Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Mar 2, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jul 26, 2007

The discussion of definite and indefinite descriptions (phrases of the form ‘the F’ and ‘an F’) has been at the center of analytic philosophy for nearly a century now. The reason that philosophers find these apparently simple expressions so intriguing is that choices made about their proper logical analysis have repercussions that extend far beyond the philosophy of language and philosophy of logic. In Bertrand Russell's hands, for example, the analysis of descriptions became a powerful tool for executing important epistemological and metaphysical projects. Despite the apparent simplicity of definite and indefinite descriptions, the past 100 years has seen heated debates about their proper analysis — ranging from treating them as devices of reference to treating them as devices of quantification to treating them as devices of predication. The theory of descriptions and extensions of the theory of descriptions continue to serve as key points of contention in epistemological and metaphysical debates today.

1. What are Descriptions?

Ordinarily, when philosophers talk about descriptions, they have two kinds of expressions in mind: definite descriptions — understood to be phrases of the form ‘the F’ (and their equivalents in other languages), and indefinite descriptions — understood to be phrases of the form ‘an F’ (and their equivalents in other languages). As we will see, this way of carving up the kinds of descriptions is far too blunt. First, there are many kinds of expressions that appear to have this form but that are often argued not to be descriptions. For example, in the expression ‘John is a lawyer’ it is often claimed that ‘a lawyer’ is not a genuine description, but is rather something different — a predicate for example. Furthermore, it is arguable that there are many kinds of expressions having the surface form ‘the F’ but that nevertheless have semantical properties unlike “typical” descriptions. For example, there are generics (as in ‘The whale is a mammal’), and plurals (as in ‘The dogs are barking’).

Second, it is arguable that there are many expressions having surface forms quite different from ‘the F’ or ‘an F’ that could count as being descriptions. For example, it seems quite plausible that possessives like ‘my father’ are descriptions (as in ‘the father of me’). Russell (1905) also proposed that ordinary proper names could be construed as definite descriptions in disguise. Thus a name like ‘Aristotle’ might be taken as shorthand for ‘the student of Plato who taught Alexander, wrote The Nichomachean Ethics etc.’. Furthermore, as we will see, it has been argued that pronouns like ‘it’ might “stand proxy” for descriptions. So, for example, the pronoun in (1) might be taken to stand proxy for the corresponding definite description in (1′).

(1) A man came in the room. He turned on the TV.

(1′) A man came in the room. [The man who came in the room] turned on the TV.

Correlatively, it has been suggested that temporal anaphors like ‘then’ and modal anaphors like ‘that’ (in ‘that would have been unfortunate’) are kinds of descriptions.

If matters weren't complicated enough, there are many natural languages that do not have anything resembling our definite and indefinite descriptions — raising questions about whether the distinction between definite and indefinite descriptions is really legitimate at all. All of these possibilities will be discussed in due course, but for now we will begin with the rather narrow conception of descriptions first taken up in Russell (1905, 1919).

2. Russell's Theory of Descriptions

Russell's theory of definite descriptions has become one of the Archimedian points in the philosophy of language during the past 100 years. By that I mean that the choice of whether to accept or reject Russell's theory has had profound consequences for our philosophy of language, epistemology, and metaphysics. Yet, for all its impact, the theory is actually very simple. The key idea of the proposal is that a sentence like (2) containing an indefinite description, is understood to have the logical form in (2′),

(2) An F is G

(2′) ∃x(F(x) & G(x))

and a sentence like (3) containing a definite description is understood to have the logical form in (3′).

(3) The F is G

(3′) ∃x(F(x) & ∀y(F(y) → x=y) & G(x))

Boiled down to its simplest non-technical form, the idea is that an expression of the form in (3) is shorthand for three claims:

i) There is an F.

ii) At most one thing is F.

iii) Something that is F is G.

Following Neale (1990) we will find it useful to substitute (iii’) for (iii), which retains Russell's truth conditions and, as we will see in section 9, allows us to extend the theory to plural descriptions in a natural way.

iii′) Everything that is F is G.

Thus tweaked, Russell's analysis is that the use of a definite description in a sentence involves an existence claim, a uniqueness claim, and a universal claim.

