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Quantum Approaches to Consciousness

First published Tue Nov 30, 2004; substantive revision Fri Dec 15, 2006

It is widely accepted that consciousness or, more generally, mental activity is in some way correlated to the behavior of the material brain. Since quantum theory is the most fundamental theory of matter that is currently available, it is a legitimate question to ask whether quantum theory can help us to understand consciousness. Several approaches answering this question affirmatively, proposed in recent decades, will be surveyed. It will be pointed out that they make different epistemological assumptions, refer to different neurophysiological levels of description, and use quantum theory in different ways. For each of the approaches discussed, problematic and promising features will be equally highlighted.

1. Introduction

The problem of how mind and matter are related to each other has many facets, and it can be approached from many different starting points. Of course, the historically leading disciplines in this respect are philosophy and psychology, which were later joined by behavioral science, cognitive science and neuroscience. In addition, the physics of complex systems and quantum physics have played stimulating roles in the discussion from their beginnings.

As regards the issue of complexity, this is quite evident: the brain is one of the most complex systems we know. The study of neural networks, their relation to the operation of single neurons and other important topics do and will profit a lot from complex systems approaches. As regards quantum physics, the situation is different. Although there can be no reasonable doubt that quantum events occur in the brain as elsewhere in the material world, it is the subject of controversy whether these events are in any way efficacious and relevant for those aspects of brain activity that are correlated with mental activity.

The original motivation in the early 20th century for relating quantum theory to consciousness was essentially philosophical. It is fairly plausible that conscious free decisions (“free will”) are problematic in a perfectly deterministic world,[1] so quantum randomness might indeed open up novel possibilities for free will. (On the other hand, randomness is problematic for volition!)

Quantum theory introduced an element of randomness standing out against the previous deterministic worldview, in which randomness, if it occurred at all, simply indicated our ignorance of a more detailed description (as in statistical physics). In sharp contrast to such epistemic randomness, quantum randomness in processes such as spontaneous emission of light, radioactive decay, or other examples of state reduction was considered a fundamental feature of nature, independent of our ignorance or knowledge. To be precise, this feature refers to individual quantum events, whereas the behavior of ensembles of such events is statistically determined. The indeterminism of individual quantum events is constrained by statistical laws.

Other features of quantum theory, which were found attractive in discussing issues of consciousness, were the concepts of complementarity and entanglement. Pioneers of quantum physics such as Planck, Bohr, Schrödinger, Pauli (and others) emphasized the various possible roles of quantum theory in reconsidering the old conflict between physical determinism and conscious free will. For informative overviews see e.g., Squires 1990 and Butterfield 1998.

In this contribution, some popular approaches for applying quantum theory to consciousness will be surveyed and compared. Section 2 outlines two fundamentally different philosophical options for conceiving of relations between material and mental states of systems. Section 3 addresses three different neurophysiological levels of description, to which particular different quantum approaches refer. After some introductory remarks, Section 4 sketches the individual approaches themselves — Section 4.2: Stapp, Section 4.3: from Umezawa to Vitiello, Section 4.4: Beck and Eccles, Section 4.5: Penrose and Hameroff, and Section 4.6: “dual-aspect” approaches such as have been tentatively proposed by Pauli and Jung as well as Bohm and Hiley. Section 5 offers some comparative conclusions.

2. Philosophical Background Assumptions

Variants of the dichotomy between mind and matter range from their fundamental distinction at a primordial level of description to the emergence of mind (consciousness) from the brain as an extremely sophisticated and highly developed material system. Informative overviews can be found in Popper and Eccles (1977), Chalmers (1996), and Pauen (2001).

One important aspect of all discussions about the relation between mind and matter is the distinction between descriptive and explanatory approaches. For instance, correlation is a descriptive term with empirical relevance, while causation is an explanatory term associated with theoretical attempts to understand correlations. Causation implies correlations between cause and effect, but this does not always apply the other way around: correlations between two systems can result from a common cause in their history rather than from a direct causal interaction.

In the fundamental sciences, one typically speaks of causal relations in terms of interactions. In physics, for instance, there are four fundamental kinds of interactions (electromagnetic, weak, strong, gravitational) which serve to explain the correlations that are observed in physical systems. As regards the mind-matter problem, the situation is more difficult. Far from a theoretical understanding in this field, the existing body of knowledge essentially consists of empirical correlations between material and mental states. These correlations are descriptive, not explanatory; they are not causally conditioned. It is (for some purposes) interesting to know that particular brain areas are activated during particular mental activities; but this does, of course, not explain why they are. Thus, it would be premature to talk about mind-matter interactions in the sense of causal relations. For the sake of terminological clarity, the neutral notion of relations between mind and matter will be used in this article.

In most approaches used to discuss relations between material [ma] brain states and mental [me] states of consciousness, these relations are conceived in a direct way (A):

[ma] image 1 [me]

This provides a minimal framework to study reduction, supervenience, or emergence relations (Kim 1998; Stephan 1999) which can yield both monistic and dualistic pictures. For instance, there is the classical stance of strong reduction, claiming that all mental states and properties can be reduced to the material domain (materialism) or even to physics (physicalism).[2] This point of view claims that it is both necessary and sufficient to explore and understand the material domain, e.g., the brain, in order to understand the mental domain, e.g., cognition. More or less, this leads to a monistic picture, in which any need to discuss mental states is eliminated right away or at least considered as epiphenomenal. While mind-brain correlations are still legitimate though causally inefficacious from an epiphenomenalist point of view, eliminative materialism renders even correlations irrelevant.

