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Harold Arthur Prichard

First published Mon Jan 26, 2009; substantive revision Thu Feb 12, 2009

Harold Prichard was the acknowledged leader of a group of moral philosophers who worked together in Oxford between the two World Wars, and which included W. D. Ross, E. F. Carritt (a pupil of Prichard's) and H. W. B. Joseph. These men, together with C. D. Broad and A. C. Ewing, who worked at Cambridge, have come to be known as the British Intuitionists.

1. Prichard's Life

Born in London in 1871, the eldest child of Walter Stennett Prichard (a solicitor) and his wife Lucy, Harold Prichard attended Clifton College in Bristol and was admitted to New College, Oxford to study mathematics. But after taking First Class honours in mathematical moderations (preliminary examinations) in 1891, he studied Greats (ancient history and philosophy) taking First Class Honours in 1894. He also played tennis for Oxford against Cambridge. On leaving Oxford he spent a brief period working for a firm of solicitors in London, before returning to Oxford where he spent the rest of his life, first as Fellow of Hertford College (1895–8) and then of Trinity College (1898–1924). He took early retirement from Trinity in 1924 on grounds of temporary ill-health, but recovered and was elected to the White's Professorship of Moral Philosophy in 1928. He retired in 1937 and died in 1947.

Prichard is mainly known for his work in moral philosophy, but the first of his very few publications were in epistemology. His main intellectual debt was to his teacher John Cook Wilson, whose thinking centered on topics in epistemology and what would now be called philosophical logic, rather than in ethics. In 1909 Prichard published his only book, Kant's Theory of Knowledge, which was an account of Kant's Transcendental Idealism. This book criticized Kant severely, and Prichard acknowledges that his main arguments against Kant originated from Cook Wilson. The book's main conclusion is that ‘Knowledge is sui generis and therefore a ‘theory’ of knowledge is impossible. Knowledge is knowledge, and any attempt to state it is terms of something else must end in describing something which is not knowledge’ (p. 247). This view that a ‘theory’ of knowledge is impossible has its analogue in Prichard's later argument that there can be no philosophical account of rightness of the sort that moral philosophers have traditionally tried to provide.

Cook Wilson's influence is also evident in Prichard's argument against Kant's view that we cannot know things in themselves, but only know them as they present themselves, or appear, to us. Prichard inherits from Cook Wilson the view that any state of mind that affects the nature of its presentations cannot be knowledge. Knowledge can only be of what it does not affect; its object must be entirely independent. In Kant's terms, then, the only possible objects of knowledge are things in themselves. Phenomena, or (better) things as they appear to us, cannot be known at all, but must be the objects of some other state of mind. This turns Kant's position upside down.

The view that knowledge must be of what is independent is basic to Prichard's persistent attacks on the notion of a sense-datum (and thereby on Russell, Moore and Price). A sense-datum, he says, is supposed to be something of whose existence we know in every case of perception. But sense-data are not supposed to have an independent existence, and therefore the very conception of a sense-datum involves a contradiction. As Prichard sees it, the basic mistake made by defenders of a sense-datum theory is that of supposing that perceiving is a form of knowing; all the other errors flow from this (Prichard 1938).

Prichard continued to work and to lecture on topics in epistemology, in particular perception. He gave lectures on Modern Philosophy (Descartes, Locke, Berkeley and Hume) every year for the first five years of his tenure of the White's Professorship. Indeed he lectured as often on these topics as on moral philosophy. He wrote on the perception of movement and the apprehension of time. He said, characteristically, that ‘the hearing a sound – a sound having as such a duration – and in general what is called the perceiving anything which has a duration – is absolutely underivative and cannot be resolved into anything else’ (Knowledge and Perception ed. Ross, 48). I cannot resist quoting also a passage from an unpublished lecture on perception, with the warning that Prichard was known to trail his coat in lectures, in the hope of generating lively discussion (ibid., 59–60). ‘For as soon as we compare our states or processes of seeing with one another or with other states or processes of perceiving we have to allow that we do not see bodies. For example, it is certain that if we see bodies we in some cases see a body move, but it is also certain that we cannot possibly ever see a body move; for in spite of what the followers of Einstein say, motion is, and is always really thought of as, absolute, relative motion being a contradiction in terms. (I should like, incidentally, but without any sense of shame, to offer this statement as a specimen of one of the few statements of things which we can really be said to know.) And, motion being absolute, when we are said to be seeing a body move, we cannot possibly be really doing so, since a stationary body would present precisely the same appearance to us, provided our body was moving in a certain way, so that in that case we should be seeing a body move although in fact it was stationary.’

