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Sorites Paradox

First published Fri Jan 17, 1997; substantive revision Mon Aug 15, 2005

The sorites paradox is the name given to a class of paradoxical arguments, also known as little-by-little arguments, which arise as a result of the indeterminacy surrounding limits of application of the predicates involved. For example, the concept of a heap appears to lack sharp boundaries and, as a consequence of the subsequent indeterminacy surrounding the extension of the predicate ‘is a heap’, no one grain of wheat can be identified as making the difference between being a heap and not being a heap. Given then that one grain of wheat does not make a heap, it would seem to follow that two do not, thus three do not, and so on. In the end it would appear that no amount of wheat can make a heap. We are faced with paradox since from apparently true premises by seemingly uncontroversial reasoning we arrive at an apparently false conclusion.

This phenomenon at the heart of the paradox is now recognised as the phenomenon of vagueness (see the entry on vagueness). Once identified, vagueness can be seen to be a feature of syntactic categories other than predicates, nonetheless one speaks primarily of the vagueness of predicates. Names, adjectives, adverbs and so on are only susceptible to paradoxical sorites reasoning in a derivative sense.

Sorites arguments of the paradoxical form are to be distinguished from multi-premise syllogisms (polysyllogisms) which are sometimes also referred to as sorites arguments. Whilst both polysyllogisms and sorites paradoxes are chain-arguments, the former need not be paradoxical in nature and the latter need not be syllogistic in form.

1. The Sorites In History

The name ‘sorites’ derives from the Greek word soros (meaning ‘heap’) and originally referred, not to a paradox, but rather to a puzzle known as The Heap: Would you describe a single grain of wheat as a heap? No. Would you describe two grains of wheat as a heap? No. … You must admit the presence of a heap sooner or later, so where do you draw the line?

It was one of a series of puzzles attributed to the Megarian logician Eubulides of Miletus. Also included were:

The Liar: A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?

The Hooded Man: You say that you know your brother. Yet that man who just came in with his head covered is your brother and you did not know him.

The Bald Man: Would you describe a man with one hair on his head as bald? Yes. Would you describe a man with two hairs on his head as bald? Yes. … You must refrain from describing a man with ten thousand hairs on his head as bald, so where do you draw the line?

This last puzzle, presented as a series of questions about the application of the predicate ‘is bald’, was originally known as the falakros puzzle. It was seen to have the same form as the Heap and all such puzzles became collectively known as sorites puzzles.

It is not known whether Eubulides actually invented the sorites puzzles. Some scholars have attempted to trace its origins back to Zeno of Elea but the evidence seems to point to Eubulides as the first to employ the sorites. Nor is it known just what motives Eubulides may have had for presenting this puzzle. It was, however, employed by later Greek philosophers to attack various positions, most notably by the Sceptics against the Stoics' claims to knowledge.

These puzzles of antiquity are now more usually described as paradoxes. Though the conundrum can be presented informally as a series of questions whose puzzling nature gives it dialectical force it can be, and was, presented as a formal argument having logical structure. The following argument form of the sorites was common:

1 grain of wheat does not make a heap.
If 1 grain of wheat does not make a heap then 2 grains of wheat do not.
If 2 grains of wheat do not make a heap then 3 grains do not.

If 9,999 grains of wheat do not make a heap then 10,000 do not.
10,000 grains of wheat do not make a heap.

The argument certainly seems to be valid, employing only modus ponens and cut (enabling the chaining together of each sub-argument which results from a single application of modus ponens). These rules of inference are endorsed by both Stoic logic and modern classical logic, amongst others.

Moreover its premises appear true. Some Stoic presentations of the argument recast it in a form which replaced all the conditionals, ‘If A then B’, with ‘Not(A and not-B)’ to stress that the conditional should not be thought of as being a strong one, but rather the weak Philonian conditional (the modern material conditional) according to which ‘If A then B’ was equivalent to ‘Not(A and not-B)’. Such emphasis was deemed necessary since there was a great deal of debate in Stoic logic regarding the correct analysis for the conditional. In thus judging that a connective as weak as the Philonian conditional underpinned this form of the paradox they were forestalling resolutions of the paradox that denied the truth of the conditionals based on a strong reading of them. This interpretation then presents the argument in its strongest form since the validity of modus ponens seems assured whilst the premises are construed so weakly as to be difficult to deny. The difference of one grain would seem to be too small to make any difference to the application of the predicate; it is a difference so negligible as to make no apparent difference to the truth-values of the respective antecedents and consequents.

Yet the conclusion seems false. Thus paradox confronted the Stoics just as it does the modern classical logician. Nor are such paradoxes isolated conundrums. Innumerable sorites paradoxes can be expressed in this way. For example, one can present the puzzle of the Bald Man in this manner. Since a man with one hair on his head is bald and if a man with one is then a man with two is, so a man with two hairs on his head is bald. Again, if a man with two is then a man with three is, so a man with three hairs on his head is bald, and so on. So a man with ten thousand hairs on his head is bald, yet we rightly feel that such men are hirsute, i.e., not bald. Indeed, it seems that almost any vague predicate admits of such a sorites paradox and vague predicates are ubiquitous.