The most discussed counterarguments against the validity of such strong reductionist approaches are qualia arguments, which emphasize the impossibility for materialist accounts to properly incorporate the quality of the subjective experience of a mental state, the “what it is like” (Nagel 1974) to be in that state. This leads to a gap between third-person and first-person accounts for which Chalmers (1995) has coined the notion of the “hard problem of consciousness”. Another, less well known counterargument is that the physical domain itself is not causally closed. Any experiment, even in classical physics, requires to fix boundary conditions and initial conditions which are not given by the fundamental laws of nature (Primas 2002). Of course, this causal gap becomes even more challenging in quantum physics, as indicated in the introduction. A third class of counterarguments refer to the difficulties to include notions of temporal present and nowness in a physical description (Franck 2004).

However, direct relations between mental and material states can also be conceived in a non-reductionistic fashion. A number of variants of emergence (Stephan 1999) are prominent examples. Mental states and/or properties can be considered as emergent if the material brain is not necessary or not sufficient to explore and understand them.[3] This leads to a dualistic picture (less radical and more plausible than Cartesian dualism) in which residua remain if one attempts to reduce the mental to the material. Within a dualistic scheme of thinking, it becomes almost inevitable to discuss the question of causal influence between mental and material states. In particular, the causal efficacy of mental states upon brain states (“downward causation”) has recently attracted growing interest (Velmans, 2002).[4]

As an alternative to (A), it is possible to conceive mind-matter relations indirectly (B), via a third category:

[ma]     [me]
image 3image 3

This third category, here denoted [mame], is often regarded as being neutral with respect to the distinction between [ma] and [me], i.e., psychophysically neutral. In scenario (B), issues of reduction and emergence concern the relation between the unseparated “background reality” [mame] and the distinguished aspects [ma] and [me]. This will be discussed in more detail in Section 4.6.

Such a “dual aspect” option, although not much emphasized in contemporary mainstream discussions, has a long tradition. Early versions go back as far as Spinoza and Leibniz. In the early days of psychophysics in the 19th century, Fechner (1861) and Wundt (1911) advocated related views. Whitehead, the modern pioneer of process philosophy, referred to mental and physical poles of “actual occasions”, which themselves transcend their bipolar appearances (Whitehead 1978). Many approaches in the tradition of Feigl (1967) and Smart (1963), called “identity theories”, conceive mental and material states as essentially identical “central states”, yet considered from different perspectives. Other variants of this idea have been suggested by Jung and Pauli (1955) [see also Meier (2001) and Atmanspacher and Primas (1996, 2006)], involving Jung's conception of a psychophysically neutral, archetypal order, or by Bohm and Hiley (Bohm 1990; Bohm & Hiley 1993; Hiley 2001), referring to an implicate order which unfolds into the different explicate domains of the mental and the material.

From a psychological perspective, Velmans (2002) has recently presented a similar approach, backed up with empirical material, and Strawson (2003) has proposed a “real materialism” which uses a closely related scheme. Another proponent of such dual aspect thinking is Chalmers (1996), who considers the possibility that the underlying, psychophysically neutral level of description could be best characterized in terms of information.

Before proceeding further, it should be emphasized that many present-day approaches prefer to distinguish between first-person and third-person perspectives rather than mental and material states. This terminology serves to highlight the discrepancy between immediate conscious experiences (“qualia”) and their description, be it behavioral, neural, or biophysical. The notion of the “hard problem” of consciousness research refers to bridging the gap between first-person experience and third-person accounts of it. In the present contribution, mental conscious states are implicitly assumed to be related to first-person experience. This does not mean, however, that the problem of how to define consciousness precisely is considered as resolved. Ultimately, it will be (at least) as difficult to define a mental state in rigorous terms as it is to define a material state.

3. Neurophysiological Levels of Description

3.1 Neuronal Assemblies

A mental system can be in many different conscious, intentional mental states. In a hypothetical state space, a sequence of such states forms a trajectory representing what is often called the stream of consciousness. Since different subsets of the state space are typically associated with different stability properties, a mental state can be assumed to be more or less stable, depending on its position in the state space. Stable states are distinguished by a residence time longer than that of metastable or unstable states. If a mental state is stable with respect to perturbations, it “activates” a mental representation encoding a content that is consciously perceived.

Moving from this purely psychological, or cognitive, description to its neurophysiological counterpart leads us to the question: What is the neural correlate of a mental representation? According to standard accounts (cf. Noë & Thompson (2004) for recent discussion), mental representations are correlated with the activity of neuronal assemblies, i.e., ensembles of several thousands of coupled neurons. The neural correlate of a mental representation can be characterized by the fact that the connectivities, or couplings, among those neurons form an assembly confined with respect to its environment, to which connectivities are weaker than within the assembly. The neural correlate of a mental representation is activated if the neurons forming the assembly operate more actively, e.g., produce higher firing rates, than in their default mode.

figure 1
Figure 1: Balance between inhibitory and excitatory connections among neurons.

In order to achieve a stable operation of an activated neuronal assembly, there must be a subtle balance between inhibitory and excitatory connections among neurons (cf. Figure 1). If the transfer function of individual neurons is strictly monotonic, i.e., increasing input leads to increasing output, assemblies are difficult to stabilize. For this reason, recent results establishing a non-monotonic transfer function with a maximal output at intermediate input are of high significance for the modeling of neuronal assemblies Kuhn et al. 2004). For instance, network models using lattices of coupled maps with quadratic maximum (Kaneko & Tsuda 2000) are paradigmatic examples of such behavior. These and other familiar models of neuronal assemblies (for an overview see Anderson & Rosenfeld 1988) are mostly formulated in a way not invoking well-defined elements of quantum theory. An explicit exception is the approach by Umezawa, Vitiello and others (see Section 4.3).