Prichard was renowned in Oxford (and not only among philosophers) for the simplicity and clarity of his writing style, though he published so little of what he wrote. There are also occasional moments of wry humour such as his comment in a commemorative piece on Joseph: ‘His best memorial, unlike that of many other teachers, perhaps consists in the books that his pupils refrained from writing.’ Prichard is standing here in a venerable Oxford tradition of not publishing oneself and discouraging others either by example and precept (Cook Wilson, Prichard – but not in fact Joseph) or by fear (Austin). Prichard's daughter wrote: ‘My father was always so reluctant to publish’ (quoted in MacAdam 2002, xv).

Finally, some anecdotes and personal testimony:

Austin was much impressed by Prichard, whom he thought the most rigorous and minute thinker in Oxford (Berlin, 1973, 2). J. O. Urmson told me that Austin had attended Prichard's lectures as an undergraduate in the early 1930s, sat right at the front and asked very many questions. Eventually Prichard wrote to Austin's tutor in Balliol (I’m not sure who that was), asking him to persuade Austin either not to ask so many questions, or not to attend at all. But Austin did neither of these things. Urmson himself wrote ‘As a member of the very last generation of undergraduates to attend Prichard's lectures and informal instruction, I learnt to admire his patience as a teacher, his philosophical acuity and, above all, his quite exceptional intellectual honesty and independence.’ (This is in his introduction to his Prichard collection, reprinted in MacAdam, p. x.)

C. D. Broad called Prichard ‘a man of immense ability whom I have always regarded as the Oxford Moore’ (Cheney 1971, 14). It is also worth reporting Broad's remarks about Prichard's examination of T. H. Green: ‘Seldom can the floor have been more thoroughly wiped with the remains of one who was at one time commonly regarded as a great thinker and who still enjoys a considerable reputation in some circles’ (1950, 557). The realist backlash against nineteenth century Oxford Idealism was complete.

Wittgenstein came to speak in Oxford in 1947, just before Prichard's death. He had said he did not want to read a paper, but was willing to respond to a paper given by some agreeable graduate student. O. P. Wood was set up as the fall guy, and read a paper on the Cogito. Wittgenstein, using the paper as a springboard for his own ideas, responded at length. Prichard made several interventions, on each occasion very deliberately mispronouncing Wittgenstein's name as Whittgensteen. Finally he rose again and said, in his high reedy voice ‘Mr. Whittgensteen, Mr. Whittgensteen, you have not answered the question. Cogito ergo sum — I think therefore I am. Is it true, Mr Whittgensteen, is it true — I think therefore I am?’. Wittgenstein, exasperated, turned very icy and replied ‘I think this is a very foolish old man; so I am — what?’. (This story comes to me from Peter Hacker, who heard it from two people who were there, J. O. Urmson and H. L. A. Hart. Hart thought that Wittgenstein's reply was brilliant repartee; Urmson thought it unforgivably rude.)

2. Prichard's Moral Philosophy

[All simple page references from now on will be to the MacAdam 2002 edition of Prichard's work.]

Prichard starts where many moral philosophers never tread: from an account of what an act is. For him, an act is the origination of a state of affairs. That is, to act is to originate a state of affairs. The agent is the originator.

What makes an act, so conceived, either right or wrong? Prichard holds that the rightness of an act is ‘constituted’ by a combination of two things:

  1. the nature of the state of affairs originated, and
  2. what Prichard calls ‘a definite relation’ in which the agent stands to himself or to others, that relation forming part of the actual situation in which he has to act.

What this means is that a right act is made right by such a combination of features. An example might be that of an act made right by being the origination of a certain change, say, the educating of a young person, and the relation between the agent and that person, say, his being her parent. However Prichard is pretty catholic about what is to count as a relation, since he allows common humanity to count as such: ‘the obligation not to hurt the feelings of another involves no special relation of us to that other, i.e. no relation other than that of our both being men, and men in one and the same world’ (13). So a ‘definite’ relation need not be a ‘special’ relation.