It is helpful to distinguish two aspects of Russell's proposal, a syntactic claim and a semantic claim. The syntactic claim is that sentences containing definite descriptions are properly analyzed as having the logical form given in (3′). The semantic claim is that whatever the form of a sentence containing a description (and it may be nothing like (3′)), the truth conditions of it are equivalent to the truth conditions of (3′). Most recent debates have centered on the question of whether Russell's semantical proposal was correct and have set aside the syntactic proposal.

Indeed Neale (1990), Brown (1992), and Stanley and Williamson (1995) have suggested that Russell's semantical and syntactical claims should be severed, and that the syntax of definite descriptions might be rendered in restricted quantifier notation as in (3*).

(3*) [The x: Fx]G(x)

The semantics of definite descriptions can then be given in terms of generalized quantifier theory as in Barwise and Cooper (1981), Higginbotham and May (1982), Keenan and Stavi (1984), where the determiners ‘a’ and ‘the’ denotes a relations that can be set-theoretically characterized as follows:

(4) ||an|| = {<X, Y>: XY ≠ ∅ };

(5) ||the|| = {<X,Y>: |X| = 1 and XY = ∅ }.

To illustrate, consider a sentence like ‘A dog barked’, and suppose that ‘dog’ denotes the set X, ‘bark’ denotes the set Y, and ‘a’ denotes the set-theoretic object characterized in (4). Then ‘A dog barked’ will be true just in case the ordered pair <X, Y> falls into the extension of the relation denoted by ‘A’ — that is, if the intersection of X (the dogs) and Y (the barkers) is non-empty. Similarly for a sentence like ‘The dog barked’. This will be true just in case the cardinality of X (the set of dogs) is 1, and X minus the Ys is empty (i.e., if all dogs are barkers).

There is an issue of how innocent this appeal to generalized quantifiers is, given Russell's logical and epistemological motivations. For Russell, definite descriptions did not denote at all — but were incomplete symbols that combined with predicates to form meaningful sentences. The move to generalized quantifier theory seems to abandon that idea. For better or worse, we will skirt this issue for the most part and concentrate on the semantical features of Russell's proposal, but see Linsky (1992, 2002) for an expression of this criticism and Neale (2002) for a response.

3. Motivations for the Theory of Descriptions

In a famous passage, Russell (1919), writing in prison, made the following declaration of his keen interest in definite descriptions:

… in this chapter we shall consider the word the in the singular, and in the next chapter we shall consider the word the in the plural. It may be thought excessive to devote two chapters to one word, but to the philosophical mathematician it is a word of very great importances: like Browning's grammarian with the enclitic δε, I would give the doctrine of this word if I were “dead from the waist down” and not merely in prison.

Strong stuff! But why was he so fascinated with the word ‘the’? Apart from the role the theory of descriptions played in Russell's development of the theory of types, there are really three motivations for the theory of descriptions; the first is metaphysical, the second involves semantical concerns in the philosophy of language, and the third is epistemological.

3.1 Metaphysical motivations for the theory of descriptions

Since Parmenides, philosophers have worried about how one can use a nondenoting expression in a meaningful utterance. If I use a name like ‘Pegasus’ or a description like ‘the present King of France’ don't these expressions have to refer to something in order for my utterance of the sentence to be meaningful? Clearly I can use these expressions in a meaningful way; consider sentences like ‘The present King of France does not exist’, ‘Pegasus does not exist’, ‘Smith believes that The present King of France is bald’ etc.

The space of possible answers is fairly constrained here. For example, one can argue (ala Meinong (1904), Parsons (1980) and Zalta (1983, 1988)) that these expressions really do refer (albeit to nonexistent objects), one can argue that one is referring to a concept of some sort (for example the concept of Pegasus), or one can claim that one really isn't expressing a complete proposition in these cases, but that the sentence itself is nonetheless meaningful (Strawson 1950). Russell saw a different solution — one in which it was possible to express a proposition with definitive truth conditions, but one without the (in his view) unsavory metaphysical commitments of nonexistent objects or concepts.

The idea is very simple. Consider a negative existential sentence like (6).

(6) The Present King of France does not exist

Because definite descriptions are devices of quantification on Russell's view they can enter into scope relations with other operators — in this case, for example, negation. Accordingly, there is a kind of ambiguity in (1), between the following two logical forms.

