A is better than B”.

The objects of preference are represented by the relata of the preference relation (A and B in AB). In order to make the formal structure determinate enough, every preference relation is assumed to range over a specified set of relata. In most applications, the relata are assumed to be mutually exclusive, i.e. none of them is compatible with, or included in, any of the others. Preferences over a set of mutually exclusive relata are referred to as exclusionary preferences. When the set of relata are mutually exclusive, it is customary to call them an alternative set, or set of alternatives A.

In philosophy, alternatives are commonly taken to be states of the world. They are represented as sentences or propositions. In contrast to this, economics commonly conceives of alternatives as bundles of goods. They are represented as vectors, where each position in the vector represents a specific good, and the scalar at that position denotes the number of units of that good. For convenience, economists often operate in two-goods worlds, where one good—the numeraire—stands for all the other goods (money is the most common numeraire). The countability of such bundles allows formulating two important preference properties. Preferences are monotone if larger bundles are always preferred to smaller bundles of the same goods, i.e. if A=⟨a1,…,an⟩ is preference ranked and there is a bundle B=⟨b1,…,bn⟩ such that for at least one i: ai>bi and for all other j: ajbj, then AB. Preferences are homothetic if all indifference sets are related by proportional expansions among rays, i.e. if AB, then aAaB for any a0. These properties allow inferring a preference relation over many alternatives on the basis of only a few observations. However, this type of alternative contains a difficult ambiguity. For example, it is not coffee per se that one prefers to tea per se. Consumers may prefer drinking coffee to drinking tea, and merchants may prefer stocking coffee to stocking tea, etc. If preferences are subjective evaluations of the alternatives, then what matters are the results that can be obtained with the help of these goods, not the goods themselves. Whether an agent has a preference e.g. for a batch of wood over a crate of bricks will depend on whether she intends to use it to generate warmth, build a shelter or create a sculpture. Economists have tried to solve this ambiguity by coupling preferences over goods with household production functions (Lancaster 1966, Becker and Michael 1973); but as these components are very difficult to determine, it is often thought more parsimonious to stick with the sentential or propositional representations of states of the world.

The following four properties of the two exclusionary comparative relations are usually taken to be part of the meaning of the concepts of (strict) preference and indifference:

(1) AB → ¬(BA)    (asymmetry of preference)
(2) ABBA    (symmetry of indifference)
(3) AA    (reflexivity of indifference)
(4) AB → ¬(AB)    (incompatibility of preference and indifference)

It follows from (1) that strict preference is irreflexive, i.e. that ¬(AA).

The relation ≽, “at least as good as” (or more precisely: “better than or equal in value to”), can be defined as follows:

ABABAB    (weak preference)

The alternative notation R is sometimes used instead of ≽.

For reasons of convenience, weak preference is usually taken to be the primitive relation of preference logic. Then both (strict) preference and indifference are introduced as derived relations, as follows:

AB if and only if AB and ¬(BA)
AB if and only if AB and BA

≻ is the strict part of ≽ and ∼ its symmetric part.

Two common notational conventions should be mentioned. First, chains of relations can be contracted. Hence, ABC abbreviates ABBC, and ABCD abbreviates ABBCCD. Second, the ancestral symbol * is used to contract repeated uses of the same relation; hence ≻* stands for ≻ repeated any finite non-zero number of times (and similarly for the other relations). Thus A≻*C denotes that either AC or there are B1Bn such that AB1B1B2 ∧ … Bn−1BnBnC.

1.2 Completeness

In most applications of preference logic, it is taken for granted that the following property, called completeness or connectedness, should be satisfied:


or equivalently:


The assumption of completeness is useful in many applications, not least in economics. Bayesian decision theory is a case in point. The Bayesian decision maker is assumed to make her choices in accordance with a complete preference ordering over the available options. However, in many everyday cases, we do not have, and do not need, complete preferences. Consider a person who has to choose between five objects A, B, C, D, and E. If she knows that she prefers A to the others, she does not have to make up her mind about the relative ranking among B, C, D, and E.

There are three major types of preference incompleteness. First, incompleteness may be uniquely resolvable, i.e. resolvable in exactly one way. The most natural reason for this type of incompleteness is lack of knowledge or reflection. Behind what we perceive as an incomplete preference relation there may be a complete preference relation that we can arrive at through observation, logical inference, or some other means of discovery.

Secondly, incompleteness may be multiply resolvable, i.e. possible to resolve in several different ways. In this case it is genuinely undetermined what will be the outcome of extending the relation to cover the previously uncovered cases.

Thirdly, incompleteness may be irresolvable. The most natural reason for this is that the alternatives differ in terms of advantages or disadvantages that we are unable to put on the same footing. A person may be unable to say which she prefers—the death of two specified acquaintances or the death of a specified friend. She may also be unable to say whether she prefers the destruction of the pyramids in Giza or the extinction of the giant panda. In environmental economics, as a third example, it is a controversial issue whether and to what extent environmental damage is comparable to monetary loss.

Two alternatives are called “incomparable” whenever the preference relation is incomplete with respect to them. The term “incommensurable” is usually reserved for cases when the incompleteness is irresolvable. In moral philosophy, irresolvable incompleteness is usually discussed in terms of the related notion of a moral dilemma.

1.3 Transitivity

By far the most discussed logical property of preferences is the following:

ABBCAC    (transitivity of weak preference)

The corresponding properties of the other two relations are defined analogously:

ABBCAC    (transitivity of indifference)
ABBCAC    (transitivity of strict preference)

A weak preference relation ≽ is called quasi-transitive if its strict part ≻ is transitive.

Many other properties have been defined that are related to transitivity. The following three are among the most important of these:

ABBCAC    (IP-transitivity)
ABBCAC    (PI-transitivity)
There is no series A1,…,An of alternatives such that A1 ≻…≻AnA1    (acyclicity)

All of these are weakenings of the transitivity of ≽. In other words, if ≽ satisfies transitivity then ≻  and ∼ are also transitive, and furthermore, IP-transitivity, PI-transitivity and acyclicity hold.

Furthermore, if ≽ is transitive, then no cycles containing ≻ are possible, i.e. there are no A and B such that A≽*BA. Preferences with such a ≻-containing cycle are called cyclic preferences.

Transitivity is a controversial property, and many examples have been offered to show that it does not hold in general. A classic type of counterexample to transitivity is the so-called Sorites Paradox. It employs a series of objects that are so arranged that we cannot distinguish between two adjacent members of the series, whereas we can distinguish between members at greater distance (Armstrong 1939, Armstrong 1948, Luce 1956). Consider 1000 cups of coffee, numbered C0, C1, C2, … up to C999. Cup C0 contains no sugar, cup C1 one grain of sugar, cup C2 two grains etc. Since one cannot taste the difference between C999 and C998, they are equally good (of equal value), C999C998. For the same reason, we have C998C997, etc. all the way up to C1C0, but clearly C0C999. This contradicts transitivity of indifference, and therefore also transitivity of weak preference.

In another famous example by Warren S. Quinn, a medical device has been implanted into the body of a person (the self-torturer). The device has 1001 settings, from 0 (off) to 1000. Each increase leads to a negligible increase in pain. Each week, the self-torturer “has only two options—to stay put or to advance the dial one setting. But he may advance only one step each week, and he may never retreat. At each advance he gets $10,000.” In this way he may “eventually reach settings that will be so painful that he would then gladly relinquish his fortune and return to 0” (Quinn 1990, 79).

In an important type of counterexample to transitivity of strict preference, different properties of the alternatives dominate in different pairwise comparisons. Consider an agent choosing between three boxes of Christmas ornaments (Schumm 1987). Each box contains three balls, coloured red, blue and green, respectively; they are represented by the vectors ⟨R1,G1,B1⟩, ⟨R2,G2,B2⟩, and ⟨R3,G3,B3⟩. The agent strictly prefers box 1 to box 2, since they contain (to her) equally attractive blue and green balls, but the red ball of box 1 is more attractive than that of box 2. She prefers box 2 to box 3, since they are equal but for the green ball of box 2, which is more attractive than that of box 3. And finally, she prefers box 3 to box 1, since they are equal but for the blue ball of box 3, which is more attractive than that of box 1. Thus,

B1B2B3B1; and

The described situation yields a preference cycle, which contradicts transitivity of strict preference. (Notice the structural similarity to Condorcet's Paradox, discussed in section 7.2.)

These and similar examples can be used to show that actual human beings may have cyclic preferences. It does not necessarily follow, however, that the same applies to the idealized rational agents of preference logic. Perhaps such patterns are due to irrationality or to factors, such as lack of knowledge or discrimination, that prevent actual humans from being rational. There is a strong tradition, not least in economic applications, to regard full ≽-transitivity as a necessary prerequisite of rationality.

