Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Jul 16, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jul 15, 2009

Starting with Frege, the semantics (and pragmatics) of quotation has received a steady flow of attention over the last one hundred years. It has not, however, been subject to the same kind of intense debate and scrutiny as, for example, both the semantics of definite descriptions and propositional attitude verbs. Many philosophers probably share Davidson's experience: ‘When I was initiated into the mysteries of logic and semantics, quotation was usually introduced as a somewhat shady device, and the introduction was accompanied by a stern sermon on the sin of confusing the use and mention of expressions’ (Davidson 1979, p. 79). Those who leave it at that, however, miss out on one of the most difficult and interesting topics in the philosophy of language.

Quotation interests philosophers and linguists for various reasons, including these:

  1. When language is used to attribute properties to language or otherwise theorize about it, a linguistic device is needed that ‘turns language on itself’. Quotation is one such device. It is our primary meta-linguistic tool. If you don't understand quotation, then you can't understand sentences like (1)-(4)[1]
    1. ‘Snow is white’ is true in English iff snow is white.
    2. ‘Aristotle’ refers to Aristotle.
    3. ‘The’ is the definite article in English.
    4. ‘bachelor’ has eight letters.

Those who are in the business of theorizing about language are particularly interested in understanding the mechanisms that render (1)-(4) intelligible.

  1. Theories of quotation address questions not just about how quotations refer, but also about what they refer to. In this regard, theories of quotation tell us what we are talking about in (1)-(4).
  2. Quotation is a paradigmatic opaque context, i.e. a context in which substitution of synonymous or co-referential expressions can fail to preserve truth-value. To understand the nature of opacity you must understand how quotation functions.
  3. Quotation is a device for talking about language, but it does so in a particularly tricky way: somehow quotation manages to uses its referent to do (or at least to participate in) the referring; the referent of “Aristotle” is part of “Aristotle”. As such, it is a particularly interesting referential device.
  4. As with all issues in the philosophy of language, theories of quotation harbor assumptions about how best to draw the distinction between semantics and pragmatics, and they do so in a particularly illuminating way.
  5. Theories of quotation raise a range of important questions about how indexicals should be interpreted and about the nature of context sensitivity.

More generally, quotation presents semanticists with a particularly challenging range of puzzles. Those interested in such puzzles tend to find the study of quotation intrinsically interesting.

1. How to Characterize Quotation

Problems arise right at the outset since quotation is not an easy category to characterize. We start with reflections on how one might go.

1.1 Quotation Identified Through Examples

There's an easy and relatively non-controversial way to identify quotation: it is the sort of linguistic phenomenon exemplified by the subject in (4) and the direct object[2] in (5); these are instances of pure and direct quotation, respectively.

5. Quine said, ‘Quotation has a certain anomalous feature’.

That leaves open the question of which semantic and syntactic devices belong to that sort. Any characterization of a more specific nature, either of a syntactic or a semantic sort, moves into controversial territory immediately.

1.2 Quotation Identified Syntactically

A syntactic characterization might go something like this: Take two quotation marks— single apostrophes in Britain, double in the United States, double angles in parts of Europe — and put, for example, a letter, a word, or a sentence between the two. What results is a quotation, as in (4)-(5). There are two problems with this identification:

  1. In spoken language, no obvious correlates of quotation marks exist. Spoken utterances of (6) seem often to be unaccompanied by lexical items corresponding to ‘quote/unquote’.
    6. My name is Donald.
  2. Even if attention is restricted to written language, quotation is not invariably indicated by the use of quotation marks. Sometimes, for example, italicization is used instead, as in (7):
    7. Bachelor has eight letters

Other devices employed as substitutes for quotation marks include bold face, indentation, and line indentation (cf. Quine 1940, pp. 23–24; Geach 1957, p. 82). There's no clear limit on the range of distinct written options, other than that they are used as quotation marks, but this renders the syntactic characterization incomplete, and thus, unsatisfactory.

1.3 Quotation Identified Semantically

Another tempting strategy is to say that an expression is quoted if it is mentioned. There are two problems with this characterization.

  1. Several theorists want to distinguish between mention and quotation (see Section 3.5). This definition would rule their theories out by stipulation.
  2. This characterization is no clearer than the intuitive distinction between use and mention, and matters become even more complicated as soon as we do try to characterize ‘mention’ and ‘use’. Isn't ‘bachelor’ in (4) in some sense used to refer to itself? If the response is that it is used, but not with its normal semantic value, then we are left with the challenge of defining ‘normal’ and ‘abnormal’ semantic values. That, again, leads immediately to controversy.

In order to remain as neutral as possible, we will stick with a simple identification-through-examples strategy, and emphasize that it is an open question as to how to identify the sort of linguistic devices to which the subject in (4) belongs.

2. Basic Quotational Features

Quotation is a subject matter that brings together a rather spectacular array of linguistic and semantic issues. Here are six basic quotational features of particular importance (BQ1-BQ6, for short) that will guide our search for an adequate account:

BQ1. In quotation you cannot substitute co-referential or synonymous terms salva veritate.
An inference from (4) to (8), for example, fails to preserve truth-value.

4. ‘bachelor’ has eight letters
8. ‘unmarried man’ has eight letters

No theory of quotation is adequate unless it explains this feature (and no theory of opacity is complete before it explains why quotation has this feature).

BQ2. It is not possible to quantify into quotation.
(9), for example, does not follow from (4):

9. (∃x)(‘x’ has eight letters)

An adequate theory of quotation must explain why not. The product of quoting ‘x’ is an expression that refers to the 24th letter of the Roman alphabet. The point is that quotation marks, at least in natural language, cannot be quantified into because they trap the variable; what results is a quotation that refers to that very variable.

BQ3. Quotation can be used to introduce novel words, symbols and alphabets; it is not limited to the extant lexicon of any one language.
Both (10) and (11) are true English sentences:
10. ‘Φ’ is not a part of any English expression.
11. ‘squiggle’ is not an expression in any natural language.

An adequate theory of quotation must explain what makes this practice possible.

BQ4. There's a particularly close relationship between quotations and their semantic values.

“lobsters” and its semantic value are more intimately related than ‘lobster’ and its semantic value, i.e., the relationship between “lobster” and ‘lobster’ is closer than that which obtains between ‘lobsters' and lobsters. Whereas the quotation (i.e., “lobster”), in some way to be further explained, has its referent (i.e., ‘lobster’) contained in it, the semantic value of ‘lobsters', i.e., lobsters, are not contained in ‘lobster’. One way to put it is that an expression e is in the quotation of e. No matter how one chooses to spell this out, any theory of quotation must explain this relationship.

BQ5. To understand quotation is to have an infinite capacity, a capacity to understand and generate a potential infinity of new quotations.

We don't learn quotations one by one. Never having encountered the quotation in (10) or (11) does nothing to prohibit comprehending them (Christensen 1967, p. 362) and identifying their semantic values.

Similarly, there doesn't seem to be any upper bound on a speaker's ability to generate novel quotations. One natural explanation for this is that quotation is a productive device in natural language.

BQ6. Quoted words can be simultaneously used and mentioned.
This is an important observation due to Davidson, as exemplified in (12).[3]

12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’.