There is a question what Prichard meant to exclude by his claim about what constitutes the rightness of an act. One thing he definitely meant to exclude was that an act can be made right merely by the goodness of its consequences. He argues (216–17) that this alone cannot be sufficient to constitute an act as right. Take an act whose consequence will be an increase in someone's patience, which is good. If that someone is oneself, one has a duty to do it, Prichard claims, but if it is someone else, one does not. So the mere goodness of the consequence is insufficient to render an act a duty. We need also to know what the relevant ‘definite relation’ is.

As it stands, however, all this is compatible with the view that the rightness of an act is (at least capable of being) constituted by this combination:

1.* the value of the state of affairs originated, and
2. a definite relation.

But in my view this reading of Prichard is wrong; it would involve two mistakes. The first, less subtle but still enticing, is to suppose that the value of the state of affairs originated is at least part of what we would now call the ‘ground’ of the relevant duty – part of what makes the action a duty. The second, more subtle, is to suppose that the phrase ‘state of affairs originated’ refers to the consequences of the action rather than to the nature of the action itself. I will comment on the first of these supposed mistakes immediately, and on the second later.

There is plenty of excuse for thinking that Prichard is a sort of agent-relative consequentialist. He says that ‘unless the effect of an act were in some way good, there would be no obligation to produce it, i.e. the goodness of the thing produced is a presupposition of the obligation to produce it’ (2). And he says that a moral principle specifies two things, (a) a good thing which the action will produce and (b) a definite relation…’ (4). And in his most famous published article he writes ‘At best it can only be maintained that there is this element of truth in the Utilitarian view, that unless we recognized that something which an act will originate is good, we should not recognize that we ought to do the action’ (10). I take it, however, that it is one thing to specify as part of the ground something that is good, and another to say that its goodness is itself part of the ground, and that Prichard's choice of the word ‘presupposition’ was well advised. And I would offer in support of this reading the following sentence from the same paper: ‘we do not come to appreciate an obligation by an argument, i.e. by a process of non-moral thinking, and in particular we do not do so by an argument of which a premiss is the ethical but not moral activity of appreciating the goodness either of the act or of a consequence of the act, i.e. our sense of the rightness of an act is not a conclusion from our appreciation of the goodness either of it or of anything else’ (14). Note the words ‘a premiss’ in this sentence.

Why did Prichard reject all such appeals to value? I think his main point is similar in style to the main ‘argument’ of Berkeley's Principles §3. ‘Suppose we ask ourselves whether our sense that we ought to pay our debts or to tell the truth arises from our recognition that in doing so we would be originating something good … We at once and without hesitation answer “No”’ (10). But he does try to support this claim by argument. For instance, it might be held that the reasoning that runs ‘This would be the repayment of a debt, and one which I voluntarily incurred; so I ought to do it’ is actually enthymematic, and properly runs ‘This would be the repayment of a debt, and one which I voluntarily incurred; such a result would be good; so I ought to do it’. But Prichard says that there is nothing much wrong with the original reasoning, and that the expanded version is actually worse, since it appeals to an unsound principle, that what is good ought to be. The principle is unsound because the idea of ‘ought to be’ does not make sense; what makes sense is ‘I ought to do it’. But we can only derive ‘I ought to do it’ by means of a principle that what is good ought to be, and another that if something ought to be, then we ought to do whatever would have it as a consequence. But these principles require us to think of the good as somehow imperatival (nowadays we would say ‘deontic’), because otherwise there would be no explanation of our ability to extract an ‘ought’ from a ‘good’ — and nobody thinks of the good as imperatival in that way. Further, it does not follow that if some state of affairs would be good, and I am able to bring it about by acting in some way, then I ought to act in that way. Suppose, for instance, that it would be good if you gave money to a hospital, and that you would do this if I wrote you a letter asking you to make some contribution. Does it follow that I ought to write you a letter? Not at all. What follows is not even that my writing you a letter would be good. (Prichard rejects the very notion of the ‘instrumentally good’.) All that we get is that my writing you a letter is something that would have a good result, which is just what we had at the beginning.

So much for Prichard's views about what makes acts right. He further held that every act that is right is of a type (specified as above) such that all acts of that type are right. At least, this is how he expressed himself early in his career. Later, he came to realize that this was incautious. We may have one act that is right, and which is of such and such a type, and which (as he would have said) is made right by being of that type, but where there could be another act of that type which is not right, because it is also of another type which is more important, as it were, and which makes the act either not a duty, or even plain wrong. So what he came to say was that if an act is right, it is of a type such that all acts of that type make a claim on the agent – a claim which may however be defeated by a greater claim made on the agent to avoid acting in that way. Either way round, Prichard is not a particularist. Wherever an act is right, according to him, there is a principle at work.

