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John Cook Wilson

First published Tue Dec 8, 2009

John Cook Wilson (1849–1915) was Wykeham Professor of Logic at New College, Oxford and the founder of ‘Oxford Realism’, a philosophical movement that flourished at Oxford during the first decades of the 20th century. Although trained as a classicist and a mathematician, his most important contribution was to the theory of knowledge, where he argued that knowledge is factive and not definable in terms of belief, and he criticized ‘hybrid’ and ‘externalist’ accounts. He also argued for direct realism in perception, criticizing both empiricism and idealism, and argued for a moderate nominalist view of universals as being in rebus and only ‘apprehended’ by their particulars. His influence helped swaying Oxford away from idealism and, through figures such as H. A. Prichard, Gilbert Ryle, or J. L. Austin, his ideas were also to some extent at the origin of ‘moral intuitionism’ and ‘ordinary language philosophy’ which defined much of Oxford philosophy until the second half of the twentieth-century. Nevertheless, his name and legacy were all but forgotten for generations after World War II. Still, his views on knowledge are with us today, being in part at work in the writings of philosophers as diverse as John McDowell, Charles Travis, and Timothy Williamson.

1. Life and Work

Details about the life of John Cook Wilson, or ‘Cook Wilson’ as he is commonly called, may be found in a memoir published in 1926 by his pupil A. S. L. Farquharson, in his edition of Cook Wilson's posthumous writings entitled Statement and Inference with other Philosophical Papers, hereafter: SI (SI, xii–lxiv). He was born in Nottingham on June 6, 1849, the son of a Methodist minister. Educated at Derby Grammar School, he went up to Balliol College in 1868, elected on an exhibition set up by Benjamin Jowett for students from less privileged schools. At Balliol, Cook Wilson read classics and mathematics but he also studied philosophy with Jowett and T. H. Green, who steered him towards Kant and idealism (SI, 880), along with other students from his generation, such as Bernard Bosanquet, F. H. Bradley, Richard Lewis Nettleship, and William Wallace. Cook Wilson even went to Göttingen in 1873–74 to attend lectures by H. R. Lotze (SI, xxvii), whose portrait he kept in his study. However, he was to write late in his life that “from the first I would not commit myself even to the most attractive form of idealism, tho' greatly attracted by it” (SI, 815). Nevertheless, according to Prichard, his move away from idealism did not fully take place until the early 1900s (Prichard 1919, 307–310). Friedrich Ueberweg's System of Logic and History of Logical Doctrines (Ueberweg 1871) also figures in Cook Wilson's intellectual background, according to Farquharson, as an early ‘realist’ influence (SI, 880). Although Cook Wilson's mature philosophy is arguably a continuation of sorts of the Scottish School of Hutcheson and Reid (see sections 5 and 8), there are hardly any references to these authors in his writings.

Cook Wilson was first elected fellow of Oriel College in 1873 and, in 1889, he succeeded Thomas Fowler as Wykeham Professor of Logic, New College. Bernard Bosanquet, Thomas Case, and John Venn had been among his rivals. He finally moved to New College in 1901, where he remained until his death from pernicious anemia, on 11 August 1915. He lived the uneventful life of an Oxford don. A Liberal in his convictions (SI, xxix), he did not get involved into politics. His most cherished extra-curricular activity appears to have been the development of tactics for military bicycle units. In his lifetime, he received numerous awards and honours, e.g., becoming fellow of the British Academy in 1907. While in Germany, he had met Charlotte Schneider, who was to become his wife in 1876. They had a son, who emigrated to South Africa.

Cook Wilson published little. Setting apart publications on military cycling and other incidental writings, the bulk of his publications were in his chosen fields of study, classics and mathematics. In the latter field, he published a strange treatise that arose out of his failed attempt at proving the four-colour theorem, On the Traversing of Geometrical Figures (TGF). It had virtually no echo; Farquharson quoted the mathematician E. W. Hobson explaining that Cook Wilson “hardly gave sufficient time and thought to the subject to make himself really conversant with the modern aspects of the underlying problems” (SI, xxxviii). Cook Wilson also published two short papers on probability (IP, PBT), where he gave what amounts, according to Ysidro Edgeworth (Edgeworth 1911, § 13, n. 10), to a new proof of the discrete Bayes' formula. (Cook Wilson's philosophical views on probability (SI, §§ 322–6) were a fundamental influence on William Kneale's Probability and Induction (Kneale 1949).) However, Cook Wilson's mathematical endeavours were largely wasted on trying to prove the inconsistency of non-Euclidean geometries, because of his claim that he ‘knows’ or has ‘apprehended’ the truth of Euclid's axiom of the parallels (see section 4).

In classics, Cook Wilson contributed regularly to scholarly journals such as Classical Review, Classical Quarterly, Transactions of the Oxford Philological Society, and Philologische Rundschau, and he published studies on the structure of seventh book of Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics (AS) and on Plato's Timaeus (IPT). His main claim concerning Nicomachean Ethics was that the seventh book contained traces of three versions probably written by some Peripatetic later than Eudemus. However, in a postscript to the revised version (1912), he claimed that the variants were probably different drafts written by Aristotle himself. His pamphlet on the Timaeus was mainly polemical, written in reaction to R. D. Archer-Hind's 1888 edition. Some of Cook Wilson's smaller points of language were later discussed and sometimes approved of by A. E. Taylor and F. M. Cornford in their own commentaries of that dialogue and one can discern some influence of his views on knowledge in H. W. B. Joseph's Knowledge and the Good in Plato's Republic (Joseph 1948) and R. C. Cross and A. D. Woozley, Plato's Republic. A Philosophical Commentary (Cross & Woozley 1964, chap. 8). Otherwise, Cook Wilson's writings on Greek philosophy had little impact. He published very little else in philosophy: his inaugural lecture On an Evolutionist Theory of the Axioms (ETA) and a very short piece in Mind as part of a debate with Lewis Carroll on the ‘Barber-Shop paradox’. (This paradox, not to be confused with the ‘Barber's paradox’, is usually attributed to Carroll, who first published about it (Carroll 1894), but it should really be attributed to Cook Wilson. See (CLP) for his attempt at a solution and Moktefi (2007) for issues concerning attribution.)

Cook Wilson's reluctance to publish was partly caused by the fact that he constantly kept revising his views and reached a more or less stable viewpoint only late in life. One of his better-known sayings is that “the (printed) letter killeth, and it is extraordinary how it will prevent the acutest from exercising their wonted clearness of vision” (SI, 872)—see also Collingwood (1939, 19–20). His argument was that authors that have committed to print their views on a given issue would more often than not, should their views prove to be erroneous, feel obliged to defend them and to engage in pointless rhetorical exchanges instead of seeing immediately the validity of arguments against them. As a result, Cook Wilson resorted throughout his career to the printing for private circulation of pamphlets, known as Dictata, which he began revising for publication shortly before he died in 1915. Only 11 years later did the two volumes of Statement and Inference appear, put together by Farquharson from his lecture notes and Dictata along with some letters. These volumes are subdivided in five parts and 582 sections. Their structure betrays their origin in Cook Wilson's lectures in logic and in the theory of knowledge; also interspersed are texts that originate from his study and lectures on Plato and Aristotle.