As presented, the paradox of the Heap and the Bald Man proceed by addition (of grains of wheat and hairs on the head respectively). Alternatively though, one might proceed in reverse, by subtraction. If one is prepared to admit that ten thousand grains of sand make a heap then one can argue that one grain of sand does since the removal of any one grain of sand cannot make the difference. Similarly, if one is prepared to admit a man with ten thousand hairs on his head is not bald, then one can argue that even with one hair on his head he is not bald since the removal of any one hair from the originally hirsute scalp cannot make the relevant difference. It was thus recognised, even in antiquity, that sorites arguments come in pairs, using: ‘non-heap’ and ‘heap’; ‘bald’ and ‘hirsute’; ‘poor’ and ‘rich’; ‘few’ and ‘many’; ‘small’ and ‘large’; and so on. For every argument which proceeds by addition there is another reverse argument which proceeds by subtraction.

Curiously, the paradox seemed to attract little subsequent interest until the late nineteenth century when formal logic once again assumed a central role in philosophy. Since the demise of ideal language doctrines in the latter half of the twentieth century interest in the vagaries of natural language, and the sorites paradox in particular, has greatly increased.

2. Its Paradoxical Forms

A common form of the sorites paradox presented for discussion in the literature is the form discussed above. Let ‘F’ represent the soritical predicate (e.g., ‘is bald’, or ‘does not make a heap’) and let the expression ‘an’ (where n is a natural number) represent a subject expression in the series with regard to which ‘F’ is soritical (e.g., ‘a man with n hair(s) on his head’ or ‘n grain(s) of wheat’). Then the sorites proceeds by way of a series of conditionals and can be schematically represented as follows:

Conditional Sorites

If Fa1 then Fa2
If Fa2 then Fa3

If Fai-1 then Fai
Fai                 (where i can be arbitrarily large)

Whether the argument is taken to proceed by addition or subtraction will depend on how one views the series.

Barnes (1982) states conditions under which any argument of this form is soritical. Initially, the series <a1,…,ai> must be ordered; for example, scalps ordered according to number of hairs, heaps ordered according to number of grains of wheat, and so on. Secondly, the predicate ‘F’ must satisfy the following three constraints: (i) it must appear true of a1, the first item in the series; (ii) it must appear false of ai, the last item in the series; and (iii) each adjacent pair in the series, an and an+1, must be sufficiently similar as to appear indiscriminable in respect of ‘F’—that is, both an and an+1 appear to satisfy ‘F’ or neither do. Under these conditions ‘F’ will be soritical relative to the series <a1,…,ai> and any argument of the above form using ‘F’ and <a1,…,ai> will be soritical.

In recent times the explanation of the fact that sorites arguments come in pairs has shifted from consideration of the sorites series itself and whether it proceeds by addition or subtraction to the predicate involved. It is now common to focus on the presence or absence of negation in the predicate, noting the existence of both a positive form which bloats the predicate's extension and negative form which shrinks the predicate's extension. With the foregoing analysis of the conditions for sorites susceptibility it is easy to verify that ‘F’ will be soritical relative to <a1,…,ai> if and only if ‘not-F’ is soritical relative to <ai,…,a1>. Thus verifying that for every positive sorites there is an analogous negative variant.

The key feature of soritical predicates which drives the paradox, constraint (iii), is described in Wright (1975) as “tolerance” and is thought to arise as a result of the vagueness of the predicate involved. Predicates such as ‘is a heap’ or ‘is bald’ appear tolerant of sufficiently small changes in the relevant respects—namely number of grains or number of hairs. The degree of change between adjacent members of the series relative to which ‘F’ is soritical would seem too small to make any difference to the application of the predicate ‘F’. Yet large changes in relevant respects will make a difference, even though large changes are the accumulation of small ones which don't seem to make a difference. This is the very heart of the conundrum which has delighted and perplexed so many for so long.

Any resolution of the paradoxes is further complicated by the fact that they can be presented in a variety of forms and the problem they present can only be considered solved when all forms have been defused.

One variant replaces the set of conditional premises with a universally quantified premises. Let ‘n’ be a variable ranging over the natural numbers and let ‘∀n(…n…)’ assert that every number n satisfies the condition …n… . Further, let us represent the claim of the form ‘∀n(if Fan then Fan+1)’ as follows:


Then the sorites is now seen as proceeding by the inference pattern known as mathematical induction:

Mathematical Induction Sorites


So, for example, it is argued that since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald and since the addition of one hair cannot make the difference between being bald and not bald (for any number n, if a man with n hairs is bald then so is a man with n+1 hairs), then no matter what number n you choose, a man with n hairs on his head is bald.

Yet another form is a variant of this inductive form. Assume that it is not the case that for every n, a man with n hairs on his head is bald, i.e., that for some number n, it is not the case that a man with n hairs on his head is bald. Then by the least number principle (equivalent to the principle of mathematical induction) there must be a least such number, say i+1, such that it is not the case that a man with i+1 hairs on his head is bald. Since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald it follows that i+1 must be greater than 1. So, there must be some number n (= i) such that a man with n hairs counts as bald whilst a man with n+1 does not. Thus it is argued that though a1 is bald, not every number n is such that an is bald, so there must be some point at which baldness ceases. Let ‘∃n(…n…)’ assert that some number n satisfies the condition …n… . Then we can represent the chain of reasoning just described as follows:

Line-drawing Sorites

n≥1(Fan & ~Fan+1)

Now obviously, given that sorites arguments have been presented in these three forms, “the sorites paradox” will not be solved by merely claiming, say, mathematical induction to be invalid for soritical predicates. All forms need to be addressed one way or another. (See Priest (1991) for yet another interesting form the paradox might take, a form which makes explicit the paradox's dependence on condition (iii) mentioned above and presents the argument as proceeding by substitutivity of identicals.)