3.2 Single Neurons and Synapses

The fact that neuronal assemblies are mostly described in terms of classical behavior does not rule out that classically undescribable quantum effects may be significant if one focuses on individual constituents of assemblies, i.e., single neurons or interfaces between them. These interfaces, through which the signals between neurons propagate, are called synapses. There are electrical and chemical synapses, depending on whether they transmit a signal electrically or chemically.

At electrical synapses, the current generated by the action potential at the presynaptic neuron flows directly into the postsynaptic cell, which is physically connected to the presynaptic terminal by a so-called gap junction. At chemical synapses, there is a cleft between pre- and postsynaptic cell. In order to propagate a signal, a chemical transmitter (glutamate) is released at the presynaptic terminal. This release process is called exocytosis. The transmitter diffuses across the synaptic cleft and binds to receptors at the postsynaptic membrane, thus opening an ion channel (Kandel et al. 2000, part III; see Fig. 2). Chemical transmission is slower than electric transmission.

Figure 2
Figure 2: Release of neurotransmitters at the synaptic cleft (exocytosis).

A model developed by Beck and Eccles applies concrete quantum mechanical features to describe details of the process of exocytosis. Their model proposes that quantum processes are relevant for exocytosis and, moreover, are tightly related to states of consciousness. This will be discussed in more detail in Section 4.4.

At this point, another approach developed by Flohr (2000) should be mentioned, for which chemical synapses with a specific type of receptors, so-called NMDA receptors,[5] are of paramount significance. Briefly, Flohr observes that the specific plasticity of NMDA receptors is a necessary condition for the formation of extended stable neuronal assemblies correlated to (higher-order) mental representations which he identifies with conscious states. Moreover, he indicates a number of mechanisms caused by anaesthetic agents, which block NMDA receptors and consequently lead to a loss of consciousness. Flohr's approach is physicalistic and reductionistic, but it is entirely independent of any specific quantum ideas.

3.3 Microtubuli

The lowest neurophysiological level, at which quantum processes have been proposed as a correlate to consciousness, is the level at which the interior of single neurons is considered: their cytoskeleton. It consists of protein networks essentially made up of two kinds of structures, neurofilaments and microtubuli (Fig. 3, left), which are essential for various transport processes within neurons (as well as other cells). Microtubuli are long polymers usually constructed of 13 longitudinal α and β-tubulin dimers arranged in a tubular array with an outside diameter of about 25 nm (Fig. 3, right). For more details see Kandel et al. (2000), Chap. II.4.

Figure 3a       Figure 3b

Figure 3: (left) microtubuli and neurofilaments, the width of the figure corresponds to approximately 700nm; (right) tubulin dimers, consisting of α- and β-monomers, constituting a microtubule.

The tubulins in microtubuli are the substrate which, in Hameroff's proposal, is used to embed Penrose's theoretical framework neurophysiologically. As will be discussed in more detail in Section 4.5, tubulin states are assumed to depend on quantum events, so that quantum coherence among different tubulins is possible. Further, a crucial thesis in the scenario of Penrose and Hameroff is that the (gravitation-induced) collapse of such coherent tubulin states corresponds to elementary acts of consciousness.

4. Selected Examples

4.1 Ways to Use Quantum Theory

In the following, (some of) the better known and partly worked out approaches that use concepts of quantum theory for inquiries into the nature of consciousness will be presented and discussed. For this purpose, the philosophical distinctions A/B (Section 2) and the neurophysiological distinctions addressed in Section 3 will be used as guidelines to classify the respective quantum approaches in a systematic way. However, some preliminary qualifications concerning different possible ways to use quantum theory are in order.

There are quite a number of accounts discussing quantum theory in relation to consciousness that adopt basic ideas of quantum theory in a purely metaphorical manner. Quantum theoretical terms such as entanglement, superposition, collapse, complementarity, and others are used without specific reference to how they are defined precisely and how they are applicable to specific situations. For instance, conscious acts are just postulated to be interpretable somehow analogously to physical acts of measurement, or correlations in psychological systems are just postulated to be interpretable somehow analogously to physical entanglement. Such accounts may provide fascinating science fiction, and they may even be important to inspire nuclei of ideas to be worked out in detail. But unless such detailed work leads beyond vague metaphors and analogies, they do not yet represent scientific progress. Approaches falling into this category will not be discussed in this contribution.

A second category includes approaches that use the status quo of present-day quantum theory to describe neurophysiological and/or neuropsychological processes. Among these approaches, the one with the longest history was initiated by von Neumann in the 1930s, later taken up by Wigner, and currently championed by Stapp. It can be roughly characterized as the proposal to consider intentional conscious acts as intrinsically correlated with physical state reductions. Another fairly early idea dating back to Ricciardi and Umezawa in the 1960s is to treat mental states, particularly memory states, in terms of vacuum states of quantum fields. A prominent proponent of this approach at present is Vitiello. Finally, there is the idea suggested by Beck and Eccles in the 1990s, according to which quantum mechanics is relevant for the description of exocytosis at the synaptic cleft.

The third category refers to further developments or generalizations of present-day quantum theory. An obvious candidate in this respect is the proposal by Penrose to relate elementary conscious acts to gravitation-induced reductions of quantum states. Ultimately, this requires the framework of a future theory of quantum gravity which is far from having been developed. Together with Penrose, Hameroff has argued that microtubuli might be the right place to look for such state reductions. Another set of approaches is based on generalizations of quantum theory beyond quantum physics proper. In this way, formally generalized concepts such as complementarity and entanglement can be applied to phenomena in both mental and material domains. In particular, relations between the two can be conceived in terms of dual aspects of one underlying “reality”. This conception, drawing on the philosophies of Spinoza and Leibniz, has been considered attractive by 20th century scientists such as Bohr, Pauli, Bohm, Primas, d'Espagnat, and others. Some of the proposed scenarios will be sketched.