This does not mean, however, that in order to appreciate the rightness of the act, one must appeal to the principle. Prichard's view is quite the contrary. The main thrust of his famous article is the claim that ‘the sense of obligation to do, or of the rightness of, an action is absolutely underivative and immediate’ (12). To come to recognize that an act is a duty, one need only concentrate on the relevant non-moral facts, facts about the state of affairs that one will, if successful, originate and facts about the relations in which one stands here to others and to oneself (e.g. that one borrowed the money and promised to return it by the end of the week). Then, by an act of specifically moral thinking, one recognizes that those facts together make a claim on one to respond in a specific way, and that the claim made is stronger than any competing claim thrown up by other features of the situation. Again, ‘Suppose we come genuinely to doubt whether we ought, for example, to pay our debts … The only remedy lies in actually getting into a situation which occasions the obligation, or – if our imagination be strong enough – in imagining ourselves in that situation, and then letting our capacities of moral thinking do their work’ (20).

But Prichard also supposes that if we ask why a feature that grounds an obligation does so, for example why the fact that I borrowed the money mean that I ought to pay it back, all we can really do is to offer a principle, e.g. ‘because I ought to pay anything I owe’ (4). If we then go on to ask for a reason for the principle, there is nothing left to be said. But this is not because there is no reason for the principle; it is because the principle ‘includes its reason, the reason becoming explicit when the principle is properly expressed’. (ibid.) It is when we have lost our sense of the truth of the principle itself, so conceived, that ‘the only remedy lies’ in exposing ourselves to a real or imaginary case. ‘We first recognize the particular obligation and then by reflecting on it discover the principle, i.e. formulate to ourselves that general character of the act which renders it, or any act like it, an obligation’ (5).

This process, then, enables one to discern a moral principle, one that says that all acts of a specified type (that is, which are the origination of some specified sort of state of affairs), and whose agents stand in some specified relation either to others or to themselves, are such that there is a claim on those agents to act in that way, this claim being grounded in the specified nature of the act and/or the relevant relation. Knowing this principle might be of some use. But if one comes to doubt the principle, just gazing at it will not restore one's confidence in it, no matter how searching one's gaze. To recover one's sense of its truth, one needs to put oneself into a situation of the relevant sort, or at least to imagine oneself in such a situation, if one's imagination is powerful enough, and see whether the sense of obligation arises or not.

3. Goodness and Rightness

It is characteristic of intuitionists to deny that the right can be derived from the good, and Prichard, as we have seen, was no exception. Some intuitionists think that the good can be derived from the right, perhaps by thinking of the good as that which it is right to approve, admire, seek. Prichard does not take this sort of line either. For him, goodness is very different from rightness. Goodness seems to be a simple monadic property. The things that can have this property are states of affairs, people and actions. An act can be thought of as good, but whenever we do so, we are really thinking of its motive; a good act is one done from a good motive. Prichard distinguished between the moral motive, which is a sense of obligation, and ordinary motives, which are desires. ‘Desire and a sense of obligation are co-ordinate species of motive’ (15). There is the act, the origination of a change, and there is the motive for that act. Acts themselves are not good or bad. But we can think of the act together with its motive, and think of such a thing as good or bad. Prichard used the term ‘action’ for this combination of act and motive (officially, but not always consistently). Acts cannot really be good or bad, but actions can (156–7).

We might protest that an act can surely be good if it has good consequences: it is ‘instrumentally good’, that is, good as a means (though not good as an instrument; the term ‘instrumental value’ is a snare). Prichard's response to this is that being a means to a good is not a way of being good.

Rightness is completely different. It looks initially as if rightness is another monadic property, distinct from goodness. If it is, the only things that can have this property are acts. The motive with which an act is done is irrelevant to its rightness; one can do the right thing for the wrong reason, or from a bad motive (11–12). Agents cannot be right, and nor can outcomes. And to think of an action (in Prichard's official sense) as right is just evidence of confusion. If an action is right, it is because the act involved, the origination, is right. Motives themselves cannot be morally right or wrong. Nor can one have an obligation to act from a certain motive, for two reasons. First, one is not able to choose to have a motive, and one can only have an obligation to do something that one is capable of choosing to do or not to do. In general, we either have certain motives or we don’t, and there is not a lot that we can do about it. (We can, of course, try to train ourselves up so that we are in a better position next time.) Second, when we choose an action, the motive for which we will act if we do so act is already given (12). There is not, and cannot be, a separate motive for which we will choose the action. The motive for choice is the motive for acting.