(12) is called a ‘mixed quotation’. This is because it mixes the direct quotation (as in (5)) and indirect (as in (13)).

  5. Quine said ‘Quotation has a certain anomalous feature’.
13. Quine said that quotation has a certain anomalous feature.

In this regard, the quotation in (12) is, in an intuitive sense, simultaneously used and mentioned. It is used to say what Quine said (viz. that quotation has a certain anomalous feature), and also to say that Quine used the words ‘has a certain anomalous feature’ in saying it.

Mixed quotation had not been much discussed prior to Davidson (1979) but it has recently taken center stage in discussions of theories of quotation. For those who believe themselves unfamiliar with the data, we point out that mixed quotation is one of the most frequently used forms of quotation. Casually peruse any newspaper and passages like the following from the New York Times are ubiquitous:

NYT Dec 7, 2004: The court ruled that the sentence was invalid because the document signed into law by President Bill Clinton contained a phrase that was illogical. The law said that defendants like Mr. Pabon, who was convicted two years ago of advertising to receive or distribute child pornography over the Internet, should be fined or receive a mandatory minimum sentence of 10 years ‘and both.’ The appeals court said this language ‘makes no sense.’

An adequate theory of quotation must account for how such dual use and mention is possible. (For further discussion of how to understand this requirement see Section 4 below).

In what follows we will refer back to these six features and make the following assumption:

It is a necessary adequacy condition on a theory of quotation that it either explains how quotations can exhibit features (BQ1)-(BQ6), or, if it fails to do so, then it must present an argument for why the unexplained feature(s) doesn't require explanation.

2.1 Guiding Questions for Theories of Quotation

BQ1-BQ6 play an important role because theories of quotation are attempts to answer certain questions, and those questions won't have satisfactory answers unless BQ1-BQ6 are accounted for. Three questions can be thought of as the guiding questions for a theory of quotation:

Q1. In a quotation, what does the referring? There are three options:
  • The quotation marks
  • The expression between the quotation marks
  • A complex of the expression and the quotation marks

Alternatively, one might hold that quotations fail to refer at all, but rather that speakers refer contingent upon the intentions with which they use an expression—with or without quotation marks.

Q2. How do quotations refer?

Are they names, descriptions, demonstratives, functors or some sui generis linguistic category?

In addition to Q1 and Q2, theories of quotation often try answer a third:

Q3. What do quotations refer to?

What kinds of objects are picked out? Is it always the same object or are quotations ambiguous?[4]

Our primary focus in what follows will be in Q1 and Q2, but along the way we will also address Q3. (Section 5 is entirely devoted to Q3.)

2.2 The Use-Mention Distinction

It is standard practice in philosophy to distinguish the use of an expression from the mentioning of it. Confusing these two is often taken to be a philosophical mortal sin. Despite its ubiquitous appeal, it is controversial exactly how to draw the distinction. The initial thought is easy enough. Consider (D1) and (D2):

D1. Jim went to Paris
D2. ‘Jim’ has three letters

In (D1) the word ‘Jim’ is used to talk about (or signify, or denote) a person, i.e. Jim, and the sentence says about that person that he went to Paris. In (D2) the word is not used in that way. Instead, ‘Jim’ is used to talk about (or signify or denote) a word, i.e. ‘Jim’, and the sentence says about that word that it has three letters[5]. In (D1), ‘Jim’ is being used and in (D2) it mentioned.

Other attempts to characterize the use-mention distinction quickly run into difficulties. Here are two familiar characterizations often found in philosophical introductions of the distinction:

  1. Expression E is mentioned in sentence S just in case E is quoted in S.

Problem: According to some theories, an expression can be mentioned without being quoted (see Objection 3 in section 3.3.2).

  1. Expression E is mentioned in sentence S just in case it is used to refer to itself in S.

Problems: First, notice that according to (ii), E must be used in order to mention it; that's potentially puzzling. More significantly, it is controversial whether standard meta-linguistic devices such as quotation are referring expressions. The theories presented in sections 3.2 and 3.3 treat quotation as descriptions. If descriptions are quantified expressions, then quotations are quantifiers, and quantifiers are typically not treated as referring expressions. Proposals along the lines of (ii) would also have to ensure that, ‘the first seven words in this sentence’ in (D3) don't end up referring to ‘the first seven words in this sentence’:

D3. The first seven words in this sentence contain thirty letters.

In sum (and this isn't recognized often enough), any attempt to characterize the distinction between use and mention more sophisticated than the initial characterization in this section will need to address at least some of the tricky issues that face the various theories of quotation we describe in what follows.

3. Five Theories of Quotation

There are, roughly, five kinds of theories of quotation that have been central to the discussion of quotation: the Proper Name Theory, the Description Theory, the Demonstrative/Paratactic Theory, the Disquotational Theory, and the Use/Identity Theory. In the following sections we discuss each of these and review their strengths and weaknesses. The first two we discuss primarily for historical and heuristic purposes. The last three are the central live options in contemporary discussion of quotation.

3.1 The Proper Name Theory

It is now almost a tradition in the literature on quotation to include a brief dismissive discussion of the Proper Name Theory of Quotation. This view is found in passages in Quine and Tarski (e.g. Quine 1940, pp. 23–26; 1961, p.140; Tarski 1933, p.159ff), and comments in passing in both Reichenbach (1947, p. 335) and Carnap (1947, p. 4) strongly suggest they too were adherents. It no longer is defended by anyone and there is even some debate about whether Quine and Tarski ever held the view (see e.g. Bennett (1988), Richard (1986), Saka (1998), and Gomez-Torrente (2001)).

Today the view is discussed in part because of its distinguished pedigree, but primarily for heuristic purposes. One common view is that the reasons why it is ‘an utter failure’ (Saka 1998, p. 114) reveals something about how to go about constructing an acceptable theory of quotation. Following this tradition, we begin our discussion of classical theories of quotation by presenting the Proper Name Theory and some of the reasons why the unanimous consensus is that it fails miserably.

According to the Proper Name Theory, quotations are unstructured proper names of the quoted expressions. Quine writes:

From the standpoint of logical analysis each whole quotation must be regarded as a single word or sign, whose parts count for no more than serifs or syllables. (Quine 1940, p. 26)

The personal name buried within the first word of the statement ‘Cicero’ has six letters, e.g., is logically no more germane to the statement than is the verb ‘let’ which is buried within the last word. (Quine 1940, p. 26)

Tarski writes:

Quotation-mark names may be treated like single words of a language, and thus like syntactically simple expressions. The single constituents of these names—the quotation marks and the expressions standing between them—fulfill the same function as the letters and complexes of successive letters in single words. Hence they can possess no independent meaning. Every quotation-mark name is then a constant individual name of a definite expression (the expression enclosed by the quotation marks) and is in fact a name of the same nature as the proper name of a man. (Tarski 1933, p. 159)