The most famous argument in favour of preference transitivity is the money pump argument. The basic idea was developed by F.P. Ramsey (1928a, 182), who pointed out that if a subject's behaviour violated axioms of probability and preference, then “[h]e could have a book made against him by a cunning better and would then stand to lose in any event”. The argument is developed in more detail in Davidson et al. (1955).

The following example can be used to show how the argument works in a non-probabilistic context (Hansson 1993): A certain stamp-collector has cyclic preferences with respect to three stamps, denoted A, B, and C. She prefers A to B, B to C, and C to A. Following Ramsey, we may assume that there is an amount of money, say 10 cents, that she is prepared to pay for exchanging B for A, C for B, or A for C. She comes into a stamp shop with stamp A. The stamp-dealer offers her to trade in A for C, if she pays 10 cents. She accepts the deal.

For a precise notation, let ⟨X,V⟩ denote that the collector owns stamp X and has paid V cents to the dealer. She has now moved from the state ⟨A,0⟩ to the state ⟨C,10⟩.

Next, the stamp-dealer takes out stamp B from a drawer, and offers her to swap C for B, against another payment of 10 cents. She accepts, thus moving from the state ⟨C,10⟩ to ⟨B,20⟩. The shop-owner can go on like this forever. What causes the trouble is the following sequence of preferences:

C,10⟩ ≻ ⟨A,0⟩
B,20⟩ ≻ ⟨C,10⟩
A,30⟩ ≻ ⟨B,20⟩
C,40⟩ ≻ ⟨A,30⟩
B,50⟩ ≻ ⟨C,40⟩
A,60⟩ ≻ ⟨B,50⟩

The money-pump argument relies on a particular way to combine preferences in two dimensions, which is only possible if two crucial assumptions are satisfied: (1) The primary alternatives (the stamps) can be combined with some other commodity (money) to form composite alternatives. (2) For each preferred change of primary alternatives, there is some non-zero loss of the auxiliary commodity (money) that is worth that change. The money-pump can be used to extract money from a subject with cyclic preferences only if these two conditions are satisfied.

A critic can argue that the construction of preferences for the combined alternative set {⟨A,0⟩, ⟨C,10⟩, ⟨B,20⟩, ⟨A,30⟩, ⟨C,40⟩, ⟨B,50⟩…} out of preferences over the primary alternative set ({A,B,C}) should not be performed in the straightforward simple way that was indicated in the examples. Therefore, although widely used, money-pumps are not philosophically uncontroversial.

Another argument for the normative appropriateness of preference transitivity suggests that transitivity is constitutive of the meaning of preference. Drawing an analogy to length measurement, Davidson (1976, 273) asks: “If length is not transitive, what does it mean to use a number to measure length at all? We could find or invent an answer, but unless or until we do, we must strive to interpret ‘longer than’ so that it comes out transitive. Similarly for ‘preferred to’”. Violating transitivity, Davidson claims, thus undermines the very meaning of preferring on option over others. A critic, however, can point out possible connections between intransitive preferences and choice (see section 3). Although these are very basic connections that may not capture the full meaning of choosing according to one's preferences, their mere existence challenges Davidson's argument.

Yet another argument rests on the importance of preferences for choice. When agents choose at once from all the elements of an alternative set, then preferences should be choice guiding. They should have such a structure that they can be used to guide our choice among the elements of that set. But when choosing e.g. from {A,B,C}, a preference relation ≻ such that ABCA does not guide choice at all: any or none of the alternatives should be chosen according to ≻ (This will be discussed in more depth in section 3.2). The transitivity of preference, it is therefore suggested, is a necessary condition for a meaningful connection between preferences and choice. A critic, however, can point out that preferences are important even when they cannot guide choices. Take e.g. preferences over lottery outcomes: these are real preferences, regardless of the fact that one cannot choose between lottery outcomes. Further, the necessary criteria for choice guidance are much weaker than weak transitivity (Hansson 2001, 23-25; compare also versions of decision theory in which transitivity fails, e.g. Fishburn 1991). Last, the indifference relation does not satisfy choice guidance either. That does not make it irrational to be indifferent between alternatives. Thus choice guidance can be an argument for the normative appropriateness of transitivity only under certain restrictions, if at all. (For further discussion, see Anand 1993).

1.4 Order typology

Two more properties of preference relations need to be specified. A relation is antisymmetric if

ABBAA=B    (antisymmetry of preference)

A relation is weakly connected if

For all AB, ABBA

The categories summarized in the table below (based on Sen 1970a) are standardly used to denominate preference relations that satisfy certain logical properties.

Properties Name(s)
1. reflexive, transitive Preorder, Quasi-order
2. reflexive, transitive, anti-symmetric Partial order
3. irreflexive, transitive Strict partial order
4. reflexive, transitive, complete Total preorder, Complete quasi-ordering, Weak ordering
5. reflexive, transitive, complete, anti-symmetric Chain, Linear ordering, Complete ordering
6. asymmetric, transitive, weakly connected Strict total order, Strong ordering

1.5 Combinative preferences

Sections 1.1-1.3 were devoted to exclusionary preferences, i.e. preferences that refer to a set of mutually exclusive alternatives. In practice, people also have preferences between relata that are not mutually exclusive. These are called combinative preferences.

Relata of combinative preferences typically are not specified enough to be mutually exclusive. To say that one prefers having a dog over having a cat does neglect the possibility that one may have both at the same time. Depending on how one interprets it, the preference expression may say very different things. It may mean that one prefers a dog (and no cat) to a cat (and no dog). Or, if one already has a cat, it may mean that one prefers a dog and a cat to just having a cat. Or, if one already has a dog, it may mean that one prefers just a dog to having a cat and a dog. Insofar as each of these relata may contain a number of possible worlds, logicians and decision theorists commonly take combinative preferences to have states of affairs as their relata. These are represented by sentences in sentential logic. It is usually assumed that logically equivalent expressions can be substituted for each other. The bundle-of-goods notion from economics can be equally applied, although most economists implicitly assume these bundles to be mutually exclusive. Last, combinative preferences can be defined over properties of objects. This will be discussed in section 4.1.

Properties such as completeness, transitivity and acyclicity can be transferred from exclusionary to combinative preferences. In addition, there are interesting logical properties that can be expressed with combinative preferences but not with exclusionary preferences. The following are some examples of these (some of which are controversial):

pqp≽(pq)≽q    (disjunctive interpolation)
pq → ¬q≽¬p    (contraposition of weak preference)
pq → ¬q∼¬p    (contraposition of indifference)
pq → ¬q≻ ¬p    (contraposition of strict preference)
pq ↔ (p∧¬q)≽(q∧¬p)    (conjunctive expansion of weak preference)
pq ↔ (p∧¬q)≻(q∧¬p)    (conjunctive expansion of strict preference)
pq ↔ (p∧¬q)∼(q∧¬p)    (conjunctive expansion of indifference)
(pq)≽rprqr    (left disjunctive distribution of ≽)
p≽(qr) ↔ pqpr    (right disjunctive distribution of ≽)

A common approach to combinative preferences is to derive them from exclusionary preferences, which are then taken to be more basic. In most variants of this approach, the underlying alternatives (to which the exclusionary preferences refer) have been possible worlds, represented by maximal consistent subsets of the language (Rescher 1967, von Wright 1972, Hansson 1996a). Possible world modelling has the advantages of generality and logical beauty, but it also has the disadvantage of cognitive unrealism. In practice, we are not capable of deliberating on anything approaching the size of completely determinate possible worlds. Instead, we restrict our deliberations to objects of manageable size. It can therefore be argued that a more realistic approach should be based on smaller alternatives that cover all the aspects under consideration—but not all the aspects that might have been considered. This approach may be seen as an application of Simon's “bounded rationality view” (Simon 1957, 196-200, Hansson 1996b).

The derivation of combinative preferences from exclusionary preferences can be produced with a representation function. By this is meant a function f that takes us from a pair ⟨p,q⟩ of sentences to a set f(⟨p,q⟩) of pairs of alternatives (perhaps possible worlds). Then pfq holds if and only if AB for all ⟨A,B⟩ ∈ f(⟨p,q⟩) (Hansson 2001, 70-73).

1.6 Preference-based monadic value predicates

In addition to the comparative notions, “better” and “of equal value”, informal discourse on values contains monadic (one-place) value predicates, such as “good”, “best”, “very bad”, “fairly good”, etc. Predicates representing these notions can be inserted into a formal structure that contains a preference relation. Most of the monadic predicates in common use belong to two major categories, the positive and negative predicates (Hansson 1990). A predicate H is ≽-positive if and only if it satisfies the property:

(Hpqp) → Hq

It is ≽-negative if and only if it satisfies the property:

(Hppq) → Hq

It can straightforwardly be shown that a monadic predicate H satisfies ≽-positivity if and only if its negation ¬H satisfies ≽-negativity.