But in fact Prichard held, or at least came to hold, that rightness is not a property of acts at all. An act that is right is one that is obligatory for some agent, one that that agent ought to do, or that is his duty. These notions of duty, obligation, ought and right really denote properties of agents. It is not so much the action that is right as the agent that has the obligation to do it, or to act in that way. There is no obligatoriness out there, belonging to the act that we are considering. A sense of obligation is not a recognition of a property that the act has got, in addition to all its more normal properties. It is really a sense that one is obliged to act in that way. One might think of this as a relation, except that there is no act there yet for one to be related to in the obligated way. It is not a relation, then. But if one is obliged to act in this way, that will (as I said at the beginning) be because – be constituted by – facts about the act and about relations in which one stands to others or to oneself.

We can now see further reason for rejecting these two inferences:

If this action would be good, I ought to do it.

If this act would have a good result, I ought to do it.

Both inferences take us from a remark about an act or action to a remark about an agent. Prichard asks us what the principles of these inferences could possibly be.

Of course Prichard does not just announce that obligatoriness is not a property of acts. He has two arguments. The first is that there are epistemic difficulties in supposing that acts are made obligatory by objective matters of fact such as their own nature and the attendant circumstances. Most of these things are things that we cannot truly know to be the case, such as what results our action will have (at this point Prichard is appealing to the theory of knowledge that he inherited from Cook Wilson). If so, we would hardly ever be able to know what our duty was; and the thought that most of our duties are things of which we cannot know is unbearable. This difficulty vanishes if we suppose that the ground for duty is not the objective nature of the situation, but the way the agent supposes things to be. But if we make that move, we suppose that the ground for duty lies in some fact about the agent (that she so supposes), and this makes it much easier to think of the duty itself as attaching to the agent rather than to the act. (On this argument and its peculiarities, see Dancy, 2002.)

Prichard's second argument is equally idiosyncratic. We can have an obligation to do an action long before the action is done. If so, the obligation cannot be a feature of the action, since it exists before the action does. It must be a feature of something else, if it is a feature of anything, and the obvious candidate is the agent.

This argument impressed Prichard. But Broad wrote ‘I find it difficult to persuade myself that this argument is very formidable’ (1950, 555). I don’t myself think that the argument is especially formidable, exactly, but it does serve to prevent errors of various sorts, such as the error of thinking that deciding what to do is like choosing chocolates from a box, as if the actions between which one is choosing are somehow laid out before one in their full particularity, waiting to be chosen, that is, done. In the present case, the question is how to avoid the argument without going down Prichard's route. It is true that there is no particular action that we are now obliged to do tomorrow; what we are obliged to do is only to act in a certain way; there will be a wide variety of actions that would meet that obligation, and we are not obliged to do one of them rather than any other. If we have to pay the money, it doesn’t matter, so far as that goes, how we go about doing it. But how does this help us understand what it is that is obligatory — the owner of the obligatoriness, as it were? It cannot belong to ‘acting in a certain way’. The most we could do would be to abandon the idea of obligatoriness as a character belonging to ‘acting in a way’ and think instead of something like ‘it is obligatory that p’, where p stands for ‘A Vs’. But even that doesn’t quite work, since it seems to specify a state of affairs or perhaps an event as obligatory, and this makes no sense at all. The only way to resolve the impasse is to take Prichard's way out and award the obligation to the agent, yielding ‘A is obliged to V’ – which is where Prichard wanted to take us.

So when one senses an obligation one senses a character of oneself, a claim on oneself to act in a certain way. And to sense an obligation all that is needed is to put oneself into the relevant situation and consider the various ways of acting that are available, and the various relevant relations in which one stands to others and to oneself. If this does not lead to a sense of obligation, there is nothing much else that can do it. Moral philosophy, certainly, offers no such resources, and the Mistake on which Moral Philosophy rests, to revert to the title of Prichard's famous article, is to suppose otherwise.