As the chronological table of the various sections shows (SI, 888–9), the texts thus assembled were written at different dates and, in light of Cook Wilson's frequent change of mind (including his move away from idealism), they express views that are at times almost contradictory. This makes any study of his philosophy particularly difficult, and more often than not accounts of his views are influenced by those, equally important, of his pupil H. A. Prichard.

Since he published so little, it is therefore through teaching and personal contact that Cook Wilson made a significant impact on Oxford philosophy. He might very well have been at the origin of the peculiar tutorials style to which generations of Greats students were subjected. He also initiated meetings that were to become the ‘Philosophers' Teas’ under Prichard's tutelage, the ‘Wee Teas’ under Ryle's, and the celebrated ‘Saturday Mornings’, under Austin's ; ‘ordinary language philosophy’ is said to have emerged from the latter. In his obituary, H. W. B. Joseph described Cook Wilson as being “by far the most influential philosophical teacher in Oxford”, adding that no one “had held a place so important” since Green (Joseph 1916b, 555). R. G. Collingwood, who reverted to idealism later on, G. Dawes Hicks, H. W. B. Joseph, H. A. Prichard, W. D. Ross and C. C. J. Webb are among his better-known pupils at the turn of the century. The volumes of Statement and Inference, which appeared in 1926, and the teaching of Joseph and Prichard were to influence further generations of philosophers in the 1920s and 1930s, from G. Ryle and H. H. Price to J. L. Austin and J. O. Urmson.

There exist only one book-length commentary of Statement and Inference, Richard Robinson's The Province of Logic (Robinson 1931), and a handful of papers, not all of equal value, specifically discussing its content, e.g., Foster (1931), Furlong (1941), LLoyd Beck (1931), Marion (2002a), Robinson (1928a, 1928b), Tacelli (1991), and Tyler (2009).

2. Ordinary Language

Cook Wilson believed that in philosophy, one must above all “uncompromisingly […] to try to find out what a given activity of thought presupposes as implicit or explicit in our consciousness”, i.e., to “try to get at the facts of consciousness and not let them be overlaid as is so commonly done with preconceived theories” (SI, 328). By ‘preconceived theories’, Cook Wilson meant the sort of systematic philosophizing or ‘reflective thought’, as he called it, which was prevalent in his days and that one finds in, say, the works of Bradley and the British idealists, but also, earlier, the empiricists. According to him, ‘reflective thought’ had two major defects: it is based on principles that, for all we know, might be false and, concomitantly, it is too abstract, because it is hardly based on the consideration of particular concrete examples. Indeed, in a passage where he criticized Bradley's infamous infinite regress argument against the reality of relations (Bradley 1897, 28), Cook Wilson begins by pointing out that “throughout this chapter there is not a single illustration, though it is of the last importance that there should be” (SI, 692)—on the critique of Bradley, see also Joseph (1916a, 37). As H. H. Price put it later, for Cook Wilson and his epigones “to philosophize without instances would be merely a waste of time” (Price 1947, 336). This is an attitude that was also then found on the Continent in the Brentano School.

Furthermore, Cook Wilson thought that philosophers are most likely to introduce distinctions of their own that do not correspond to the ‘facts of consciousness’ and thus distort our understanding of them. He therefore strove to uncover ‘facts of consciousness’ through an analysis of concrete examples which would be free of philosophical jargon. This is strongly reminiscent of descriptive psychology of the Brentano School. As a matter of fact, Gilbert Ryle, who described himself as a “fidgetty Cook Wilsonian” (Ryle 1993, 106), but who was also one rare Oxonian who knew something about phenomenology in the 1920s, believed Cook Wilson's descriptive analyses to be as good as any from Husserl (Ryle 1971, vol. I, 176 & 203n.).

If philosophical jargon is not to be trusted, ordinary language is a safer guide:

It is not fair to condemn the ordinary view wholly, nor is it safe: for, if we do, we may lose sight of something important behind it. Distinctions in current language can never safely be neglected. (SI, 46) [See also SI (102), quoted below.]

It is safer because distinctions found in ordinary language are “more likely to be right than wrong” (SI, 874)—albeit not always, see, e.g., (SI, 35)—mainly because “they are not the issue of any system, they were not invented by any one” and they were developed “in what may be called the natural course of thinking, under the influence of experience and in the apprehension of particular truths” (SI, 874). Furthermore, “reflective thought tends to be too abstract, while experience which has developed the popular distinctions recorded in language is always in contact with the particular facts” (SI, 875). Cook Wilson, therefore, considered it “repugnant to create a technical term out of all relation to ordinary language” (SI, 713), and he particularly disliked the tendency to unearth some concept in Greek philosophy in order to introduce a new technical term.

Thus, Cook Wilson appealed to ordinary language almost every other page in Statement and Inference. For example, he argued in support of his views on universals (see section 6) that “ordinary language reflects faithfully a true metaphysics of universals” (SI, 208). But he did not merely appeal to ordinary language in order to undermine philosophical distinctions, he did it also in a constructive way. For example, when distinguishing between the activity of thinking and ‘what we think’, i.e., between ‘act’ and ‘content’ (SI, 63–64), he argued that this is “likely to be right” because “it is the natural and universal mode of expression in ordinary untechnical language, ancient and modern” (SI, 67) and “it comes from the very way of speaking which is natural and habitual with those who do not believe in any form of idealism” (SI, 64).

These views were to prove particularly influential in the case of J. L. Austin, who began his studies at Oxford four years after the publication of Statement and Inference. It is a common mistake to think of Wittgenstein as having had some formative influence on Austin, as he was arguably the least influenced by Wittgenstein of the Oxford philosophers (Hacker 1996, 172). The philosophy of G. E. Moore notwithstanding, it is rather Cook Wilson and epigones such as Prichard that are the source of the peculiar brand of ‘analytical philosophy’ that was to take root in Oxford in the 1930s, known as ‘Oxford philosophy’ or ‘ordinary language philosophy’. One merely needs here to recall the following well-known passage from Austin's ‘A Plea for Excuses’, which is almost a paraphrase of Cook Wilson:

Our common stock of words embodies all the distinctions men have found worth drawing, and the connections they have found worth marking, in the lifetimes of many generations: these surely are likely to be more numerous, more sound, since they have stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest, and more subtle, at least in all ordinary and reasonably practical matters, than any that you or I are likely to think up in our arm-chairs of an afternoon—the most favoured alternative method. (Austin 1979, 182)

The influence of Cook Wilson on Austin extends much further, including on the analysis of knowledge (see section 4).