3.1.1 Strengths of the Proper Name Theory

The Proper Name Theory nicely accommodates (BQ1)-(BQ3); that is, on this theory we see why co-referential expressions cannot be substituted for one another. According to the Proper Name Theory, the name ‘Cicero’ does not occur in ‘‘Cicero’’, from the fact that Cicero = Tully, ‘Tully’ cannot be substituted for ‘Cicero’ in ‘‘Cicero’’. As Quine puts it, ‘[t]o make substitution upon a personal name, with such a context, would be no more justifiable than to make a substitution upon the term ‘cat’ within the context ‘cattle’ (Quine 1961, p. 141). The Proper Name Theory permits the creation of new quotations much as natural languages permit the introduction of new names. And it prohibits quantifying in, since each quotation is a single word, and so, there is nothing to quantify into. To see that this is so, think of the left and right quotation marks as the 27th and 28th letters of the roman alphabet, then quantifying into (4) in deriving (9) makes as much sense as deriving (16) from (14) and (15) by quantifying into (14):

  4. ‘bachelor’ has eight letters.
  9. (∃x)(‘x’ has eight letters)

14. There is a birth dearth in Europe.
15. Earth is the third planet form the sun.
16. (∃x)(x is the third planet from the sun & there is a birth dx in Europe)

The occurrence of the 24th letter of the alphabet in (9), as Quine notes with regards to a similar sentence, ‘is as irrelevant to the quantifier that precedes it as is the occurrence of the same letter in the context ‘six’’ (Quine 1961, p. 147).

3.1.2 Weaknesses of the Proper Name Theory

Here are three objections to the Proper Name Theory of Quotation. (The main objections are in Davidson (1979, pp. 81–83), though some were anticipated by Geach (1957, p.79ff).)

Objection 1: The Proper Name Theory cannot explain how we can generate and interpret an indefinite number of novel quotations (see BQ5).

If quotations were proper names and lacked semantic structure altogether, then there would be no rule for determining how to generate or interpret novel quotations. To understand one would be to learn a new name. (Remember, the quotation marks, according to Quine, carry no more significance than the serifs you see on these letters.) But (11), e.g., can be understood by someone who has never encountered its quoted symbol before.

11. ‘squiggle’ is not a letter in any language

Understanding (11) is not like understanding a sentence with a previously unknown proper name. Upon encountering (11), you know exactly which symbol is being referenced in a way that you do not with a name you’ve never before encountered.

This is the most obvious flaw in the Proper Name Theory and its obviousness has caused some philosophers to doubt whether Quine or Tarski ever held this view (see references above).

Objection 2: There's a special relationship between quotations and their semantic values (see BQ4).

According to the Proper Name Theory, the relationship between “lobsters” and ‘lobsters’ is no closer than the relationship between ‘lobsters’ and lobsters. That seems to miss the fundamental aspect of quotation spelled out in (BQ4).

Davidson summarizes these first two objections succinctly:

If quotations are structureless singular terms, then there is no more significance to the category of quotation-mark names than to the category of names that begin and end with the letter ‘a’ (“Atlanta’, ‘Alabama’, ‘Alta’, ‘Athena’, etc.). On this view, there is no relation, beyond an accident of spelling, between an expression and the quotation-mark name of that expression. (Davidson 1979, pp. 81–82; cf., also, Garcia-Carpintero 1994, pp. 254–55)
Objection 3: Proper Name Theory leaves no room for dual use and mention (see BQ6).

If quotations were proper names, and if their interiors lacked significant structure, there would seem to be no room for dual usage of the kind found in (12); indeed, on the Proper Name Theory (12) has the same interpretive form as (17):

12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’.
17. Quine said that quotation Ted.

That is, the Proper Name Theory fails to account for (BQ6).

Other objections have been raised against the Proper Name Theory of Quotation. Since the view has no proponents today, we will not pursue these objections here. For further discussion, see Davidson (1979), Cappelen and Lepore (1997b) and Saka (1998).

3.2 The Description Theory of Quotation

The Description Theory of Quotation was introduced in order to guarantee that ‘a quoted series of expressions is always a series of quoted expressions’ (Geach 1957, p. 82) and not ‘a single long word, whose parts have no separate significance’ (ibid., p. 82). According to this theory, there is a set of basic units in each language: words, according to Geach (ibid., Ch. 18 and (1970)); letters, according to Tarski (1956, p. 160) and Quine (1960, p. 143, p. 212)).[6]

This view retains the Proper Name Theory for basic quotations, e.g. according to Quine, “a” is a name of one letter, “b” a name of another, etc. For Geach, each word has a quotation name. Complex quotations, i.e., quotations with more than one basic unit, are understood as descriptions of concatenations of the basic units. Here is an illustration from Geach (where ‘&’ is his sign for concatenation):

…the quotation ‘'man is mortal’’ is rightly understood only if we read it as meaning the same as ‘‘man’ & ‘is’ & ‘mortal’’, i.e., read it as describing the quoted expression in terms of the expressions it contains and their order. (Geach 1957, pp. 82–83)

For Quine and Tarski, (4) gets analyzed as (18):

  4. ‘Bachelor’ has eight letters.
18. ‘B’-‘a’-‘c’-‘h’-‘e’-‘l’-‘o’-‘r’ has eight letters

where ‘-’ is their sign for concatenation and the individual quotations are names of the letters.

Davidson's characterizes the difference between the two versions as follows:

In primitive notation, which reveals all structure to the eye, Geach has an easier time writing (for only each word needs quotation marks) but a harder time learning or describing the language (he has a much larger primitive vocabulary—twice normal size if we disregard iteration). (Davidson 1979, p. 84)

3.2.1 Strengths and Weaknesses of the Description Theory

In one respect the Description Theory is an immense improvement over the Proper Name Theory: it deals with no more than a finite set of basic names, thus, potentially accommodating (BQ5). In other respects, however, the theory is, by a wide consensus, not much of an improvement over the Proper Name Theory. At the basic level, the theory still treats quotations as names. So, at that level, it inherits all of the problems confronting the simpler Proper Name Theory and is for that reason not considered much more attractive. Some the obvious objections are these (again we mention only some of the most obvious objections here since the theory is not central to contemporary discussions):

3.3 The Demonstrative Theory of Quotation

The seminal paper on quotation in the twentieth century is, almost by universal consensus, Davidson's ‘Quotation’ (1979). It is without comparison the most discussed and influential paper on the subject. The view Davidson defends is called the Demonstrative Theory. (It is also called the Paratactic Theory; though we shall use the former label in our discussion.) The Demonstrative Theory is presented in the final pages of ‘Quotation’ and the key passages are these:[7]

…quotation marks…help refer to a shape by pointing out something that has it…The singular term is the quotation marks, which may be read ‘the expression a token of which is here’. (Davidson 1979, p. 90)

On my theory which we may call the demonstrative theory of quotation, the inscription inside does not refer to anything at all, nor is it part of any expression that does. Rather it is the quotation marks that do all the referring, and they help to refer to a shape by pointing out something that has it. (Davidson 1979, p. 90)

Quotation marks could be warped so as to remove the quoted material from a sentence in which they play no semantic role. Thus instead of:

‘Alice swooned’ is a sentence

we could write:

Alice swooned. The expression of which this is a token is a sentence. (Davidson 1979, p. 90)

The Demonstrative Theory has three central components:

  1. The quotation marks are treated as contributing a definite description containing a demonstrative to sentences in which they occur, i.e., the quotation marks in (4) become ‘The expression of which this is a token’, as in (19):
      4. ‘Bachelor’ has eight letters.
    19. Bachelor. The expression of which that is a token has eight letters.
  2. In the logical form of a sentence containing a quotation, the token that occurs between the two quotation marks in the surface syntax is discharged, so to speak, from the sentence containing the quotation. What occurs between the quotation marks in the surface syntax is not part of the sentence in which those quotation marks occur. It is demonstrated by a use of the quoting sentence.
  3. Utterances of quotation marks, by virtue of having a demonstrative/indexical ingredient, refer to the expression instantiated by the demonstrated token, i.e., the expression instantiated by the token that in surface syntax sits between the quotation marks.

