Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Philosophy of Economics

First published Fri Sep 12, 2003; substantive revision Tue Feb 26, 2008

“Philosophy of Economics” consists of inquiries concerning (a) rational choice, (b) the appraisal of economic outcomes, institutions and processes, and (c) the ontology of economic phenomena and the possibilities of acquiring knowledge of them. Although these inquiries overlap in many ways, it is useful to divide philosophy of economics in this way into three subject matters which can be regarded respectively as branches of action theory, ethics (or normative social and political philosophy), and philosophy of science. Economic theories of rationality, welfare, and social choice defend substantive philosophical theses often informed by relevant philosophical literature and of evident interest to those interested in action theory, philosophical psychology, and social and political philosophy. Economics is of particular interest to those interested in epistemology and philosophy of science both because of its detailed peculiarities and because it possesses many of the overt features of the natural sciences, while its object consists of social phenomena.

1. Introduction: What is Economics?

Both the definition and the precise domain of economics are subjects of controversy within philosophy of economics. At first glance, the difficulties in defining economics may not appear serious. Economics is, after all, concerned with aspects of the production, exchange, distribution, and consumption of commodities. But this claim and the terms it contains are vague; and it is arguable that economics is relevant to a great deal more. It helps to approach the question, “What is economics?” historically, before turning to comments on contemporary features of the discipline.

1.1 The emergence of economics and of economies

Philosophical reflection on economics is ancient, but the conception of the economy as a distinct object of study dates back only to the 18th century. Aristotle addresses some problems that most would recognize as pertaining to economics mainly as problems concerning how to manage a household. Scholastic philosophers addressed ethical questions concerning economic behavior, and they condemned usury — that is, the taking of interest on money. With the increasing importance of trade and of nation-states in the early modern period, ‘mercantilist’ philosophers and pamphleteers addressed questions concerning the balance of trade and the regulation of the currency. There was an increasing recognition of the complexities of the financial management of the state and of the possibility that the way that the state taxed and acted influenced the production of wealth.

In the early modern period, those who reflected on the sources of a country's wealth recognized that the annual harvest, the quantities of goods manufactured, and the products of mines and fisheries depend on facts about nature, individual labor and enterprise, and state and social regulations. Trade also seemed advantageous, at least if the terms were good enough. It took no conceptual leap to recognize that manufacturing and farming could be improved and that some taxes and tariffs might be less harmful to productive activities than others. But to formulate the idea that there is such a thing as “the economy” with regularities that can be investigated requires a bold further step. In order for there to be an object of inquiry, there must be regularities in production and exchange; and for the inquiry to be non-trivial, these regularities must go beyond what is obvious to the producers, consumers, and exchangers themselves. Only in the eighteenth century, most clearly illustrated by the work of Cantillon (1755), the physiocrats, David Hume, and especially Adam Smith, does one find the idea that there are laws to be discovered that govern the complex set of interactions that produce and distribute consumption goods and the resources and tools that produce them (Backhouse 2002).

Crucial to the possibility of a social object of scientific inquiry is the idea of tracing out the unintended consequences of the actions of individuals. Thus, for example, Hume traces the rise in prices and the temporary increase in economic activity that follow an increase in currency to the perceptions and actions of individuals who first spend the additional currency (1752). In spending their additional gold imported from abroad, traders do not intend to increase the price level. But that is what they do nevertheless. Adam Smith expands and perfects this insight and offers a systematic Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations. From his account of the demise of feudalism (1776, Book II, Ch. 4) to his famous discussion of the invisible hand, Smith emphasizes unintended consequences. “[H]e intends only his own gain; and he is in this, as in many other cases, led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention. Nor is it always the worse for the society that it was no part of it. By pursuing his own interest, he frequently promotes that of the society more effectually than when he really intends to promote it” (1776, Book IV, Ch. 2). The existence of unobvious regularities, which are the unintended consequences of individual choices gives rise to an object of scientific investigation.

One can distinguish the domain of economics from the domain of other social scientific inquiries either by specifying some set of causal factors or by specifying some range of phenomena. But since so many different causal factors are relevant to the study of production or consumption, from the laws of thermodynamics and metallurgy to the laws governing digestion, economics cannot be distinguished from other inquiries only by the phenomena it studies. Some reference to a set of central causal factors is needed. Thus, for example, John Stuart Mill maintained that, “Political economy…[is concerned with] such of the phenomena of the social state as take place in consequence of the pursuit of wealth. It makes entire abstraction of every other human passion or motive, except those which may be regarded as perpetually antagonising principles to the desire of wealth, namely aversion to labour, and desire of the present enjoyment of costly indulgences.” (1843, Book VI, Chapter 9, Section 3) Economics is mainly concerned with the consequences of individual pursuit of wealth, though it takes some account of less significant motives such as aversion to labor.

Mill takes it for granted that individuals act rationally in their pursuit of wealth and luxury and avoidance of labor, rather than in a disjointed or erratic way, but since he does not have a theory of consumption, he develops no explicit theory of rational economic choice. Such theories were developed only in the wake of the so-called neoclassical revolution, which linked choice (and price) of some object of consumption not to its total utility but to its marginal utility. For example, nothing could be more useful than water. But in much of the world water is plentiful enough that another glass more or less matters little to an agent. So water is cheap. Early “neoclassical” economists such as Jevons held that agents make consumption choices so as to maximize their own happiness (1871). This implies that they distribute their expenditures so that a dollar's worth of water or porridge or upholstery makes the same contribution to their happiness. The “marginal utility” of a dollar's worth of each good is the same.

In the Twentieth Century, economists stripped this general theory of rationality of its hedonistic clothing (Pareto 1909, Hicks and Allen 1934). Rather than supposing that all consumption choices can be ranked in terms of the extent to which they promote an agent's happiness, economists focused on the ranking itself. All that they suppose concerning evaluations is that agents are able consistently to rank the alternatives they face. This is equivalent to supposing first that rankings are complete — that is, for any two alternatives x and y, either the agent ranks x above y (prefers x to y), or the agent prefers y to x, or the agent is indifferent. Second, economists suppose that agent's rankings of alternatives (preferences) are transitive. Though there are further technical conditions to extend the theory to infinite sets of alternatives and to capture further plausible rationality conditions concerning gambles, economists generally subscribe to a view of a rational agent as possessing complete and transitive preferences and as choosing among the feasible alternatives whatever he or she most prefers. Attempts have also been made in the theory of revealed preference to eliminate all reference to subjective preference or to define preference in terms of choices (Samuelson 1947, Houtthaker 1950, Little 1957, Sen 1971, 1973).

In clarifying the view of rationality that characterizes economic agents, economists have for the most part continued to distinguish economics from other social inquiries by the content of the motives or preferences with which it is concerned. So even though an agent may for example seek happiness through asceticism or may rationally prefer to sacrifice all his or her worldly goods to a political cause, economists have supposed that such preferences are rare and unimportant to economics. What economists are concerned with are the phenomena deriving not just from rationality, but from rationality coupled with a desire for wealth and larger consumption bundles.

Economists have flirted with a less substantive characterization of individual motivation and with a more expansive view of the domain of economics. In his influential monograph, An Essay on the Nature and Significance of Economic Science, Lionel Robbins defined economics as “the science which studies human behavior as a relationship between ends and scarce means which have alternative uses” (1932, p. 15). According to Robbins, economics is not concerned with production, exchange, distribution, or consumption as such. It is instead concerned with an aspect of all human action. Although Robbins' definition helps one to understand efforts to apply economic concepts, models, and techniques to other subject matters such as the analysis of voting behavior and legislation, it seems evident that economics maintains its connection to a traditional domain.

1.2 Contemporary economics and its several schools

Contemporary economics is extremely diverse. There are many schools and many branches. Even so-called “orthodox” or “mainstream” economics has many variants. Some mainstream economics is highly theoretical, though most of it is applied and relies on only rather rudimentary theory. Both theoretical and applied work can be distinguished as microeconomics or macroeconomics. Microeconomics focuses on relations among individuals (though firms and households often count as honorary individuals and consumer demand is in practice often treated as an aggregate). Individuals have complete and transitive preferences that govern their choices. Consumers prefer more commodities to fewer and have “diminishing marginal rates of substitution” — i. e. they will pay less for units of a commodity when they already have lots of it than when they have little of it. Firms attempt to maximize profits in the face of diminishing returns: holding fixed other inputs, with more units of one input output increases, but at a diminishing rate. Economists idealize and suppose that in competitive markets, firms and individuals cannot influence prices, but economists are also interested in strategic interactions, in which the rational choices of separate individuals are interdependent. Game theory, which is devoted to the study of strategic interactions, is of growing importance both in theoretical and applied microeconomics. Economists model the outcome of the profit-maximizing activities of firms and the attempts of consumers to best satisfy their preferences as an equilibrium in which there is no excess demand on any market. What this means is that anyone who wants to buy anything at the going market price is able to do so. There is no excess demand, and unless a good is free, there is no excess supply.