(6a) not ([the x: x is the present King of France] exists(x))

(6b) [the x: x is the present King of France] not (exists(x))

If one wants to avoid the ontological entanglements of nonexistent objects, then one is free to say that (6b) is false (since it involves quantifying over things that don't exist) but that (6a) is true (since it is not the case that there is a present King of France). What is negated in (6a) is not a claim about some particular individual, but rather a general claim about the world — in effect a claim that the world contains exactly one individual that is presently the King of France and that whoever is presently the King of France exists.

The same holds when I use a definite description in a propositional attitude report. If I say ‘Smith believes that the present King of France is bald’ I am claiming that Smith believes a general proposition — not a proposition about some particular individual, but rather a proposition to the effect that someone or other satisfies the property of presently being the King of France and that whoever satisfies that property is bald. The theory of descriptions allows me to report Smith's belief without my referring to any particular individual or even supposing that some individual is denoted by the description. We can even avoid talk of properties here if we wish, for we might just as well have said that Smith has a belief to the effect that someone or other satisfies the predicate ‘present King of France’ and whoever satisfies that predicate also satisfies the predicate ‘bald’.

Notice how much can be accomplished here with minimal technical resources. By invoking the theory of descriptions we have avoided appeal to nonexistent objects, and we have likewise avoided saying that Smith's belief is about the concept of the present King of France. If we choose, we can extend our metaphysical austerity further by opting for talk of predicates instead of properties. The result is that we can freely employ negative existential sentences and we can freely report the beliefs of others — even if those negative existentials and beliefs are reported by using expressions that fail to denote.

The theory of descriptions not only liberates our ontology when we use descriptions in negative existentials and belief reports, but Russell argued that it also can be extended to handle our use of fictional names in those environments. Suppose that a name like ‘Pegasus’ is really a definite description in disguise. Then when I report a belief by uttering ‘Smith believes that Pegasus was in his garden’ I need not be taken as referring to a fictional entity of some sort, but can be understood as attributing a general belief to Smith — one to the effect that there is a white winged horse and it is in his garden. Again, the belief that I attribute to Smith is not about any particular entity, but is a general belief about the world.

We can extend this strategy to ordinary discourse about fictions — discourse that has nothing to do with belief attribution — for example an utterance of ‘Pegasus was swift’. Following a suggestion due to Burge (1974) we might suppose that this sort of discourse about fictions is to be understood being embedded within an implicit operator — for example, ‘A well-known myth asserts that’ or ‘A fictional story by Homer asserts that’. Fully unpacked, an utterance of ‘Pegasus is swift’ is a claim to the effect that a well-known myth asserts that there is a unique thing that satisfies the predicate ‘white winged horse…’ and that also satisfies the predicate ‘swift’.

This general strategy has been extended to other domains as well. For example, A. N. Prior (1967), in seeking to mount a defense of presentism — the doctine that there are no future or past objects — encountered the problem of individuals that no longer exist. Consider, for example, the sentence ‘Aristotle was fond of dogs’. If the name ‘Aristotle’ refers (or an utterance of it must refer), then the presentist is in trouble, for ‘Aristotle’ clearly does not refer to an individual that presently exists. Prior's solution was to employ the theory of descriptions. What he saw was that if the description was embedded in the scope of a past tense operator then the effect would be the same as if the description was embedded in the scope of negation, an attitude verb, or the well-known-myth operator discussed above. An utterance of ‘Aristotle was fond of dogs’ comes to an assertion that p was true, where p is the proposition that there is an individual who is a student of Plato and teacher of Alexander … and he is fond of dogs. (Here Prior takes propositions to be non-eternal, so that their truth value might change over time.)

Whatever we may think of the merits of presentism and other forms of metaphysical austerity, the value of the theory of descriptions should be obvious. It is a device that allows us to avoid being herded into unwanted metaphysical commitments while at the same time allowing us to hold that our use of non-denoting expressions is entirely meaningful. Not surprisingly then, the theory of descriptions and various extensions of the theory continue to be employed in the service of metaphysical austerity today.