4. The Rights and Wrongs of Non-intuitionism

Prichard works initially with Sidgwick's contrast between intuitionism as the view that conduct is right when conforming to certain principles known to be unconditionally binding, and non-intuitionism as the view that there are ends at which we should aim. (The view that there are ends that we should do what we can to realize, which is a different view, is according to Prichard not Sidgwick's official view, but a better view that Sidgwick should have adopted instead.)

Prichard argues that when one asks oneself what it is to aim at an outcome, the answer has to be that it is to act from the desire of it, that is, to be motivated by the prospect of achieving it. But in that case, Sidgwick (as a non-intuitionist) is maintaining that right actions are those that have a certain motive. And Prichard has his argument (which we have already seen) that we cannot be required to act from a certain motive, since our motivation is not something over which we have the required control. This form of non-intuitionism, then, is a non-starter, despite the fact that it appears to be Sidgwick's preferred form.

What is more, Prichard thinks that even if it were true that we ought to aim at this end, it would not follow that we ought to do what (we think) will lead to it. The derived ‘ought’ here can only be identical with the sort of ‘ought’ that we derive in non-moral cases, as when we say to a poisoner ‘you ought to give a second dose’, and such an ‘ought’ has no force for those who have not adopted the relevant end. This is partly because it is not true that we have a moral duty to do those actions that will lead to outcomes that we have a duty to aim at. We might, for instance, have a duty to help the sick, and it may be that the only way to achieve that end is to write begging letters to our more prosperous friends. But it does not follow that we have a duty to write those letters. It will be true that we ought to write those letters, but this only means (says Prichard) that if we do not write them, we will not achieve our end. The ‘ought’ here is the non-moral ‘ought’.

We might think (and Broad did think) that Prichard cannot be right to say that there are only two sorts of ‘ought’: the moral one, full-blown, and the means-end one which only has force for those who have adopted the end, and only says that if they don’t take this means they will not achieve that end. I myself would want to appeal to the normative force of advice. But Prichard's main point might survive such a response. For all that he needs to establish is that in order to show that we have a moral duty to write the begging letters we need to do more than show that it is the best or only means to something which we have a moral duty to aim at.

Prichard thinks, however, that Sidgwick never really considered the question what it is to aim at an outcome, and that if he had he would have abandoned his official view for a very different view, namely that our duty is not to aim at certain outcomes, but to achieve them or ensure them.

This new view, however, comes in two forms, which emerge when we ask what it is about those outcomes that gives us a duty to ensure them. The first answer, which again we can attribute to Sidgwick, is that it is the value of those outcomes that grounds the relevant duty. But we have already seen Prichard's attack on this view. He claims that it doesn’t survive the test of instances; nobody thinks that their sense of obligation, when they feel obliged to do something, arises from their recognition that in so acting they will be originating something good. And even if they did, it is impossible to understand how the supposed duty can be derived from some fact about goodness. For duty is imperatival in nature and goodness is not. We would have to find some link between the goodness of the action and the duty to act, and all such links are spurious.

The only remaining alternative is to say that the ground for our duty to ensure certain outcomes lies not in their value but in their nature. But Prichard claims that this is just a form of intuitionism in its conception of our duties – at least in its conception of those duties that are grounded in outcomes (137–42). We are dealing with principles that are unconditionally binding, and which require us to achieve certain ends, or ensure certain outcomes. There is nothing here that is inconsistent with intuitionism, or even hard for the intuitionist to explain. At this stage non-intuitionism collapses into intuitionism. For the act which it is our duty to do is the origination of a change, and the act of originating that change is not a duty in virtue of its consequences, or outcomes; it is a duty in its own nature.

5. The Rights and Wrongs of Kantianism

Prichard's other main target was Kant. As he sees it, Kant maintained that an action is right if and only if it is done from the motive of duty, that is, from a sense of obligation. Now Prichard wants to admit that it can be good to act from this motive; maybe this is the only morally good motive. Other motives, such as a general benevolence, may make the relevant action good, but cannot make it morally good. But he wants first to insist that we cannot have an obligation to act from a particular motive, as we have already seen. And there are further difficulties peculiar to Kant's position, in which the motive is specified as the conviction that the act concerned is a duty. The first is that the position has the consequence that no act, in Prichard's official narrow sense, is a duty at all. One's duty is to act from the motive of duty, never to do this or that act in the narrow sense. So Prichard is able to present Kant as holding that there is nothing that we ought to do, and therefore that it is impossible to act from the sense that one ought to do this. If so, Kant has undermined his own position, since his understanding of the motive of duty shows that there can be no such thing. Or rather, if there is such a thing as the motive of duty, it follows necessarily that it cannot be one's sole or primary duty to act on it.