Macroeconomics grapples with the relations among economic aggregates, focusing especially on problems concerning the business cycle and the influence of monetary and fiscal policy on economic outcomes. Many mainstream economists would like to unify macroeconomics and microeconomics, but few economists are satisfied with the attempts that have been made to do so, especially via representative agents (Kirman 1992, Hoover 2001a). Econometrics is a third main branch of economics, devoted to the empirical estimation, elaboration, and to some extent testing of specific microeconomic and macroeconomic models (but see Summers 1991 and Hoover 1994). Among macroeconomists, disagreement is much sharper than among microeconomists or econometricians. In addition to Keynesians and monetarists, “new classical economics” (rational expectations theory -- Begg 1982, Carter and Maddock 1984, Hoover 1988, Minford and Peel 1983) has spawned several approaches such as so-called “real business cycle” theories (Kydland and Prescott 1991, 1994; Sent 1998). Branches of mainstream economics are also devoted to specific questions concerning growth, finance, employment, agriculture, natural resources, international trade, and so forth. Within orthodox economics, there are also many different approaches, such as agency theory (Jensen and Meckling 1976, Fama 1980), the Chicago school (Becker 1976), or public choice theory (Brennan and Buchanan 1985, Buchanan 1975).

Although mainstream economics is dominant and demands the most attention, there are many other schools. Austrian economists accept orthodox views of choices and constraints, but they emphasize uncertainty and question whether one should regard outcomes as equilibria, and they are skeptical about the value of mathematical modeling (Buchanan and Vanberg 1989, Dolan 1976, Kirzner 1976, Mises 1949, 1978, 1981, Rothbard 1957, Wiseman 1983). Traditional institutionalist economists question the value of abstract general theorizing (Hodgson 2000, Dugger 1979, Wilber and Harrison 1978, Wisman and Rozansky 1991). They emphasize the importance of generalizations concerning norms and behavior within particular institutions. Applied work in institutional economics is sometimes very similar to applied orthodox economics. More recent work in economics, which is also called institutionalist, attempts to explain features of institutions by emphasizing the costs of transactions, the inevitable incompleteness of contracts, and the problems “principals” face in monitoring and directing their agents (Williamson 1985; Mäki et al. 1993). Marxian economists traditionally articulated and developed Karl Marx's economic theories, but recently many Marxian economists have revised traditional Marxian concepts and themes with tools borrowed from orthodox economic theory (Morishima 1973, Roemer 1981, 1982). There are also socio-economists (Etzioni 1988), behavioral economists (Camerer (2003), Camerer et al. (2003), Thaler (1994), Ben Ner and Putterman 1998, Winter 1962), post-Keynesians (Dow 1985, Kregel 1976), neo-Ricardians (Sraffa 1960, Pasinetti 1981, Roncaglia 1978) and even neuroeconomics (Camerer 2007, Camerer et al. 2005, Camerer et al. 2008, Rusticinni 2005). Economics is not one homogeneous enterprise.

2. Six central methodological problems

Although the different branches and schools of economics raise a wide variety of methodological issues, six problems have been central to methodological reflection concerning economics:

2.1 Positive versus normative economics

Policy makers look to economics to guide policy, and it seems inevitable that even the most esoteric issues in theoretical economics may bear on some people's material interests. The extent to which economics bears on and may be influenced by normative concerns raises methodological questions about the relationships between a positive science concerning “facts” and a normative inquiry into what ought to be. Most economists and methodologists believe that there is a reasonably clear distinction between facts and values, between what is and what ought to be, and they believe that most of economics should be regarded as a positive science that helps policy makers choose means to accomplish their ends, though it does not bear on the choice of ends itself.

This view is questionable for several reasons (Mongin 2006, Hausman and McPherson 2006). First economists have to interpret and articulate the incomplete specifications of goals and constraints provided by policy makers (Machlup 1969b). Second, economic “science” is a human activity, and like all human activities it is governed by values. Those values need not be the same as the values that influence economic policy, but it is questionable whether the values that govern the activity of economists can be sharply distinguished from the values that govern policy makers. Third, much of economics is built around a normative theory of rationality. One can question whether the values implicit in such theories are sharply distinguishable from the values that govern policies. For example, it may be difficult to hold a maximizing view of individual rationality, while at the same time insisting that social policy should resist maximizing growth, wealth, or welfare in the name of freedom, rights, or equality. Fourth, people's views of what is right and wrong are, as a matter of fact, influenced by their beliefs about how people in fact behave. There is evidence that studying theories that depict individuals as self-interested leads people to regard self-interested behavior more favorably and to become more self-interested (Marwell and Ames 1981, Frank et al. 1993). Finally, people's judgments are clouded by their interests. Since economic theories bear so centrally on people's interests, there are bound to be ideological biases at work in the discipline (Marx 1867, Preface).

2.2 Reasons versus causes

Orthodox theoretical microeconomics is as much a theory of rational choices as it a theory that explains and predicts economic outcomes. Since virtually all economic theories that discuss individual choices take individuals as acting for reasons, and thus in some way rational, questions about the role that views of rationality and reasons should play in economics are of general importance. Economists are typically concerned with the aggregate results of individual choices rather than with particular individuals, but their theories in fact offer both causal explanations for why individuals choose as they do and accounts of the reasons for their choices. See also the entry on Methodological Individualism.

Explanations in terms of reasons have several features that distinguish them from explanations in terms of causes. Reasons justify the actions they explain. Reasons can be evaluated, and they are responsive to criticism. Reasons, unlike causes, must be intelligible to those for whom they are reasons. On grounds such as these, many philosophers have questioned whether explanations of human action can be causal explanations (von Wright 1971, Winch 1958). Yet merely giving a reason — even an extremely good reason — fails to explain an agent's action, if the reason was not in fact “effective.” Someone might, for example, start attending church regularly and give as his reason a concern with salvation. But others might suspect that this agent is deceiving himself and that the minister's attractive daughter is in fact responsible for his renewed interest in religion. Donald Davidson (1963) argued that what distinguishes the reasons that explain an action from the reasons that fail to explain it are that the former are also causes of the action. Although the account of rationality within economics differs in some ways from the “folk psychology” people tacitly invoke in everyday explanations of actions, many of the same questions carry over (Rosenberg 1976, ch. 5; 1980).

An additional difference between explanations in terms of reasons and explanations in terms of causes, which some economists have emphasized, is that the beliefs and preferences that explain actions may depend on mistakes and ignorance (Knight 1935). As a first approximation, economists can abstract from such difficulties caused by the intentionality of belief and desire. They thus often assume that people have perfect information about all the relevant facts. In that way theorists need not worry about what people's beliefs are. By assumption people believe and expect whatever the facts are. But once one goes beyond this first approximation, difficulties arise which have no parallel in the natural sciences. Choice depends on how things look “from the inside”, which may be very different from the actual state of affairs. Consider for example the stock market. The “true” value of a stock depends on the future profits of the company, which are of course uncertain. In 1999 and 2000 stock prices were far above any plausible estimate of their true value. But what matters, at least in the short run, is what people believe. No matter how overpriced shares might be, they were excellent investments if tomorrow or next month somebody would be willing to pay even more for them. Economists disagree about how significant this subjectivity is. Members of the Austrian school argue that these differences are of great importance and sharply distinguish theorizing about economics from theorizing about any of the natural sciences (Buchanan and Vanberg 1989, von Mises 1981).

2.3 Social scientific naturalism

Of all the social sciences, economics most closely resembles the natural sciences. Economic theories have been axiomatized, and articles and books of economics are full of theorems. Of all the social sciences, only economics boasts a Nobel Prize. Economics is thus a test case for those concerned with the extent of the similarities between the natural and social sciences. Those who have wondered whether social sciences must differ fundamentally from the natural sciences seem to have been concerned mainly with three questions:

(i) Are there fundamental differences between the structure or concepts of theories and explanations in the natural and social sciences? Some of these issues were already mentioned in the discussion above of reasons versus causes.

(ii) Are there fundamental differences in goals? Philosophers and economists have argued that in addition to or instead of the predictive and explanatory goals of the natural sciences, the social sciences should aim at providing us with understanding. Weber and others have argued that the social sciences should provide us with an understanding “from the inside”, that we should be able to empathize with the reactions of the agents and to find what happens “understandable” (Weber 1904, Knight 1935, Machlup 1969a). This (and the closely related recognition that explanations cite reasons rather than just causes) seems to introduce an element of subjectivity into the social sciences that is not found in the natural sciences.

(iii) Owing to the importance of human choices (or perhaps free will), are social phenomena too “irregular” to be captured within a framework of laws and theories? Given human free will, perhaps human behavior is intrinsically unpredictable and not subject to any laws. But there are, in fact, many regularities in human action, and given the enormous causal complexity characterizing some natural systems, the natural sciences must cope with many irregularities, too.