3. States of Mind

Since Cook Wilson's philosophy was largely defined in opposition to British Idealism, it is worth beginning with some point of explicit disagreement. Roughly put, under the idealist view knowledge is constituted by a coherent set of mutually supporting beliefs, none of which are basic, while others would be derivative. Cook Wilson did not argue directly against the coherence theory, as Russell was famously to do (Russell 1910, 131–146), but took instead the opposite, foundationalist stance. Surprisingly, when H. H. Joachim published The Nature of Truth (1906), one of Cook Wilson's criticisms was that he was relying on a discredited ‘correspondence’ theory (SI, 809–810). His foundationalism has this interesting particularity that he rejected the underlying thesis that knowledge is to be defined in terms of belief, together with one or more additional properties such as ‘justified’ and ‘true’ (see section 4). He reasoned that, if one believes on evidence, the latter may itself be belief, but this chain of justification ought to come to an end, and that this end point is some non-derivative knowledge, which he called after 1906 ‘apprehension’ (SI, 816). As he put it: “it becomes evident that there must be apprehensions not got by inference or reasoning” (LL, § 18). Unfortunately, Cook Wilson did not define his key notion of ‘apprehension’ (SL, 78 n.), which appears to be at the same time close to Aristotle's ‘noesis’ and to Russell's ‘acquaintance’. Cook Wilson obviously took his lead from Posterior Analytics but his comments are also reminiscent of Thomas Reid, who argues in his Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (Bk. II, chap. v) that perception involves some conception of the object and the conviction of its existence, this conviction being immediate, non-inferential, and, following Posterior Analytics (Book II, § 19), not open to doubt. Cook Wilson was not exactly faithful to Aristotle and Reid, however, since he argued that apprehensions can be both perceptual and non-perceptual (SI, 79), and that some are obtained by inference while some are not, the latter being the material of inference (SI, 84–85). Furthermore, he argued that perceptual apprehensions should not be confused with sensations, as the mere having of a sensation is not yet to know what the sensation is. For this, one needs an “originative act of consciousness” that goes beyond mere passivity and compares it in order to apprehend its definite character. As Cook Wilson put it: “we are really comparing but we do not recognize that we are” (SI, 46).

In one of his polemics against idealism, Cook Wilson's main target was the traditional theory of judgement that one finds, for example, in Bradley's Principles of Logic (Bradley 1928), where the topic is simply divided into ‘judgement’ and ‘inference’. Cook Wilson thought it misleading to base logic on judgement instead of proposition or statement (SI, 94), as one is misled, he argues, by the common verbal form: there is no common form of thinking called ‘judgement’ which would include non-inferred knowledge, opinion, and belief, but would exclude inferred knowledge. (Cook Wilson often talks in this context of ‘activities of consciousness’, as opposed to ‘forms of consciousness’, but the view is perhaps better stated in the contemporary terminology of ‘mental states’. Cook Wilson's language will be retained here.) He thus argued first that inferring is one of the forms of judgement: “if we take judging in its most natural sense, that is as decision on evidence after deliberation, then inferring is just one of those form of apprehending to which the words judging and judgement most properly apply” (SI, 86). Some inferences are, however, immediately apprehended, e.g., when one recognizes that it follows from ‘if p, then q’ and ‘p’, that ‘q’.

Still working with this ‘judicial’ definition of judgement, Cook Wilson further criticized the idealists for also thinking that judgement is a common form which includes knowledge, opinion, and belief (SI, 86–7). The notion of judgement one finds in logic books being thus a fabricated one, Cook Wilson claimed instead to follow ‘ordinary usage’ in stating that

A judgement is a decision. To judge is to decide. It implies previous indecision; a previous thinking process, in which we were doubting. Those verbal statements, therefore, which result from a state of mind not preceded by such doubt, statements which are not decisions, are not judgements, though they may have the same verbal form as judgements. (SI, 92–3)

Therefore, the presence of a prior indecision or doubt, as opposed to confidence, is deemed an essential ingredient of judgement. However, judgement does not fully put an end to doubt: as a judge may well be mistaken, our ordinary judgements “form fallible opinions only” (Joseph 1916a, 160). Now, if indecision and doubt are involved prior to judgement, apprehension or knowledge (perceptual or not) could not be not judgement, because, by definition, there is no room for doubt.

Moreover, it is an important characteristic of ‘believing’, setting it apart from other ‘activities of consciousness’, that it is accompanied with a feeling of confidence. For example, when I open the door of my office, I confidently expect to find my desk, books, etc. and not an empty room or just a whole in the floor, into which I plunge accidentally. This characteristic sets belief apart from judgement:

To a high degree of such confidence, where it naturally exists, is attached the word belief, and language here, as not infrequently, is true to distinctions which have value in our consciousness. It is not opinion, it is not knowledge, it is not properly even judgement. (SI, 102)

Statements of opinion are said not to be the expression of a decision, so they not judgement either, even though ‘opining’ is here conceived of as a form of decision:

It is a peculiar thing—the result of estimate—and we call it by a peculiar name, opinion. For it, taken in its strict and proper sense, we can use no term that belongs to knowing. For the opinion that A is B is founded on evidence we know to be insufficient, whereas it is of the very nature of knowledge not to make its statements at all on grounds recognized to be insufficient, nor to come to any decision except that the grounds are insufficient; for it is here that in the knowing activity we stop. (SI, 99–100)

Cook Wilson held the view that knowledge, in the form of ‘apprehension’, was presupposed by other ‘activities of thinking’ such as judging and opining. For example, opinion involves knowledge, but goes beyond it:

There will be something else besides judgement to be recognized in the formation of opinion, that is to say knowledge, as manifested in such activities as occur in ordinary perception; activities, in other words, which are not properly speaking decisions. (SI, 96)

The upshot of this set of remarks is that knowledge, belief, and opinion are not species of the same genre, judgement. There is in fact no highest common factor to these states of mind (see next section); they are all sui generis and irreducible to each other.

4. Knowledge

Cook Wilson believed that “our experience of knowing then being the presupposition of any inquiry we can undertake, we cannot make knowing itself a subject of inquiry in the sense of asking what knowing is” (SI, 39). This leads to his main thesis concerning knowledge, namely that it is not definable in terms of something else. In particular, it is not to be defined in terms of belief augmented by some other property or properties, as in the traditional view of knowledge as ‘justified true belief’. In particular, the difference between, on the one hand, knowledge and, say, belief or opinion, on the other, is not a difference of degree of something such as the feeling of confidence, or the amount of supportive evidence:

In knowing, we can have nothing to do with the so-called ‘greater strength’ of the evidence on which the opinion is grounded; simply because we know that this ‘greater strength’ of evidence of A's being B is compatible with A's not being B after all. (SI, 100)

J. L. Austin has a nice supporting example in Sense and Sensibilia, using the fact that ‘seeing that’ is factive: if no pig is in sight, I might accumulate evidence that one lives in a given place: buckets of pig food, pig-like marks on the ground, the smell, etc. But if the pig suddenly appears, “there is no longer any question of collecting evidence; its coming into view doesn't provide me with more evidence that it's a pig, I can now just see that it is, the question is settled” (Austin 1962, 115).