3.3.1 Strengths of the Demonstrative Theory

The Demonstrative Theory is attractive for at least five reasons:

  1. To grasp the function of quotation marks is to acquire a capacity with infinite applications (BQ5). The Demonstrative Theory explains why: there's no limit to the kinds of entities we can demonstrate. Hence, (BQ5) is explained without making quotation a productive device (for elaboration see Cappelen and Lepore 1997b).
  2. Opacity is explained (BQ1): There's no reason to think that two sentences demonstrating different objects will have the same truth-value. (4) and (8) demonstrate different objects, so there's no more reason to think the move from (4) to (8) is truth preserving than there is to think that the move from (20) to (21) is:
    20. That's nice.
    21. That's nice.
  3. We have an elegant explanation of mixed quotation, i.e., we can explain (BQ6). Davidson says:
    I said that for the demonstrative theory the quoted material was no part, semantically, of the quoting sentence. But this was stronger than necessary or desirable. The device of pointing can be used on whatever is in range of the pointer, and there is no reason why an inscription in active use can't be ostended in the process of mentioning an expression. (Davidson 1979, p. 91)

    This, according to Davidson, is what goes on in (12). A token that is being used for one purpose is at the same time demonstrated for another: ‘Any token may serve as target for the arrows of quotation, so in particular a quoting sentence may after all by chance contain a token with the shape needed for the purposes of quotation’ (Davidson 1979, pp. 90–91; cf., also, Cappelen and Lepore 1997b). On this view, (12) is understood as (22):

    12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’
    22. Quine says, using words of which these are a token, that quotation has a certain anomalous feature.[8]

    (Here the ‘these’ is accompanied by a pointing or indexing to the token of Quine's words.)

  4. There is no mystery about how to introduce new vocabulary; since there's no limit to what can be demonstrated, there's no limit to what can be quoted. (BQ3) is explained.
  5. Quantifying-in is obviously ruled out, since the quoted token is placed outside the quoting sentence, i.e., the Demonstrative Theory can explain (BQ2).

The Demonstrative Theory is both bold and radical. It triggered an entire cottage industry devoted to criticizing and defending it. For proponents, see, for example, Partee (1973), Garcia-Carpintero (1994), and Cappelen and Lepore (1997b); for critics, see just about anyone else writing on quotation after 1979.

3.3.2 Weaknesses of the Demonstrative Theory

In what follows we present five criticisms of the Demonstrative Theory. Needless to say, the list is not exhaustive, and indeed, each objection has triggered lively discussion which space limitations prohibit our taking up here.

Objection 1. If the Demonstrative Theory were correct, it should be possible for (4) to demonstrate, e.g., a penguin.

Here is an argument that mimics a range of objections raised against Davidson's account of the semantics for indirect reports (Burge (1986), Stainton (1999).)[9]

Recall that according to Davidson the logical form of (4) is (19).

  4. ‘Bachelor’ has eight letters
19. Bachelor. The expression of which this is a token has eight letters.

(19) contains a demonstrative and demonstratives refer to whatever is demonstrated with their use. What is demonstrated on a given occasion depends on the speaker (either the demonstration or the intention or some combination of the two). It should be possible, then, for a speaker to utter (4) and not demonstrate the exhibited token of ‘bachelor’. That is to say, if there really is a demonstrative in (19), that demonstrative should have the same kind of freedom that other demonstratives have: it should be able to reference, for example, a nearby penguin. Of course, no utterance of (4) makes reference to a penguin. So the Demonstrative Theory is wrong.[10] (For replies to this objection see Cappelen and Lepore (1999b).)

Objection 2. The Problem of Relevant Features

According to Davidson, a quotation refers to an expression indirectly, by referring to a token that instantiates that expression. Davidson thinks expressions are shapes or patterns (see Davidson 1979, p. 90). A problem for this view is that any one token instantiates indefinitely many distinct shapes or patterns, i.e. many different expressions. So how, on Davidson's view, do we get from a particular token to a unique type, i.e., from a token to an expression?

Jonathan Bennett formulates the problem as follows:

Any displayed token has countless features, and so it is of countless different kinds. Therefore, to say the inscription-types instantiated here: Sheep or what amounts to the same thing, the inscription-type each token of which is like this: Sheep is to leave things open to an intolerable degree. How do we narrow it down? That is what I call the problem of relevant features. It urgently confronts the demonstrative theory which must be amplified so as to meet it. (Bennett 1988, p. 403, see also Washington 1992, pp.595–7.)

A related worry is this: Read (4) out loud. It seems obvious that a spoken utterance says (makes) the same claim as a written utterance of (4). On the Demonstrative Theory it is unclear why this should be so: the spoken utterance demonstrates a vocal pattern, and the written utterance a graphemic pattern. They seem to be attributing properties to different objects. (Several suggestions are on offer for how to amend the Demonstrative Theory in this respect: cf., Garcia-Carpintero (1994), Cappelen and Lepore (1997b, 1999c), and Davidson (1999).)

Objection 3. The Problem of Missing Quotation Marks

According to Davidson, quotation marks are what are used to do the referring. They are descriptions containing demonstratives whose uses refer to whatever pattern is instantiated by the demonstrated token. This makes the presence of quotation marks essential. Much recent work on quotation argues that we can quote (or do something quote-like) without quotation marks and that a theory of quotation should be capable of explaining how quotation can take place in the absence of quotation marks. Here is Reimer's version of this objection:

Consider the following sentence:
(3) Cat has three letters

Here, we have a case in which an expression is quoted—not by means of quotation marks—but by means of italicization. But surely it would be absurd to suppose (consistently with Davidson's view) that the italicization of (3)'s subject term is itself a demonstrative expression! (Reimer 1996, p. 135)

The same idea is expressed by Washington (1992):

In conversation, oral promptings (‘Quote-unquote’) or finger-dance quotes can often be omitted without impairing the intelligibility or well-formedness of the utterance. When I introduce myself, I do not say ‘My name is quote-unquote Corey,’ nor do I make little finger gestures or even use different intonation in order to show that it is my name and not myself that is being talked about. (Washington 1992, p. 588; cf., also, Saka (1998, pp. 118–19), Recanati (2001) and Benbaji (2004a, 2004b).)

The Demonstrative Theory depends on the presence of quotation marks (inasmuch as they are what get used to do the referring), so if quotation can occur without quotation marks (as in the Reimer and Washington cases), it's hard to see how the Demonstrative Theory is adequate.