2.4 Abstraction, idealization, and ceteris paribus clauses in economics

Economics raises questions concerning the legitimacy of severe abstraction and idealization. For example, mainstream economic models often stipulate that everyone is perfectly rational and has perfect information or that commodities are infinitely divisible. Such claims are exaggerations, and they are clearly false. Other schools of economics may not employ idealizations that are this extreme, but there is no way to do economics if one is not willing to simplify drastically and abstract from many complications. How much simplification, idealization, and abstraction is legitimate?

In addition, because economists attempt to study economic phenomena as constituting a separate domain, influenced only by a small number of causal factors, the claims of economics are true only ceteris paribus — that is, they are true only if there are no interferences or disturbing causes. What are ceteris paribus clauses, and when if ever are they legitimate in science? Questions concerning ceteris paribus clauses are closely related to questions concerning simplifications and idealizations, since one way to simplify is to suppose that the various disturbing causes or interferences are inactive and to explore the consequences of some small number of causal factors. These issues and the related question of how well supported economics is by the evidence have been the central questions in economic methodology. They will be discussed further below in Section 3 and elsewhere.

2.5 Causation in economics and econometrics

Many important generalizations in economics are causal claims. For example, the law of demand asserts that a price increase will (ceteris paribus) diminish the quantity demanded. Econometricians have also been deeply concerned with the possibilities of determining causal relations from statistical evidence and with the relevance of causal relations to the possibility of consistent estimation of parameter values. Since concerns about the consequences of alternative policies are so central to economics, causal inquiry is unavoidable.

Before the 1930s, economists were generally willing to use causal language explicitly and literally, despite some concerns that there might be a conflict between causal analysis of economic changes and “comparative statics” treatments of equilibrium states. Some economists were also worried that thinking in terms of causes was not compatible with recognizing the multiplicity and mutuality of determination in economic equilibrium. In the anti-metaphysical intellectual environment of the 1930s and 1940s (of which logical positivism was at least symptomatic), any mention of causation became highly suspicious, and economists commonly pretended to avoid causal concepts. The consequence was that they ceased to reflect carefully on the causal concepts that they continued implicitly to invoke (Hausman 1983, 1990, Helm 1984, Runde 1998). For example, rather than formulating the law of demand in terms of the causal consequences of price changes for quantity demanded, economists tried to confine themselves to discussing the mathematical function relating price and quantity demanded. There were important exceptions (Haavelmo 1944, Simon 1953, Wold 1954), and during the past generation, this state of affairs has changed dramatically.

For example, in his Causality in Macroeconomics (2001b) Kevin Hoover develops feasible methods for investigating large scale causal questions, such as whether changes in the money supply (M) cause changes in the relate of inflation P or accommodate changes in P that are otherwise caused. If changes in M cause changes in P, then the conditional distribution of P on M should remain stable with exogenous changes in M, but should change with exogenous changes in P. Hoover argues that historical investigation, backed by statistical inquiry, can justify the conclusion that some particular changes in M or P have been exogenous. One can then determine the causal direction by examining the stability of the conditional distributions. Econometricians have made vital contributions to the contemporary revival of philosophical interest in the notion of causation. In addition to Hoover's work, see for example Geweke (1982), Granger (1969, 1980), Cartwright (1989), Sims (1977), Zellner and Aigner (1988), Pearl (2000), Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (2001).

2.6 Structure and strategy of economics

In the wake of the work of Kuhn (1970) and Lakatos (1970), philosophers are much more aware of and interested in the larger theoretical structures that unify and guide research within particular research traditions. Since many theoretical projects or approaches in economics are systematically unified, they pose questions about what guides research, and many economists have applied the work of Kuhn or Lakatos to shed light on the overall structure of economics (Baumberg 1977, Blaug 1976, de Marchi and Blaug 1991, Bronfenbrenner 1971, Coats 1969, Dillard 1978, Hands 1985b, Hausman 1992, ch. 6, Hutchison 1978, Latsis 1976, Jalladeau 1978, Kunin and Weaver 1971, Stanfield 1974, Weintraub 1985, Worland 1972). Whether these applications have been successful is controversial, but the comparison of the structure of economics to Kuhn's and Lakatos' schema has at least served to highlight distinctive features of economics. For example, asking what the “positive heuristic” of mainstream economics consists in permits one to see that mainstream models typically attempt to demonstrate that an economic equilibrium will obtain, and thus that mainstream models are unified in more than just their common assumptions. Since the success of research projects in economics is controversial, understanding their global structure and strategy may clarify their drawbacks as well as their advantages.

3. Inexactness, ceteris paribus clauses, and “unrealistic assumptions”

As mentioned in the previous section, the most important methodological issue concerning economics involves the very considerable simplification, idealization, and abstraction that characterizes economic theory and the consequent doubts these features of economics raise concerning whether economics is well supported. Claims such as, “Agents prefer larger commodity bundles to smaller commodity bundles,” raise serious questions, because if they are interpreted as universal generalizations, they are false. Can a science rest on false generalizations? If these claims are not universal generalizations, then what is their logical form? And how can claims that appear in this way to be false or approximate be tested and confirmed or disconfirmed? These problems have bedeviled economists and economic methodologists from the first methodological reflections to the present day.

3.1 Classical economics and the method a priori

The first extended reflections on economic methodology appear in the work of Nassau Senior (1836) and John Stuart Mill (1836). Their essays must be understood against the background of the prevailing economic theory. Like Smith's economics (to which it owed a great deal) and modern economics, the “classical” economics of the middle decades of the 19th century traced economic regularities to the choices of individuals facing social and natural constraints. But, as compared to Smith, more reliance was placed on severely simplified models. In David Ricardo's Principles of Political Economy (1817), a portrait is drawn in which wages above the subsistence level lead to increases in the population, which in turn require more intensive agriculture or cultivation of inferior land. The extension of cultivation leads to lower profits and higher rents; and the whole tale of economic development leads to a gloomy stationary state in which profits are too low to command any net investment, wages return to subsistence levels, and only the landlords are affluent.

Fortunately for the world, but unfortunately for economic theorists at the time, the data consistently contradicted the trends the theory predicted (de Marchi 1970). Yet the theory continued to hold sway for more than half a century, and the consistently unfavorable data were explained away as due to various “disturbing causes.” It is consequently not surprising then that Senior's and Mill's accounts of the method of economics emphasize the relative autonomy of theory.

Mill distinguishes between two main kinds of inductive methods. The method a posteriori is a method of direct experience. In his view, it is only suitable for phenomena in which few causal factors are operating or in which experimental controls are possible. Mill's famous methods of induction provide an articulation of the method a posteriori. In his method of difference, for example, one holds fixed every causal factor except one and checks to see whether the effect ceases to obtain when that one factor is removed.

Mill maintains that direct inductive methods cannot be used to study phenomena in which many causal factors are in play. If, for example, one attempts to investigate whether tariffs enhance or impede prosperity by comparing the prosperity of nations with high tariffs and nations without high tariffs, the results will be worthless because the prosperity of the countries studied depend on so many other causal factors. So, Mill argues, one needs instead to employ the method a priori. Despite its name, Mill emphasizes that this too is an inductive method. The difference between the method a priori and the method a posteriori is that the method a priori is an indirect inductive method. One first determines the laws governing individual causal factors in domains in which Mill's methods of induction are applicable. Having then determined the laws of the individual causes, one investigates their combined consequences deductively. Finally, there is a role for “verification” of the combined consequences, but owing to the causal complications, this testing has comparatively little weight. The testing of the conclusions serves only as a check on one's deductions and as an indicator of whether there are significant disturbing causes that one has not yet accounted for.

Mill gives the example of the science of the tides. One determines the law of gravitation by studying planetary motion, in which gravity is the only significant causal factor. Then one develops the theory of tides deductively from that law and information concerning the positions and motions of the moon and sun. The implications of the theory will be inexact and sometimes badly mistaken, because many subsidiary causal factors influence tides. By testing the theory one can uncover mistakes in one's deductions and evidence concerning the role of the subsidiary factors. But because of the causal complexity, such testing does little to confirm or disconfirm the law of gravitation, which has already been established. Although Mill does not often use the language of “ceteris paribus”, his view that the principles or “laws” of economics hold in the absence of “interferences” or “disturbing causes” provides an account of how the principles of economics can be true ceteris paribus (Hausman 1992, ch. 8, 12).