Two major attempts have been made to define the principal monadic predicates “good” and “bad” in terms of the preference relation. One of these defines “good” as “better than its negation” and “bad” as “worse than its negation” (Brogan 1919).

GN pp≻¬p    (negation-related good)
BN p ↔ ¬pp    (negation-related bad)

The other definition requires that we introduce, prior to “good” and “bad”, a set of neutral propositions. Goodness is predicated of everything that is better than some neutral proposition, and badness of everything that is worse than some neutral proposition. The best-known variant of this approach was proposed by Chisholm and Sosa (1966). According to these authors, a state of affairs is indifferent if and only if it is neither better nor worse than its negation. Furthermore, a state of affairs is good if it and only if is better than some indifferent state of affairs, and bad if and only if some indifferent state of affairs is better than it.

GI p ↔ (∃q)(pq∼¬q)    (indifference-related good)
BI p ↔ (∃q)(¬qqp)    (indifference-related bad)

The negation-related and the indifference-related “good” respectively “bad” do not necessarily coincide. Both definitions have been developed with complete preference relations in mind, but extensions are available that cover the more general cases (Hansson 2001).

2. Preference and value

Preferences can be interpreted as expressions of value. AB then means that more value is assigned to A than to B, and AB that the same value is assigned to the two. Values are usually taken to be adequately expressible in numerical terms. Let u (as in “utility”) be a value function that assigns a real number to each element of the alternative set. We can then construct a model of preference logic in the following way:

AB iff u(A)>u(B)    (Exact value representation)

A preference relation has an exact value representation only if it satisfies both completeness and transitivity. The inverse is generally true only for finite A. If A is infinite, not all complete and transitive preference relations can be represented by a utility function (for a counter-example based on a lexicographic preference relation, see Debreu 1954).[1] It is important to note that the value function used for exact value representation only needs to carry ordinal information: a higher number assigned to A than to B only signifies that A is preferred to B, not how much A is preferred to B. Thus it should be clear that ≻ is represented by any function u′ that is a positive monotone transformation of u. (The only currently accepted way to incorporate cardinal information into a value function is by making value comparisons over lotteries, and using the probabilities of these lotteries—either as objective probabilities or in the form of subjective beliefs—as an interval measure. This procedure falls within the domain of decision theory and will not be discussed any further here.)

An incomplete preference ordering also has a value representation of the following type:

If AB, then u(A)>u(B)

The inverse is obviously not true. However, under fairly wide circumstances, given the set of all utility functions thus defined, one can find the preference relation (Aumann 1962).

As can be seen from the “cups of coffee” example mentioned in section 1.3, the exact value representation of preferences is too demanding for some purposes. If u(A)> u(B), but u(A)-u(B) is so small that it cannot be discerned, then AB cannot be expected to hold. One way to represent this feature is to employ a cardinal utility function and to introduce a fixed limit of indiscernibility, such that AB holds if and only if u(A)−u(B) is larger than that limit. Such a limit is commonly called a just noticeable difference (JND).
AB iff u(A)−u(B)>δ,    (JND representation, δ>0)

If the set of alternatives is finite, then ≽ has a JND representation if and only if ≽ is complete, and satisfies the two properties that for all A,B,C,D: ABBCADDC and ABCDADCB.

Another interesting construction is to assign to each alternative an interval instead of a single number. This requires two real-valued functions, umax and umin, such that for all A, umax(A)≥ umin(A). Here, umax(A) represents the upper limit of the interval assigned to A, and umin(A) its lower limit. AB holds if and only if all elements of the interval assigned to A have higher value than all elements of the B interval:

AB iff umin(A)> umax(B)    (Interval representation)

It has been shown that a preference relation ≽ has an interval representation if and only if it satisfies completeness and the property that for all A,B,C,D: ABCDADCB.

A final generalization is to let the threshold of discrimination depend on both relata.

AB iff u(A)−u(B)>σ(A, B)    (Doubly variable threshold representation, σ(A,B)>0)

If the set of alternatives is finite, then ≽ has a doubly variable threshold representation if and only if it satisfies acyclicity.

3. Preferences and choice

There is a strong tradition, particularly in economics, to equate preference with choice. Preference is considered to be hypothetical choice, and choice to be revealed preference.

3.1 Choice functions and their properties

Given an alternative set A, we can represent (hypothetical) choice as a function C that, for any given subset B of A, delivers those elements of B that a deliberating agent has not ruled out for choice. For brevity's sake we will call them 'chosen elements'. The formal definition of a choice function is as follows:

C is a choice function for A if and only if it is a function such that for all BA: (1) C(B)B, and (2) if B ≠ ∅, then C(B) ≠ ∅.

A large number of rationality properties have been proposed for choice functions. The five most important of these are described here.

If BA then BC(A)C(B)    (Property α, “Chernoff”)

This property states that if some element of subset B of A is chosen from A, then it is also chosen from B. According to property α, removing some of the alternatives that are not chosen does not influence choice. This is a very basic and quite reasonable requirement of choice; however, consider the following example. Erna is invited to an acquaintance's house for dinner. Her choice for dessert is between an apple (which is the last piece of fruit in the fruit basket) (X) and nothing instead (Y). Because Erna is polite, she chooses Y. Had she faced a choice between an apple (X), nothing (Y) and an orange (Z), she would have taken the apple. Thus her choices are:

C({X,Y,Z}) ={X}


C({X,Y}) ={Y},

which violate property α. More generally, property α is reasonably violated when alternatives are preferred for their position in an alternative set, when the set of alternatives itself constitutes important information about the alternative chosen, or when certain alternatives provide the chooser with the freedom to reject them (Sen 1993, 501-503).[2]

The second property states that if X and Y are both chosen from B, a subset of A, then one of them cannot be chosen in A without the other also being chosen.

If BA and X, YC(B), then XC(A) iff YC(A)    (Property β)

Property β is more controversial than property α. As Sen (1970a, 17) points out, property α states that if the world champion in some game is a Pakistani, then he must also be the champion in Pakistan, while property β states that if some Pakistani is a world champion, then all champions of Pakistan must be world champions.

The third property requires that an element X that is chosen from every set in a particular class must also be chosen from their union.

C(B1) ∩ … ∩ C(Bn) ⊆ C(B1 ∪ … ∪ Bn)    (Property γ, Expansion)

As an example of property γ, if the town's best ladies' hairdresser is also the town's best gents' hairdresser, then (s)he is the best hairdresser in town.

In contrast to the above three properties that are mainly found in the social choice literature, the following two properties are standardly employed in economics.

The fourth property is the so-called Weak Axiom of Revealed Preferences (WARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, then there cannot be an alternative set B containing both alternatives for which Y is chosen and X is not.

If X,YA and XC(A), then for all B, if XB, and YC(B), then XC(B)    (WARP)

WARP is equivalent to the combination of properties α and β (Sen 1971, 50). Thus it also suffers from their problems, in particular the problems of property β. Consider an agent who chooses to stay at a friend's house for a cup of tea (T) rather than to go home (H), but who leaves in a hurry when the friend offers a choice between tea and cocaine (C) at his next visit. Thus the visitor chose C({T,H}) ={T}, and C({T,H,C}) ={H}, and hence violates β and WARP.

The fifth and strongest of the properties of a choice function is the so-called strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). In essence, SARP is a recursive closure of WARP.[3]

X1,X2, …, XnA1,
X2, …, XnA2,
XnAn, and
X1C(A1), X2C(A2), …, XnC(An),


for all B with X1,X2,…,XnB, if XiC(B), i∈{1,…,n},
then X1,X2,…,Xi−1C(B)    (SARP)

Simplified, SARP says that if from a set of alternatives A1, X is chosen while Y is available, and if in some other set of alternatives A2, Y is chosen while Z is available, then there can be no set of alternatives containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. (SARP says this for chains of unlimited length). SARP is much stronger than α, β and γ combined. However, for choice functions that specify choices over all subsets of the alternative set with at most three elements, SARP is equivalent to WARP and hence to properties α and β (Sen 1971, 50).

3.2 Constructing choice from preference

A choice function that is defined on the basis of a preference relation is called relational (also binary). The most obvious way to construct a choice function from a preference relation ≽ is to have the function always choose the elements that are best according to ≽:

CB(B) = {XB | ∀YB: (XY)}    (The best choice connection)

CB is a choice function (i.e. satisfies the defining criteria for a choice function given in section 3.1) if and only if ≽ is complete and acyclical. Such a choice function satisfies properties α and γ. Furthermore, CB satisfies property β if and only if ≽ is transitive and complete (Sen 1970a, 19).

When the underlying preference relation is incomplete, there may not be an element that is preferred to all other elements. A function C constructed according to the best choice connection will then be empty, and hence not a choice function. To avoid this, an alternative connection constructs the choice function as choosing those elements that are not dispreferred to any other elements of the set:

CL(B) = {XB | ∀YB: ¬(YX)}    (The non-dominance choice connection)

CL is a choice function if and only if ≽ is acyclical. Such a choice function satisfies properties α and γ. Furthermore, CL satisfies property β if and only if ≽ is transitive and complete (Herzberger 1973).