This is a lovely chain of criticism, but it seems to me to suffer from a mistake right at the beginning — which, if it is a mistake, is one echoed by Ross (1930, 5). Kant held that an action was only morally good if done from the motive of duty, but he did not hold, as far as I can see, that an act is only right if done from that motive. The Kantian Categorical Imperative ‘I ought never to act except in such a way that I could also will that my maxim should become a universal law’ need not, and surely should not, be read as saying acts are only right if motivated in a certain way. Kant treats it as an open question whether an act done ‘in conformity with duty’ has also been done ‘from duty’. He would think it possible for people to do what they ought, do the right thing, even if their actions do not have the special sort of value that so interests him. Actions have that sort of value when they are done out of respect for the law rather than merely in accordance with it.

So it seems to me that Prichard imposes on Kant a view that he neither held nor needed to hold (but see the extended discussion of Kant (153–9), which ends ‘Plainly he had not fully thought the position out.’). Prichard would have done better to concentrate on the difference between Kant's account of how it comes about that an action is a duty and his own minimal account. Kant's explanation would start from the fact that the maxim of the action can be willed as a universal law. Prichard would, I think, say that there is no possibility of, or need for, any such explanation. This is just one more instance of the quietism that characterizes intuitionism as opposed to constructivism.

6. Significant Issues on Which Prichard Changed His Mind

Prichard's views remained broadly unchanged throughout his life, except in the following respects.

6.1 The moral motive

Prichard originally thought that conscience, or a sense of obligation, was a distinct species of motive from desire. ‘A sense of obligation does sometimes move us to act’ (15). In this he was a precursor of the direction that intuitionistic moral philosophy would take 60 years later. By 1928, however, he had abandoned this dualist view, writing ‘Again, if we face the purely general question ‘Can we really do anything whatever unless in some respect or other we desire to do it?’ we have to answer “No”’ (38; see also 129). On this new understanding a sense of obligation was not a motive at all, since it involved no desire; to get motivation, one needs in addition a desire to do the right. This ‘externalist’ position, also adopted by Ross, opened the door to complaints that on the intuitionist picture moral cognition was the recognition of facts that lacked any intrinsic connection to action; it should be possible to come to know that it is wrong to kill the innocent without thinking of that as at all relevant to one's choice of action. And those complaints eventually became the strongest argument for non-cognitivism in meta-ethics.

6.2 The nature of action

At the beginning of his career Prichard writes ‘In action we consciously originate a change’ (1). On p.10 he speaks apparently without strain both of our action as being the origination of a change and as originating that change, and of ourselves as originating that change. In the Manuscript on Morals (of uncertain date, perhaps c. 1928), we read that the phrase ‘an action’ is ambiguous, but ‘ordinarily it stands for the origination or bringing something about … such as the action of poking a fire or annoying a neighbour’.

By 1932 he has moved on, but only a little. ‘It is, no doubt, not easy to say what we mean by ‘an action’ or by ‘doing something’. Yet we have in the end to allow that we mean by it originating, causing, or bringing about the existence of something, viz. some new state of an existing thing or substance, or, more shortly, causing a change of state of some existing thing. … We may be tempted to go farther, and say that we mean by ‘an action’ the conscious origination of something, i.e. the originating something knowing that we are doing so. But this will not do; for no one, for instance, thinks himself to be denying that he has hurt a man's feelings when he says that he did not know that he was hurting them, and, indeed, thought he was not’ (85).

But at this point Prichard introduces a distinction between what we cause directly and what we cause indirectly. He says that when we cause something indirectly, by causing something else to cause it, ‘the result is not wholly due to us’. When we cause something directly, by contrast, it is wholly due to us. And Prichard gives us an example of such a thing, namely ‘transferring certain ink to certain places on a piece of paper’. But he maintains that if such a thing were an obligation, it would be the sort of obligation we would never be able to know that we have, because we can never know what will in fact result. If we are to be capable of knowing our obligations, they cannot be obligations which we cannot know that we have met when we have met them. If so, our obligations cannot be to achieve this or that outcome, but only to ‘set ourselves to achieve them’. All actions that are obligatory are of this sort. And Prichard evidently concludes that when we cause a change directly, in each case there is such a thing as ‘setting oneself to cause that change’, which may be successful and may not be. An action that is a failure is still an action. So though we may describe an action in terms of its further effects, say lighting the fire, a necessary part of that action will have been a ‘setting oneself to …’.