Proponents have been unimpressed. Several possible replies spring to mind. So, consider an utterance of (6):

6. My name is Donald
  • One thing a Demonstrative Theorist might say is that there are no missing quotation marks in (6): they are in the logical form of the sentence, not in its surface syntax.
  • Alternatively, quotation marks for an utterance of (6) could be generated as conversational or conventional implicatures. (He can't be saying that Donald, the person, is his name as he knows that that is false… so he must be conversationally implicating that the expression of which he used a token is a name (cf., Garcia-Carpintero (1994, pp. 262-63)). Or by an appeal to the distinction between semantic reference and speaker reference. (6) is grammatically correct but false; nonetheless, someone can succeed in communicating something true about Donald's name if he succeeds in conveying to his audience his intention to refer to it (cf., Gomez-Torrente (2001)).
  • Finally, a Demonstrative Theorist can argue that these other quotation-like phenomena are just that—quotation-like. They require a separate treatment. There's no need for a unified theory (cf., Cappelen and Lepore (2005)).
Objection 4. The Problem of Iteration

The Demonstrative Theory seems to have difficulty dealing with iterated quotation. (24) refers to the quotation in (23):

23. ‘smooth’ is an English expression.
24. “smooth” is an English expression.

The Demonstrative Theory's account for (23) is (25).

25. Smooth. The expression of which that is a token is an English expression

How, then, can the account accommodate (24)? (24), after all, includes two sets of quotation marks. It might seem like the Demonstrative Theory would have to treat it as the ungrammatical (26) or the unintelligible (27).

26. Smooth. That that is an English expression.
27. Smooth. That. That is an English expression.

This objection has been raised by Saka (1998, pp. 119–20), Reimer (1996), and Washington (1992).

In response, Demonstrative Theorists insist that quotations are not iterative. Cappelen and Lepore write:

However, it does follow, on the demonstrative account, that quotation is not, contrary to a common view, genuinely iterative. Quoted expressions are exhibited so that speakers can talk about the patterns (according to Davidson) they instantiate. The semantic properties of the tokens are not in active use; they are semantically inert…So, quotation marks within quotation marks are semantically inert. (Cappelen and Lepore 1997b, pp. 439–40)

For further discussion of whether quotation is a genuinely iterative device, see Cappelen and Lepore (1999a) and Saka (forthcoming).

Objection 5. The Problem of Open Quotation: Dangling Singular Terms

Recanati (2001) focuses on cases where quoted expressions do not serve as noun phrases in sentences. He has in mind cases like (29) and (30):

  1. Stop that John! ‘Nobody likes me’, ‘I am miserable’…
    Don't you think you exaggerate a bit?
  2. The story-teller cleared his throat and started talking. ‘Once upon a time, there was a beautiful princess named Arabella. She loved snakes and always had a couple of pythons around her…’

In these cases it looks like the Demonstrative Theory would have to postulate a dangling singular term, something like (31) or (32):

  1. Stop that john. That. Nobody likes me. That. I am miserable.…Don't you think you exaggerate a bit?
  2. The story-teller cleared his throat and started talking. That. Once upon a time, there was a beautiful princess named Arabella. She loved snakes and always had a couple of pythons around her…

In response to the idea that (29) is elliptical for (33),

  1. Stop that John! You say ‘Nobody likes me’, ‘I am miserable’… Don't you think you exaggerate a bit?

Recanati says:

I deny that [29] and [33] are synonymous. Nor are there any grounds for postulating ellipsis here except the desire to save the theory in the face of obvious counterexamples’ (Recanati 2001, p. 654).

3.4 Disquotational Theory of Quotation

Less baroque than the Demonstrative Theory, the Disquotational Theory is probably the simplest, most natural and obvious account of quotation. It is endorsed by a wide range of authors, often in passing, as if completely obvious. A simple version of it can be found in Richard's Disquotational Schema (DQR):

DQR: For any expression e, the left quote (lq) followed by e followed by the right quote (rq) denotes e (Richard 1986, p. 397)

Ludwig and Ray write:

Its semantic function is given by the following reference clause in the theory: (ref([‘E’]) = E (Ludwig and Ray, 1998, p.163, note 43)

where the ‘[‘ and ‘]’ are the left and right corner quotes. (See also Mates 1972, p. 21; Wallace 1972, p. 237; Salmon 1986, p. 6; Smullyan 1957.)

On this account, quotations are not proper names, or descriptions or demonstratives but rather they are functors that take an expression as their argument and return it as value.

3.4.1 Strengths of Disquotational Theory

The two most obvious strengths of the Disquotational Theory are its simplicity and intuitiveness. If asked how quotation functions, the obvious reply is something along the lines of (DQR). It is also an axiom (or axiom schema) that's pleasingly simple and requires no complicated assumptions about the surface structure of the sentence (in this respect, it has a clear edge on the Demonstrative Theory).

In addition to be being exceedingly simple and intuitive, this theory easily accounts for three of the Basic Facts about Quotation:

3.4.2 Weaknesses of the Disquotational Theory

Even with these advantages, at least three serious difficulties confront the Disquotational Theory:

  1. (BQ3) says that we can use quotation to refer to symbols that are not in the English lexicon, as in (9) and (10):
      9. ‘Φ’ is not a part of any English expression.
    10. ‘squiggle’ is not an expression in any language.

    (DQR) says we can take any expression e, put quotation marks around e, and what results is an expression that refers to e. What exactly is meant by ‘any expression’ in (DQR)? Richard offers the following answer:

    It is easy enough to come up with a finite list of elements (the letters, punctuation symbols, the digits, the space, etc.) and an operation (concatenation) with which one can generate all of the concatenates…If we are formalizing a grammar for a language with quotation names, we would include, as part of the specification of the lexicon, a proviso to the effect that, for each concatenate e, the left quote (lq), followed by e, followed by the right quote (rq) is a singular term (Richard 1986, pp. 386–89, our emphasis).

    If this is how expressions are generated, how then are we to account for the truth of (9) and (10)? More generally, the worry is this: (DQR) needs to specify in some manner or other the domain of expressions over which it quantifies. How can it do this without unreasonably limiting the kinds of symbols that can be quoted?[11] (See Lepore (1999) for elaboration on this point.)

  2. According to (BQ6), a theory of quotation should leave room for dual use and mention. It is hard to see how (DQR) leaves such room. If quotes are referring expressions (as they are according to DQR), then if we let ‘Ted’ name the expression ‘has a certain anomalous feature’, (12) should say the same as, express the same proposition as, (17).
    12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’.
    17. Quine said that quotation Ted.

    Not only should (12) and (17) express the same proposition, according to DQR, they should also have the same logical form. That's an obviously incorrect account of (12). (For further discussion of mixed quotation see Section 4 below.)

  3. Those who raise Objection 4 against the Demonstrative Theory would probably raise the same objection here: the Disquotational Theory fails to account for quotation without quotation marks. All the work is being done by quotation marks, so there's no room for quotation without quotation marks. (DQR) proponents would presumably be as unimpressed as Demonstrative Theorists and their replies would be much the same (see above).