When the preference relation over A is cyclical, neither CB nor CL may be a relational choice function for A. In the simplest case, with a cyclical preference ABCA, CB(A,B,C) = CL(A,B,C) = ∅. Schwarz (1972) therefore proposes a third relational choice function, which operates even on the basis of cyclical preferences. He constructs the choice connection in two steps. In the first step, alternatives from A are grouped into sets B so that no alternative outside of the set B is preferred to any alternative in it. Further, these sets are formed so that removing some alternatives from the set would result in that alternative being preferred to an alternative in the set. Let S be the set of these sets. Formally, B is in S iff:

(1) B ∈ ℘(A)
(2) for all X,Y: if XA\B and YB then not XY
(3) for all FB there is a YF such that for some X∈A\F: XY

The choice function is then defined as the union of S:

CO(A) = S    (The optimization choice connection)

CO is a choice function for any asymmetric ≻. With cyclical preference ABCA, CO(A,B,C)={A,B,C}. CO satisfies properties α and γ if and only if ≽ is acyclical. Furthermore, CO satisfies property β if and only if ≽ is transitive and complete.

3.3 Constructing preference from choice

The close connections between preference axioms and choice axioms can also be employed to construct a preference ordering from a choice function that satisfies certain axioms. In economics, the revealed preference approach has been used to define preference in terms of choice. Historically, this approach developed out of the pursuit of behaviouristic foundations for economic theories—i.e. the attempt to eliminate the preference framework altogether. Today, it serves to derive preference orderings from an agent's observed choices, and to test the empirical validity of the preference axioms by testing for the violation of choice axioms (Grüne-Yanoff 2004).

There are many ways to construct preference relations from observed choices. Three prominent ones are introduced here. The first defines an alternative X as “at least as good as” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from some set of alternatives that also contains Y.

XSY iff for some B, XC(B) and YB (1)
XSY iff XSY and not YSX
XSY iff XSY and YSX

If the choice function is defined over all subsets of B, ≽S is complete. ≻S does not necessarily satisfy transitivity of strict preference, transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.

A second construction method defines an alternative X as “at least as good as” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from the binary set that contains Y.

XBY iff XC({X,Y}) (2)
XBY iff XBY and not YBX
XBY iff XBY and YBX

If the choice function is defined over all binary subsets of a set of alternatives, ≽B is complete. However, ≽B does not necessarily satisfy transitivity of strict preference, transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.

A third method defines an alternative X as “strictly preferred to” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from some set of alternatives that also contains Y, but Y is not chosen from that set.

XRY iff for some B, XC(B) and Y∈[B\C(B)] (3)
XRY iff not XRY
XRY iff XRY and YRX

If the choice function is defined over all relevant subsets of the set of alternatives, ≽R is always complete. However, ≻R may violate transitivity of strict preference, and ≽R may violate transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.

In constructing ≽B, if C({X,Y})={X,Y}, then indifference holds, i.e. XBY. However, this is not the only possible interpretation. One can interpret C({X,Y})={X,Y} either as an indifference between X and Y or as incomparability between these two alternatives. Extra information is required to distinguish the two. One possibility of obtaining such extra information is the small improvement argument (Chang 1997, 23-26). When observing an agent choosing C({X,Y}) = {X,Y}, the observer makes the agent repeat the choice, now with an offer of a small independent incentive i attached to one of the alternatives. If the agent chooses C({Xi,Y}) = {Xi}, the observer may conclude that the agent was indifferent between X and Y, and that the addition of i to X shifted the balance to Xi over Y. If the agent however chooses C({Xi,Y}) = {Xi,Y}, then the observer may conclude that X and Y were incomparable for the agent, and that the addition of i to X did not alter X's incomparability to Y. Because the agent's evaluation of i is presupposed, this method is not uncontroversial.

The elicitation of preferences through choices is of particular importance in economics, where prices and choices of large groups of agents are often the only available empirical data. The revealed preference method proceeds in two steps. In the first step, an agent's observed choice of a goods bundle Xi = ⟨x1,…,xn⟩ in combination with the prices Pi = ⟨p1,…,pn⟩ for these goods determine the set of alternatives from which the agent chooses. If the agent chooses Xi = ⟨xi1,…,xin⟩ under prices Pi = ⟨pi1,…,pin⟩, her budget is B = Xi × Pi = ⟨xi1,…,xin⟩ × ⟨pi1,…,pin⟩, assuming that she spends all her resources. Under price regime Pi, she can thus choose between all goods bundles Xj that are affordable under the budget B, i.e. for which Xi × PiXj × Pi. In the second step, preference construction method (1) is applied. If the agent is observed choosing bundle Xi from budget B, then Xi is declared weakly preferred to all Xj affordable under B. The revealed preference connection, in accord with method (1), is then formulated as:

XiCXj if and only if Xi × PiXj × Pi
XCY iff XCY and not YCX
XCY iff XCY and YCX

It may be the case that an agent chooses Xi under prices Pi and Xj under prices Pj, even though Xi × PiXj × Pi and Xj × PjXi × Pj. The revealed preference method then elicits XiCXj and XjCXi, which violates asymmetry of strict preference. To avoid this undesirable conclusion, only those choices are considered that satisfy the Weak Axiom of Revealed Preferences (WARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, then there can be no budget set containing both alternatives for which Y is chosen and X is not (see section 3.1). Thus, asymmetry of ≻C is secured.

As discussed in section 3.1, for situations that specify choices over all subsets (up to three elements) of the alternative set, WARP also ensures that the relation ≽C is transitive. For practical purposes, however, this method is not very helpful, as the space of prices and goods bundles is very large. Social scientists do not have the resources to observe agents' choices from all relevant preference sets. If they want to derive a transitive preference relation from a choice function not defined over all subsets (up to three elements), then they have to restrict themselves to consider only choices that satisfy the strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, and if in some other budget set Y is chosen when Z is available, then there can be no budget set containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. Thus, transitivity of ≽C is ensured.

The above-discussed theoretical effort sees preferences as completely tied to choices. Various caveats concerning this connection are in order. First, it must be pointed out that choices and preferences are in fact entities of quite different categories. Preferences are states of mind whereas choices are actions. The strong behaviourist program, which sought to eliminate the notion of preference by reducing it to choices, is therefore rightly regarded with suspicion today.

Secondly, it is necessary to distinguish between those agents who indeed have preferences as state of minds—e.g. humans, and maybe higher animals—and those agents who do not—e.g. machines, plants or institutions. The former category may choose on the basis of their preferences, and hence the above-discussed effort can aim at eliciting the preferences on which their choices are based. The latter category, despite their lack of states of mind, may nevertheless exhibit behaviour that can be interpreted as relational choice. In those cases, one can only speak of preferences reconstructed from choice, without claiming that these agents actually have preferences at all.

Thirdly, it seems obvious that there are preferences over alternatives that one cannot choose between—for example preferences for winning a certain prize of a lottery, or for particular configurations of Paradise. This contradicts the claim that preferences exclusively transpire from choices. One way to substantiate preferences over alternatives that one cannot choose between is to ask people what they prefer. Their answers can be interpreted as further choice evidence—as verbal or writing behaviour. This interpretation treats their answers on a par with all other forms of behaviour. It thus acknowledges that their answers are possibly influenced by other preferences, e.g. for privacy, status or pretend play, and explains why answers may not be true. Alternatively, their answers can be interpreted as introspective reports. This interpretation treats answers as agents' privileged access to their own minds; and it becomes difficult to explain "false" answers.

Fourthly, some choices are not based on stable preferences over actions, but are constructed from more basic cognitive and evaluative elements. A simple choice—like e.g. choosing between two candies—may be based on a preference for a world in which one eats candy X over a world in which one eats candy Y. But more complex choices—e.g. choosing one's higher education—depends on what one believes these choices to bring about, and how one evaluates the consequences of these choices. In those cases, a more complex framework specifies beliefs about the likelihood of possible states of the world, preferences over the consequences of choices in those worlds, and an aggregation mechanism of these preferences under those beliefs. Often, this framework yields a preference relation over actions much like the simple case. However, alternative frameworks, where this is not the case, have been developed (e.g. Loomes and Sugden 1982).

Last, the introspective concept of preference is closely connected to the notion of welfare. An agent who prefers X to Y is expected to judge herself to be better off with X than with Y. But if preferences are tightly linked to choice, the welfare interpretation is jeopardized. As Sen argues, people choose not only on the basis of their concern for their own welfare, but also on the basis of commitments—e.g. traditions, habits, moral maxims, etc. (Sen 1977). So it seems that preferences can either be interpreted as welfare judgements, or as the basis of choices, but not as both at the same time.