Because economic theory includes only the most important causes and necessarily ignores minor causes, its claims, like claims concerning tides, are inexact. Its predictions will be imprecise, and sometimes far off. Mill maintains that it is nevertheless possible to develop and confirm economic theory by studying in simpler domains the laws governing the major causal factors and then deducing their consequences in more complicated circumstances. For example, the statistical data are ambiguous concerning the relationship between minimum wages and unemployment of unskilled workers; and since the minimum wage has never been extremely high, there are no data about what unemployment would be in those circumstances. On the other hand, everyday experience teaches one that firms can choose among more or less labor-intensive processes and that a high minimum wage will make more labor-intensive processes more expensive. On the assumption that firms try to keep their costs down, one has good though not conclusive reason to believe that a high minimum wage will increase unemployment.

In defending a view of economics as in this way inexact and employing the method a priori, Mill was able to reconcile his empiricism and his commitment to Ricardo's economics. Although Mill's views on economic methodology were challenged later in the nineteenth century by economists who believed that the theory was too remote from the contingencies of policy and history (Roscher 1874, Schmoller 1888, 1898), Mill's methodological views dominated the mainstream of economic theory for well over a century (for example, Cairnes 1875). Mill's vision survived the so-called neoclassical revolution in economics beginning in the 1870s and is clearly discernable in the most important methodological treatises concerning neoclassical economics, such as John Neville Keynes' The Scope and Method of Political Economy (1891) or Lionel Robbins' An Essay on the Nature and Significance of Economic Science (1932). Hausman (1992) argues that current methodological practice closely resembles Mill's methodology, despite the fact that few economists would explicitly defend it.

3.2 Friedman and the defense of “unrealistic assumptions”

Although some contemporary philosophers have argued that Mill's method a priori is largely defensible (Bhaskar 1978, Cartwright 1989, and Hausman 1992), by the middle of the Twentieth Century Mill's views appeared to many economists out of step with contemporary philosophy of science. Without studying Mill's text carefully, it was easy for economists to misunderstand his terminology and to regard his method a priori as opposed to empiricism. Others took seriously Mill's view that the basic principles of economics should be empirically established and found evidence to cast doubt on some of the basic principles, particularly the view that firms attempt to maximize profits (Hall and Hitch 1938, Lester 1946, 1947). Methodologists who were well-informed about contemporary developments in philosophy of science, such as Terence Hutchison (1938), denounced “pure theory” in economics as unscientific.

Philosophically reflective economists proposed several ways to replace the old-fashioned Millian view with a more up-to-date methodology that would continue to justify much of current practice (see particularly Machlup 1955, 1960 and Koopmans 1957). By far the most influential of these was Milton Friedman's contribution in his 1953 essay, “The Methodology of Positive Economics.” This essay has had an enormous influence, far more than any other work on methodology.

Friedman begins his essay by distinguishing between positive and normative economics and conjecturing that policy disputes are typically really disputes about the consequences of alternatives and thus are capable of being resolved by progress in positive economics. Turning to positive economics, Friedman asserts (without argument) that the ultimate goal of all positive sciences is correct prediction concerning phenomena not yet observed. He holds a practical view of science and looks to science for predictions that will guide policy.

Since it is difficult or impossible to carry out experiments and since the uncontrolled phenomena economists observe are difficult to interpret (owing to the same causal complexity that bothered Mill), it is hard to judge whether a particular theory is a good basis for predictions or not. Consequently, Friedman argues, economists have supposed that they could test theories by the realism of their “assumptions” rather than by the accuracy of their predictions. Friedman argues at length that this is a grave mistake. Theories may be of great predictive value even though their assumptions are extremely “unrealistic.” The realism of a theory's assumptions is, he maintains, irrelevant to its predictive value. It does not matter whether the assumption that firms maximize profits is realistic. Theories should be appraised exclusively in terms of the accuracy of their predictions. What matters is whether the theory of the firm makes correct and significant predictions.

As critics have pointed out (and almost all commentators have been critical), Friedman refers to several different things as “assumptions” of a theory and means several different things by speaking of assumptions as “unrealistic” (Brunner 1969). Since Friedman aims his criticism to those who investigate empirically whether firms in fact attempt to maximize profits, he must take “assumptions” to include central explanatory generalizations, such as “Firms attempt to maximize profits,” and by “unrealistic,” he must mean, among other things, “false.” In arguing that it is a mistake to appraise theories in terms of the realism of assumptions, Friedman is arguing at least that it is a mistake to appraise theories by investigating whether their central explanatory generalizations are true or false.

It would seem that this interpretation would render Friedman's views inconsistent, because in testing whether firms attempt to maximize profits, one is checking whether predictions of theory concerning the behavior of firms are true or false. An “assumption” such as “firms maximize profits” is itself a prediction. But there is a further wrinkle. Friedman is not concerned with every prediction of economic theories. In Friedman's view, “theory is to be judged by its predictive power for the class of phenomena which it is intended to explain” (1953, p. 8 [italics added]). Economists are interested in only some of the implications of economic theories. Other predictions, such as those concerning the results of Lester's surveys, are irrelevant to policy. What matters is whether economic theories are successful at predicting the phenomena that economists are interested in. In other words, Friedman believes that economic theories should be appraised in terms of their predictions concerning prices and quantities exchanged on markets. In his view, what matters is “narrow predictive success” (Hausman 2008a), not overall predictive adequacy.

So economists can simply ignore the disquieting findings of surveys. They can ignore the fact that people do not always prefer larger bundles of commodities to smaller bundles of commodities. They need not be troubled that some of their models suppose that all agents know the prices of all present and future commodities in all markets. All that matters is whether the predictions concerning market phenomena turn out to be correct. And since anomalous market outcomes could be due to any number of uncontrolled causal factors, while experiments are difficult to carry out, it turns out that economists need not worry about ever encountering evidence that would disconfirm fundamental theory. Detailed models may be confirmed or disconfirmed, but fundamental theory is safe. In this way one can understand how Friedman's methodology, which appears to justify the eclectic and pragmatic view that economists should use any model that appears to “work” regardless of how absurd or unreasonable its assumptions might appear, has been put in service of a rigid theoretical orthodoxy. For other discussions of Friedman's essay, see Bear and Orr 1969, Boland 1979, Hammond 1992, Hirsch and de Marchi 1990, Mäki 1990a, Melitz 1963, Rotwein 1959, and Samuelson 1963.

Over the last two decades there has been a surge of experimentation in economics, and Friedman's methodological views probably do not command the same near unanimity that they used to. But they are still enormously influential, and they still serve as a way of avoiding awkward questions concerning simplifications, idealizations, and abstraction in economics rather than responding to them.

4. Contemporary directions in economic methodology

The past half century has witnessed the emergence of a large literature devoted to economic methodology. That literature explores many methodological approaches and applies its conclusions to many schools and branches of economics. Much of the literature focuses on the fundamental theory of mainstream economics — the theory of the equilibria resulting from constrained rational individual choice. Since 1985, there has been a journal Economic and Philosophy devoted specifically to philosophy of economics, and since 1994 there has also been a Journal of Economic Methodology. This section will sample some of the methodological work that has been done during the past two decades.

4.1 Popperian approaches

Karl Popper's philosophy of science has been influential among economists, as among other scientists. Popper defends what he calls a falsificationist methodology (1968, 1969). Scientists should formulate theories that are “logically falsifiable” — that is, inconsistent with some possible observation reports. “All crows are black” is logically falsifiable, since it is inconsistent with (and would be falsified by) an observation report of a red crow. Second, Popper maintains that scientists should subject theories to harsh test and should be willing to reject them when they fail the tests. Third, scientists should regard theories as at best interesting conjectures. Passing a test does not confirm a theory or provide scientists with reason to believe it. It only justifies continuing to employ it (since it has not yet been falsified) and devoting increased efforts to attempting to falsify it (since it has thus far survived testing). Popper has also written in defense of what he calls “situational logic” (which is basically rational choice theory) as the correct method for the social sciences (1967, 1976). There appear to be serious tensions between Popper's falsificationism and his defense of situational logic, and his discussion of situational logic has not been as influential as his falsificationism. For discussion of how situational logic applies to economics, see Hands (1985a).

Given Popper's falsificationism, there seems little hope of understanding how extreme simplifications can be legitimate or how current economic practice could be scientifically reputable. Specific economic theories are rarely logically falsifiable. When they are, the widespread acceptance of Friedman's methodological views insures that they are not subjected to serious test. When they apparently fail tests, they are rarely repudiated. Economic theories, which have not been well tested, are taken to be well-established guides to policy, rather than merely conjectures. Some critics of neoclassical economics have made these criticisms (Eichner 1983). But most of those who have espoused Popper's philosophy of science have not repudiated mainstream economics and have not been so harshly critical of its practitioners.

Mark Blaug (1992) and Terence Hutchison (1938, 1977, 1978, 2000), who are the most prominent Popperian methodologists, criticize particular features of economics, and they both call for more testing and a more critical attitude. For example, Blaug praises Gary Becker (1976) for his refusal to explain differences in choices by differences in preferences, but criticizes him for failing to go on and test his theories severely (1980a, chapter 14). However, both Blaug and Hutchison understate the radicalism of Popper's views and take his message to be little more than that scientists should be critical and concerned to test their theories.