3.5 The Identity Theory of Quotation (or, better: the Use-Theory of Quotation)

The label ‘the Identity Theory of Quotation’ was first used, as far as we know, by Washington (1992), though he attributes the view to Frege (1892) and Searle (1969). However, the passages in which this view was allegedly offered prior to Washington hardly count as presenting a theory; they read more like dogmatic pronouncements devoid of argumentation. Since Washington paper was published related views have been developed in more detail by Saka (1998, 2004), Reimer (1996), Recanati (2000, 2001) and others.

Washington's presentation of the Identity Theory is somewhat compressed—the key passage is this:

The quotation as a whole is analyzed into the marks that signify quotational use of the quoted expression and the quoted expression itself used to mention an object. All expressions, even those whose standard uses are not as mentioning expressions, become mentioning expressions in quotation…a quoted expression is related to its value by identity: a quoted expression mentions itself. (Washington 1992, p. 557)

There are three important components of this view:[12], [13]

  1. The use of quotation marks (as in (4)) is a derivative phenomenon. The basic phenomenon is what Washington calls quotational use (Washington 1992, p. 557)
  2. The primary function of quotation marks is to indicate that words are used quotationally (or mentioned) and not (merely) used with their regular extensions.
  3. Quotation marks do not refer according to Washington; that which is doing the referring in the quotation is the expression itself, so in (2), for example, it is ‘Aristotle’, not “Aristotle” that refers to ‘Aristotle’, i.e., ‘Aristotle’ refers to itself. It refers to itself because it is being used quotationally (not with its regular extension.)

One way to get a handle on this kind of view is to consider a spoken utterance of (6)

6. My name is Donald

According to the Use/Identity theory, (6), when spoken, is grammatical (Washington 1992, pp. 588–90). There are no missing (or implicit) quotation marks. When uttered by a person whose name is ‘Donald’ it is true (if ‘Donald’ is used quotationally). The function of quotation marks in written language is simply to indicate that words are being used in this special, quotational, way, i.e. not (only) with their regular extensions. In other words, ‘Donald’ can be used in two different ways: with its usual semantic value (its regular referent) or quotationally. In the latter case, its semantic value is an expression.

We wish that the Identity Theory were not called ‘the Identity Theory’. (In private communication, Washington has expressed the same sentiment.) The ‘identity’ component is picked up from the formulation, ‘a quoted expression is related to its value by identity: a quoted expression mentions itself’. This formulation, however, is deeply misleading (as Washington himself has pointed out to us), since according to both Washington (and later, for example, Saka (1998)), quotations are ambiguous. They can, according to Washington, refer to types, tokens, or shapes (see Washington 1992, p. 594) and according to another proponent of this kind of view, Saka, they are even more flexible (Saka (1998), see further presentation of Saka's view below). A better label would be ‘the Use-Theory of Quotation’, since this emphasizes the point that a proper understanding of quotation requires appeal to a special way of using language. In what follows, we use the ungainly compromise ‘the Use/Identity Theory’.

It is useful to contrast Washington's account with the Disquotational Theory. Recall, that, according to DQR, quotation marks have a semantic function and that function is spelled out in the disquotational schema (DQR). (DQR) is a semantic axiom. It treats quotation marks as identity functions. Speaker's intentions figure not at all in this axiom (other than the intention to speak English). There is no need, on the Disquotational Theory, to appeal to a special kind of quotational usage. For Washington, the quotation marks have no genuine semantic function. They are no more than a heuristic device for indicating that expressions are used in a special way, i.e. quotationally.

3.5.1 Other Versions of the Use/Identity Theory: Reimer, Recanati, Saka, and the Picture Theory

Several recent views share important components of Washington's. Reimer (2005) combines versions of the Demonstrative Theory and the Identity Theory. Recanati (2000, 2001) doesn't explicitly discuss any version of the Identity Theory, but his theory incorporates some of its components; it is distinctive by focusing on what he calls ‘Open Quotation’ (see Objection 5 to the Demonstrative Theory above) and the iconic aspects of quotation (see Recanati (2001) for elaboration). Two theories might be worth a closer look for those interested in exploring Use/Identity Theories further (the second of these is mostly of historical interest):

  1. Saka (1998, 1999, 2005) has developed a theory that has much in common with Washington's (though it also differs in important respects). He agrees with Washington in emphasizing ‘quotational use’ (Saka calls it ‘mentioning’), but Saka has more to say about mentioning than Washington has to say about quotational use (see Saka (1998) and (2005)). Saka also goes further than Washington in claiming that quotation marks are not required for mentioning even in written language. (For Washington, it is only in spoken language that we can quote without quotation marks). According to Saka, (34) ‘is a grammatical and true sentence’ (Saka 1998, p.118)
    34. Cats is a noun

    Even though Saka agrees with Washington that quotation marks ‘announce ‘I am not (merely) using expression X; I am also mentioning it’ (Saka 1998, p. 127)', he differs from Washington in that he assigns them a genuine syntactic and semantic function (Saka, 1998, p. 128). In this respect he incorporates components of what we above called the Disquotational Theory.[14], [15]

    Saka's account also differs from Washington's in that he emphasizes that quotations are ambiguous (or indeterminate) and that what they refer to depends on the speaker's intentions (see Saka 1998, pp. 123–4). For further discussion of this point, see Section 5 below.

  2. There is one view we have not discussed and which might (admittedly with some difficulty) be squeezed into the category of the Use/Identity Theory. Quine said a number of things about quotation; in one passage he writes: …a quotation is not a description but a hieroglyph; it designates its object not by describing it in terms of other objects, but by picturing it (Quine 1940, p. 26).Davidson (1979), taking his cue from this passage and others, baptized the view intimated in Quine's passage as ‘the Picture Theory of Quotation’ (cf., also, Christensen 1967, p. 362). As Davidson notes, on this view:
    …it is not the entire quotation, that is, expression named plus quotation marks, that refers to the expression, but rather the expression itself. The role of the quotation marks is to indicate how we are to take the expression within: the quotation marks constitute a linguistic environment within which expressions do something special… (Davidson 1979, pp. 83–84)

    Notice that according to Davidson's description of this view, the quotation marks per se have no semantic function; rather, they indicate that the words are being used in a special way. They are being used ‘autonomously’, that is, to name themselves”. So understood, the Picture Theory has at least this much in common with a Use/Identity Theory: they agree that quotation marks are inessential; they only indicate a special use. They indicate that expressions are being used as a picture (or as a hieroglyph). The Picture Theory—if it's even appropriate to call it a theory—is never elaborated in any great detail and we suspect that if it were, it would become obvious that it is a version of the Use/Identity Theory.

3.5.2 Strengths of the Use/Identity Theory

Use/Identity Theorists claim that their theories are explanatorily more powerful than traditional semantic theories. By seeing quotation marks as a parasitic phenomenon, they are able to explain the semantics of both quotation and this more general phenomenon in a unified way.

There's a great deal of specific data that these theories claim to be able to explain. The most important of these is the possibility of mentioning without quotation marks (as in spoken language and in written language when no quotation marks are used). If we take appearances at face value, that means meta-linguistic discourse (call it mentioning or quotational use) can take place in the absence of quotation marks. Hence, an account of meta-linguistic discourse must proceed independently of an account of the semantics (or pragmatics) for quotation marks.