4. Reasons for preferences

Rational choice theory conceives of choices as rational if they are (correctly) derived from a complete and transitive preference ordering over the choice alternatives. But we rarely consider those who justify their choice only by saying “Because I preferred to do this” as giving reasons. Interestingly, the structures that represent common notions of reason often involve preferences themselves, so that a two-level framework emerges: preferences of the reason-giving type give rise to preferences that are the basis of choice. In the following, two notions of reason-giving preferences are discussed.

4.1 Property-preferences

Minimally, the explanation or justification of a choice requires showing that the agent had preferences over the possible consequences or other properties of the alternative actions, as well as a way to connect those preferences over consequences/properties to preferences over choice alternatives. Decision theory, which models preferences over consequences, thus considers reasons for choice and action. But it only considers a shallow notion of reasons, namely preferences over states of affairs or prospects. A deeper notion of reasons, as Pettit (1991) argues, acknowledges that desires, and hence preferences, have two quite different sorts of objects—prospects and properties—and that the preferences we form over different prospects are determined by the properties that we think they have. For example, when I say that I prefer my living room to be painted pink rather than grey I indicate a preference for a specific state of affairs out of a set of fixed alternatives. When I say that I prefer pink to grey, however, I express a preference for a property that may be realised in an indefinite number of states of affairs. The presence of one of these properties will make any prospect more attractive to me; at the limit its realisation in one of a number of alternatives between which I am otherwise indifferent will lead me to prefer that alternative. Decision theory has traditionally not treated this property-dimension of deliberation. By introducing an appropriate connecting principle between prospect and property preferences, one imposes an additional consistency constraint on the rational agent: his prospect preferences must cohere with his preferences over those properties that the prospects realise. Grüne-Yanoff (2006) argues that the connecting principle cannot be a logical connection, but must be based on the causal beliefs of the agent. A preference ordering over prospects and properties is consistent if all prospect preferences cohere with the preferences over those properties that the agent believes to be causally relevant for bringing about the prospect.

4.2 Aspect-preferences

Another way to model reasons within the preference framework is to leave the individuation of alternatives intact, and instead multiply the number of preference orderings over these alternatives for each individual. These represent the individual's partial judgements of the same alternative from different points of view—e.g. moral, political, economic or aesthetic. Let each of these judgements be represented by a complete and transitive preference ordering. Then the evaluation of the alternatives in set A according to all aspects yields a bundle (≽1, ≽2, …, ≽n) of n aspect orderings. To arrive at a single overall evaluation of A, the agent needs to employ a formation rule F, which in itself has nothing to do with choosing between alternatives but with evaluating preferences on a meta-level according to the agent's specific character. Steedman and Krause (1986) discuss different types of formation rules, which map a bundle (≽1, ≽2, …, ≽n) onto a single preference relation. The first formation rule describes a very cautious character, who considers an alternative at least as good as another only if she considers it at least as good in every aspect.

FP (≽1, ≽2, …, ≽n) = i    (Pareto type)

The outcome of FP is transitive, but not complete. The other extreme is a character who considers one alternative at least as good as another if she strictly prefers it even just according to one aspect.

FS (≽1, ≽2, …, ≽n) = i    (Sen type)

The outcome of FS is complete, but not transitive. In between these two extremes, one can define many kinds of counting rules that determine the overall preference for an alternative according to the numbers of aspects in its favour. The outcome of majority rule defined this way will always be complete, but not transitive, while a rule involving a certain threshold will neither be transitive nor complete.

Last, another type of formation rule considers one alternative at least as good as another if it is strictly preferred according to the most relevant aspect, and in case of a tie, according to the next relevant aspect.

For all X,YA: FH (≽1, ≽2, …, ≽n) = XkY, where ≽k is the first in a relevance reordered (≽s1, ≽s2, …, ≽sn) such that XkY does not hold    (Hierarchical type)

The outcome of FH is always a transitive and complete ordering. These are only some examples of possible formation rules.

As will become clear in section 7, all these formation rules are structurally identical to social choice functions. This is not surprising: many philosophers, Plato and Bishop Butler amongst them, have drawn the analogy between intrapersonal conflict and citizens' diverging preferences within a state. This also means, as will be discussed in section 7.4, that there is no formation rule that satisfies four seemingly plausible conditions and that in general yields a transitive and complete overall preference ordering. If those conditions really are applicable to intrapersonal conflict (as Steedman and Krause 1986 argue), then an agent who is rational in the sense that she has reasons for her evaluations (i.e. aspect preferences) may well not be rational in the sense that she has a transitive and complete preference ordering that can be mechanically derived (via a formation rule) from these reasons. Instead, deliberating on the basis of multiple, conflicting reasons often requires creativity: “Reasons do not come with previously assigned weights; the decision process is not one of discovering such precise weights but of assigning them. The process not only weighs reasons, it (also) weights them” (Nozick 1981, 244). This particularly pertains to judgements and deliberations that are important, complex or unfamiliar, such as gambles, jobs, careers, homes, partnerships, or surgical treatments. Instead of reading them off some master list, these preferences have to be constructed by an adaptive decision maker (Payne, Bettman and Johnson 1993).

Such creative and adaptive weighting processes are sensitive to task complexity, time pressure, response mode, framing effects, and other contextual factors. One therefore cannot expect that agents in all cases do come up with a transitive and complete preference ordering. Levi has argued for the importance of cases where “an agent may terminate deliberation and take decisions without having resolved the moral, political, economic and aesthetic conflicts relevant to their predicaments” (Levi 1986, 246). These considerations add to the controversy of the normative justification of transitivity and completeness as rationality requirements. “People do and should act as problem solvers, not maximizers, because they have many different and incommensurable … goals to achieve” (Kranz 1991, 34).

5. Preference criticism

In practical reasoning, it is an important issue whether preferences are rationally criticisable. Preference sets as discussed so far have been portrayed as open to rational criticism only insofar as (i) they have been inconsistent, violating some of the rationally justifiable preference axioms, or (ii) they (in combination with beliefs) commit the agent to inferences that make the resulting preference sets inconsistent.

Can there be rationally justifiable claims that certain intrinsic preferences—i.e. those preferences that are not dependent on other preferences—are wrong, or should be changed? The Humean position answers no. Hume distinguished reason from the passion, and argued “that reason alone can never be a motive to any action of the will;…that it can never oppose passion in the direction of the will” (Treatise Book II, Part III, Section III). Humeans often took this distinction between beliefs and desires not only to imply that beliefs alone cannot motivate action, but also that desires are not open to similar rational criticism as beliefs. Therefore, Humeans conclude, preferences can only be criticised if they are extrinsic—i.e. are instrumentally derived from other preferences on the basis of beliefs—or inconsistent. This is a very minimal position on preference criticism, but it has been questioned regardless. On the one hand, the criticism of extrinsic preferences ultimately turns out to be a criticism of false beliefs, and hence does not count as preference criticism. On the other hand, it has been questioned whether a Humean position can allow even such a preference criticism on the basis of inconsistency (Broome 1993).

Several authors have argued for a more substantial criticism of preferences, including that of intrinsic ones. Some radical approaches deny the duality of mental states and argue that some or all preferences are in fact a kind of belief—and hence are open to the same rational criticism that beliefs are. Two defences have been presented to counter this challenge. First, it has been claimed that that desires (standing for motivation in general) are fundamentally distinct from epistemic states in their direction of fit. Beliefs are directed to fit the world; hence their insufficient fit provides the basis for their criticism. Desires are directed to fit the world to them; hence they lack this basis for criticism (Smith 1987). Second, Humeans have argued that the D(esire)-A(s)-B(elief) thesis is incompatible with Bayesian decision theory and also with other, non-quantitative, decision theories (Lewis 1988, Collins 1991, Byrne/Hajek 1997).

A less radical approach exploits the multitude of relations in which preference stands with other concepts, some of which were discussed in this entry (choice, introspection, welfare, inferential commitments, values). Bringing these perspectives into a compatible whole is a form of criticism (Kusser 1989). However, it was argued earlier that some of these perspectives are incompatible (e.g. preferences as welfare judgements and preferences as reconstructed from choices). It is an open question how the unification attempt can persist in the face of these incompatibilities.

Last, agents may form second-order preferences. An addict may prefer not to prefer smoking; a malevolent person may prefer not to prefer evil actions; an indolent may prefer not to prefer to shun work; a daydreamer may prefer not to prefer what cannot be realised, etc. First-order preferences are criticisable if they do not comply with second-order preferences. (For accounts of second-order preferences, see Frankfurt 1971, Sen 1977.)