Belief is also to be distinguished from knowledge, since one is likely to say ‘I believe p’ precisely when one recognizes that one's grounds for believing p—which may be knowledge, in which case it is clear that knowing entails believing—are insufficient for one's knowledge of p (Prichard 1950, 86f.). So, when one knows, one does not believe: “Belief is not knowledge and the man who knows does not believe at all what he knows; he knows it” (SI, 100). It follows immediately from this that a ‘theory’ of knowledge is impossible, a consequence first expressed in 1904 by Cook Wilson in correspondence with Prichard, who was to put forth an analogous argument in moral philosophy eight years later (see section 8):

We cannot construct knowing—the act of apprehending—out of any elements. I remember quite early in my philosophic reflection having an instinctive aversion to the very expression ‘theory of knowledge’. I felt the words themselves suggested a fallacy. (SL, 803)
Knowledge is sui generis and therefore a ‘theory’ of it is impossible. Knowledge is simply knowledge, and an attempt to state it in terms of something else must end in describing something which is not knowledge. (Prichard 1909, 245)

At the turn of the last century, only the minor German neo-Kantian philosopher Leonard Nelson was holding this view, for roughly similar reasons (Nelson 1908 & 1949). It was to become the central plank of ‘Oxford Realism’, the movement it inspired, and it is still defended in Oxford today by Timothy Williamson, according to whom knowledge is a mental state “being in which is necessary and sufficient for knowing p” (Williamson 2000, 21), and which “cannot be analysed into more basic concepts” (Williamson 2000, 33).

The fact that there is no highest common factor to knowledge and belief entails that Cook Wilson had to reject ‘hybrid’ and ‘externalist’ accounts of knowledge. Any ‘hybrid’ account would factor knowledge into an internal part, possibly a copy of the object known, and a relation of that copy to the object itself (on the ‘copy theory’, see section 5). A highest common factor would be a state of mind that would, depending on one or more given factors, count as knowing, but in absence of these factors, count as something else. Since there is no such highest common factor, this view, integral to ‘externalist’ accounts of knowledge, must be rejected (Travis 2005, 287).

Instead, Cook Wilson argues that, given that knowledge is factive in the sense that one knows p only if p, an externalist account would have it that for someone to know or to be in error (while thinking that one knows) would just be undistinguishable states, since it would depend on some factors external to that person:

… the two states of mind in which the man conducts his arguments, the correct and the erroneous one, are quite undistinguishable to the man himself. But if this is so, as the man does not know in the erroneous state of mind, neither can he know in the other state. (SI, 107)

Therefore, the possibility of undetectable error would, he claims, undermine the very possibility of “demonstrative knowledge” (SI, 107–108). In other words, if knowledge is factive, then there is no such thing as some condition under which one knows p erroneously; if not-p, one just does not know p. And the condition under which it might be discovered that one does not know p cannot be somehow cognitively inaccessible. To put it another way, Cook Wilson is suggesting that knowledge contains its object: “what we apprehend […] is included in the apprehension as a part of the activity or reality of apprehending” (SI, 70).

A similar line of argument has been used recently by McDowell against the ‘hybrid’ conception in ‘Criteria, Defeasibility and Knowledge’ (McDowell 1998, 374). But Cook Wilson added here a further thesis, an ‘accretion’ as Charles Travis puts it (Travis 2005, 289f.), namely that one is always in a position to know if one knows or if one merely believes:

The consciousness that the knowing process is a knowing process must be contained within the knowing process itself. (SI, 107)

This accretion, which was given further emphasis by Prichard (Prichard 1950, 86, 88 & 96), amounts to an early statement of the ‘knowing that one knows’ principle. It is related to the problem of the equivalence between ‘i knows that p’ and ‘i knows that i knows that p’ or Kip and KiKip in epistemic logic, first discussed by Jaakko Hintikka in his seminal book, Knowledge and Belief (Hintikka 1962, chap. 5). Hintikka pointed out, however, that Cook Wilson and Prichard merely restricted their remarks to the case where i is taken to be the first-person pronoun ‘I’ (Hintikka 1962, 110). The accretion is also related to Timothy Williamson's notion of ‘luminosity’: a condition C is said to be ‘luminous’ if and only if for every case a, if in a C obtains then in a one is in a position to know that C obtains (Williamson 2000, 95). However, for Williamson, who nevertheless remains an internalist, one can know without being in a position to know that one knows, so knowing is not luminous. For Williamson's argument against luminosity, see Williamson (2000, chap. 4).

A broadly similar conception of knowledge is also at work behind rejoinders to the argument from illusion in J. L. Austin's Sense and Sensibilia (Austin 1962) and John McDowell's ‘Knowledge and the Internal’ (McDowell 1998, 395–413). This is not to say that their positions are identical, as there are notable differences, e.g., when Austin rejects the accretion, while apparently McDowell does not. (See Travis (2005) for a discussion of this point.) In ‘Other Minds’ (Austin 1979, 76–116), Austin also argues anew for the thesis that ‘If I know, I can't be wrong’ (Austin 1979, 79), by pointing out that the claim that ‘I know that p’ provides a form of warrant for one's claim. (See Urmson (1988) for a discussion, in relation to Prichard.)

Cook Wilson still needs to account from his internalist standpoint for ‘real error’ as opposed to, say, ‘false opinion’. For that purpose, he distinguished in some of his most interesting descriptive analyses a further ‘form of consciousness’ which he called ‘being under the impression that’ (SI, 109–113). A typical example would be when I see the back of Smith on the street and, ‘being under the impression that’ it is my friend Jones, I tap him on the shoulder, only to realize my mistake when he turns his head. As Cook Wilson argues, it won't do to answer that I thought I knew but really did not, because it is not true that I thought I knew to begin with (SI, 109–110). This state simulates knowledge because of the absence of doubt, while not being the same as ‘being certain’. Prichard would later speak of ‘thinking without question’ or ‘taking for granted’ (Prichard 1950, 96–7):

A doubt requires a positive ground or basis: or, more fully, it is only possible to doubt one thing if we are convinced of, or, more accurately, think without question something else. Thus if I come to doubt whether the noise I heard was due to a car, as I at first thought without doubting, it is only because I am thinking without question that such a noise can be caused by something other than a car, say, an aeroplane. (Prichard 1950, 79)

This notion played a significant role in the writings of the ‘Oxford Realists’, not just those of Prichard but also those of William Kneale, H. H. Price and J. L. Austin—see, e.g., Kneale (1949, 5 & 18), Price (1935), and Austin (1962, 122). In his book on Belief, H. H. Price presented this notion as an important addition to the traditional ‘occurrence’ analysis of belief, as opposed to the then fashionable ‘dispositional’ analysis (Price 1966, 208–212). It was not, however, without critics. For example, H. P. Grice put forth a common objection when he argued that Cook Wilson's position leaves “no room for the possibility of thinking that we know p when in fact it is not the case that p”, while the introduction of the state of ‘being under the impression that’ does not solve the problem: “for what enables us to deny that all of our so-called knowledge is really only ‘taking for granted’?” (Grice 1989, 383–384).