3.2 Semantical motivations for the theory

Metaphysical issues are not the only motivations for the theory of descriptions. For example, Russell also had a number of concerns that today we might call “semantical”. They were, in effect, concerns about the meaning or semantical content that we attribute to expressions of the language — concerns that were initially brought to attention by Gottlob Frege.

Consider the expressions ‘The Morning Star’ and the ‘Evening Star’. Both refer to the planet Venus, but there are contexts in which it seems incorrect to say that they have the same meaning. For example, it was as an astronomical discovery that The Morning Star was identical to the Evening Star, so it would be odd to treat an expression like ‘The Morning Star is the Evening Star’ as merely asserting some object to be self-identical. In a similar vein, Russell (1905) observed that if we utter (7),

(7) King George IV wondered whether Scott is Sir Walter.

we are most likely not saying that George IV was curious about the law of identity (that is, we are not saying that he was wondering whether a = a).

Frege proposed that that the solution to this puzzle involved the introduction of senses — abstract objects that fix the referents of these expressions, each having a different cognitive significance. In the case of (7), the Fregean solution would be to say that there are different senses attached to the names ‘Scott’ and ‘Sir Walter’. Taking exception to Frege's proposal, Russell held that descriptions could do all the work that senses are supposed to do, and without the metaphysical baggage. If we take the names in (7) as standing proxy for definite descriptions, then (7) can be unpacked as in (7′).

(7′) King George IV wondered whether the x that … is identical to the y that ___.

where the ‘…’ and the ‘___’ represent different descriptions (for example, the first description might be ‘the clever author of Ivanhoe named ‘Scott’’ and the other might be ‘the dapper gentleman named ‘Sir Walter’’).

Russell saw that scope relations are relevant here as well. So, for example, sentences like (7) evince what are sometimes called de dicto / de re ambiguities. There are circumstances under which George IV has someone in particular in mind and is wondering, of that individual, whether he is the author of Waverly. We can use (7) to report this fact as well; In this case we may think of the description as taking wide scope relative to the propositional attitude verb ‘wondered’ yielding a logical form like (8).

(8) the x that … is such that King George IV wondered whether x is identical to the y that ___.

And of course if George IV has gone mad and is in fact wondering about the law of identity, this may be represented as in (9), where both descriptions have wide scope.

(9) the x that … is such that the y that ___ is such that King George III wondered whether x is identical to y.

The possibility that descriptions and names (analyzed as descriptions) might enter into scope relations has given rise to a tremendous amount of interesting work in the philosophy of language, much of it showing — or at least purporting to show — that certain philosophical gambits fail because they overlook the hidden scope ambiguities in play.

3.3 Epistemological motivations for the theory

Metaphysical and semantical concerns were important to Russell in his (1905) paper, but epistemological concerns were no less significant. This was already evident in the original paper, but it became particularly clear when he authored his (1910-11) paper “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” In that paper. Russell distinguished between objects that we are directly acquainted with and objects that we only know under a description. So, for example, I might know myself by acquaintance, but I know the tallest man in Iowa only under a description.

Of course, there are a number of individuals to talk about besides myself and the tallest man in Iowa, and that is where matters get interesting. Consider, for example, former President Bill Clinton. Am I directly acquainted with him or do I merely know him under a description? Prima facie, there is some reason to think I am acquainted with him, even if that acquaintance relation is mediated by television cameras and satellite uplinks. On the other hand, as Descartes argued, it is at least conceivable that Clinton does not really exist — perhaps he was a holographic invention of media moguls or perhaps an evil demon caused me to hallucinate his entire presidency.

Temporarily under the spell of Cartesian epistemology, Russell came to hold that the mere possibility that I am deceived about Clinton means that I only know Clinton under a description. This means that we would want the name ‘Bill Clinton’ to stand proxy for a definite description of some form. After all, my linguistic intentions are grounded in my psychology (I can't intend to say what I can't think) and there is no way I can, as it were, get outside my skin to determine whether a referring expression or a description is called for. Russell was led to the extreme position that we are directly acquainted with very few individuals — one can be acquainted with oneself and with sense data, but that is about it. Correlatively, he came to hold that nearly all of our claims are general (employing descriptions rather than referring expressions).