4.2 Stapp: Quantum State Reductions and Conscious Acts

The act or process of measurement is a crucial aspect in the framework of quantum theory, that has been the subject of controversy for more than seven decades now. In his monograph on the mathematical foundations of quantum mechanics, von Neumann (1955, Chap. V.1) introduced, in an ad hoc manner, the projection postulate as a mathematical tool for describing measurement in terms of a discontinuous, non-causal, instantaneous and irreversible act given by (1) the transition of a quantum state to an eigenstate bj of the measured observable B (with a certain probability). This transition is often called the collapse or reduction of the wavefunction, as opposed to (2) the continuous, unitary (reversible) evolution of a system according to the Schrödinger equation.

In Chapter VI, von Neumann (1955) discussed the conceptual distinction between observed and observing system. In this context, he applied (1) and (2) to the general situation of a measured object system (I), a measuring instrument (II), and (the brain of) a human observer (III). His conclusion was that it makes no difference for the result of measurements on (I) whether the boundary between observed and observing system is posited between I and (II & III) or between (I & II) and III. As a consequence, it is inessential whether a detector or the human brain is ultimately referred to as the “observer”.[6]

By contrast to von Neumann's fairly cautious stance, London and Bauer (1939) went much further and proposed that it is indeed human consciousness which completes quantum measurement (see Jammer (1974, Sec. 11.3 or Shimony (1963) for a detailed account). In this way, they attributed a crucial role to consciousness in understanding quantum measurement — a truly radical position. In the 1960s, Wigner (1967) followed up on this proposal,[7] coining his now proverbial example of “Wigner's friend”. In order to describe measurement as a real dynamical process generating irreversible facts, Wigner called for some nonlinear modification of (2) to replace von Neumann's projection (1).[8]

Since the 1980s, Stapp has developed his own point of view on the background of von Neumann and Wigner. In particular, he tries to understand specific features of consciousness in relation to quantum theory. Inspired by von Neumann, Stapp uses the freedom to place the interface between observed and observing system and locates it in the observer's brain. He does not suggest any modifications to present-day quantum theory but adds major interpretational extensions, in particular with respect to a detailed ontological framework.

In his earlier work, Stapp (1993) starts with Heisenberg's distinction between the potential and the actual (Heisenberg 1958), implementing a decisive step beyond the operational Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics. Heisenberg's notion of the actual is related to a measured event in the sense of the Copenhagen interpretation. However, Heisenberg's notion of the potential, of a tendency, relates to the situation before measurement, which expresses the idea of a reality independent of measurement.[9]

Immediately after its actualization, each event holds the tendency for the impending actualization of another, subsequent actual event. Therefore, events are by definition ambiguous. With respect to their actualized aspect, Stapp's essential move is to “attach to each Heisenberg actual event an experiential aspect. The latter is called the feel of this event, and it can be considered to be the aspect of the actual event that gives it its status as an intrinsic actuality” (Stapp 1993, p. 149).

With respect to their tendency aspect, it is tempting to understand events in terms of scheme (B) of Sec. 2. This is related to Whitehead's ontology, in which mental and physical poles of so-called “actual occasions” are considered as psychological and physical aspects of reality. The potential antecedents of actual occasions are psychophysically neutral and refer to a a mode of existence at which mind and matter are unseparated. This is expressed, for instance, by Stapp's notion of a “hybrid ontology” with “both idea-like and matter-like qualities” and “two complementary modes of evolution” (Stapp 1999, 159). Similarities with a dual aspect approach (B) (cf. Section 4.6) can clearly be recognized.

In a recent interview (Stapp 2006), Stapp specifies some ontological features of his approach with respect to Whitehead's process thinking, where actual occasions rather than matter or mind are fundamental elements of reality. They are conceived as based on a processual rather than a substantial ontology (see the entry on process philosophy). Stapp relates the fundamentally processual nature of actual occasions to both the physical act of state reduction and the correlated psychological intentional act.

Another significant aspect of his approach is the possibility that “conscious intentions of a human being can influence the activities of his brain” (Stapp 1999, 153). Different from the possibly misleading notion of a direct interaction, suggesting an interpretation in terms of scheme (A) of Sec. 2, he has recently described this feature in a much more subtle manner. The requirement that the mental and material outcomes of an actual occasion must match, i.e. be correlated, acts as a constraint on the way in which these outcomes are formed within the actual occasion (cf. Stapp 2006). The notion of interaction is thus replaced by the notion of a constraint set by mind-matter correlations.

At a level at which conscious mental states and material brain states are distinguished, each conscious experience, according to Stapp (1999, p. 153), has as its physical counterpart a quantum state reduction actualizing “the pattern of activity that is sometimes called the neural correlate of that conscious experience”. More precisely, this pattern of activity may encode an intention and, thus, represent a “template for action”. An intentional decision for an action, preceding the action itself, is then the key for anything like free will in this picture.

As to the quantum aspect of a template for action, Stapp argues that the mental effort, i.e. attention devoted to such intentional acts can protract the lifetime of the neuronal assemblies that represent the templates for action due to quantum Zeno-type effects. Concerning the neurophysiological implementation of this idea, intentional mental states are assumed to correspond to reductions of superposition states of neuronal assemblies. Additional commentary concerning the concepts of attention and intention in relation to James' idea of a holistic stream of consciousness (James 1950) is given in Stapp (1999).

For further progress, it will be mandatory to develop a coherent formal framework for this approach and elaborate on concrete details. For instance, it is not yet worked out precisely how quantum superpositions and their collapses are supposed to occur in neural correlates of conscious events. Some indications are outlined in a recent article by Schwartz et al. (2005). With these desiderata for future work, the overall conception is conservative insofar as the physical formalism remains unchanged. However, it contains a radical conceptual move insofar as quantum measurement is understood to involve a conscious act in addition to a physical process.