One would hope to solve the paradox, if at all, by revealing some general underlying fault common to all forms of the paradox. No such general solution could depend on the diagnosis of a fault peculiar to any one form. On the other hand, were no general solution available then “the sorites paradox” will only be adequately addressed when each of its forms separately have been adequately dealt with. This piecemeal approach holds little attraction though. It is less economical than a unified approach, arguably less elegant, and would fail to come to grips with the underlying unifying phenomenon which is considered to give rise to the paradoxes, namely vagueness. A logic of vagueness, be it classical or otherwise, ought to be able to defuse all those paradoxes that have their source in this phenomenon.

3. Responses

The various responses to soritical reasoning can be most easily catalogued by focussing on that form most commonly discussed in the literature—the conditional form. As with any paradox, four responses appear to be available. One might:

  1. deny that logic applies to soritical expressions.

According to this response the problem cannot legitimately be set up in the first place. On the other hand one might accept that the sorites paradox constitutes a legitimate argument to which logic applies and deny its soundness by:

  1. denying some premise(s),


  1. denying its validity.

Finally, seemingly as a last resort, one might embrace the paradox and

  1. accept it as sound.

3.1 Ideal Language Approaches

Committed as Frege and Russell were to ideal language doctrines, it is not surprising to find them pursuing response (1). (See especially Russell (1923).) A key attribute of the ideal language is said to be its precision; the vagueness of natural language is a defect to be eliminated. Since soritical terms are vague, the elimination of vagueness will entail the elimination of soritical terms. They cannot then, as some theorists propose, be marshalled as a challenge to classical logic.

A modern variation on this response, promoted most notably in Quine (1981), sees vagueness as an eliminable feature of natural language. The class of vague terms, including soritical predicates, can as a matter of fact be dispensed with. There is, perhaps, some cost to ordinary ways of talking, but a cost that is nonetheless worth paying for the simplicity it affords—namely, our thereby being able to defend classical logic with what Quine describes as its “sweet simplicity”.

However, with the demise of ideal language doctrines and subsequent restoration of respect for ordinary language, vagueness is increasingly considered less superficial than response (1) suggests. If logic is to have teeth it must be applicable to natural language as it stands. Soritical expressions are unavoidable and the paradox must be squarely faced.

Responses of type (2) do just this and are now the most common. Logic is seen as applicable to natural language, in particular the sorites paradox, but the conditional form of the argument is seen as proceeding from a faulty premise.

3.2 The Epistemic Theory

According to Williamson (1994), Stoic logicians pursued just such a type (2) response. Given their acceptance of the principle of bivalence and their presentation of the argument as invoking a material conditional, they blocked the sorites by claiming some one conditional to be false (since not true) and that there comes a point in any sorites series where the relevant predicate ceases to apply and its negation does. For example vague terms like ‘heap’ or ‘knowledge’, though soritical relative to an appropriately chosen series, are semantically determinate so, in spite of appearances to the contrary, there is a sharp cut-off point to their application. The inclination to validate all the premises of a sorites argument (along with the inference pattern employed, which the Stoics accepted) was to be explained via ignorance—more exactly, the unknowable nature of the relevant sharp semantic boundary.

In this way the threat of wholesale scepticism urged by the Sceptics was met by the limited scepticism arising from our inability to know the precise boundaries to knowledge. ‘Nothing can be known’ was rejected in favour of ‘The precise boundaries to knowledge itself cannot be known’. This epistemological response has been elaborated on most notably in Sorensen (1988), (2001) and Williamson (1994), (2000). Though soritical predicates are admittedly indeterminate in their extension, the indeterminacy is not semantic. The conundrum presented by the sorites paradox is an epistemological one which in no way undermines classical semantics or logic.

In the modern era, such a solution was commonly ruled out by definition until recently, as a cursory study of encyclopedia and dictionary entries will reveal. Vagueness was typically characterised as a semantic phenomenon whereby the apparent semantic indeterminacy surrounding a soritical term's extension was considered real. In the absence of any apparent barrier to knowledge of a soritical predicate's precise extension it was generally assumed that there was simply no precise extension to be known. The philosophical landscape has now changed. Williamson and Sorensen have offered an impressive array of arguments defending an epistemological account of vagueness which, if successful, would make possible an epistemological solution to the sorites.

Nonetheless, a central concern with the epistemological approach is its counter-intuitive nature—a purported problem that Sorensen (2001) is dedicated to resolving. Even if an epistemic analysis is possible, the indeterminacy surrounding the application of soritical terms is generally considered to be a semantic phenomenon. (See Keefe (2000), Chapter 3 for more detailed criticism.) If seen in this way, classical semantics appears in need of revision, and with it classical logic. In the second half of this century there have been a number of attempts to develop non-classical logics of vagueness, a major constraint being the provision of a solution to the sorites paradox. The extent of the proposed logical innovation varies.

3.3 Supervaluationism and its Relatives

3.3.1 Supervaluationism

In accord with a principle of least mutilation, Dummett (1975), Fine (1975) and Keefe (2000) adapt Van Fraassen's supervaluation semantics to the sorites paradox, and vagueness more generally, resulting in a non-bivalent logic that, initially at least, retains the classical consequence relation and classical laws whilst admitting truth-value gaps. The challenge posed by the sorites paradox can, on this view, be met by logical revision in the metatheory alone and a type (2) response is advocated.