Recent years have seen the development of versions of epistemology that are more forgiving of the possibility of error, and it is now routine to suppose that one can be acquainted with objects that are in the perceptual environment, objects that we have only seen on television, and indeed, objects like Aristotle that we are only connected with via a long causal chain (see Kripke 1980 and Evans 1973 for discussion). In this respect, writers have often retained Russell's distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description while jettisoning his Cartesian epistemology and holding that a broad class of objects are known by acquaintance. This anti-Cartesianism has given rise to puzzles of it's own, however, including the question of whether it doesn't undermine the authority of our self-knowledge — in this case there is the question of whether one can know one's linguistic intentions without first investigating the world to determine once and for all whether Clinton, Pegasus, and Aristotle really exist(ed).

4. Objections to the Theory of Descriptions

Despite the great promise of the theory of descriptions, it has encountered its fair share of criticism. This criticism has ranged from contentions that Russell simply got the truth conditions wrong in important cases to nagging worries about the details of the proposal — in particular worries relating to the nature of the descriptive content. As we will see, none of these concerns have been completely ameliorated.

4.1 The challenge to Russell's truth conditions

Strawson (1950) objected that Russell's theory is simply incorrect about the truth conditions of sentences like ‘The present King of France is bald’. According to Russell's analysis, this sentence is false (since it contains an existence claim to the effect that there is a present King of France), but according to Strawson, this does not conform to our intuitions about the truth of an utterance of that sentence. In Strawson's view, an utterance of the sentence in a world where there is no present King of France is neither true nor false; perhaps the sentence has a truth value gap, or perhaps it fails to express a determinate proposition (Strawson vacillated on this), but either way it does not appear to be false. Strawson held that this fact supported a referential interpretation of expressions like ‘The present King of France’.

If there is no present King of France, then an utterance containing such an expression is somehow defective. It is as if I looked into my desk drawer, not allowing you to see what I was looking at, and said ‘that is a fine green one.’ Strawson held that utterances like these do not entail the existence of a fine green one or the present King of France, but rather presuppose their existence. If the expressions fail to refer, then there is a presupposition failure and the utterance fails to have a determinate truth value. (Notice that this sort of failure is not supposed to undermine the meaningfulness of the sentences that we utter; for Strawson, sentences are meaningful in and of themselves, independently of the utterance situation. Utterances of meaningful sentences may be true or false or, if here is a presupposition failure, they may be neither.)

For his part, Russell (1957) argued that, despite Strawson's protestations, the sentence was in fact true:

Suppose, for example, that in some country there was a law that no person could hold public office if he considered it false that the Ruler of the Universe is wise. I think an avowed atheist who took advantage of Mr. Strawson's doctrine to say that he did not hold this proposition false would be regarded as a somewhat shifty character.

Does this whole debate come down to a case of intuition swapping? Thomason (1990; 327) and Soames (1976; 169) seemed to think so, and Strawson himself (1964) also came to doubt whether the entailment vs. presupposition debate could be settled by “brisk little formal argument[s]”.

However, Neale (1990) maintained that the matter could be settled in Russell's favor, and supported the claim by collecting a number of previously observed cases in which intuitions about truth conditions clearly do not support Strawson's view. For example, ‘My mother is dating the present King of France’ seems clearly false, as does ‘The present King of France cleans my swimming pool’, and he concluded that these are clearly cases where the Strawsonian truth conditions have gone awry. What is Strawson to make of these examples, given that there ought to be the same sort of reference failure that we saw in ‘The present King of France is bald’?

A number of linguists have recently come to Strawson's defense on this matter. For example, Lasersohn (1993) argued that in cases of presupposition failure we test to see whether a truth-value can be assigned independently of our knowledge that the proposition is in some sense defective. If there is no way the sentence could be true even if the term had a reference, then we judge the sentence to be false.

Why is it that someone who points at an empty chair and says ‘The King of France is sitting in that chair’ seems to be saying something false? I would like to suggest that it is because even if we suspend our knowledge that there is no King of France, there is no way of consistently extending our information to include the proposition that the King of France is sitting in that chair. Such an extension is impossible because we know the chair to be empty.

Notice however, that the utterance in question seem equally false even if we cannot see the person making the utterance, nor the chair that is being demonstrated. Taking another tack, von Fintel (2003) argued that cases like ‘The present King of France clean my pool’ are in fact truth-valueless, but we have a pragmatic “fall-back strategy” that assigns working truth values to sentences that, in point of fact, have no truth values.