4.3 From Umezawa to Vitiello: Quantum Field Theory of Mind/Matter States

In the 1960s, Ricciardi and Umezawa (1967) suggested to utilize the formalism of quantum field theory to describe brain states, with particular emphasis on memory. The basic idea is to conceive of memory states in terms of states of many-particle systems, as inequivalent representations of vacuum states of quantum fields.[10] This proposal has gone through several refinements (e.g., Stuart et al. 1978, 1979; Jibu and Yasue 1995). Major recent progress has been achieved by including effects of dissipation, chaos, and quantum noise (Vitiello 1995; Pessa and Vitiello 2003). For readable nontechnical accounts of the approach in its present form see Vitiello (2001, 2002).

Quantum field theory (see the entry on quantum field theory) yields infinitely many representations of the commutation relations, which are inequivalent to the Schrödinger representation of standard quantum mechanics. Such inequivalent representations can be generated by spontaneous symmetry breaking (see the entry on symmetry and symmetry breaking), occuring when the ground state (or the vacuum state) of a system is not invariant under the full group of transformations providing the conservation laws for the system. If symmetry breaks down, collective modes are generated (so-called Nambu-Goldstone boson modes), which propagate over the system and introduce long-range correlations in it.

These correlations are responsible for the emergence of ordered patterns. Unlike in thermal systems, a large number of bosons can be condensed in an ordered state in a highly stable fashion. Roughly speaking, this provides a quantum field theoretical derivation of ordered states in many-body systems described in terms of statistical physics. In the proposal by Umezawa these dynamically ordered states represent coherent activity in neuronal assemblies.

The activation of a neuronal assembly is necessary to make the encoded content consciously accessible. This activation is considered to be initiated by external stimuli. Unless the assembly is activated, its content remains unconscious, unaccessed memory. According to Umezawa, coherent neuronal assemblies correlated to such memory states are regarded as vacuum states; their activation leads to excited states with a finite lifetime and enables a conscious recollection of the content encoded in the vacuum (ground) state. The stability of such states and the role of external stimuli have been investigated in detail by Stuart et al. (1978, 1979).

A decisive further step in developing the approach has been achieved by taking dissipation into account. Dissipation is possible when the interaction of a system with its environment is considered. Vitiello (1995) describes how the system-environment interaction causes a doubling of the collective modes of the system in its environment. This yields infinitely many differently coded vacuum states, offering the possibility of many memory contents without overprinting. Moreover, dissipation leads to finite lifetimes of the vacuum states, thus representing temporally limited rather than unlimited memory (Alfinito and Vitiello 2000; Alfinito et al. 2001). Finally, dissipation generates a genuine arrow of time for the system, and its interaction with the environment induces entanglement. In a recent contribution, Pessa and Vitiello (2003) have addressed additional effects of chaos and quantum noise.

It should be noted that most presentations of this approach do not consistently distinguish between mental states and material states. This suggests reducibility of mental activity to brain activity, within scenario (A) of Sec. 2, as an underlying assumption. In this sense, Umezawa's proposal addresses the brain as a many-particle system as a whole, where the “particles” are more or less neurons. In the language of Section 3.1, this refers to the level of neuronal assemblies, which has the benefit that this is the level which directly correlates with mental activity. Another merit of the quantum field theory approach is that it avoids the restrictions of standard quantum mechanics in a formally sound way. In these regards, the approach appears to be quite convincing.

Conceptually, however, it contains ambiguities demanding clarification, e.g., concerning the continuous confusion of mental and material states (and their properties). If mental states are the primary objects of reference, the quantum field theoretical treatment shows, in a very subtle and refined manner, metaphorical features. If quantum field theory is supposed to literally apply to material brain states, it remains to be specified how this is backed up by the results of contemporary neurobiology. Some first steps in this direction (Freeman and Vitiello 2006) suggest, however, that potential neurobiologically relevant observables such as electric field amplitudes or neurotransmitter concentration are purely classical and do not make use of the quantum ideas underlying the theory.

A provocative topic introduced by Vitiello (2001, Sec. 7.7), is the significance of forward and backward arrows of time due to the doubling of collective modes. In his final chapters, Vitiello (2001) argues that this doubling leads to a “time-reversed copy” of brain behavior which might be interpreted as its mental counterpart. In his words, “consciousness seems thus to emerge as a manifestation of the dissipative dynamics of the brain” (p. 141). Such a scenario ascribes comparable significance to material and mental properties and is evidently non-reductive.

4.4 Beck and Eccles: Quantum Mechanics at the Synaptic Cleft

Probably the most concrete and detailed suggestion of how quantum mechanics can play a role in brain processes is due to Beck and Eccles (1992), later refined by Beck (2001). It refers to particular mechanisms of information transfer at the synaptic cleft. However, ways in which these quantum processes might be relevant for mental activity, and in which their interactions with mental states are conceived, remain unclarified to the present day.

As presented in Section 3.2, the information flow between neurons in chemical synapses is initiated by the release of transmitters in the presynaptic terminal. This process is called exocytosis, and it is triggered by an arriving nerve impulse with some small probability. In order to describe the trigger mechanism in a statistical way, thermodynamics or quantum mechanics can be invoked. A look at the corresponding energy egimes shows (Beck and Eccles 1992) that quantum processes are distinguishable from thermal processes for energies higher than 10-2 eV (at room temperature). Assuming a typical length scale for biological microsites of the order of several nanometers, an effective mass below 10 electron masses is sufficient to ensure that quantum processes prevail over thermal processes.