At the end of his life, in 1945, he writes that the view he has inherited from Cook Wilson, namely that to act is to originate a change, has to be wrong. In fact, to act is to will a change, and the change willed is not an action; most often it is a bodily movement, that is to say, a change in the location of one's body or of parts of it. He says that the characterization of willing as ‘setting oneself to cause a change’ has to be wrong. “I now think I was mistaken in suggesting that the phrase in use for it is ‘setting oneself to cause’” (274).

The reason he gives for abandoning the Cook Wilson picture is that an action is an activity, and there is no such activity as that of originating or causing a change in oneself or anything else (273). Even if causing a change may require an activity, it is not that activity. Now often we do not know what activity is involved when one body causes a change in another. But when it comes to human actions, we do know. First, we know that we are looking for something mental, and second, we know that the word for that special kind of mental activity is ‘willing’.

Very little can be said about this mental activity of willing, though we are all, of course, perfectly familiar with it. But we can ask about its proper object. What is it that we will? Two possible answers present themselves: we will actions, and we will changes. The first of these must be wrong because it generates an infinite regress. So the second must be right. An action is the willing of a change.

6.3 The nature of obligation, or of obligatedness

Prichard's earliest work does seem to treat rightness or obligatoriness as a property of the action to be done, or rather, as a property of the action once it is done. By 1932, however, as discussed in section 3 above, he had moved to the view that obligation is a property of the agent, not of the act at all. There is some sign in his published paper of that date that he had not yet extended the new view to include rightness, i.e. that he had come to distinguish rightness, which remained a property of the act and not of the agent, from obligation or obligatedness, now appearing as a property of the agent. For he writes ‘While the truth could not be expressed by saying ‘My setting myself to do so-and-so would be right, because I think it would have a certain effect’ – a statement which would be as vicious in principle as the statement ‘Doing so-and-so would be right because I think it would be right’ — there is nothing to prevent its being expressible in the form ‘I ought to set myself to do so-and-so because I think it would have a certain effect’ (99–100). With this distinction the property of obligatoriness vanishes altogether, though rightness remains, grounded in the familiar combinations of the (objective) nature of the situation and some definite relation in which the agent stands to others or to himself. However, if this was Prichard's view at the time, no trace of it appears later, and Ross appears not to have noticed it at all (see his account of the argument of Prichard's 1932 paper in Ross 1939, ch. 7). And this is just as well, because it is very unsettling to be told that one can have an obligation to do an action that is in fact wrong.

6.4 The content of a moral principle

In his earliest work Prichard supposes that principles specify distinct obligations, e.g. those of telling the truth, educating one's children, serving one's country. It did not take him long to see that, so understood, pretty well any collection of principles is going to lead to contradiction and incoherence. He then moved to what looks like a form of what we now know best as Ross's theory of prima facie duties. On this understanding, a principle specifies what Prichard calls a ‘claim’ on us, for example that we serve our country – but all such claims can be defeated by more pressing claims to do something else, such as care for our aging mother. Prichard's version seems to differ from Ross's, however, at least if we are to trust a letter he wrote to Ross in 1932 (to be found in MacAdam, 286–7). Ross thinks that duty proper, as he calls it, is a quite different sort of thing from a prima facie duty; the notion of ‘duty’ in ‘prima facie duty’ is a different notion from that in ‘duty proper’. Prichard, by contrast, thinks of this as incoherent, and opts instead for the view that, expressed in terms of ‘ought’ maintains that, faced with a moral difficulty, there will be different actions each of which in some respect I ought to do (this is the prima facie ought) and of those one will be the action which I most ought to do, my duty proper. On this picture there is no great divide between the ‘ought’ of duty proper and the ‘ought’ of prima facie duty.


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Related Entries

action | consequentialism | Kant, Immanuel | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | metaethics | moral particularism | motivation | Ross, William David | Sidgwick, Henry | value theory | Wilson, John Cook