In contrast to the epistemic conception of vagueness, a semantic conception will treat the apparent semantic indeterminacy of vague predicates as real. Borderline cases, symptomatic of vagueness, are cases to which the predicate neither definitely applies nor definitely doesn't apply, where ‘definitely’ is now given a semantic analysis as opposed to an epistemic one. Contra an epistemic account, the positive extension of a predicate is given by those objects to which the predicate definitely applies, the negative extension is given by those objects to which the predicate definitely does not apply, and the remaining (borderline) cases constitute the predicate's penumbra. Consistent with a view of vagueness as a semantic deficiency (e.g., Fine (1975)) or as semantic indecision (e.g., Lewis (1986)) “truth” can now be defined in terms of that which is true irrespective of how the semantic deficiency or indecision is resolved (“super-truth” as it is sometimes called).

With validity then defined as “truth” preservation, validity coincides with classical validity. In particular, treating laws as zero-premise arguments, such supervaluationism preserves all classical laws. Thus, in spite of its being non-bivalent the supervaluationist response validates the law of excluded middle. For example, irrespective of the vagueness of ‘heap’ it is logically true of any number of grains of wheat that it either does or does not make a heap. As a consequence, supervaluation semantics is no longer truth-functional. It countenances instances of true disjunctions neither of whose disjuncts is true. Conjunction and the conditional exhibit analogous non-classical features.

Since all the forms taken by the sorites are classically valid, they are also supervaluationally valid. The conclusion of the conditional form is resisted by noticing that some conditional premise fails to be true; though, admittedly, none is false. The conditional sorites is valid but unsound.

More revealing is the diagnosis with regard to the mathematical induction form. It is also deemed unsound due to the failure of one of the premises—the universal premise. The universally quantified conditional is not true; in fact it is false. While there is no one conditional premise of the conditional form which is false, it is nonetheless true according to supervaluation theory that some conditional is. That is to say, it is false that for all n, if Fan then Fan+1 (where ‘F’ is soritical relative to the subjects of the form an).

Given that supervaluation semantics admits that the falsity of ‘∀n(FanFan+1)’ is logically equivalent to the truth of ‘∃n(Fan & ~Fan+1)’, the line-drawing form of the sorites is also solved. The argument is supervaluationally valid since classically valid and its premises are uncontestably true. What supervaluation semantics claims to provide is a formal account of how it is that such a conclusion could, contrary to appearances, be true; it is true since true no matter how one resolves the indeterminacy of the vague term involved (i.e., the soritical predicate).

In this way then the sorites paradoxes are said to be defused. With vagueness viewed as a semantic phenomenon, classical semantics is no longer appropriate as a semantics of vague language and supervaluation semantics is proposed in its place.

One immediate concern facing this solution, however, is the fact that it ultimately treats the mathematical induction and line-drawing forms of the sorites in just the same way as the logically conservative epistemic theory. We are forced to accept the avowedly counter intuitive truth of ‘∃n(Fan & ~Fan+1)’ which seems to postulate the existence of a sharp boundary, yet the existence of just such a boundary is what the semantic theory of vagueness is supposed to deny. Supervaluationists respond by denying that the conclusion of the line-drawing sorites expresses the existence of a sharp boundary. Though committed to the claim

  1. T ‘∃n (Fan & ~Fan+1)’,

semantic precision is only properly captured by the claim that

  1. n T ‘(Fan & ~Fan+1)’

and this is clearly denied by supervaluation theory. Whilst it is true that there is some cut-off point, there is no particular point of which it is true that it is the cut-off point. Since it is only this latter claim which is taken to commit one to the existence of a sharp boundary, there is no commitment to there being such a boundary of which we are ignorant (contra the epistemic theorist).

With this explanation, however, doubts arise as to the adequacy of the logic. Not only must (b) be properly taken to represent the semantic precision of ‘F’ but we must also be prepared to admit that some existential statements can be true without having any true instance, thus blocking any inference from (a) to (b). Just as the failure of the metatheoretic principle of bivalence in conjunction with the retention of the law of excluded middle commits the supervaluationist to the presence of true disjunctions lacking true disjuncts, so too must we countenance analogous non-standard behaviour in the logic's quantification theory. In effect, the counter-intuitive aspects of the epistemic theory are avoided only at a cost to other intuitions.

At this point the supervaluationist might seek to explain these semantic anomalies by showing how they are mandated by a proper understanding of the underlying phenomenon of vagueness. More exactly, the suggestion is that a view of vagueness as merely semantic and in no way a reflection of any underlying phenomenon of metaphysical vagueness (i.e., a view of vagueness as merely representational) might underpin a supervaluationist approach to vagueness. Fine (1975) appears to promote this representational view when defending the law of excluded middle, for example, and Varzi (2001) amongst others also defendes supervaluationism in this way. (If successful, such a defence would also provide a principled justification of the common de facto linkage of supervaluation theory and a representational view of vagueness.) If this explanation is to be pursued then the formal machinery of supervaluationism solves the paradox only in conjunction with a denial of metaphysical vagueness. The metaphysical debate is ongoing. Keefe (2000), on the other hand, opts for a pragmatic defence. Though counterintuitive, the semantic anomalies that beset supervaluationism should be accepted because they are part of a theory which fares better overall than any other. No additional defence is necessary.