The upper limit of the time scale of such processes in the quantum regime is of the order of 10-12 sec. This is significantly shorter than the time scale of cellular processes, which is 10-9 sec and longer. The sensible difference between the two time scales makes it possible to treat the corresponding processes as decoupled from one another.

The detailed trigger mechanism proposed by Beck and Eccles (1992) is based on the quantum concept of quasi-particles, reflecting the particle aspect of a collective mode. Skipping the details of the picture, the proposed trigger mechanism refers to tunneling processes of two-state quasi-particles, resulting in state collapses. It yields a probability of exocytosis in the range between 0 and 0.7, in agreement with empirical observations. Using a theoretical framework developed earlier (Marcus 1956; Jortner 1976), the quantum trigger can be concretely understood in terms of electron transfer between biomolecules.

As indicated above, the proposal outlined so far is the most empirically concrete and theoretically detailed approach to treating brain processes from a quantum theoretical point of view. However, the question remains how the quantum trigger for exocytosis may be relevant for conscious mental states. There are two aspects to this question.

The first one refers to Eccles' intention to utilize quantum processes in the brain as an entry point for mental causation. The idea, as indicated in Section 1, is that the fundamentally indeterministic nature of individual quantum state collapses offers room for the influence of mental powers on brain states. In the present picture, this is conceived in such a way that “mental intention (volition) becomes neurally effective by momentarily increasing the probability of exocytosis” (Beck and Eccles 1992, 11360). Further justification of this assumption is not given.

The second aspect refers to the problem that processes at single synapses cannot be simply correlated to mental activity, whose neural correlates are coherent assemblies of neurons. Most plausibly, prima facie uncorrelated random processes at individual synapses would result in a stochastic network of neurons (Hepp 1999). Although Beck (2001) has indicated possibilities (such as quantum stochastic resonance) for achieving ordered patterns at the level of assemblies from fundamentally random synaptic processes, this remains an unsolved problem.

With the exception of Eccles' idea of mental causation, the approach by Beck and Eccles essentially focuses on brain states and brain dynamics. In his more recent account, Beck (2001, 109f) states explicitly that “science cannot, by its very nature, present any answer to […] questions related to the mind”. In this sense, a strictly biophysical approach may open the door to controlled speculation about mind-matter relations, but more cannot be achieved.

4.5 Penrose and Hameroff: Quantum Gravity and Microtubuli

In the scenario developed by Penrose and neurophysiologically augmented by Hameroff, quantum theory is claimed to be effective for consciousness, but this happens in an extremely sophisticated way. It is argued that elementary acts of consciousness are non-algorithmic, i.e., non-computable, and they are neurophysiologically realized as gravitation-induced reductions of coherent superposition states in microtubuli.

Unlike the approaches discussed so far, which are essentially based on (different features of) status quo quantum theory, the physical part of the scenario, proposed by Penrose, refers to future developments of quantum theory for a proper understanding of the physical process underlying quantum state reduction. The grander picture is that a full-blown theory of quantum gravity is required to ultimately understand quantum measurement (see the entry on quantum gravity).

This is a far-reaching assumption, and Penrose does not offer a concrete solution to this problem. However, he gives a number of plausibility arguments which clarify his own motivations and have in fact inspired others to take his ideas seriously. Penrose's rationale for invoking state reduction is not that the corresponding randomness offers room for mental causation to become efficacious (although this is not excluded). His conceptual starting point, at length developed in two books (Penrose 1989, 1994), is that elementary conscious acts must be non-algorithmic. Phrased differently, the emergence of a conscious act is a process which cannot be described algorithmically, hence cannot be computed. His background in this respect has a lot to do with the nature of creativity, mathematical insight, Gödel's incompleteness theorem, and the idea of a Platonic reality beyond mind and matter.

By contrast to the unitary time evolution of quantum processes à la (2), Penrose suggests that a valid formulation of quantum state reduction replacing (1) must faithfully describe an objective physical process that he calls objective reduction. Since present-day quantum theory does not contain such a picture, he argues that effects not currently covered by quantum theory should play a role in state reduction. Ideal candidates for him are gravitational effects since gravitation is the only fundamental interaction which is not integrated into quantum theory so far. Rather than modifying elements of the theory of gravitation (i.e., general relativity) to achieve such an integration, Penrose discusses the reverse: that novel features have to be incorporated in quantum theory for this purpose. In this way, he arrives at the proposal of gravitation-induced objective state reduction.

Why is such a version of state reduction non-computable? Initially one might think of an objective version of state reduction in terms of a stochastic process, as most current proposals for such mechanisms indeed do (see the entry on collapse theories). This would certainly be indeterministic, but probabilistic and stochastic processes can be standardly implemented on a computer, hence they are definitely computable. Penrose (1994, Secs 7.8 and 7.10) sketches some ideas concerning genuinely non-computable, not only random, features of quantum gravity. In order for them to become viable candidates for explaining the non-computability of gravitation-induced state reduction, a long way still has to be gone.

With respect to the neurophysiological implementation of Penrose's proposal, his collaboration with Hameroff has been crucial. With his background as an anaesthesiologist, Hameroff suggested to consider microtubules as an option for where reductions of quantum states can take place in an effective way, see e.g., Hameroff and Penrose (1996). The respective quantum states are assumed to be coherent superpositions of tubulin states, ultimately extending over many neurons. Their simultaneous gravitation-induced collapse is interpreted as an individual elementary act of consciousness. The proposed mechanism by which such superpositions are established includes a number of involved details that remain to be confirmed or disproven.