Under Cook Wilson's conception, instances of ‘knowledge’ will turn out harder to find, mathematics providing the only prima facie cases. As Prichard was to put it: “In mathematics we have, without real possibility of question, an instance of knowledge; we are certain, we know” (Prichard 1919, 302). Joseph used the view to argue against Mill's empiricist account of mathematics, using ‘intuition’ where Cook Wilson would use ‘apprehension’ (Joseph 1916a, 543–553). Cook Wilson offered as an example of his concept of knowledge the axiom of parallels in Euclidean geometry. He held it to be “absolutely self-evident” (SI, 561), and he believed consequently that the idea of a non-Euclidean space is a “chimera” (SI, 456) and that the various non-Euclidean geometries are “the mere illusion of specialists” (SI, xxxix). He even tried to find a contradiction in them in order to “convince the rank and file of mathematicians” so that “they would at least not suppose the philosophic criticism, by which I intended anyhow to attack, somehow wrong” (SI, xcvi). This mistaken attitude greatly undermined the credibility of his views about knowledge. If, for any p, such as the axiom of parallels, some fail to ‘apprehend’ it, then Cook Wilson could only ask them to try and “remove […] whatever confusions or prejudices […] prevent them from apprehending the truth of the disputed proposition” (Furlong 1941, 128). Of course, this is no proper answer to, say, David Hilbert, the author of Grundlagen der Geometrie (Hilbert 1903).

5. Realism

Cook Wilson also argued against idealism that in apprehension it is neither the case that the object exists only within the apprehending consciousness, nor that it is constituted by it: it is just independent of it. This independence he considered to be presupposed by the very idea of knowledge. Arguing from analogy with the case of two bodies colliding, Cook Wilson reasoned that

… the apprehension of an object is only possible through a being of the object other than its being apprehended, and it is this being, no part itself of the apprehending thought, which is what is apprehended. (SI, 74)

Under this view, the object apprehended may or may not be ‘mental’. This also means that the object apprehended must not be some ‘copy’ of the real object:

… what I think of the red object is its own redness, not some mental copy of redness in my mind. I regard it as having real redness and not as having my copy of redness. […] If we ask in any instance what it is we think of a given object of knowledge, we find it always conceived as the nature or part of the nature of the thing known. (SI, 64)

Part of Cook Wilson's rejection of ‘hybrid’ accounts of knowledge (see previous section) precisely involved the rejection of epistemological ‘intermediaries’, so that knowledge is not of some representative or copy, but, in a sense, knowledge contains its object. He considered all such intermediaries—‘images’, ‘copies’, tertium quid, or ‘representatives’—as “not only useless in philosophy but misleading as tending to obscure the solution of a difficult problem” (SI, 772). (In this he stood in the tradition of Thomas Reid; his arguments were as a matter of fact developed at first against the Modern view of Locke and Berkeley, e.g., at (LL, § 10).) Of particular importance here is a long letter (SI, 764–800) to G. F. Stout, where Cook Wilson provided detailed criticisms of the latter's ‘Primary and Secondary Qualities’ (Stout 1904), and in which he wrote:

You begin an important section of your argument by assuming the idea of sensations being representative.

They { represent—express—stand for } something other than themselves.

Now, I venture to think that the idea of such representation in philosophy, or psychology rather, is very loose and treacherous and, if used at all, should be preceded by a ‘critique’ of such representative character, and an explanation of the exact sense in which the word representative is used. (SI, 769)

Against views of this kind, Cook Wilson developed three arguments in his letter: first, he pointed out that it is impossible to know anything about the relation between the representative and the object, since one can never truly compare the former to the latter. Secondly, he claimed that representationalist theories are always in danger of leading towards idealism, since one must then somehow ‘prove’ the existence of the object which is, so to speak, ‘behind’ its representatives—there might be none. Finally, he claimed that all such theories are begging the question, since the representative has to be apprehended in turn by the mind, and not only this further ‘apprehension’ remains unexplained, it would require that the mind be equipped with the very apparatus that the representationalist theories were, to begin with, devised to explain:

We want to explain knowing an object and we explain it solely in terms of the object known, and that by giving the mind not the object but some idea of it which is said to be like it—an image (however the fact may be disguised). The chief fallacy of this is not so much the impossibility of knowing such image is like the object, or that there is any object at all, but that it assumes the very thing it is intended to explain. The image itself has to be apprehended and the difficulty is only repeated. (SI, 803)

Cook Wilson also inveighed against Stout's notion of ‘sensible extension’ pointing out inter alia that it makes no sense to claim that these are extended without being in space (SI, 783) and he tried to explain how a given object may appear to have different shapes from different perspectives, without making an appeal to any representative (SI, 790f.).

Although, he never cites Cook Wilson, Stout felt compelled to answer his critique in print. (For a discussion, where Cook Wilson is portrayed as an ‘old’ or ‘naïve’ realist, see Nasim (2008, 30–40 & 94–98).) For example, Stout argued that he was not holding a view akin to Locke's representationalism, claiming that the ‘representative function’ of his ‘presentations’ is of a different nature, more like a memory-image would represent what is remembered (e.g., at (Stout 1911, 14f.)), but it is at first blush unclear what he meant by this. Against Cook Wilson's first argument, he claimed that in his conception presentations and presented objects form an “inseparable unity” (Stout 1911, 22), this being, once more, unclear. At all events, both Stout and Russell, in his theory of ‘sense-data’ as ‘objects of perception’ (Russell 1912), insisted that the physical object and the representative are ‘real’ but this ‘objectification’ of ‘appearing’ as ‘appearance’, to use Cook Wilson's language (SI, 796), does not annul his diagnosis of the difficulties inherent in that position. At least Russell was clearer about its implications, requiring a ‘logical construction’ of physical objects as functions of ‘sense-data’. One way to counter Cook Wilson on the absurdity of the locution ‘sensible extensions’ is to distinguish between ‘private’ and ‘public’ space, as Russell was to do in ‘The Relation of Sense-Data to Physics’ (Russell 1917, 139–171); as it is well-known, this postulation generates its own set of difficulties, e.g., the discovery that space must have 6 dimensions (Russell 1917, 154). Russell's theory was to become a favourite target for Prichard's acerbic wit in, e.g., Prichard (1915 & 1928).