Blaug's and Hutchison's criticisms have sometimes been challenged on the grounds that economic theories cannot be tested, because of their ceteris paribus clauses and the many subsidiary assumptions required to derive testable implications (Caldwell 1984). But this response ignores Popper's insistence that testing requires methodological decisions not to attribute failures of predictions to mistakes in subsidiary assumptions or to “interferences.” For views of Popper's philosophy and its applicability to economics, see de Marchi (1988), Caldwell (1991), and Boland (1982, 1989, 1992).

Applying Popper's views on falsification literally would be destructive. Not only neoclassical economics, but all known economic theories would be condemned as unscientific, and there would be no way to discriminate among economic theories. One major problem is that one cannot derive testable implications from theories by themselves. To derive testable implications, one also needs subsidiary assumptions concerning distributions, measurement devices, proxies for unmeasured variables, the absence of various interferences, and so forth. This is the so-called “Duhem-Quine problem” (Duhem 1906, Quine 1953, Cross 1982). These problems arise generally, and Popper proposes that they be solved by a methodological decision to regard a failure of the deduced testable implication to be a failure of the theory. But in economics the subsidiary assumptions are dubious and in many cases known to be false. Making the methodological decision that Popper requires is unreasonable and would lead one to reject all economic theories.

Imre Lakatos (1970), who was for most of his philosophical career a follower of Popper, offers a broadly Popperian solution to this problem. Lakatos insists that testing is always comparative. When theories face empirical difficulties, as they always do, one attempts to modify them. Scientifically acceptable (in Lakatos' terminology “theoretically progressive”) modifications must always have some additional testable implications and are thus not purely ad hoc. If some of the new predictions are confirmed, then the modification is “empirically progressive,” and one has reason to reject the unmodified theory and to employ the new theory, regardless of how unsuccessful in general either theory may be. Though progress may be hard to come by, Lakatos' views do not have the same destructive implications as Popper's. Lakatos appears to solve the problem of how to appraise mainstream economic theory by arguing that what matters is empirical progress or retrogression rather than empirical success or failure. Lakatos' views have thus been more attractive to economic methodologists than Popper's.

Developing Thomas Kuhn's notion of a “paradigm” (1970) and some hints from Popper, Lakatos also developed a view of the global theory structure of whole theoretical enterprises, which he called “scientific research programmes.” Lakatos emphasized that there is a “hard core” of basic theoretical propositions that define a research programme and are not to be questioned within the research programme. In addition members of a research programme accept a common body of heuristics that guide them in the articulation and modification of specific theories. These views have also been attractive to economic methodologists, since theory development in economics is so sharply constrained and since economics appears at first glance to have a “hard core.” The fact that economists do not give up basic theoretical postulates that appear to be false might be explained and justified by regarding them as part of the “hard core” of the neoclassical research programme.

Yet Lakatos' views do not provide a satisfactory account of how economics can be a reputable science despite its reliance on extreme simplifications. For it is questionable whether the development of neoclassical economic theory has demonstrated empirical progress. For example, the replacement of “cardinal” utility theory by “ordinal” utility theory (see below Section 5.1) in the 1930's, which is generally regarded as a major step forward, involved the replacement of one theory by another that was strictly weaker and which had no additional empirical content. Furthermore, despite his emphasis on heuristics as guiding theory modification, Lakatos still emphasizes testing. Science is for Lakatos more empirically driven than is contemporary economics (Hands 1992). It is also doubtful whether research enterprises in economics have “hard cores” (Hoover 1991, Hausman 1992, ch. 6). For attempts to apply Lakatos' views to economics see Latsis (1976), and Weintraub (1985). As is apparent in de Marchi and Blaug (1991), writers on economic methodology have in recent years become increasingly disenchanted with Lakatos' philosophy.

There is a second major problem with Popper's philosophy of science, which plagues Lakatos' views as well. Both maintain that there is no such thing as empirical confirmation (for some late qualms of Lakatos see Lakatos 1974). Popper and Lakatos maintain that evidence never provides reason to believe that scientific claims are true, and both also deny that results of tests can justify relying on statements in practical endeavours or in theoretical inquiry. There is no better evidence for one unfalsified proposition than for another. Someone who questions whether there is enough evidence for some proposition to justify relying on it in theoretical studies or for policy purposes would be making the methodological “error” of supposing that there can be evidence in support of hypotheses. With the notable exception of Watkins (1984), few philosophers within the Popperian tradition have faced up to this radical consequence.

4.2 The rhetoric of economics

One radical reaction to the difficulties of justifying the reliance on severe simplifications is to deny that economics passes methodological muster. Alexander Rosenberg (1992) maintains that economics can only make imprecise generic predictions, and it cannot make progress, because it is built around folk psychology, which is a mediocre theory of human behavior and which (owing to the irreducibility of intentional notions) cannot be improved. Complex economic theories are valuable only as applied mathematics, not as empirical theory. Since economics does not show the same consistent progress as the natural sciences, one cannot dismiss Rosenberg's suggestion that economics is an empirical dead end. But his view that it has made no progress and that it does not permit quantitative predictions is hard to accept. For example, contemporary economists are much better at pricing stock options than economists were even a generation ago.

An equally radical but opposite reaction is Deirdre McCloskey's, who denies that there are any non-trivial methodological standards that economics must meet (1985, 1994). In her view, the only relevant and significant criteria for assessing the practices and products of a discipline are those accepted by the practitioners. Apart from a few general standards such as honesty and a willingness to listen to criticisms, the only justifiable criteria for any conversation are those of the participants. Economists can thus dismiss the arrogant pretensions of philosophers to judge economic discourse. Whatever a group of economists takes to be good economics is good economics. Philosophical standards of empirical success are just so much hot air. Those who are interested in understanding the character of economics and in contributing to its improvement should eschew methodology and study instead the “rhetoric” of economics — that is, the means of argument and persuasion that succeed among economists.

McCloskey's studies of the rhetoric of economics have been valuable and influential (1985, esp. ch. 5-7), but much of her work consists not of such studies but of philosophical critiques of economic methodology. These are more problematic, because the position sketched in the previous paragraph is hard to defend and potentially self-defeating. It is hard to defend, because epistemological standards for good science have already infected the conversation of economists. The standards of predictive success which lead one to have qualms about economics are already standards that many economists accept. The only way to escape these doubts is to surrender the standards that gave rise to them. But McCloskey's position undermines any principled argument for a change in standards. Furthermore, as Alexander Rosenberg has argued (1988), it seems that economists would doom themselves to irrelevance if they were to surrender standards of predictive success, for it is upon such standards that policy decisions are made.

McCloskey does not, in fact, want to preclude all criticisms that economists are sometimes persuaded when they should not be or are not persuaded when they should be. For she herself criticizes the bad habit some economists have of conflating statistical significance with economic importance (1985, ch. 9). Sometimes McCloskey characterizes rhetoric descriptively as the study of what in fact persuades, but sometimes she characterizes it normatively as the study of what ought to persuade (1985, ch. 2). And if rhetoric is the study of what ought to persuade, then it is methodology, not an alternative to methodology. Questions about whether economics is a successful empirical science cannot be conjured away.

4.3 “Realism” in economic methodology

Economic methodologist have paid little attention to debates within philosophy of science between realists and anti-realists (van Fraassen 1980, Boyd 1984), because economic theories rarely postulate the existence of unobservable entities or properties, apart from variants of “everyday unobservables,” such as beliefs and desires. Methodologists have, on the other hand, vigorously debated the goals of economics, but those who argue that the ultimate goals are predictive (such as Milton Friedman) do so because of their interest in policy, not because they seek to avoid or resolve epistemological and semantic puzzles concerning references to unobservables.

Nevertheless there are two important recent realist programs in economic methodology. The first, developed mainly by Uskali Mäki, is devoted to exploring the varieties of realism implicit in the methodological statements and theoretical enterprises of economists (see Mäki 1990a, b, c, 2007). The second, which is espoused by Tony Lawson and his co-workers, mainly at Cambridge University, derives from the work of Roy Bhaskar (1978) (see Lawson 1997, Bhaskar et al. 1998, and Fleetwood 1999). In Lawson's view, one can trace many of the inadequacies of mainstream economics (of which he is a critic) to an insufficient concern with ontology. In attempting to identify regularities on the surface of the phenomena, mainstream economists are doomed to failure. Economic phenomena are in fact influenced by a large number of different causal factors, and one can achieve scientific knowledge only of the underlying mechanisms and tendencies, whose operation can be glimpsed intermittently and obscurely in observable relations. Mäki's and Lawson's programs obviously have little to do with one another, though Mäki (like Mill, Cartwright, and Hausman) shares Lawson's and Bhaskar's concern with underlying causal mechanisms. See also the entry on Scientific Realism.