Williamson (1994) points to two further problems which beset the account. If the definition of validity as necessary truth-preservation is retained, as it commonly is, then classical inferences like conditional proof, dilemma and reductio ad absurdum are no longer valid in a language extended to admit the expression of vagueness (achieved by the addition of a determinately operator ‘D’ or similar). (Dummett (1975) offers an alternative definition of validity that does not encounter this problem. Williamson suggests other problems which such a definition faces.) The logic of the extended language is decidedly non-classical. Moreover, problems also arise with regard to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness. In accommodating higher order vagueness the supervaluationist must admit that their proffered concept of truth, i.e., super-truth, lacks properties that truth is standardly assumed to possess. Contrary to claims by supervaluationists then, truth is not super-truth. (See Keefe (2000) for a defence.)

3.3.2 Relatives

Some criticisms of supervaluationism are mounted from positions much closer to the supervaluationist's own perspective, and share some central insights of that approach while abandoning others.

Burgess and Humberstone (1987), while agreeing to the type (2) response advocated by supervaluationists, take issue with the much-discussed retention of the law of excluded middle in supervaluationism, adopting instead a variation on supervaluationist logic which abandons this law in the face of seeming counter-examples presented by vagueness. (For discussion and criticism from a supervaluationist perspective see Keefe (2000), Chapter 7.)

Another variant on supervaluationism is Jaśkowski's paraconsistent (see the entry on paraconsistent logic) “discussive logic” which underwrites a type (3) response to the conditional sorites. A decade before Mehlberg (1958) first proposed what was, in effect, a supervaluationist treatment of vagueness, a student of Łukasiewicz, Stanisław Jaśkowski, published an account of a logic which he proposed as a logic of vague concepts. It was, in fact, the first formal system of paraconsistent logic described. (Interestingly, both Mehlberg and Jaśkowski were students of the Lvov-Warsaw School (see the entry on the Lvov-Warsaw School) of philosophy where Łukasiewicz was a professor.) Paraconsistent approaches to the sorites paradox had been advocated by Marxists for some time, with borderline case predications providing paradigm examples of dialectical situations. The paradox was commonly cited as evidence of the inadequacy of classical logic. It was not until Jaśkowski's pioneering work though that the proposal received formal explication. This logic, sometimes now referred to as “subvaluationism” to emphasise its duality with the more familiar supervaluationism, represents the postulated semantic indeterminacy as semantic overdetermination, rather than underdetermination typical of truth-value gap responses to the phenomenon of vagueness. While arguing for a supervaluationist semantics for vagueness, Fine (1975) had noted that the (subvaluationist) truth-value glut approach can be arrived at by a simple reinterpretation of the truth-value gap approach advocated therein. (For more on this system and a limited defence thereof see Hyde (1997). For criticism see Keefe (2000), Ch. 7 and Beall & Colyvan (2001).)

3.4 Many-Valued Logic

In contrast to the non-truth-functional logics outlined above, other non-classical logics have been proposed, and in particular, many-valued logics (see the entry on many-valued logic). Again vagueness is seen as a properly semantic phenomenon, with the attendant indeterminacies providing cases of semantic underdetermination or overdetermination, however truth-functionality is preserved. The approaches vary as regards the number of non-classical truth-values deemed appropriate to model vagueness and defuse the sorites paradox.

An initial proposal, first developed in Halldén (1949) and Körner (1960) and recently revamped in Tye (1994), uses a three-valued logic. The motivation for such a logic is similar to the supervaluationist's. Just as a vague predicate divides objects into the positive extension, negative extension and the penumbra, vague sentences can be divided into the true, the false and the indeterminate. Unlike supervaluation semantics, however, the connectives are all defined truth-functionally. There are a range of proposals with Kleene's strong three-valued tables as the preferred choice. (See Haack (1974), Appendix. A recent variation on this theme is Field (2003).)

The particular response to the sorites paradox then depends on the definition of validity adopted. A common generalisation of the concept of validity to many-valued logic involves the designation of certain values. A sentence holds (or is assertible) in a many-valued interpretation just if it takes a designated value. Validity may then be defined as the necessary preservation of designated value. (In classical logic, of course, only truth is designated and thus the generalised concept reduces to the classical concept of necessary truth-preservation.) There are then two non-trivial choices: let the set of designated values be {true} or {true, indeterminate}. The former proposal (advocated by Halldén, Körner and Tye) results in a type (2) response, the latter (effectively charactersising the paraconsistent logic LP) results in a type (3) response (see the section on many-valued systems in the entry on paraconsistent logic).

While some are motivated to adopt the foregoing three-valued approaches for their truth-functionality, others find the consequences unacceptable. Those who, for example, find supervaluationist arguments for classical laws plausible will baulk at excluded middle claims sometimes being other than wholly true or contradictions sometimes being other than wholly false, as may be the case in such systems. A further concern with such approaches is that the invoked tripartite division of sentences seems to face similar objections to those which led to the abandonment of the bipartite division effected by two-valued classical logic. Due to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness (in particular second order vagueness) there would seem to be no more grounds for supposing there to exist a sharp boundary between the true sentences and indeterminate ones or the indeterminate sentences and false sentences than there was for supposing a sharp boundary to exist between the true sentences and the false ones. The phenomenon of vagueness which drives the sorites paradox no more suggests two sharp boundaries than it did one. Vague concepts appear to be concepts without boundaries at all. No finite number of divisions seems adequate. Tye (1994) seeks to avoid such difficulties by employing a vague metalanguage.