The following are additional claims made on behalf of the Use/Identity Theory (we take it to be an open question at this point whether these points are sustainable):

3.5.3 Weaknesses of the Use/Identity Theory

Discussion of the Use/Identity Theories is not yet as extensive as discussion of the Demonstrative Theory, so there are fewer objections to report. We discuss four concerns that have surfaced in various discussions.

Question about the Relevance of Quotational Use/Mention: Use/Identity Theories put a great deal of weight on the idea that the semantics for quotation cannot be developed without an account of quotational usage (mention in Saka's terminology.) There are several reasons for doubting this, two of which are these:

  1. It is not at all clear that the alleged phenomenon of mention without quotation marks is genuine. It might very well be, as mentioned in connection with Objection 3 to the Demonstrative Theory, that it is not possible to mention without using quotation marks. The cases appealed to might all turn out to be cases in which a conversational or conventional implicature is generated and where that implicature contains quotation marks. Alternatively, the quotation marks might actually be in the logical form of the sentence through some form of ellipsis. (See Carpintero (1994) and Cappelen and Lepore (1999)).
  2. Even if we suppose that the phenomenon of mentioning without quotation marks is genuine, it is not at all clear why we should consider it relevant to the semantics for quotation. Suppose that you're in the business of trying to develop a semantic theory of sentences with quotation marks. Suppose it also turns out that it is possible to talk about language by mentioning without the use of quotation marks. This might just be a different way of talking about language. An interesting phenomenon, no doubt, but not one that needs to have anything to do with the semantics for sentences containing quotation marks. It does not follow from there being a variety of ways in which language can be used to talk about language, that all of these ways are relevant to the semantics of quotation.

Question about the Semantics-Pragmatics Divide: On the Use/Identity Theory, a lot of work is done by pragmatic mechanisms. The appeal to speaker intentions plays a central role on all levels of analysis. On Saka's view, for example, what a quoted expression refers to is largely up to the speaker's intentions (and, maybe, what's salient in the context of utterance). A consequence of this view is that there is no guarantee, for example, that an utterance of (35) or (36) will be true:

35. ‘a’ = ‘a
36. ‘run’ is a verb in English

The two ‘a's’ in (35) could refer to different objects; the “run” in (36) might refer to, for example, a concept (see Cappelen and Lepore (1999b) and Saka (1999, 2005)).

Over-generation Problems: According to Use/Identity Theories, you can do a lot with quotation. The question is whether this results in such theories running into problems of over-generation. Take, for example, Saka's claim that a quotation refers to an item associated with the expression. There's only one restriction: This item cannot be the expression's regular extension. If this is the sole restriction on what quotations can be used to refer to, we should be able to do things with quotation that there's no evidence that we can. It could, for example, be the case that in a particular context, the (regular) extension of ‘love’, call it love, was associated with the expression ‘money’; maybe, for some reason, that association was contextually salient. Nonetheless, (37) cannot be used to say that love plays a central role in many peoples' lives.

37. ‘Money’ plays a central role in many peoples' lives.

Use/Identity Theories have to explain what blocks such readings (or show that they are possible). (See Saka (2005), and Cappelen and Lepore (2005)).

Dual Use-Mention (BQ6): Washington says that quotation marks indicate quotational usage and that expressions used quotationally refer to themselves (or some related entity). If so, the logical form of (12) should be that of (17), clearly not a correct result.

12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’.
17. Quine said that quotation Ted.[16]

It is at least a challenge to Identity/Use theorists to explain how the theory can accommodate simultaneous use and mention.

In addition to the above points, there's now a lively debate about the specifics of identity/use theories. For discussions of Saka, cf., Cappelen and Lepore (2005), Reimer (2005)), and for discussions of Recanati, cf., Cappelen and Lepore (2005), Reimer (2005), Benbaji (2004a, 2004b, 2005), and Cumming (2005).

We now turn from discussions of large-scale theories of quotation to discussions of how to understand specific aspects of our quotational practice. Two issues have been particularly important in the recent discussions: Mixed Quotation and the alleged ambiguity of quotations. One's view of these issues has wide reaching implications for which theory of quotation one favors. We discuss these in turn.

4. Mixed Quotation: Semantic or Pragmatic?

There is currently a great deal of discussion devoted to the correct understanding of the phenomenon Cappelen and Lepore in their 1997 paper labeled ‘Mixed Quotation’ (see (BQ6) above.) Much of the discussion concerns whether mixed quotation is a semantic or pragmatic phenomenon, i.e., whether a theory of quotation should treat mixed quotation as a genuinely semantic phenomenon. How one comes down on this issue will significantly shape one's overall theory of quotation.

By ‘a semantic account of mixed quotation’, we mean any theory that accepts all of (a)-(c):

  1. The semantic truth conditions for (12) require that Quine used the locution ‘has a certain anomalous feature’ (in proposition talk: the proposition semantically expressed by an utterance of (12) can't be true unless Quine used the locution ‘has a certain anomalous feature’).
    12. Quine said that quotation ‘has a certain anomalous feature’.
  2. The semantic truth conditions for (12) require that Quine used the locution ‘has a certain anomalous feature’ because (12) contains “has a certain anomalous feature”, i.e., it is a part of the semantic truth conditions for (12) that arise as the result of its compositional structure, in particular, as the result of the presence, and position, of “has a certain anomalous feature” in (12).
  3. As a corollary to (b), the requirement specified in (a) arises independently both of whatever intentions a speaker might happen to have when uttering (12) and also independently of the context that she happens to find herself in when she makes her utterance.

By a ‘pragmatic account of mixed quotation’ we mean any theory that denies one or more of (a)-(c). Versions of the pragmatic account have been presented, by among others, Recanati (2001), Clark & Gerrig (1990), Wilson (2000), Sperber & Wilson (1981), Tsohatzidis (1998), Staintion (1999), Saka (2005) and is discussed (though not fully endorsed) by Reimer (2005).

Here's Stainton's version of the pragmatic account:

A speaker could report parts of Alice's conversation in a squeaky voice, or with a French accent, or with a stutter, or using great volume. In none of these cases would the speech reporter say, assert, or state that Alice spoke in these various ways. […] In these cases, the truth conditions of the speech report are exhausted by the meaning of the words, and how the words are put together; as far as truth conditions are concerned, the tone, volume, accent etc. add nothing whatever. Ditto, say I, for the quotation marks in mixed quotation. In which case, ‘Alice said that life ‘is difficult to understand’ isn't false where Alice actually speaks the words ‘is tough to understand’. It may, of course, be infelicitous and misleading. (Stainton 1999: 273–274; italics added; similar quotes can be found in Clark & Gerrig 1990).

There's a lively debate about these issues (see, for example, Cappelen and Lepore (2005), and in Reimer (2005)). The debate has a lot in common with other discussions about whether certain phenomena are semantic or pragmatic in nature. (It is, for example, analogous in many ways to discussions about the significance of referential uses of definite descriptions.)

One aspect of this discussion, however, is worth particular mention: the behavior of indexicals within mixed quotes.