4.4 Economic methodology and social studies of science

Throughout its history, economics has been the subject of sociological as well as methodological scrutiny. Many sociological discussions of economics, like Marx's critique of classical political economy, have been concerned to identify ideological distortions and thereby to criticize particular aspects of economic theory and economic policy. Since every political program finds economists who testify to its economic virtues, there is a never-ending source of material for such critiques.

The influence of contemporary sociology of science and social studies of science, coupled with the difficulties methodologists have had making sense of and rationalizing the conduct of economics, have led to a sociological turn within methodological reflection itself. Rather than showing that there is good evidence supporting developments in economic theory or that those developments have other broadly epistemic virtues, methodologists and historians such as D. Wade Hands (2001); Hands and Mirowski 1998), Philip Mirowski (2002), and E. Roy Weintraub (1991) have argued that these changes reflect a wide variety of non-rational factors, from changes in funding for theoretical economics, political commitments, personal rivalries, attachments to metaphors, or mathematical interests.

Furthermore, many of the same methodologists and historians have argued that economics is not only an object of social inquiry, but also as a tool of social inquiry. By studying the incentive structure of scientific disciplines and the implicit or explicit market forces impinging on research (including of course research in economics), it should be possible to write the economics of science and the economics of economics itself (Hands 1995, Hull 1988, and Leonard 2002).

Exactly how, if at all, this work is supposed to bear on questions concerning how well supported are the claims economists make is not clear. Though eschewing traditional methodology, Mirowski's monograph on the role of physical analogy in economics (1990) is often very critical of mainstream economics. In his recent Reflection without Rules (2001) D. W. Hands maintains that general methodological rules are of little use. He defends a naturalistic view of methodology and is skeptical of prescriptions that are not based on detailed knowledge. But he does not argue that no rules apply.

4.5 Detailed contemporary studies

The above survey of approaches to the fundamental problems of appraising economic theory is far from complete. For example, there have been substantial efforts to apply structuralist views of scientific theories (Sneed 1971, Stegmüller 1976, 1979) to economics (Stegmüller et al. 1981, Hamminga 1983, Hands 1985c, Balzer and Hamminga 1989). The above discussion does at least document the diversity and disagreements concerning how to interpret and appraise economic theories. It is not surprising that there is no consensus among those writing on economic methodology concerning the overall empirical appraisal of specific approaches in economics, including mainstream microeconomics, macroeconomics, and econometrics. When practitioners cannot agree, it is questionable whether those who know more philosophy but less economics will be able to settle the matter. Since the debates continue, those who reflect on economic methodology should have a continuing part to play.

Meanwhile, there are many other more specific methodological questions to address, and it is a sign of the maturity of the subdiscipline that a large and increasing percentage of work on economic methodology addresses more specific questions. There is plethora of work, as a perusal of any recent issue of the Journal of Economic Methodology or Economics and Philosophy will confirm. Some of the range of issues currently under discussion were mentioned above in Section 2. Here is a list of three of the many areas of current interest:

1. Although more concerned with the content of economics than with its methodology, the recent explosion of work on feminist economics is shot through with methodological (and sociological) self-reflection. The fact that a larger percentage of economists are men than is true of any of the other social sciences and indeed than several of the natural sciences raises methodological questions about whether there is something particularly masculine about the discipline. Important texts are Ferber and Nelson (1993), Nelson (1995, 1996, 2001), Barker and Kuiper 2003. Since 1995, there has been a journal, Feminist Economics, which pulls together much of this work.

2. A century ago economists talked of their work in terms of “principles,” “laws,” and “theories.” Nowadays the standard intellectual tool or form is a “model.” Is this just a change in terminological fashion, or does the concern with models signal a methodological shift? What are models? These questions have been discussed by Cartwright 1989, 1999, Hausman 1992, Mäki, ed. 1991, Morgan 2001, Morgan and Morrison 1999, Rappaport 1998, and Sugden 2000.

3. During the past generation, experimental work in economics has expanded rapidly. This work has many different objectives (see Roth 1988) and apparently holds out the prospect of bridging the gulf between economic theory and empirical evidence. Some of it casts light on the way in which methodological commitments influence the extent to which economists heed empirical evidence. For example, in the case of preference reversals, discussed briefly below in Section 5.1, economists devoted considerable attention to the experimental findings and conceded that they disconfirmed central principles of economics. But economists were generally unwilling to pay serious attention to the theories proposed by psychologists that predicted the phenomena before they were observed. The reason seems to be that these psychological theories do not have the same wide scope as the basic principles of mainstream economics (Hausman 1992, chapter 13). The methodological commitments governing theoretical economics are much more complex and much more specific to economics than the general rules proposed by philosophers such as Popper and Lakatos.

The relevance of experimentation remains however controversial. There are many questions about whether experimental findings can be generalized to non-experimental contexts and, more generally, concerning the possibilities of learning from experiments. See Guala (2000a, b, 2005), Hey (1991), Kagel and Roth (1995, 2008), Plott (1991), Smith (1991), Starmer (1999), Camerer (2003), and the June, 2005 special issue of the Journal of Economic Methodology.

5. Rational choice theory

Insofar as economics explains and predicts phenomena as consequences of individual choices, which are themselves explained in terms of reasons, it must depict agents as to some extent rational. Rationality, like reasons, involves evaluation, and just as one can assess the rationality of individual choices, so one can assess the rationality of social choices and examine how they are and ought to be related to the preferences and judgments of individuals. In addition, there are intricate questions concerning rationality in strategic situations in which outcomes depend on the choices of multiple individuals. Since rationality is a central concept in branches of philosophy such as action theory, epistemology, ethics, and philosophy of mind, studies of rationality frequently cross the boundaries between economics and philosophy and thus constitute one of the domains of philosophy of economics.

5.1 Individual rationality

The barebones theory of rationality discussed above in Section 1.1 takes an agent's preferences (rankings of objects of choice) to be rational if they are complete and transitive, and it takes the agent's choice to be rational if the agent does not prefer any feasible alternative to what he or she chooses. Such a theory of rationality is clearly too weak, because it says nothing about belief or what rationality implies when agents do not know (with certainty) everything relevant to their choices. But it may also be too strong, since, as Isaac Levi in particular has argued (1986), there is nothing irrational about having incomplete preferences in situations involving uncertainty. Sometimes it is rational to suspend judgment and to defer ranking alternatives that are not well understood. On the other hand, transitivity is a plausible condition, and the so-called “money pump” argument demonstrates that if one's preferences are intransitive, then one can be exploited. (Suppose an agent A prefers X to Y, Y to Z and Z to X, and that A will pay some small amount of money $P to exchange Y for X, Z for Y, and X for Z. That means that, starting with Z, A will pay $P for Y, then $P again for X, then $P again for Z and so on. Agents are not this stupid. They will instead adjust their preferences to eliminate the intransitivity (but see Schick 1986).

On the other hand, there is considerable experimental evidence that people's preferences are not in fact transitive. Such evidence does not establish that transitivity is not a requirement of rationality. It may show instead that people are sometimes irrational. In the case of so-called “preference reversals,” for example, it seems plausible that people in fact make irrational choices (Lichtenstein and Slovic 1971, Tversky and Thaler 1990). Evidence of persistent violations of transitivity is disquieting, since standards of rationality should not be impossibly high.

A further difficulty with the barebones theory of rationality concerns the individuation of the objects of preference or choice. Consider, for example, data from multistage ultimatum games. Suppose A can propose any division of $10 between A and B. B can accept or reject A's proposal. If B rejects the proposal, then the amount of money drops to $5, and B gets to offer a division of the $5 which A can accept or reject. If A rejects B's offer, then both players get nothing. Suppose that A proposes to divide the money with $7 for A and $3 for B. B declines and offers to split the $5 evenly, with $2.50 for each. Behavior such as this is, in fact, common (Ochs and Roth 1989, p. 362). Assuming that B prefers more money to less, these choices appear to be a violation of transitivity. B prefers $3 to $2.50, yet declines $3 for certain for $2.50 (with some slight chance of A declining and B getting nothing). But the objects of choice are not just quantities of money. B is turning down $3 as part of “a raw deal” in favor of $2.50 as part of a fair arrangement. If the objects of choice are defined in this way, there is no failure of transitivity.

This plausible observation gives rise to a serious problem. Unless there are constraints on how the objects of choice are individuated, conditions of rationality such as transitivity are empty. A's choice of X over Y, Y over Z and Z over X does not violate transitivity if “X when the alternative is Y” is not the same object of choice as “X when the alternative is Z”. John Broome (1991) argues that further substantive principles of rationality are required to limit how alternatives are individuated or to require that agents be indifferent between alternatives such as “X when the alternative is Y” and “X when the alternative is Z.”