There was no doctrinal unity among Cook Wilson's epigones on this issue. H. H. Price, who was at first close to Cook Wilson (Price 1924), incorporated a sense-data theory while rejecting phenomenalism in Perception (Price 1932); he became for that reason one of J. L. Austin's targets in Sense and Sensibilia (Austin 1962), which remains, for all its novelty (and the fact that it is aimed at Moore's peculiar brand of scepticism more than the standard Cartesian variety), faithful to Cook Wilson's orthodoxy on knowledge. Prichard, who was probably the first to put Cook Wilson's views into print in ‘Appearances and Reality’ (Prichard 1906), ended up arguing late in life that we really see only colour expansions, which we systematically mistake for or ‘take for granted’ as objects (Prichard 1950, 52–68). Nevertheless, a form of direct realism in the theory of perception remains one of the characteristic features of Oxford Realism and its heir, ‘ordinary language philosophy’. It is an ancestor to contemporary variants such as the position argued for by John McDowell in Mind and World (McDowell 1994).

6. Universals

Cook Wilson also argued against the neo-Kantian (not neo-Hegelian) views of idealists such as T. H. Green, that apprehension has no ‘synthetic’ character, i.e., he argued that any synthesis apprehended is attributed to the object and not the result of an activity of the ‘apprehending mind’. As he put it, “in the judgement of knowledge and the act of knowledge in general we do not combine our apprehensions, but apprehend a combination” (SI, 279), and it is “the nature of the elements themselves” which “determines which unity they have or can have”; the ‘apprehending mind’ has “no power whatever to make a complex idea out of simple ones” (SI, 524). This view implies that universals and connections between them are in rebus and to be apprehended as such (Price 1947, 336). As was pointed out earlier (section 3), ‘apprehension’ is, according to Cook Wilson, not mere ‘sensation’, because in the former one recognizes the definite character of a sensation, through comparison. So apprehension is of the universal in the sensation, albeit not necessarily an apprehension of it as universal. This conception implies that the universal is “strictly objective” and “not a mere thought of ours” (SI, 335). This view, Cook Wilson held as being in accordance with ordinary language and common sense, if not popular among philosophers (SI, 344–345).

The universal may be a “real unity in objects” (SI, 344), but Cook Wilson also believed that the reality of the universal cannot be separated from its particulars—which he preferred to call ‘particularization of the universal’ (SI, 336)—, because “the particular is not something that has the quality, it is the particularized quality” (SI, 713). The view is, therefore, that there is no possible apprehension of the universal except as particularized:

Just as the universal cannot be, except as particularized, so we cannot apprehend it except in the apprehension of a particular. (SI, 336)

Cook Wilson had already argued for a distinction between subject and attribute on the one hand, and subject and predicate on the other; there is a unique ‘logical subject’ but possibly many ‘subjects of attributes’ for a given statement (SI, 158–159). Cook Wilson's argument was that ‘That building is the Bodleian’ may be the answer to ‘What building is that?’ or ‘Which building is the Bodleian?’ (SI, 117–120), and that in the statement ‘That building is the Bodleian’, with the italics indicating that it is an answer to the second question, ‘that building’ is a subject of attributes but not the logical subject (SI, 158). He put this view to use to shed doubt on the traditional form, ‘S is P’ (SI, 114f.)—see also Joseph (1916a, 6 & 185). And he proposed that one avoids the misleading term ‘predicate’ by introducing ‘attributive’ (SI, 193). He also argued in these passages that the attribution holds between particulars only, and inferred further that

… the grammatical forms of our existing language are the expression of particulars; not, however, of mere particulars (there is no such thing), but of particulars of universals. It is this which makes it fallacious to use ordinary grammatical forms unguardedly for universals qua universals, that is for universals when expressly stated in the form of universal nouns proper. (SI, 191)

(For further elaboration on this point, see the beginning of next section.)

One could say that Cook Wilson held a moderate form of nominalism about universals, which is actually rather close to the better-known view of G. F. Stout (Stout 1930). Cook Wilson corresponded in 1903–1904 with Stout, who published his theory of universals only in 1921, and there are reasons to believe that Stout took some of his key ideas from Cook Wilson, e.g., when he reported with approval Cook Wilson stating that “square shape is not squareness plus shape; squareness itself is a special way of being a shape” (Stout 1930, 398). Even the term ‘character’, that stands for what are also known in the literature as ‘moments’ or ‘tropes’, was already Cook Wilson's. The universal is not, according to Cook Wilson, merely identical in all its particulars, but something definite, an ‘intrinsic character’ (SI, 342n. & 351), for which Cook Wilson reluctantly introduced the technical term ‘characteristic being of the universal’ (SI, 342). It is this ‘characteristic being’ which we are said to apprehend, but “neither as universal nor as particularized” (SI, 343). That Cook Wilson's view prefigured Stout's is not generally known, simply because Cook Wilson's has been ignored. (There are but a few notable exceptions, e.g., when P. F. Strawson gives to non-relational ties between particulars—e.g., between the particular Socrates and the particular event of his death—the name ‘attributive ties’ in memory of Cook Wilson (Strawson 1959, 168), or a mention of Cook Wilson among early 20th century proponents of tropes in the seminal paper ‘Truth-Makers’ by K. Mulligan, P. Simons & B. Smith (Mulligan, Simons & Smith 1984, 293n.).)

There are, however, some notable differences with Stout. The ‘characteristic being’ of an universal is not to be captured in terms of similarity (SI, 344 & 347), but Cook Wilson did not go so far as to introduce here, as Stout was to do, a fundamentum relationis, i.e., the ‘distributive unity of a class’ (Stout 1930, 388). For he believed that this unity of the universal is inexplicable, because the relation between particular and universal, although fundamental and thus presupposed by any explanation (SI, 335 & 345), is—again—sui generis, therefore not explicable: “The nature of the universal therefore necessarily and perpetually eludes any attempt to explain itself” (SI, 348). His argument was that one could not explain, say, ‘triangularity’ except by treating it as a particular, i.e., putting it in the subject position of a phrase, therefore assuming that we could apprehend it in abstraction from any particular, which is, according to him, impossible.