Goguen (1969) and Zadeh (1975), on the other hand, suggest replacing classical two-valued logic with an infinite-valued one. Infinite-valued or fuzzy logics (see the entry on fuzzy logic) have also been promoted for their recognition of degrees of truth. Just as baldness comes in degrees so too, it is argued, does the truth of sentences predicating baldness of things. The fact that John is more bald than Jo is reflected in the sentence ‘John is bald’ having a higher degree of truth than ‘Jo is bald’. With this logical innovation infinite-valued logics are then offered as a means to solve the sorites paradox.

As with all many-valued logics, the connectives can be defined in a number of ways, giving rise to a number of distinct logics. A standard proposal proceeds by way of the continuum-valued, truth-functional semantics devised by Łukasiewicz. (See Haack (1974), Appendix.) As with the three-valued case, the type of response offered to the paradox also crucially depends on the definition of validity.

Where validity is defined as preservation of designated value and only the maximum value is designated, the conditional sorites admits of a type (2) response. Reinstating the validity of classical laws would, however, require designating more than the maximum value and a type (3) response then results. Machina (1976), on the other hand, suggests defining validity as preservation of the lowest degree of truth possessed by any of the argument's premises. The conditional sorites is, on this approach, deemed invalid and thus a type (3) response again ensues. Edgington (1996) expounds a distinctly different non-truth-functional degree theory that preserves the principle of bivalence and classical logic. On this approach the conditional form of the sorites is valid and a type (2) response is advocated.

As with three-valued approaches, there are a number of problems which beset any infinite-valued approach to vagueness. Firstly, the very idea of a degree of truth needs explanation. Secondly, if numerical truth-values are to used some justification seems required for the particular truth-value assignments. Thirdly, the full implications of abandoning the well-understood classical theory in favour of degree theory need spelling out before a proper evaluation of its worth can be made. (On these points see Sainsbury (1995) Chapter 2; Keefe (2000), Chapter 4.) Furthermore, it is far from clear whether such an approach successfully avoids problems of higher order vagueness. And the assumption of a totally ordered truth-set is overly simple. Not all natural language sentences are comparable as regards their truth. Due to the multi-dimensional nature of a concept such as redness we may be unable to say of two reddish patches which differ in hue or brightness or colour-saturation whether one is redder than the other. (On these latter points see Williamson (1994) Ch. 4; Keefe (2000) Ch. 4.)

3.5 Contextualism and Relatives

Dissatisfied with many-valued and supervaluationist approaches, Kamp (1981) proposed what has now become known as “contextualism”. This approach seeks to account for the apparent lack of sharp boundaries in the extension of vague terms, the central feature driving the sorites paradox, by proffering an explanation as to how such boundaries will never be found wherever one looks for them. Confronted with any pair of items in a series with regard to which the predicate in question is soritical, the predicate is always interpreted in such a way as to not distinguish between them. For example, ‘heap’ is never interpreted in a context so as to apply to one of an indistinguishable pair of piles of wheat and not the other. This overriding demand produces contextual-shifts along a sorites series (akin to “Gestalt-shifts”) whereby the predicate is re-interpreted so as to comply, i.e., not distinguish between adjacent items. Vague predicates thus appear “tolerant” since contextual variation in their interpretation masks any relevant boundaries that may exist in the series.

With this understanding of the elusive nature of semantic boundaries, the way is clear to suppose that such boundaries might exist despite their apparent absence. As Stanley (2003) puts it “when we look for [a] boundary of the extension of a vague expression in its penumbra, our very looking has the effect of changing the interpretation of the vague expression so that the boundary is not where we are looking.”

While some contextualists like Burns (1991) make use of this idea to defend a purely pragmatic analysis of the sorites paradox which leaves classical semantics and logic intact, others advocate a non-classical approach. Focussing on the mathematical induction form, Kamp advocates a type (2) response; despite every instance of the universally quantified premise being true, the premise itself is false and a non-classical analysis of the quantifier proposed. Raffman (1994) and (1996) agree with Kamp that the mathematical induction form has a false major premise, however Raffman retains a standard semantics for the universal quantifier; the conditional sorites is accordingly valid but has some false premise. Again, appearances to the contrary fail to properly account for context by failing to notice that truth can be secured for all the conditionals together only by equivocating on context. Soames (1999) uses context-sensitivity to defend a tripartite picture of vague predicates, postulating boundaries between the determinate exemplars, the determinate non-exemplars, and the borderline cases. Subsequently coupled with Kleene's strong, three-valued semantics, this non-classical contextualism denies the truth of the universally quantified, major premise of the mathematical induction sorites while nonetheless also denying its falsity. (Tappenden (1993) suggests a very similar three-valued approach which also appeals to context to explain the apparent truth of the universally quantified premise, but the use made of context here is subtly different from that of Kamp's and Soames'.) The conditional sorites also admits of solution. Accepting the standard (three-valued) truth-conditions for the universal quantifier, Soames (1999) takes the conditional sorites to have some non-true conditional premise. (For arguments for a non-bivalent approach see Tappenden (1993), and Soames (2002). For argument for the classical variant, see Williamson (2002).)