To extend the theory of rationality to circumstances involving risk (where the objects of choice are lotteries with known probabilities) and uncertainty (where agents do not know the probabilities or perhaps even the payoffs in the lotteries among which they are choosing) requires further principles of rationality, as well as controversial technical simplifications. Subjective Bayesians suppose that individuals in circumstances of uncertainty have well-defined subjective probabilities over all the payoffs and thus that the objects of choice can be modeled as lotteries, just as in circumstances involving risk, though with subjective probabilities in place of objective probabilities. See the entries on Bayes' theorem and Bayesian epistemology. The central additional principle of rationality decision theorists invoke is the independence condition. Suppose an agent is offered a choice between two bets involving flipping a fair coin. In both cases the agent loses $1 if the coin lands tails, but the prizes the agent wins if the coin lands heads differ. The independence condition says that rational agents should prefer the first bet to the second bet if and only if the agent prefers the prize in the first bet when the coin lands heads to the prize in the second bet when the coin lands heads. An agent A is irrational if A prefers X to Y, but A does not prefer the lottery [(X, 0.5), ($-1, 0.5)] to [(Y, 0.5), ($-1, 0.5)]. Although initially plausible, the independence condition is very controversial. See Allais and Hagen (1979) and McClennen (1983, 1990).

A considerable part of rational choice theory is concerned with formalizations of conditions of rationality and investigation of their implications. When an agent's preferences are complete and transitive and satisfy a further continuity condition, then they can be represented by a so-called ordinal utility function. What this means is that it is possible to define a function that represents an agent's preferences so that U(X) > U(Y) if and only if the agent prefers X to Y, and U(X) = U(Y) if and only if the agent is indifferent between X and Y. This function merely represents the preference ranking. It contains no information beyond the ranking. Any order-preserving transformation of “U” would represent the agent's preferences just as well.

When an agent's preferences in addition satisfy the independence condition and some other technical conditions, then they can be represented by an expected utility function (Harsanyi 1977b, ch. 4, Hernstein and Milnor 1953, Ramsey 1926, and Savage 1972). Such a function has two important properties. First, the expected utility of a lottery is equal to the expectation of the expected utilities of its prizes. Suppose, for example, that a lottery L has two prizes W and Z and the probability of winning W is p (and hence the probability of winning Z is 1 - p). Then if U is an expected utility function representing the agent's preferences, U(L) = pU(W) + (1 - p)U(Z). Second, expected utility functions are unique up to a positive affine transformation. What this means is that if U and V are both expected utility functions representing the preferences of an agent, then for all objects of preference, X, V(X) must be equal to aU(X) + b, where a and b are real numbers and a is positive. In addition, the axioms of rationality imply that the agent's degrees of belief will satisfy the axioms of the probability calculus.

A great deal of controversy surrounds the theory of rationality, and there have been many formal investigations into weakened or amended theories of rationality. For further discussion, see Allais and Hagen 1979, Barberà, Hammond and Seidl 1999, Kahneman and Tversky 1979, Loomes and Sugden 1982, Luce and Raiffa 1957 and Machina 1987.

5.2 Collective rationality and social choice

Although societies are very different from individuals, they evaluate alternatives and make choices, which may be rational or irrational. It is not, however, obvious, what principles of rationality should govern the choices and evaluations of society. Transitivity is one plausible condition. It seems that a society that chooses X when faced with the alternatives X or Y, Y when faced with the alternatives Y or Z and Z when faced with the alternatives X or Z either has had a change of heart or is choosing irrationally. Yet, purported irrationalities such as these can easily arise from standard mechanisms that aim to link social choices and individual preferences. Suppose there are three individuals in the society. Individual One ranks the alternatives X, Y, Z. Individual Two ranks them Y, Z, X. Individual Three ranks them Z, X, Y. If decisions are made by pairwise majority voting, X will be chosen from the pair (X, Y), Y will be chosen from (Y, Z), and Z will be chosen from (X, Z). Clearly this is unsettling, but are possible cycles in social choices irrational?

Similar problems affect what one might call the logical coherence of social judgments (List and Pettit 2002). Suppose society consists of three individuals who make the following judgments concerning the truth or falsity of the propositions P and Q and that social judgment follows the majority.

  P if P then Q Q
Individual 1 true true true
Individual 2 false true false
Individual 3 true false false
Society true true false

The judgments of each of the individuals are consistent with the principles of logic, while social judgments violate them. How important is it that social judgments be consistent with the principles of logic?

Although social choice theory in this way bears on questions of social rationality, most work in social choice theory explores the consequences of principles of rationality coupled with explicitly ethical constraints. The seminal contribution is Kenneth Arrow's impossibility theorem (1963, 1967). Arrow assumes that both individual preferences and social choices are complete and transitive and (as completeness implies) that the method of making social choices issues in some choice for any possible profile of individual preferences. In addition, he imposes a weak unanimity condition: if everybody prefers X to Y, then Y must not be chosen. Third, he requires that there be no dictator whose preferences determine social choices irrespective of the preferences of anybody else. Lastly, he imposes the condition that the social choice between X and Y should depend on how individuals rank X and Y and on nothing else. He proved the surprising result that no method of relating social choices and individual preferences can satisfy all these conditions!

In the half-century since Arrow wrote, there has been a plethora of work in social choice theory, a good deal of which is arguably of great importance to ethics. For example, John Harsanyi proved that if individual preferences and social evaluations both satisfy the axioms of expected utility theory (with shared or objective probabilities) and a stronger unanimity condition is imposed, then social evaluations are determined by a weighted sum of individual utilities (1955, 1977a). When there are instead disagreements in probability assignments, there is an impossibility result: the unanimity condition implies that social evaluations will not satisfy the axioms of expected utility theory (Hammond 1983, Seidenfeld, et al. 1989, Mongin 1995). For further discussion of social choice theory and the relevance of utility theory to social evaluation, see Sen (1970) and for a recent reappraisal Fleurbaey (2007).

5.3 Game theory

When outcomes depend on what several agents do, one agent's best choice may depend on what other agents choose. Although the principles of rationality governing individual choice still apply, arguably there are further principles of rationality governing expectations of the actions of others (and of their expectations concerning your actions and expectations, and so forth). Game theory occupies an increasingly important role within economics itself, and it is also relevant both to inquiries concerning rationality and inquiries concerning ethics. For further discussion see the entries on Game Theory, Game Theory and Ethics, and Evolutionary Game Theory.

6. Economics and ethics

As discussed above in Section 2.1 most economists would insist that one distinguish between positive and normative economics, and most would argue that economics is mainly relevant to policy because of the information it provides concerning the consequences of policy. Yet the same economists who so sharply distinguish positive and normative economics will often turn around and offer their advice concerning how to fix the economy. In addition, there is a whole field of normative economics.

Economic outcomes, institutions, and processes may be better or worse in several different ways. Some outcomes may make people better off. Other outcomes may be less unequal. Others may restrict individual freedom more severely. Economists typically evaluate outcomes exclusively in terms of welfare. This does not imply that they believe that only welfare is of moral importance. They focus on welfare, because they believe that economics provides a particularly apt set of tools to address questions of welfare and because they believe or hope that questions about welfare can be separated from questions about equality, freedom, or justice. As sketched below, economists have had some things to say about other dimensions of moral appraisal, but welfare takes center stage. Indeed normative economics is called “welfare economics.”

6.1 Welfare

One central question of moral philosophy has been to determine what things are intrinsically good for human beings. This is a central question, because all plausible moral views assign an important place to individual welfare or well-being. This is obviously true of utilitarianism (which hold that what is right maximizes total or average welfare), but even non-utilitarian views must be concerned with welfare, if they recognize the virtue of benevolence, or if they are concerned with the interests of individuals or with avoiding harm to individuals.

There are many theories of well-being, and the prevailing view among economists themselves has shifted from hedonism (which takes the good to be a mental state such as pleasure or happiness) to the view that welfare is the satisfaction of preferences. Unlike hedonism, taking welfare to be the satisfaction of preference specifies how to find out what is good for a person rather than committing itself to any substantive view of a person's good. Note that equating welfare with the satisfaction of preferences is not equating welfare with any feeling of satisfaction. If welfare is the satisfaction of preferences, then a person is better off if what he or she prefers comes to pass, regardless of whether that occurrence makes the agent feel satisfied.

Since mainstream economics attributes a consistent preference ordering to all agents, and since more specific models typically take agents to be well-informed and self-interested, it is easy for economists to accept the view that an individual agent A will prefer X to Y if and only if X is in fact better for A than Y is. This is one place where positive theory bleeds into normative theory. In addition the identification of welfare with the satisfaction of preferences is attractive to economists, because it prevents questions about the justification of paternalism (to which most economists are strongly opposed) from even arising.