Whether preferences are rationally criticisable crucially depends on how a thus criticised agent is capable of modifying her intrinsic preferences in the light of such criticism. To criticise someone for a characteristic that he does not or did not have any influence over—e.g. for being born under a dictatorship—does not merit the label “rational”. Thus it is a crucial question whether preference criticism can in principle lead to its abandonment or change. Brandt (1979, 1998) claims that agents are capable of modifying their preferences by merely reflecting upon relevant beliefs. He gives the example of a rich man who has an aversion to luxury goods that he acquired in his poverty-stricken childhood. Brandt is convinced that “if only he could discriminate, and tell himself firmly, and maybe repeatedly, that his situation in life has changed, he would be able to overcome his disability” (Brandt 1998, 73). Critics have argued that the plausibility of this example rests on an ambiguity about the role of beliefs. If the rich man's aversion to luxury goods rests on the belief that consumption will deplete his resources, and he prefers to stay wealthy, then a correction of this belief will change his aversion to luxury goods. But in this case, the aversion is an extrinsic preference, instrumentally depending on his preference to stay wealthy. The criticism is directed against the belief, and not against the preference at all. If however the rich man's aversion has become a trait of his (it may have been originally formed in the light of his belief that he will have to starve later, but now his preference stands independently of that belief), it is not so clear that any criticism will bring about a change of that preference. The rich man may well say that he knows that he is rich enough to afford any luxury good, and still insist that he has the aversion—and one may not want to call him irrational for that. He may further claim that even if he wanted to, he could not affect his preference with his changed belief. If, on the other hand, he could, that may be considered evidence for the aversion being an extrinsic preference. This puts doubt on the claim that preferences can be manipulated by rational reflection. Rather, it seems that insight into a preference's inappropriateness does not lead to its change—a claim that was commonly accepted amongst Hume's contemporaries: “Neither benevolence nor any other affection or desire can be directly raised by volition” (Hutcheson (1738, 274).

But even if preferences cannot be directly manipulated by volition, insight into the inappropriateness of a preference may motivate engaging in (non-rational) processes or putting oneself in particular circumstances thatfacilitate preference change. Methods of self-restraint, self-command and self-improvement have been extensively described (Schelling 1984, Elster 1989, 2000). Already Hume described the possibility of rationally choosing such expedience (Grüne-Yanoff & McClennen 2006).

Critics have argued against the possibility of rationally choosing such indirect preference-modifying strategies. Millgram (1998) argues that knowledge of the way such desires-at-will were brought about makes it impossible that they actually function as the desires they are intended to be. He gives the example of a car salesman, who, in order to be successful in his work, makes himself prefer the various useless knick-knacks that the brand he represents offers for its cars. When the salesman is laid off, the car-dealer offers him a car with all the useless extras that he made himself prefer. Because he remembers how he acquired these preferences, he chooses not to act on them. So, Millgram argues, the desire-at-will is not the same as a similar, but genuine desire for these car extras. What is missing, he points out, are the backward-directed inferential commitments that genuine preferences bring with them. Only if one forgets that one acquired a specific preference at will, or if one also acquires the inferential commitments of such a preference, can preferring-at-will be successful. These conditions, however, may not be as demanding as Millgram thinks they are. In section 6.4, a model of preference change is discussed that models the necessary consistency adjustments which follow a preference formation. As long as these consistency adjustments are made, Millgram's conditions for desiring-at-will are satisfied. It is plausible that for most cases of self-restraint, self-command and self-improvement, these adjustments will in fact be made. Only in extreme cases such as “desiring at pill”—acquiring a desire by self-administering a preference-altering drug—does his argument therefore apply.

6. Preference change

Preferences have at least three relevant temporal dimensions. Future preferences may differ from present preferences because their relata (or the agent's beliefs about the relata) have changed. They may further differ because the agent's subjective evaluation of the relata has changed. Last, even if future preferences do not differ from present preferences on these two accounts, future preferences may differ because they are formed from another point of view than present preferences are.

Section 6.1 explains why preference change requires explanatory and theoretical treatment.[4] In the following sections, three types of explanatory models are discussed. Time preference models (section 6.2) only refer to the temporal occurrence of a preference. Doxastic change models (section 6.3) investigate how a change of an agent's beliefs leads to a change in her preferences. Valuational change models (section 6.4) investigate how a change in an agent's basic evaluations leads to a change in her preferences.

6.1 Evidence for preference change

Some authors have argued that preference change is only a superficial perception, and that the underlying preferences remain stable over time. But there are at least four arguments to the effect that people's preferences really do change over time. First, many successful explanations of behavioural change have interpreted the empirical behavioural evidence as preference change. These explanations can be differentiated into models of external influences and models of internal coherence. External influence models attempt to establish general links between external events and agents' preference formations. They include, for example, social imitation (Leibenstein 1950), parental influence (Cavalli-Sforza 1973), habit formation (Pollack 1976), or the effect of production patterns on consumption (Duesenberry 1949). Internal coherence models take certain external influences as given, and model the preference change as an accommodation of these external influences. They include, for example, the influence of ethnic values (Borjas 1992), religious convictions (Iannaccone 1990), or the effect of cognitive dissonance on preferences (Elster 1982).

A second argument for preference change is based on the correlations between physiological changes and changes in behaviour. Changes in blood sugar levels, for example, are correlated to feeding behaviour, sexual behaviour varies with hormonal changes, and many behavioural patterns change with increasing age (for references and discussion, see Loewenstein 1996). These correlations are not determinate; each of these behavioural changes can be resisted. Hence it is plausible to incorporate these potential physiological effects as visceral preferences in the general preference framework, and to treat the relevant physiological changes as closely connected with preference changes.

Third, we all have introspective evidence for our own preferences changing over time. The favourite activities of a child are replaced by new pleasures as we grow up. Thus was the experience of Shakespeare's Benedick: “…but doth not the appetite alter? A man loves the meat in his youth that he cannot endure in his age” (Much ado about nothing Act II, Scene III). Even in adult life, we are literally overcome by sudden and very radical changes of preference. Nowhere are these changes more acute than with respect to love, as Bertrand Russell describes at the hand of his own example (Russell 1992, 195). It would be strange to claim that it is only our beliefs about the different types of activities that change. Explanations in terms of preference change are much more in line with how we spontaneously interpret our experiences of such changes.

Last, certain concepts like taste refinement or self-restraint cannot be understood without a notion of real preference change. In particular, self-restraint presupposes that the motivational components of one's self can change, for example, through maturation or social influence; and that one can and should plan one's future self by curbing appetites or by designing the environment in ways that affect one's preferences.

6.2 Time preferences

Models involving time preferences analyze preference change on the basis of the temporal occurrence of the preference alone. Time preferences are thus best specified over a tuple consisting of alternatives A,B and times t1,t2, so that (A,t1)≽(B,t2). The particular character of time preferences consists in their dependence on the time factor. Thus for many A,B: (A,ti) ∼ (B,ti) holds, whereas (A,ti+j) ∼ (B,ti+j) does not hold. Insofar as this temporal factor of evaluations can be separated from time-independent factors of evaluations, one speaks of pure time preferences.

The standard approach to this issue in economic analysis treats preference as based on value. Value is dealt with in a bifactorial model, in which the value of a future good is assumed to be equal to the product of two factors. One of these factors is a time-independent evaluation of the good in question, i.e. the value of obtaining it immediately. The other factor represents the subject's pure time preferences. It is a function of the length of the delay, and is the same for all types of goods. The most common type of time preference function can be written

v(A,ti) = v(A,ti-1) × (1−r)t

where r is a discount rate and t = ti−ti-1 the duration of the delay. This is the discounted utility model, proposed by Samuelson (1937), which still dominates in economic analysis.

There is a wealth of evidence that the discounted utility model does not adequately represent human behaviour. For a simple example, consider a person who prefers one apple today to two apples tomorrow, but yet (today) prefers two apples in 51 days to one apple in 50 days. Although this is a plausible preference pattern, it is incompatible with the discounted utility model. It can however be accounted for in a bifactorial model with a declining discount rate. Pioneered by Ainslie (1992), psychologists and behavioural economists have therefore proposed to replace Samuelson's exponential discounting model with a model of hyperbolic discounting. The hyperbolic model discounts the future consumption with a parameter inversely proportional to the delay of the consumption, and hence covers examples like the above.

Other deviations from the discounted utility model have also been demonstrated. Experimental evidence indicates that we tend to discount gains more than losses, and small amounts more than large amounts. Discount rates also differ between different goods (such as money and health). For some—but only some—types of goods, improving sequences of outcomes are preferred to declining sequences. These are all patterns that cannot be handled in the bifactorial model with its object-independent time preferences (Loewenstein et al 2002). Given the empirical evidence, it is an open question whether the concept of “time preferences” is at all descriptively adequate.