4.1 Indexicals in Mixed Quotation: Monsters?

Here is an example of a journalist's mixed quotation from Cappelen and Lepore (1997b):

Mr. Greenspan said he agreed with Labor Secretary R. B. Reich ‘on quite a lot of things’. Their accord on this issue, he said, has proved ‘quite a surprise to both of us’. (Cappelen and Lepore 1997b, p. 429)

Notice the occurrence of ‘us’ in the last sentence of this passage. It refers to Greenspan and Reich and not to the journalist and someone else. If the quotation marks in this sentence were semantically superfluous (as they are according to non-semanticists such as Recanati and Stainton), then this occurrence of ‘us’ should be read as spoken by the journalist (i.e. the reporter).

Two examples from Cumming (2005) make this point even clearer:

(C1) Bush also said his administration would ‘achieve our objectives’ in Iraq. (New York Times, November 4, 2004)
(C2) He now plans to make a new, more powerful absinthe that he says will have ‘a more elegant, refined taste than the one I'm making now.’

According to Recanati, ‘the proposition expressed by the complement sentence is the same with or without the quotation marks’ (Recanati 2001, p. 660). According to Stainton, ‘as far as truth conditions are concerned, the [quotation marks in mixed quotation] add nothing whatever’. Now try to remove them. What results are (C1*) and (C2*):

(C1*) Bush also said his administration would achieve our objectives in Iraq.
(C2*) He now plans to make a new, more powerful absinthe that he says will have a more elegant, refined taste than the one I'm making now.

These are obviously mistaken renderings of (C1) and (C2). Cappelen and Lepore (2005) claim that this is an argument in favor of a semantic account of mixed quotation because it shows that the quotation marks cannot just be dropped without semantic consequences. For discussion of this point see also Recanati (2001), Cumming (2005), Geurts and Maier (2005).

Kaplan (1989) defines ‘a monstrous operator’ as one that shifts the context of evaluation of an indexical away from the context of the actual speech act. He claims that monsters not only do not exist, but that they could not exist in a natural language. The data above make it extremely tempting to understand mixed quotation as monsters. (For monstrous interpretations, see, for example, Cumming (2005) and Geurts and Maier (2005).) Some think this temptation should be resisted, and the account in Cappelen and Lepore (2005) does not introduce monsters.

5. What Kinds of Entities do Quotations Refer to?

Running parallel to the debate about how quotations refer (how they manage to hook up with their semantic values) is a debate about what quotations refer to. One view that is widespread is that quotations are ambiguous or indeterminate. That is, one and the same quotation, e.g. “lobster” can, on this view, refer to different objects on different occasions of use, all depending on the context of utterance. Garcia-Carpintero (1994, p. 261) illustrates this kind of view and the kind of argument typically given for it. He says that “gone” can refer to any of the following:

Others think quotation can pick out contents or concepts. Goldstein says:

For when Elvis says ‘Baby, don't say ‘don't’,’ he is not just requiring his baby to refrain, when confronted with a certain request, from uttering tokens of the same phonetic shape as ‘don't’, but from uttering any tokens that mean the same. (Goldstein 1984, p. 4)

Saka (1998, p. 124) concurs and claims that “premise” and “premiss” in (38) pick out concepts:

38. The concept ‘premise’ is the same as the concept ‘premiss’.

Tsohatzidis (1998) claims that since T1 is true, even though Descartes didn't speak English, “is a thinking substance” in T1 can't refer to an English expression.

(T1) In one of the greatest philosophy books ever written in Latin, Descartes said that man ‘is a thinking substance’.

These arguments all take the same form: first, they identify a sentence S that we are inclined to interpret as true and suggest that the only way to understand how S can be true is to assume that quotations can refer to some kind of object O. This is then alleged to be evidence that quotations can be used to refer to objects of kind O.

If quotation has this kind of flexibility, the five theories discussed above will all have to be evaluated with respect to whether they can accommodate it. The Proper Name Theory, Description theory, and Disquotational Theory, all seem to have particular difficulties in this respect.

Not all, however, are convinced that quotations are flexible in just this way. Some have expressed skepticism both about the form of argument (see Cappelen and Lepore (1999a)) and about the specific examples. Cappelen and Lepore (1999a) also argue that the multiple ambiguity view over-generates, i.e., it predicts that it is possible to express propositions with quotation sentences that it is not possible to express with such sentences. For further discussion, see also Saka (2005).

6. Alternative Quotational Devices

A number of authors over the years have thought that our standard practices of quotation is not suitable for all purposes and have, in effect, introduced new technical devices. They cannot all be summarized here, but here is a brief sketch of some such devices.

6.1 Token Quotes

Reichenbach (1947, p. 284) writes: ‘Whereas the ordinary-quotes operation leads from a word to the name of that word, the token-quotes operation leads from a token to a token denoted by that token’. Reichenbach uses little arrows (ltoken rtoken) for token quotes, so that the sign (39):

39. ltokenartoken

represents not a name for the token of ‘a’, but a token for it. That is, the token in (39) cannot be repeated. (40), for example, is not only a token different from (39) but refers to a different token (Reichenbach 1947, pp. 285–86).

40. ltokenartoken

Token quotes then are much like writing a demonstrative expression like ‘this’ and fastening to it an object to produce a symbol of that object. (As noted above, some authors (Bennett (1988), Saka (1998), Washington (1992) opine that this is how ordinary quotation sometimes functions.)

6.2 Corner (Quasi) Quotation

As Quine (1940, §6) notes, the quotation:


designates only the specific expression therein depicted, containing a specific Greek letter. In order to effect reference to the unspecified expression he introduces a new notation of corners (namely, ‘ ’and ‘ ’). So, for example, if we take the expression ‘Quine’ as μ, then (μ)is ‘(Quine)’. The quasi-quotation is synonymous with the following verbal description: The result of writing ‘(’ and then μ and ‘)’ (Quine 1940, p. 36).

6.3 Dot Quotes

Someone who uses the word ‘red’ in speaking or thinking would generally be held to be employing the same concept as a French person who uses ‘rouge’. Assuming that ‘rouge’ is a good translation of ‘red’, Sellars (1963) thought it convenient to have a general term by which to classify words that are functional counterparts in this way. Such a term is provided by Sellars' dot quotes. Dot-quotes form a common noun true of items in any language that play the role performed in our language by the tokens exhibited between them, So, any expression that is a functional counterpart to ‘red’ can be described as a ·red·. In Sellars’ terminology, the concept red is something that is common and peculiar to ·red·s.

6.4 Unambiguous Quotes

Consider (41):

41. ‘a’ concatenated with ‘b’ is an expression.

Michael Ernst claims this sentence is ambiguous. Read one way, (41) means that the concatenation of the first letter of the Roman alphabet with the second letter is an expression; read another way it means that the expression between the two outer quote marks is an expression. Confronted with this ambiguity, Boolos (1995) introduced a notation for quotation in which every quotation mark ‘knows its name’. So understood there are denumerably many distinct quotation marks, each formed by prefixing a natural number n of strokes to a small circle, and in order to meaningfully enclose an expression with Boolos quotation marks we have to choose quotation marks of a ‘higher order’ than the quotation marks that occur in the expression to be quoted (if there are any) and each quotation mark in a grammatical sentence is to be ‘paired’ with the next identical quotation mark (Boolos 1995, p. 291).


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Davidson, Donald | descriptions | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | Tarski, Alfred