There are however many obvious objections to the view that well-being is the satisfaction of preferences. Preferences may be based on mistaken beliefs. People may prefer to sacrifice their own well-being for some purpose they value more highly. Preferences may reflect past manipulation or distorting psychological influences (Elster 1983). Taking well-being to be the satisfaction of preferences makes it very difficult to make interpersonal comparisons of well-being. (Although mental states are hard to measure, it is easier to make sense of a comparison of A's happiness to B's happiness than it is to make sense of a comparison of the extent to which A's and B's preferences are satisfied.) In addition there are objections to basing policy on identifying welfare with the satisfaction of preferences. Doing so implies that one can make people better off by molding their wants rather than by providing them with goods and services. Furthermore, it seems unreasonable that social policy should attend to extravagant preferences. Rather than responding to these objections and defending this theory of welfare, most economists would argue that the satisfaction of preference is instead a good empirical proxy for whatever it is that welfare “really” is. There are some exceptions, most notably Amartya Sen (1987a,b,c, 1992), but most economists take welfare to be the satisfaction of preference.

6.2 Efficiency

Because the preference satisfaction view of welfare makes it questionable whether one can make interpersonal welfare comparisons, few economists defend a utilitarian view of policy as maximizing total or average welfare. (Harsanyi is one exception, for another see Ng 1983). Economists have instead explored the possibility of making welfare evaluations of economic processes, institutions, outcomes, and policies without making interpersonal comparisons. Consider two economic outcomes S and R, and suppose that some people prefer S to R and that nobody prefers R to S. In that case S is “Pareto superior” to R, or S is a “Pareto improvement” over R. Without making any interpersonal comparisons, one can conclude that people's preferences are better satisfied in S than in R. If there is no state of affairs that is Pareto superior to S, then economists say that S is “Pareto optimal” or “Pareto efficient.” Efficiency here is efficiency with respect to satisfying preferences rather than minimizing the number of inputs needed to produce a unit of output or some other technical notion (Legrand 1991). If a state of affairs is not Pareto efficient, then society is missing an opportunity costlessly to satisfy some people's preferences better. A Pareto efficient state of affairs avoids this failure, but it has no other obvious virtues. For example, suppose nobody is satiated and people care only about how much food they get. Consider two distributions of food. In the first, millions are starving but no food is wasted. In the second, nobody is starving, but some food is wasted. The first is Pareto efficient, while the second is not.

The notions of Pareto improvements and Pareto efficiency might seem useless, because economic policies almost always have both winners and losers. Mainstream economists have nevertheless found these concepts useful in two ways. First, they have proved two theorems concerning properties of perfectly competitive equilibria (Arrow 1968). The first theorem says that perfectly competitive equilibria are Pareto optimal, while the second says that any Pareto optimal allocation, with whatever distribution of income policy makers might prefer, can be achieved as a perfectly competitive equilibrium, provided that one begins with just the right distribution of endowments among economic agents. The first theorem has been regarded as underwriting Adam Smith's view of the invisible hand (Arrow and Hahn 1971, preface; Hahn 1973). This interpretation is problematic, because no economy has ever been or will ever be in perfectly competitive equilibrium. The second theorem provides some justification for the normative division of labor economists prefer, with economists concerned about efficiency and others concerned about justice. The thought is that theories of just distribution are compatible with reliance on competitive markets. These theorems go some way toward explaining why mainstream economists, whether they support laissez-faire policies or government intervention to remedy market imperfections, think of perfectly competitive equilibria as ideals. But the significance of the theorems is debatable, since actual markets differ significantly from perfectly competitive markets and, when there are multiple market imperfections, the “theory of the second best” shows that fixing some of the imperfections may lead the society away from a perfectly competitive equilibrium rather than toward one (Lipsey and Lancaster 1956-7).

The other way that economists have found to extend the Pareto efficiency notions leads to cost-benefit analysis, which is a practical tool for policy analysis (Mishan 1971; Sugden and Williams 1978; Adler and Posner 2000, 2006). Suppose that S is not a Pareto improvement over R. Some members of the society would be losers in a shift from R to S. They prefer R to S, but there are enough winners — enough people who prefer S to R — that the winners could compensate the losers and make the preference for S′ (S with compensation paid) over R unanimous. S is a “potential Pareto improvement” over R. In other terms, the amount of money the winners would be willing to pay to bring about the change is larger than the amount of money the losers would have to be compensated so as not to object to the change. (Economists are skeptical about what one learns from asking people how much they would be willing to pay and attempt to infer this information indirectly from market phenomena, but what matters in principle is willingness to pay.) When S is a potential Pareto improvement over R, there is said to be a “net benefit” to the policy of bringing about S. According to cost-benefit analysis, among eligible policies (which satisfy legal and moral constraints), one should, other things being equal, employ the one with the largest net benefit. Note that the compensation is not paid. It is entirely hypothetical. There are losers. Justice or beneficence may require that the society do something to mitigate their losses. Because there is a larger “pie” of goods and services to satisfy preferences (since compensation could be paid and everybody's preferences better satisfied), selecting policies with the greatest net benefit serves economic efficiency (Hicks 1939, Kaldor 1939).

Despite the practical importance of cost-benefit analysis, the technique and the justification for it sketched in the previous paragraph are controversial. One technical difficulty is that it is possible for S to be a potential Pareto improvement over R and for R to be a potential Pareto improvement over S (Scitovsky 1941, Samuelson 1950). That means that the fact that S is a potential Pareto improvement over R does not imply that there is a larger economic “pie” in S than in R, because there cannot, of course, be a larger economic pie in S than in R and a larger economic pie in R than in S. A second problem is that willingness to pay for some policy and the amount one would require in compensation if one opposes the policy depend on how much wealth one has as well as on one's attitude to the policy. Cost-benefit analysis weights the preferences of the rich more than the preferences of the poor (Baker 1975). It is possible to compensate roughly for the effects of income and wealth (Harburger 1978), but it is bothersome to do so, and cost-benefit analysis is commonly employed without any adjustment for wealth or income.

6.3 Other directions in normative economics

Although welfare economics and concerns about efficiency dominate normative economics, they do not exhaust the subject, and in collaboration with philosophers, economists have made a wide variety of important contributions to contemporary work in ethics and normative social and political philosophy. Section 5.2 and Section 5.3 gave some hint of the contributions of social choice theory and game theory. In addition economists and philosophers have been working on the problem of providing a formal characterization of freedom so as to bring tools of economic analysis to bear (Pattanaik and Xu 1990, Sen 1988, 1990, 1991, Carter 1999). Others have developed formal characterizations of equality of resources, opportunity, and outcomes and have analyzed the conditions under which it is possible to separate individual and social responsibility for inequalities (Pazner and Schmeidler 1974, Varian 1974, 1975, Roemer 1986b, 1987, Fleurbaey 1995, 2002, 2005). John Roemer has put contemporary economic modeling to work to offer precise characterizations of exploitation (1982). Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum have not only developed novel interpretations of well-being in terms of capabilities (Sen 1992, Nussbaum and Sen 1993, Nussbaum 2000), but Sen has linked them to characterizations of egalitarianism and to operational measures of deprivation (1999). There are many lively interactions between normative economics and moral philosophy. See also the entries on Libertarianism, Paternalism, Egalitarianism, and Economic Justice.

7. Conclusions

There is an enormous amount of activity at the frontiers between economics and philosophy concerned with methodology, rationality, ethics and normative social and political philosophy. This work is diverse and addresses very different questions. Although many of these are related, philosophy of economics is not a single unified enterprise. It is a collection of separate inquiries linked to one another by connections among the questions and by the dominating influence of mainstream economic models and techniques.


The following bibliography is not comprehensive. It generally avoids separate citations for methodological essays in collections. It does not list separately the essays on economic methodology from the special issues on philosophy and economics of Philosophical Forum (vol. 14, no. 3-4, Spring-Summer, 1983), or Richerche Economiche, vol. 43, no. 1-2, January-June, 1989.

Readers may want to consult the Journal of Economic Methodology, vol. 8 #1, March 2001 Millennium symposium on “The Past, Present and Future of Economic Methodology”. For an encyclopedic overview of economic methodology, see the Handbook of Economic Methodology edited by Davis, Hands, and Mäki. For a comprehensive bibliography of works on economic methodology through 1988, see Redman 1989. Essays from economics journals are indexed in The Journal of Economic Literature, and the Index of Economic Articles in Journal and Collective Volumes also indexes collections. Since 1991, works on methodology can be found under the number B4. Works on ethics and economics can be found under the numbers A13, D6, and I3. Discussions of rationality and game theory can be found under A1, C7, D00, D7, D8, and D9.

Economic methodology

Ethics and economics


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Related Entries

action | Bayes' Theorem | economics and economic justice | epistemology: Bayesian | folk psychology: as a theory | game theory | game theory: and ethics | game theory: evolutionary | Lakatos, Imre | Popper, Karl