7. Logic

Cook Wilson used his views on statements as attributing particulars to particulars as a basis for an attack on mathematical logic, aiming in particular at Russell. His argument appears to be this: when one says that ‘a is a triangle’, one can be construed as predicating of a substance a the universal ‘triangularity’. If, however, one reasons analogously, stating that ‘triangularity is an universal’, one would thus put the universal ‘triangularity’ in the subject position—the ‘nominative case to the verb’ as he quaintly puts it (SI, 349)—thereby treating it as if it were a substance, while one would put ‘universal’ in the predicate position, thereby implying that there is a ‘universal of universals’ or ‘universalness’, of which universals would be the particulars. But then ‘universalness’ would be a particular of itself, which is, Cook Wilson claims, “obviously absurd” (SI, 350). Therefore, one is bound to commit a fallacy with such locutions. Cook Wilson thought that this line of reasoning shows that Russell's paradox of the class of all classes that do not contain themselves (Russell 1903, chap. X) is a “mere fallacy of language” (SI, cx). He argued at length (SI, §§ 422–32, 477–500 & 501–18) that there is no more ‘class of classes’ than ‘universalness’ can be said to be the ‘universal of universals’ and that it is no more possible for a class to be a member of itself than ‘universalness’ could be a particular of itself. Cook Wilson had but contempt for what he called “the puerilities of certain paradoxical authors” (SI, 348). He even wrote to Bosanquet:

I am afraid I am obliged to think that a man is conceited as well as silly to think such puerilities are worthy to be put in print: and it's simply exasperating to think that he finds a publisher (where was the publisher's reader?), and that in this way such contemptible stuff can even find its way into examinations. (SI, 739)

The problem with Cook Wilson's argument is that it is based on an elementary confusion between membership of a class and inclusion of classes. Peter Geach called Cook Wilson “an execrably bad logician” (Geach 1978, 123) for committing blunders such as this. For a clear statement of this mistake, see SI (733–734). Geach also points out another elementary blunder in the exchange of letters with Lewis Carroll, when Cook Wilson claimed that it is not possible to ‘know’ that ‘Some S is P’ without knowing which S it is which is P (Carroll 1977, 376).

Cook Wilson's main reason for opposing Russell was simply that logical inferences are exhausted by syllogistic, while “mathematical inference as such is not syllogistic” (SI, xcvi), but he also believed that his views about universals confirm Plato's doctrine of assumbletoi arithmoi or ‘unaddible numbers’, which he interpreted as meaning that numbers are universals, e.g., ‘3’ stands for ‘3-ness’ as apprehended in any particular group of 3, and therefore not magnitudes that could be added; the implication here being that the usual logicist definition of natural numbers would not be possible. As a matter fact, on this view… no account of numbers is possible (SI, 342). For the same reasons, Cook Wilson also criticized Richard Dedekind's definition of continuity in Stetigkeit und die irrationale Zahlen (Dedekind 1872), which he called “a mere fantastic chimera” (SI, 352). (See (OPD) for the details of this peculiar critique.)

Cook Wilson made no positive contribution to logic, but some of his remarks pertaining rather to the philosophy of logic had a life of their own. Cook Wilson believed that all statements are ‘categorical’, so he was obliged to explain away ‘hypothetical judgements’. He did so in claiming that “in the hypothetical attitude”, we apprehend “a relation between two problems” (SI, 542–543), in other words that conditionals do not express judgements but connections between questions—see also (LL, §§ 98–99). This view was elaborated by Ryle into his controversial stance on indicative conditionals as ‘inference-tickets’ in ‘‘If’, ‘So’, and ‘Because’’ (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 234–249). Ryle compared conditionals of the form ‘If p, then q’, to “bills for statements that statements could fill” (Ryle 1971, vol. II, 240) and he rejected the form ‘If p then q, but p, therefore q’, claiming that in some way the p in the major premise cannot for that reason be the same as p asserted by itself. This, of course, runs directly afoul of Geach's celebrated ‘Frege Point’ (Geach 1972).

Cook Wilson's distinction between subject/attribute and logical subject/predicate (see section 6) was put to use by P. F. Strawson against the possibility of a strict ontological distinction between entities that can only be put in the ‘subject’ place and those that can only be put in the ‘predicate’ place (Strawson 1959, 144). Cook Wilson can also be taken here as implying that the meaning of a statement might be determined by the question to which it is an answer, as did R. G. Collingwood (Collingwood 1938, 265n.), who used the idea as the basis for his ‘logic of questions and answers’ (Collingwood 1939, chap. 5; 1940, chaps. 3–4), the idea being further developed since by the linguist Oswald Ducrot (Ducrot 1980, 42f.). Collingwood, however, would have been reluctant to recognize Cook Wilson's idea as an inspiration, since he thought ill of the idea of ‘apprehensions’ as a non-derivative basis for knowledge, since knowledge comes, according to him, from asking questions first (Collingwood 1939, 25).

8. Moral Philosophy

Cook Wilson hardly wrote on topics outside the theory of knowledge and logic, but two remarks ought to be made concerning moral philosophy. First, the last piece included in Statement and Inference is composed of notes for an address to a discussion society in 1897, that was announced as ‘The Ontological Proof for God's Existence’. In this text, which opens with a discussion of Hutcheson and Butler, Cook Wilson argued that in the case of “emotions as are proper to the moral consciousness”, such as the feeling of gratitude:

We cannot separate the judgement from the act as something in itself speculative and in itself without the emotion. We cannot judge here except emotionally. This is true also of all moral and aesthetic judgements. Reason in them can only manifest itself emotionally. (SI, 860)

He argued further, in what amounts to a form of moral realism, that there must be a real experience, i.e., in the case of gratitude, “Goodwill of a person, then, must here be a real experience” (SI, 861), and that the feeling of “reverence with its solemnity and awe” is in itself “not fear, love, admiration, respect, but something quite sui generis” (SI, 861). It is a feeling that, Cook Wilson argued, “seems directed to one spirit and one alone, and only possible for spirit conceived as God” (SI, 864). In other words, the existence of the feeling of reverence presupposes that God exists. This may not be the most convincing argument for the existence of God, but Cook Wilson sketched within of a few pages a theory of emotions which is echoed today in the moral realism that has been developed, without knowledge of this previous theory, in the wake of David Wiggins' ‘Truth, Invention and the Meaning of Life’ (Wiggins 1976) and a series of influential papers by John McDowell—now collected in McDowell (2001).