It is a separate question whether pure time preferences are rational. Critics argue that one should want one's life, as a whole, to go as well as possible, and that counting some parts of life more than others interferes with this goal (Pigou, 1920; Ramsey, 1928b; Rawls 1971). According to this view, it is irrational to prefer a smaller immediate good to a greater future good, because now and later are equally parts of one life. Choosing the smaller good or the greater bad makes one's life, as a whole, turn out worse: “Rationality requires an impartial concern for all parts of our life. The mere difference of location in time, of something's being earlier or later, is not a rational ground for having more or less regard for it” (Rawls 1971, 293). Critics of pure temporal preferences often attribute apparent departures from temporal neutrality to a cognitive illusion (which causes people to see future pleasures or pains in some diminished form) or to a weakness of will (which causes people to choose options against their better judgment).

Against the temporal neutrality of preferences, some have argued that there is no enduring, irreducible entity over time to whom all future utility can be ascribed; they deny that all parts of one's future are equally parts of oneself (Parfit 1984). They argue, instead, that a person is a succession of overlapping selves related to varying degrees by memories, physical continuities, and similarities of character and interests, etc. By this view, it may be just as rational to discount one's "own" future preferences, as to discount the preferences of another distinct individual, because the divisions between the stages of one's life may be as “deep” as the distinctions between individuals.

6.3 Doxastic preference change

Two kinds of beliefs are especially important for doxastic models. The first is the belief that a state X is instrumental in bringing about a desired state Y. Take for example the belief that fluoride prevents dental cavities. This can lead a person to prefer fluoride toothpaste to others. If she comes to disbelieve this connection, she may well abandon this preference. More generally, if XY is preferred to X∧¬Y, then a rise of the probability that Y given X will result in a rise in the desirability of X, and vice versa.

The second kind of belief relevant for doxastic preference change concerns prospects that influence the preference for other prospects without being probabilistically related. For example, one's preference for winning a trip to Florida in the lottery will crucially depend on one's belief about the weather there during the specified travel time, even though these two prospects are probabilistically unrelated. More generally, if XY is preferred to X∧¬Y, with X and Y probabilistically not correlated, then a rise of the probability that X will result in a rise in the desirability of Y (even if it does not affect the probability of Y), and vice versa.

Jeffrey (1977) provides a simple model of preference change as the consequence of an agent coming to believe a proposition A to be true. His model incorporates both kinds of belief relevant for doxastic preference change. It is based on the notion of conditional preferences. Jeffrey treats preferences as a relation over propositions, viz. sets of possible worlds. They are represented by a utility function U (see section 2), such that:

XY iff U(X) ≥ U(Y)

U(X) in turn is defined as the weighted average of the utility u of all the possible worlds w in which X is true:

U(X) = [1/P(X)] ∑wX [u(w) × P(w|X)]

where P is the probability weight (Jeffrey's original notation here is adapted to the discrete case). ⟨u,P⟩ represents the unconditional preference ≽ if P is the probability distribution based on the agent's actual information. The conditional preference ordering ≽A, in contrast, is represented by the tuple ⟨u,PA⟩, where PA is the probability distribution based on the counterfactual scenario that the agent accepts proposition A as true. That is, the agent imagines that if he changed his whole belief system from P to PA (and hence specifically P(A)<1 to PA(A)=1), then he would have the preference relation ≽A as represented by ⟨u,PA⟩ (for more discussion on the existence and uniqueness conditions of conditional preferences, see Luce and Krantz 1971, Joyce 1999, chapter 4, Bradley 1999). Jeffrey shows that the posterior utility function UA is related to the prior utility function U as follows:

UA(X) = [1/PA(X)] ∑wX [u(w) × PA(w|X)]
= [P(A)/P(AX)] ∑wXA [u(w) × P(w|AX)/P(A)]
= U(AX)

Conditional preferences allow modelling doxastic preference change. What matters for an agent's evaluation and behaviour are his unconditional preferences, ≽t, which are unconditional only in the sense that they rely on the agent's actual information at time t. When the agent accepts a new proposition A at time t+1, his conditional-on-A preferences become his unconditional preferences at t+1: ≽t+1 = ≽A.

Jeffrey's model is restricted in two ways. First, it requires an evaluative function u defined over the atoms of the propositional space, viz. possible worlds. Thus for all doxastically changed preference orderings, the preferences over worlds remain identical. Second, the model only considers the effects of a belief change to certainty. But it is plausible that one's preference—say, for a vacation in Florida—changes just because one believes that it is more likely that there will be a Hurricane next week. Jeffrey's model can be generalised by introducing a more general probability updating rule (e.g., Jeffrey conditionalisation). An alternative solution is proposed in a new paper by Bradley (2006), albeit under relatively strong assumptions on the relation between prior and posterior unconditional preferences.

Before leaving the topic, an important discussion from economics needs mentioning, namely the question whether models of doxastic preference change are capable in principle to represent all preference changes. This question originates with an important paper by Stigler and Becker (1977), who argued that a wide range of phenomena which are commonly thought of as preference changes—like addiction, habitual behaviour, advertising and fashions—can be explained by stable, well-behaved preferences. In a rather informal fashion, they argue that such explanations involve only changes in information (more precisely: prices and income), while leaving preferences intact. As a result of this, economists largely abandoned the discusion of preference change, believing that all preference change phenomena can be explained in this way. Prima facie, their proposed explanations exhibit important similarities to the discussed accounts of doxastic preference change. The results from that discussion, which show that models of doxastic preference change are subject to relatively strong constraints, may therefore put doubt on the orthodox position in economics that models of doxastic preference change are capable in principle to represent all preference changes.

6.4 Valuational preference change

Models of valuational change investigate how a change in an agent's basic evaluations leads to a change in her preferences. In comparison to models of belief change, these models face the problem of unboundedness. Beliefs are bounded by certainty, while valuations are principally unbounded. Arguably, this difference is based on beliefs being subject to the concept of truth, while no such criterion exists for preferences. However, assuming that

  1. reproductive success is an increasing function of material payoffs, and
  2. individual preferences are inherited either by genetic transmission or imitation,

it has been claimed that certain preferences (at least in particular environments) may be rationalised as evolutionarily stable. This argument has—without much rigour—been employed to equate preferences with maximal material payoffs (Friedman 1953, 22). Both of these assumptions have been criticised. Many preferences are at least ambiguous with respect to their fitness effects (think a preference for living in Europe over living in the US, or a preference for realistic over romantic literature). And it is controversial whether preferences are inherited or transmitted. Hence the evolutionary stability of preferences provides at most an incomplete account of preference change. Given the unboundedness of preferences, the prospects of a comprehensive account of valuational change along these lines therefore look somewhat dim.

Hansson (1995) suggest differentiating valuational change into preference formation and preference change, and construct a formalised model of preference change proper. If an agent forms a specific preference as a result of some experience, further changes in her overall preference state are often necessary to regain consistency. The model of preference change proper shows which path consistency restoration will take, conditional on the previous state and the available dynamic information, and it determines what the ensuing state will look like.

7. Preference combination

One of the central issues in the social sciences is how to make decisions that reflect the choices and preferences of individuals.

7.1 Aggregation and voting

Two major types of combinations of preferences are relevant in social science and social philosophy. First, an official such as a social planner may have the task to satisfy the preferences or choices of individuals as far as possible, which is not easily done if their opinions diverge. Such an official will need some form of aggregation procedure that can be used to make a decision that is based on individual wishes. Secondly, individuals can make a joint decision, which is normally done by using some form of voting procedure.

In the former case, it would seem reasonable for the social planner to use (individual) preferences as inputs into the procedure, whereas its outcome will be a (social) choice. In other words, this will typically be a preference-to-choice procedure. A practical reason for this is that in order to obtain a workable solution to a social problem, the planner can use information not only about what each individual would prefer most but also about how they value other alternatives.

In contrast, a voting procedure does not consist in combining the preferences of the participants. The objects of combinations are votes, that in most voting systems take the form of opting for one of the alternatives under consideration. (Of course, individuals can be expected to vote in a way that reflects their preferences, but it is nevertheless the votes, not the preferences, that are inputs into the voting procedure.) Therefore, it is more adequate to represent voting as a choice-to-choice procedure.

These distinctions have often not been made in the literature on preference combinations. Most formal studies in this area have been devoted to preference-to-preference or preference-to-choice combinations, that are assumed to represent both joint decisions (voting) and decisions based on individual wishes. However, in the interpretation of formal results in this area, these distinctions can be essential.

7.2 Condorcet's paradox

Preference aggregation and social decision processes were studied already in the 18th century. The most important result from those studies is Condorcet's paradox.

To introduce the paradox, consider three individuals, i1, i2, and i3, who are going on a trip together. They have three countries to choose between, namely Argentina (A), Bolivia (B), and Columbia (C), and their decision will be made by simple majority. i1's preferences are as ABC, whereas i2's are BCA and i3's are CAB. It is then impossible for them to make a decision that is stable in the sense that no majority can be made against it. Hence, if i1 should manage to convince i3 to settle for A that is her second-best alternative, then i2 has reasons to form a coalition with i3 in favour of C. Then, however, it would be sensible for i1 and i2 to form instead a coalition in favour of B. This gives i3 a good motive to offer i1 a coalition in favour of C, etc.