The idea of focusing on microtubuli is partly motivated by the argument that special locations are required to ensure that quantum states can live long enough to become reduced by gravitational influence rather than by interactions with the warm and wet environment within the brain. Speculative remarks about how the non-computable aspects of the expected new physics mentioned above could be significant in this scenario[11] are given in Penrose (1994, Sec. 7.7).

Influential criticism of the possibility that quantum states can in fact survive long enough in the thermal environment of the brain has been raised by Tegmark (2000). He estimates the decoherence time of tubulin superpositions due to interactions in the brain to be less than 10-12 sec. Compared to typical time scales of microtubule processes of the order of milliseconds and more, he concludes that the lifetime of tubulin superpositions is much too short to be significant for neurophysiological processes in the microtubuli. In a response to this criticism, Hagan et al. (2002) have shown that a revised version of Tegmark's model provides decoherence times up to 10 to 100 μ sec, and it has been argued that this can be extended up to the neurophysiologically relevant range of 10 to 100 msec under particular assumptions of the scenario by Penrose and Hameroff.

However, decoherence is just a tiny piece in the debate about the overall picture proposed by Penrose and Hameroff. From a philosophical perspective, their proposal has occasionally received outspoken rejection, see e.g., Grush and Churchland (1995). Indeed, their approach collects several top level mysteries, among them the relation between mind and matter itself, the ultimate unification of all physical interactions, the origin of mathematical truth, and the understanding of brain dynamics across hierarchical levels. Combining such deep issues is certainly fascinating, but it is as ambitious as it is provocative.

By and large, the scenario by Penrose and Hameroff represents a highly speculative approach with conceptual problems and without plausible concrete ideas for empirical confirmation. On the other hand, it is worthwhile to remember Bohr's bonmot that the question may not be whether a theory is too crazy but whether it is crazy enough.

4.6 Mind and Matter as Dual Aspects

Dual-aspect approaches consider mental and material domains of reality as aspects, or manifestations, of one underlying reality in which mind and matter are unseparated. In such a framework, the distinction between mind and matter results from the application of a basic tool for achieving epistemic access to, i.e., gather knowledge about, both the separated domains and the underlying reality.[12] Consequently, the status of the underlying, psychophysically neutral domain is considered as ontic relative to the mind-matter distinction.

As mentioned in Section 2, dual-aspect approaches have a long history. As regards quantum theoretically inspired variations on this theme, interesting versions have been proposed by Pauli and Jung (Jung and Pauli 1955; Meier 2001; Atmanspacher and Primas 1996, 2006) and by Bohm and Hiley (Bohm 1990; Bohm and Hiley 1993; Hiley 2001).

In the latter approach, the notions of implicate and explicate order mirror the distinction between ontic and epistemic domains. At the level of the implicate order, the term active information expresses that this level is capable of “informing” the epistemically distinguished, explicate domains of mind and matter. At this point it should be emphasized that the usual notion of information is clearly an epistemic term. Nevertheless, there are quite a number of dual-aspect approaches addressing something like information at the ontic, psychophysically neutral level.[13] Using an information-like concept in a non-epistemic manner is inconsistent if the common (syntactic) significance of Shannon-type information is intended, which requires distinctions in order to construct partitions, providing alternatives, in the set of given events. Most information-based dual-aspect approaches do not sufficiently clarify their notion of information, so that misunderstandings are almost unavoidable.

While the proposal by Bohm and Hiley essentially sketches a conceptual framework without further details, particularly concerning the mental domain, the suggestions by Pauli and Jung offer some more material to discuss. An intuitively appealing way to represent their approach considers the distinction between epistemic and ontic domains of material reality due to quantum theory in parallel with the distinction between epistemic and ontic mental domains.

On the physical side, the epistemic/ontic distinction refers to the distinction between a “local realism” of empirical facts obtained from classical measuring instruments and a “holistic realism” of entangled systems (Atmanspacher and Primas 2003). Essentially, these domains are connected by the process of measurement, thus far conceived as independent of conscious observers. The corresponding picture on the mental side refers to a distinction between the conscious and the unconscious.[14] In Jung's depth psychological conceptions, these two domains are connected by a process of emergence of conscious mental states from the unconscious, analogous to physical measurement.

In Jung's depth psychology it is crucial that the unconscious has a collective component, unseparated between individuals and consisting of the so-called archetypes. They are regarded as constituting the psychophysically neutral level covering both the collective unconscious and the holistic reality of quantum theory. At the same time they operate as “ordering factors”, being responsible for the arrangement of their psychical and physical manifestations in the epistemically distinguished domains of mind and matter. More detailed illustrations of this picture can be found in Jung and Pauli (1955), Meier (2001), and Atmanspacher and Primas (1996, 2006).

This scheme is clearly related to scenario (B) of (Sec. 2, combining an epistemically dualistic with an ontically monistic approach. There is a causal relationship (in the sense of formal rather than efficient causation) between the psychophysically neutral, monistic level and the epistemically distinguished mental and material domains. In Pauli's and Jung's terms this kind of causation is expressed by the ordering operation of archetypes in the collective unconscious.

A remarkable feature of scenario (B) is the possibility that the mental and material manifestations may inherit mutual correlations due to the fact that they are jointly caused by the psychophysically neutral level. One might say that such correlations are remnants reflecting the lost holism on this level. In this sense, they are not the result of any direct causal interaction between mental and material domains. Thus, they are not suitable for an explanation of direct mental causation in the usual sense. Their existence would require some unconscious activity entailing correlation effects that would appear as mental causation. Independently of quantum theory, a related move was suggested by Velmans (2002). But even without mental causation, scenario (B) is relevant to the ubiquitous correlations between conscious mental states and brain states.