Secondly, and more importantly, Prichard is also responsible for an extension of Cook Wilson's philosophy to moral philosophy, with his paper ‘Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?’ (Prichard 1912), whose main argument is analogous to Cook Wilson's argument for the irreducibility of knowledge. In short, duty is sui generis and not definable in terms of something else. The parallel is mentioned at Prichard (1912, 21 & 35–36). That we ought to do certain things, we are told, arises “in our unreflective consciousness, being an activity of moral thinking occasioned by the various situations in which we find ourselves”, and the demand that it is proved that we ought to do these things is “illegitimate” (Prichard 1912, 36). In order to find out our duty, “the only remedy lies in actual getting into a situation which occasions the obligation” and “then letting our moral capacities of thinking to do their work” (Prichard 1912, 37). This paper became so influential that Prichard was elected in 1928 to the White's Chair of Moral Philosophy at Corpus Christi, although his primary domain of competence had been the theory of knowledge. His papers in moral philosophy were edited after his death as Prichard (1949, now 2002). Prichard stands at the origin of the school of ‘moral’ or ‘Oxford intuitionism’, of which another pupil of Cook Wilson, the Aristotle scholar Sir David Ross remains the foremost representative (along with H. W. B. Joseph, E. F. Carritt, and J. Laird). Some of the views expressed by Prichard and Ross (Ross 1930, 1939) have recently gained new currency with the advent of ‘moral particularism’, e.g., in the writings of Jonathan Dancy (Dancy 1993, 2004).

9. Legacy

The legacy of Cook Wilson can be plotted through successive generations of Oxford philosophers, from his pupils H. A. Prichard and H. W. B. Joseph, to the post-World War I generation of the 1920s, including Frank Hardie, W. C. Kneale, J. D. Mabbott, H. H. Price, R. Robinson, and G. Ryle, and to the early analytic philosophers of the 1930s, J. L. Austin, I. Berlin, J. O. Urmson, and H. L. A. Hart, in particular. For example, see Isaiah Berlin's description of Hart as “an excellent solid Cook Wilsonian” in a letter to Price (Berlin 2004, 509) or his own admission that he was at first an Oxford Realist (Jahanbegloo 1992, 153). (See Marion (2000, 490-508) for further details.) So ‘Oxford Realism’ first dislodged ‘British Idealism’ from its position of prominence at Oxford and then morphed into ‘ordinary language philosophy’. Through Prichard, Cook Wilson is also somehow genetically related to the ‘moral intuitionism’ that flourished at Oxford in the 1930s. The only Oxford philosopher of note who opposed the ‘realists’ before World War II was R. G. Collingwood, who felt increasingly alienated and ended up reduced to invective: he described their theory of knowledge as “based upon the grandest foundation a philosophy can have, namely human stupidity” (Collingwood 1940, 34) and their attitude towards moral philosophy as a “mental kind of decaudation” (Collingwood 1939, 50). Collingwood had another more telling complaint, when he criticized the Oxford Realists for being only interested in assessing the truth or falsity of particular philosophical theses, without paying attention to the fact that the meaning of the concepts involved may evolve through history, as there might simply be no ‘eternal problem’ (Collingwood 1939, chap. 7). This lack of historical sensitivity is indeed another feature of analytic philosophy that arguably originates in Cook Wilson and Prichard.

In the post-World War II years, Cook Wilson's name gradually faded away (e.g., there is no mention of him in (Woozley 1949), which nevertheless argues for some of his views), while ‘ordinary language philosophy’, which owed a lot to his constant reliance on ordinary language against philosophical jargon, blossomed. The historical importance of Cook Wilson's influence cannot, therefore, be underestimated. The ‘realist’ reaction against British idealism at the turn of the 20th century was not confined to the well-known rebellion of G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell at Cambridge. There were also ‘realisms’ sprouting in Manchester (with Robert Adamson and Samuel Alexander), and in Oxford, where Thomas Case had already argued for realism in Physical Realism (Case 1888). (On Case, see Marion (2002b).) In Oxford, it is Cook Wilson who turned the tide and, as one of the originators of ordinary language philosophy, which is but one of the many strands going under the name of ‘analytic philosophy’, he should be counted among its ancestors.

There was, however, a deleterious side to Cook Wilson's influence, as his contempt for mathematical logic explains why, although his criticisms of Russell's theory of classes utterly fail to convince, one had to wait until after World War II for modern formal logic first to be taught at Oxford, with the appointment of Hao Wang. In the 1930s, H. H. Price was still teaching deductive logic from H. W. B. Joseph's An Introduction to Logic (Joseph 1916a) and inductive logic from Mill's System of Logic. Cook Wilson's reactionary attitude towards modern logic might also explain why he was forgotten after World War II, and why many hesitate today to mention his name.

As the tide of ‘ordinary language’ ebbed, however, Cook Wilson's views on knowledge showed more resilience, so to speak. In the 1960's, Phillips Griffiths' anthology, Knowledge and Belief included excerpts from Cook Wilson (Phillips Griffiths 1967, 16–27) and John Passmore was able to write that “Cook Wilson's logic may have had few imitators; but his soul goes on marching on in Oxford theories of knowledge” (Passmore 1968, 257). In the United States, Cook Wilson's views on knowledge had a formative influence on the thought of Wilfrid Sellars, who studied at Oxford in the mid-1930s, and whose views are in turn of importance for McDowell (McDowell 1994, 1998). In his ‘Autobiographical Reflections’, Sellars wrote:

I soon came under the influence of H. A. Prichard and, through him, of Cook Wilson. I found here, or at least seemed to find, a clearly articulated approach to philosophical issues which undercut the dialectic, rooted in Descartes, which led to both Hume and 19th Century Idealism. At the same time, I discovered Thomas Reid and found him appealing for much the same reasons. (Sellars 1975, 284)

Cook Wilson himself had already spoken of an “insidious and scarcely ‘conscious’ dialectic” that “has done much mischief in modern metaphysics and theories of perception” (SI, 797), one according to which “empiricism ends in the Subjective Idealism it was intended to avoid” (LL, § 10).

As was shown in section 4, Cook Wilson's views on knowledge remain influential to this day: not only the idea that knowledge is factive and indefinable was argued for anew by J. L. Austin, whose ideas have been further developed recently, along different paths, by Peter Hacker (Hacker 1988) and Charles Travis (Travis 1989, 2005), it was taken up recently by philosophers as significantly different as John McDowell (McDowell 1994, 1998) and Timothy Williamson (Williamson 2000, 2007), who is since 2000 Cook Wilson's successor as Wykeham Professor of Logic, New College. One has, therefore, what Charles Travis once described as “an Oxford tradition despite itself” (Travis 1989, xii)—on this last point, see also Williamson (2007, 269–270n).


Primary Sources

Writings by Cook Wilson

For a complete list of Cook Wilson's publications during his lifetime, see (SI, lxv–lxxii). Cook Wilson's papers were deposited at the Bodleian Library, University of Oxford, in 1970, ref. GB 161 MSS. Top. Oxon. c. 580–4, and a carbon copy of his lecture notes on Plato's The Republic, that had been in possession of A. D. Woozley, was donated to the Houghton Library, Harvard University, in 2008.

Oxford Philosophy

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Austin, John Langshaw | knowledge: analysis of | non-naturalism, moral | perception: the problem of | Prichard, Harold Arthur | properties | tropes


Thanks to Cora Diamond, Colin Tyler and an anonymous referee for help in writing this entry.