Contextualism is not without its problems, however. Stanley (2003) points to versions of the paradox seemingly resistant to a contextualist analysis. If we agree with Soames that such an analysis treats vague terms as indexicals, then a diagnosis of some paradoxical forms by means of equivocation on an implicit contextual parameter is precluded by certain facts about indexicals. In particular, indexicals do not admit of varied interpretation in verb phrase ellipsis. Consider, for example, the statement ‘Jack is tired now and Jill is too’. Both the first and second (implicit) occurrence of the indexical ‘now’ must be given the same interpretation; Jack and Jill are simultaneously tired. As a consequence, versions of the sorites paradox that employ such ellipses, even granting the contextual parameters implicit in the vague predicates, are not open to contextualist resolution. Stanley suggests the following as an example of such a sorites:

If that1 is a heap then that2 is too, and if that2 is, then that3 is, and if that3 is, then that4 is, … and then thati is,

where ‘thatn’ refers to the nth element of a series with regard to which ‘heap’ is soritical. There appears to be no scope for supposing that the conditional conjuncts are, as appearances suggest, all true, but in different contexts.

Similar in spirit, but sufficiently different in detail to avoid the foregoing difficulties, Graff (2000) pursues an approach that, like contextualism, appeals to hidden parameters to account for misleading appearances underwriting the sorites paradox. According to Graff's “interest-relative” account, vague predicates express properties that are interest-relative in the sense that their extensions are determined by what counts as significant for an individual, x, at a time. For example, ‘is a tall building’ as used in a context by an individual x expresses the property of being significantly taller for x than an average building. Given the variation of facts over time then (as opposed to contextualism's variation in the context of use) the extension of the univocal property expressed by the vague predicate will vary since what is or is not significant for an individual varies over time (as opposed to the variation appealed to by contextualists due to equivocal properties being expressed in varied contexts). Consequently, like contextualist solutions, the conditional sorites appears sound only because we fail to heed variation in background factors relevant to the evaluation of the various conditionals. Assertions of their joint truth equivocate on temporal indices.

Graff's interest-relative account encounters difficulties too. As she admits, the account applies only to expressions that admit of comparative analysis (e.g., analysing ‘tall’ as per the account invokes the comparative ‘taller than’). Moreover, it is a key aspect of the account that vague predicates express interest-relative properties and, as Stanley (2003) points out, seemingly untoward consequences follow from such a supposition.

3.6 Embracing the Paradox

A final option is to simply embrace the paradox. (See Dummett (1975), Wright (1975).) Conditional sorites paradoxes are, contrary to appearances, sound. For example, no amount of grains of wheat makes a heap. This initial claim in favour of a universal type (4) response immediately runs into difficulty, however, with the realisation that, as noted at the outset, such paradoxes come in pairs. There are negative and positive versions depending on whether the soritical predicate is negated or not. To accept all sorites as sound requires assent to the additional claim that, since one grain of wheat makes a heap, any number do. A radical incoherence follows since there is a commitment to all and any number both making a heap and not making a heap. Similarly, everyone is bald and no-one is; everyone is rich and no-one is, and so on.

The problem is that the soundness of any positive conditional sorites undercuts the truth of the unconditional premise of the corresponding negative version, and vice versa. Unless one is prepared to countenance the almost total pervasiveness of contradictions in natural language, it seems that not all sorites can be sound. Unger (1979) and Wheeler (1979) propose a more restricted embrace. Following dissatisfaction with responses of type (1) and (3) one accepts the applicability and validity of classical norms of reasoning. Nonetheless, dissatisfaction with responses of type (2) considered so far—rejecting some conditional premise—leaves open the possibility of either rejecting the unconditional premise or accepting it and, with it, the soundness of the paradox. What is advocated is the soundness of those sorites which deny heapness, baldness, hirsuteness, richness, poverty, etc. of everything—a type (4) response—and the corresponding falsity of the unconditional premise of all respective positive variants of the argument—a type (2) response. Terms like ‘heap’, ‘bald’, ‘hirsute’, ‘rich’ and ‘poor’ apply to nothing. It is admitted that they apply to everything if they apply to anything, but the all-or-nothing choice is resolved in favour of the latter option. (See Williamson (1994) Ch. 6.)

4. Philosophical Lessons

The sorites paradox presents a serious logical challenge and the foregoing presents the mainstream responses to this challenge. Having considered these ways of dealing with the logical paradox, it is worth pausing to consider at least some of the broader philosophical issues that the problem raises.

Since the deeply puzzling phenomenon of vagueness manifests itself first and foremost as a linguistic phenomenon, it is unsurprising that the responses variously intersect with problems concerning meaning, truth and reference.

4.1 Meaning as Use

A challenge posed for the epistemic theorist's response is that on such a view the commonly supposed connection between meaning and use appears to be severed. While the margin-for-error principle discussed in Williamson (1994) might serve to explain how we could be ignorant of the postulated sharp boundaries were they to exist, it might be thought that since our use of vague terms does not draw sharp boundaries they could not possess them given the generally accepted connection between meaning and use. As Williamson reports this concern others might have, in the case of sentences “the epistemic view of vagueness sets truth-conditions floating unacceptably free of our dispositions to assent and dissent” (1994: 205). It seems that such a view must abandon the idea that our use determines meaning.

One obvious response is that the connection between meaning and use is not as strong as might be supposed. Nature might also sometimes also play a role in determining meaning, e.g., in the case of natural kind terms. But such a response will not help with terms like ‘thin’, for example. It is implausible to suggest in such a case that nature provides what our use does not. Williamson further responds by pointing out that the determination thesis at issue is really a supervenience thesis—meaning supervenes on use—and this thesis can be agreed to by epistemicists. To be sure, the epistemicist cannot say exactly how meaning supervenes on use, and so cannot calculate the meaning or truth-conditions of a claim given facts about use (vagueness is a matter of ineliminable ignorance). But, the response continues, this inability is something which all theorists ought to accept. To suppose that the epistemic theory must make good on this count is to place unreasonable expectations on the theory. (See Williamson (1996) and Burgess (2001) for further discussion.)