In the proposal by Pauli and Jung, these correlations are called synchronistic (see also Primas 1996), and have been applied to psychosomatic relationships as well (Meier 1975). An essential condition required for synchronistic correlations is that they are meaningful for those who experience them. It is tempting to interpret the use of meaning as an attempt to introduce semantic information as an alternative to syntactic information as addressed above. Although this entails all kinds of problems concerning a clear-cut definition and operationalization, something like meaning, both explicitly and implicitly, might be a relevant informational currency for mind-matter relations (Atmanspacher 1997).

Very recently, Primas (2003) has proposed a dual-aspect approach where the distinction of mental and material domains originates from the distinction between two different modes of time: tensed (mental) time, including nowness, on the one hand and tenseless (physical) time, viewed as an external parameter, on the other (see the entries on time and on being and becoming in modern physics). These two concepts of time emerge due to a symmetry breaking of a timeless level of reality that is psychophysically neutral.[15] Nowness and the directedness of time originate in the mental domain, whose tensed time is quantum-correlated with the parameter time of physics via time-entanglement. It must be admitted that this is still a tentative scheme without concrete indications of how to confirm or reject it empirically. Nevertheless it is highlighted here since, for the first time, it offers a formally elaborated and conceptually consistent dual-aspect quantum framework for basic aspects of the mind-matter problem.

As indicated above, the approaches by Stapp (Section 4.2) and Vitiello (Section 4.3) contain elements of dual-aspect thinking as well, although these are not much emphasized by the authors. The dual-aspect quantum approaches discussed in the present section tend to focus on the issue of entanglement more than on state reduction. The primary purpose here is to understand correlations between mental and material domains rather than direct interactions between them. In this respect, it is worthwhile to refer to an attempt at generalizing the axiomatic basis of standard quantum theory in such a way that the concept of entanglement becomes applicable even beyond physical examples (Atmanspacher et al. 2002).

A final critical issue of dual-aspect approaches in general refers to the problem of panpsychism (see the recent review by Skrbina 2003, and the entry on panpsychism). In the limit of a universal symmetry breaking at the psychophysically neutral level, every system has both a mental and a material aspect. In such a situation it is important to understand “mentality” much more generally than “consciousness”. Unconscious or proto-mental acts as opposed to conscious mental acts are notions sometimes used to underline this difference. The special case of human consciousness within the mental domain as a whole might be regarded as special as its material correlate, the brain, within the material domain as a whole.

5. Conclusions

The historical motivation for exploring quantum theory in trying to understand consciousness derived from the realization that collapse-type quantum events introduce an element of randomness, which is primary (ontic) rather than merely due to ignorance or missing information (epistemic). Approaches such as those of Wigner, of Stapp, and of Beck and Eccles emphasize this (in different ways), insofar as the ontic randomness of quantum events is regarded to provide room for mental causation, i.e., the possibility that conscious mental acts can influence brain behavior. The approach by Penrose and Hameroff also focuses on state collapse, but with a significant move from mental causation to the non-computability of (particular) conscious acts.

Any discussion of state collapse or state reduction refers, at least implicitly, to entangled states since those are the states that are reduced. In this sense, entanglement is always co-addressed when state reduction is discussed. By contrast, some of the dual-aspect quantum approaches utilize the topic of entanglement differently, and independently of state reduction in the first place. Inspired by the entanglement-induced nonlocal correlations of quantum physics, mind-matter entanglement is conceived as the hypothetical origin of mind-matter correlations. This reflects the highly speculative picture of a fundamentally holistic, psychophysically neutral level of reality from which correlated mental and material domains emerge.

Each of the examples discussed in this overview has both promising and problematic aspects. The approach by Beck and Eccles is most detailed and concrete with respect to the application of standard quantum mechanics to the process of exocytosis. However, it does not solve the problem of how the activity of single synapses enters the dynamics of neural assemblies, and it leaves mental causation of quantum processes as a mere claim. Stapp's approach suggests a radically expanded ontological basis for both the mental domain and status-quo quantum theory as a theory of matter without essentially changing the formalism of quantum theory. Although related to inspiring philosophical and some psychological background, it still lacks empirical confirmation. The proposal by Penrose and Hameroff exceeds the domain of present-day quantum theory by far and is the most speculative example among those discussed. It is not easy to see how the picture as a whole can be formally worked out and put to empirical test.

The approach initiated by Umezawa is embedded in the framework of quantum field theory, more broadly applicable and formally more sophisticated than standard quantum mechanics. It refers directly to the activity of neuronal assemblies as the neural correlates of mental representations. A clear conceptual distinction between brain states and mental states is most often missing, although the approach is not intended to be reductionistic. Vitiello's more recent accounts offer some clarifying hints in that direction, which point to an understanding in terms of a dual-aspect approach. Other such approaches, like those of Pauli and Jung and of Bohm and Hiley, are conceptually more transparent in this respect. On the other hand, they are essentially unsatisfactory with regard to a sound formal basis and concrete empirical scenarios. A novel dual-aspect quantum proposal by Primas, based on the distinction between tensed mental time and tenseless physical time, marks a significant step forward, particularly as concerns a consistent formal framework.


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panpsychism | physics: symmetry and symmetry breaking | process philosophy | quantum mechanics: collapse theories | quantum theory: quantum field theory | quantum theory: quantum gravity | space and time: being and becoming in modern physics | time


Inspiring discussions on numerous topics treated in this paper with Guido Bacciagaluppi, Thomas Filk, Hans Flohr, Hans Primas, Stefan Rotter, Henry Stapp, Giuseppe Vitiello, and Max Velmans are gratefully acknowledged. Useful comments by Guido Bacciagaluppi, Friedrich Beck, Thomas Filk, Stuart Hameroff, Hans Primas, Henry Stapp and an anonymous referee helped to improve an earlier version of the manuscript.