Based on this result, it would seem natural to search for another voting procedure that differs from the majority method in not giving rise to this form of cycles. No such method was found, but it was not until the 20th century that formal results that refer to all possible voting (or decision) procedures were obtained.

7.3 Formal representation

The formal study of social choices and decisions is dominated by a fruitful formal model that was developed by Kenneth Arrow. In the Arrovian framework, collective decisions are modelled as aggregations of individual preferences over the options that the procedure has been set up to decide between. It is usually described as representing a voting procedure, and that terminology will be used here.

The model contains an n-tuple (vector) of individuals, namely those that take part in the voting procedure. The reason why the individuals are not represented as a set is that a set is unordered. In order to cover decision procedures in which individuals differ in their influence on the decision, the individuals must be distinguishable. This is obtained by using a vector representation.

The decision procedure concerns a set of alternatives that society has to choose between. In preference-to-choice and choice-to-choice procedures, the outcome is an element of that alternative set, or possibly a tie outcome (meaning that no social choice was made). In preference-to-preference procedures, the outcome is a preference relation over the set of alternatives.

The inputs of the decision procedure can also vary. In a voting procedure, the inputs are the votes of the individual participants. In the most common forms of voting, the votes refer to elements of the alternative set. However, there are also voting procedures in which voters state not only their first alternative, but also a list of how they rank the other alternatives. In a multi-stage process, the inputs may be more adequately represented as strategies for how to vote at each stage. In a general framework, that covers these various options, the individual inputs are usually called strategies. A voting pattern is an assignment of a strategy to each participant, in the form of an n-tuple.

A social choice function takes us from each voting pattern, i.e., total input, to an outcome. The outcome may either be one of the alternatives that the procedure has been set up to choose between, or it may be the tie outcome (λ).

Summarizing the above, a voting procedure can be identified with a quadruple ⟨I,A,S,r⟩ such that (in the case when the outcome is a social choice):

I = ⟨i1,⟩ is an n-tuple of individuals.
A = {x,y...} is the set of (decision-)alternatives. A∪{λ} is the set of outcomes, where λ is the tie outcome.
S = {s1,...,sm} is the set of strategies. An n-tuple π = ⟨α1,...,αn⟩ of elements of S is called a voting pattern. For each k, π assigns αk to ik.
r, the social choice function, is a function from the set of voting patterns to the set of outcomes.

Social choice theory is the study of properties of social choice functions.

7.4 Arrow's theorem

Kenneth Arrow (1963) studied social choice functions in a preference-to-preference framework. In this framework, a social choice function is a function from a vector of individual preference relations over a set A of alternatives, ⟨≽1,…,≽n⟩, to a collective preference relation ≽ over the same set of alternatives, hence ≽ = r(⟨≽1,…,≽n⟩). It is assumed that ≽1,…,≽n and ≽ are all weak orderings, i.e. they are complete, reflexive, and transitive.

Arrow proposed that a procedure of social choice should satisfy the following four axioms:

(1) Unlimited domain: r is a total function, i.e. it yields an outcome for all voting patterns.
(2) Pareto principle: If XiY for all i∈{1,..n}, then XY
(3) Independence of irrelevant alternatives: Let ⟨≽1,…,≽n⟩ and ⟨≽′1,…,≽′n⟩ be such that for all for all i ∈{1,...n} and all X, Y ∈A: XiY if and only if X≽′iY. Let ≽ = r(⟨≽1,…,≽n⟩) and ≽ = r(⟨≽′1,…,≽′n⟩). Then XY if and only if X≽′Y.
(4) Non-dictatorship: There is no i ∈{1,..,n} such that for all X, Y ∈A: XY if and only if XiY.

These conditions all seem highly plausible. The first condition says that for any combination of individual preferences, the rule should yield a collective preference ordering. According to the second condition, if all individuals agree in preferring X to Y, then X should be collectively preferred to Y. According to the third condition, the collective preference between X and Y should depend only on how the individuals order these same two alternatives. In other words, the collective ordering of X and Y should not be changed if the individuals move some third alternative Z up or down in their preference orderings, without changing the order between X and Y. According to the fourth criterion, there should be no individual whose influence is so strong that her or his preferences determine the collective preference ordering, thereby making the other participants in the procedure superfluous.[5]

Arrow showed that these four conditions are not compatible, in other words there is no function r that satisfies all of them. A large number of additional impossibility results have been obtain that strengthen Arrow's result in various ways. In particular, corresponding results for preference-to-choice procedures are easily obtainable (Sen, 1970a).

Another important impossibility result is obtained by introducing the notion of individual freedom into the theory of social choice. Sen codified the sphere of individual freedom as a sphere in which the person's individual preferences, and these alone, should determine the social preference. For this purpose, he introduced the condition of minimal liberalism.

Minimal liberalism: There are two individuals j, k ∈{1,…n}and four alternatives X, Y, Z, WA such that XY if and only if XjY, YX if and only if YjX, ZW if and only if ZkW, and WZ if and only if WkZ.

Sen showed that there is no social choice function that satisfies the following three conditions: Unlimited domain, the Pareto principle and Minimal liberalism (the “impossibility of the Paretian liberal”) (Sen 1970b).

The impossibility results are highly general in nature. They put limits on all social procedures in which social preferences, choices or decisions are supposed to be responsive to individual preferences. This includes social planning, voting procedures and also the workings of markets. Of course, this does not mean that such procedures are impossible, only that they have to disobey at least one of the four conditions mentioned above.

7.5 Procedural preferences

In the Arrovian framework, collective decisions are modelled as aggregations of individual preferences over the options that the procedure has been set up to decide between. However, individuals who take part in collective decision procedures often have preferences that do not refer exclusively to these options (decision-alternatives). Besides wanting the outcome to be as good as possible (according to her own standard), a participant may have preferences such as the following:

  1. She prefers to be part of the winning coalition.
  2. She prefers the decision to be taken by as large a majority as possible. (This may lead a committee member to vote for another alternative than the one that she actually prefers most, in order to contribute to unanimity.)
  3. She prefers to cast her own vote for as good an alternative as possible. Such “principled” preferences may prevent a participant from taking part in a coalition that would change the outcome, say, from her third-best to her second-best alternative. (This is one of the mechanisms through which candidates that have no chance to get elected still receive votes.)
  4. She may want the outcome of the voting procedure to be X, but yet prefer to vote for Y, since Y is more in strict accord with her ideals (although it is sadly unrealistic as things are at present).

In cases like these, the preferences that guide the voter's decision do not refer exclusively to the decision-alternatives that the procedure aims at choosing between. Her preferences have a procedural component. In order to express such preferences, the Arrovian framework can be extended by generalizing the format for representing individual preferences. For each individual i, let the preference relation ≽i have the set of voting patterns (hence not the set of alternatives) as its domain. This is sufficient for expressing procedural preferences of the types referred to above. (Hansson 1992, 1996c) Consider for instance a preference for consensus in a voting procedure with three participants and simple majority rule. A person who strictly prefers consensus should prefer the voting pattern ⟨X,X,X⟩ to each of the patterns ⟨Y,X,X⟩, ⟨X,Y,X⟩, and ⟨X,X,Y⟩, for all distinct X and Y in A. (The original Arrovian framework can be treated as a special case of this extension, namely the case in which for all individuals i and all voting patterns π and π′, if r(π) = r(π′) then π∼iπ′.)

As Condorcet's paradox shows even more clearly than Arrow's theorem, in the context of voting, the impossibility results of social choice theory give rise to instability: Whatever the outcome, there is a coalition that has something to gain by reopening the issue and repeating the voting procedure. Therefore, the decision process would seem to have a tendency to go on forever. In studies using the extended framework with procedural preferences, it has been shown that instability can be eliminated or its probability substantially reduced with the introduction of certain types of procedural preferences. This is no surprise; we all know that individuals striving for consensus find it easier to reach an agreement than individuals who have no preference for consensus. Procedural preferences can explain why there seems to be more stability (less circularity) in the voting procedures of the real world than what could be expected on the basis of (Arrovian) social choice theory. However, instability is in many cases not replaced by the ideal situation in which there is exactly one stable outcome, which is not the tie outcome. Instead, these procedural preferences give rise to multi-stability (two or more stable outcomes) or tie-stability (tie is the only stable outcome). A decreased occurrence of instability is therefore bought at the price of an increased occurrence of multi-stability and tie-stability (Hansson 1992b). It can however be argued that since instability tends to prevent the decision process from coming to an end, it is a more pernicious phenomenon than multi-stability and tie-stability.


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