The supervenience thesis is also challenged by symmetry considerations. When confronted with a borderline case of ‘thin’, a language user will neither assent to the application of the term nor to the application of its negation. Patterns of dissent are similarly symmetrical with respect to the two claims. And yet despite this symmetry at the level of use it must be broken at the level of truth and falsity where one of the term or its negation truly applies according to the theory; one or the other claim is true and the other false. If our patterns of use leave the matter equally unsettled either way then how can the truth of the matter be settled without arbitrariness and a severing of the connection between meaning and use? The answer, Williamson suggests, lies in the fact that truth and falsity are not symmetrical notions. Falsity obtains in the absence of truth, so where there is symmetry at the level of use falsity reigns. Whether this response succeeds is debated in Burgess (2001) and Weatherson (2003).

4.2 Truth and the T-schema

As already noted when discussing supervaluationism, theories that abandon bivalence have been charged with having to reject the required Tarskian constraint on truth encapsulated in his T-schema: ‘p’ is true if and only if p. The rejection of bivalence in the context of the T-schema is said to lead to absurdity (Williamson (1994), ch. 7). This charge obviously applies more generally to any non-bivalent theory of vagueness. If validated, it would also cast doubt on a disquotationalist account of truth. Many will find this consequence untoward.

Supervaluationists have responded by noting that though the T-schema is not true a corresponding mutual entailment thesis is not threatened: ‘p’ is true entails and is entailed by p. Strictly weaker than the corresponding claim involving the conditional according to supervaluationism, it might be wondered whether the weaker commitment is sufficient to capture what matters about truth. (See Keefe (2000), ch. 8.) Others have taken issue with the Williamson argument by pointing out that in the context of non-bivalent approaches to vagueness negation can be variously defined and that the argument supposes a rejection of bivalence invoking a particularly strong reading of negation. In response Williamson contends that while an appropriately weak account of negation can be offered sufficient to undermine the argument for a general acceptance of bivalence, in the special case of vagueness the phenomenon of higher-order vagueness provides the materials for similarly reducing this weaker rejection to absurdity. (See Williamson (1994), 193f. and Pelletier and Stainton (2003) for further discussion.)

The claim then is that even if there were a sense in which truth was non-bivalent and nonetheless satisfied the T-schema, thus making available a disquotationalist account, the particular nature of the problem posed by vagueness precludes such a synthesis. The depth of the problem, as evidenced by the phenomenon of higher-order vagueness, shows that it cannot be accounted for by a rejection of bivalence.

4.3 The Inscrutability of Reference

Attempts to solve the sorites paradox also throw issues of reference into sharp relief. Unlike epistemic responses to the sorites which postulate inscrutable boundaries, supervaluationism is frequently associated with a semantic approach to vagueness seemingly committed to the inscrutability of reference.

Consider a sorites paradox using the predicate ‘is on Everest’ using the series of millimetre discriminations along a line from its peak to the valley floor below. The first point (the summit) is clearly on Everest. The last (in the valley) clearly is not. And there is no clear point in between where we would draw the sharp boundary separating the mountain from its surrounds. The vagueness or indeterminacy that underwrites this sorites paradox is, on this approach, not a result of epistemic limitations, nor a result of indeterminacy in Everest itself but, rather, arises as a result of indeterminacy surrounding what to count as the referent of the term. Vagueness is a matter of semantic indecision, as it is frequently put. In the case to hand, there is simply no fact of the matter as to exactly what portion of earth is referred to. There is a range of admissible candidates, all with equal claim to be Everest, amongst which we have simply not decided, nor (to paraphrase Lewis) is anyone stupid enough to try.

In such a case, overlapping the problem of the many (see the entry on the problem of the many), the theory commits to a singular term ‘Everest’, though apparently a denoting phrase, lacking any unique determinate referent. This accords with Russell's much earlier analysis of vagueness as “one-manyness in denotation”.

As Keefe (2000, ch. 7.1) points out, supervaluationism thus understood nonetheless makes true the claim that there is but one (sharply bounded) Mt Everest (thus claiming a solution to the problem of the many, and to the foregoing sorites paradox since it is true that there is a sharp cut-off point to being on Everest) even if there is no one (sharply bounded) mountain of which it is true that it is the thing referred to by ‘Everest’ (and thus no point on the mountain of which we can say that it is truly the cut-off point). There is but one Everest but there is no fact of the matter what it is.

As with earlier problems concerning the role of existential quantification in supervaluationism, one can debate whether this is a consequence to be embraced or an untoward consequence undermining the theory being advanced. It is certainly surprising that reference is inscrutable in this way. Moreover, such cases are not the exception; given the ubiquity of vague singular terms such cases appear to be the rule. (See Lewis (1993), McGee and McLaughlin (2000), Morreau (2002).)



Sorites in History

Its Paradoxical Forms

Ideal Language Responses

The Epistemic Response

Supervaluationism and Relatives

Many-Valued Approaches

Contextualism and Relatives

Embracing the Paradox

Philosophical Lessons

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

logic: fuzzy | logic: many-valued | logic: paraconsistent | many, problem of | vagueness