Suffice it to say that Strawson's concerns here have not delivered a knock-out blow to the theory of descriptions, although they continue to have currency among many philosophers and linguistics. This topic remains very much active.

4.2 Donnellan's distinction and the argument from misdescription

Donnellan (1966) observed that there is a sense in which Strawson and Russell are both right (and both wrong) about the proper analysis of descriptions. He argued that definite descriptions can be used in (at least) two different ways. On a so-called attributive use, a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ is used to express a proposition equivalent to ‘Whatever is uniquely F is G’. For example, on seeing murder victim Smith's badly mutilated corpse, Detective Brown might say “The murderer of Smith is insane” thereby communicating the thought that some unique individual murdered Smith and that whoever that individual is, he/she is insane. Alternatively, on a referential use, a sentence of the form ‘The F is G’ is used to pick out a specific individual, x, and say of x that x is G. For example, suppose Jones is on trial for Smith's murder and is behaving quite strangely at the defense table. I point at Jones and say, “The murderer of Smith is insane”, thereby communicating the thought that Jones is insane (whether or not Jones is the actual murderer).

Donnellan suggested that Russell's quantificational account of definite descriptions might capture attributive uses, but that it does not work for referential uses. In effect, we might take Donnellan as saying that in some cases descriptions are Russellian and in some cases they are Strawsonian. Perhaps we could even say that the definite determiner ‘the’ is ambiguous between these two cases (it is not clear whether Donnellan himself intended to endorse a lexical ambiguity of this sort).

Kripke (1977) responded to Donnellan by arguing that the Russellian account of definite descriptions could, by itself, account for both referential and attributive uses; the difference between the two cases could be entirely a matter of pragmatics. Here is the idea: Grice showed us that there is an important distinction to be made between what one literally says by an utterance and what one intends to communicate (what one means) by that utterance. To take a famous example of Grice's, I might write a letter of recommendation for a student saying that he is very punctual and has excellent handwriting. Now what I have said is something about the student's punctuality and handwriting, but what I meant was that this is a very weak student.

In a similar vein, we could say that when I use a description referentially — say in Donnellan's courtroom case — I am literally making a general claim to the effect that there is a murderer of Smith and that he is insane, but what I mean by that utterance is that Jones is insane. That is, when I say ‘The murderer of Smith insane’ what I literally say is that exactly one person, x, is such that x murdered Smith and x is insane, but in that context I would succeed in communicating the singular proposition (about Jones) that Jones is insane.

Kripke gave several reasons for thinking that this Gricean solution was preferable to an ambiguity thesis. One reason was a general methodological point that one should not introduce ambiguities blithely — doing so is a kind of philosophical cheat. All the more so in this case, where there do not appear to be natural languages that make an explicit lexical distinction between these two kinds of descriptions (i.e., there are no languages that have two different words corresponding to the referential and attributive uses of ‘the’ — see also Sennett (forthcoming), who invokes several linguistic tests for ambiguity to show that definite determiners are not ambiguous between referential and attributive interpretations). Kripke also noted that we could easily imagine a community of individuals who spoke a surface form of a Russell language (explicitly spelling out descriptions as ‘there is an x, such that …’). Would the speakers of such a language be prohibited from using their descriptions referentially? Clearly not. Kripke's point was thus that the mere possibility of these different uses does not provide evidence for the ambiguity thesis. (But see Reimer 1998 and Devitt 2002 for criticism of this argument).

Finally, Kripke observed that these two uses of definite descriptions are really just subspecies of the general distinction between what is meant (speaker's reference in Kripke's terminology) and what is literally said (semantic reference) and not at all unique to descriptions. Kripke noted that the distinction even applies to uses of proper names. So, for example, consider the case where I see a man in the distance raking leaves. I take the man to be Jones but it is actually Johnson. I say ‘Jones is really working up a sweat today’. Now what I have literally said is that Jones is working up a sweat, but what I have communicated (what I meant) is something about Johnson. Clearly no one would argue that the name ‘Jones’ is ambiguous between referring to Jones and referring to Johnson, so why opt for an ambiguity thesis when descriptions are involved? It appears to be exactly the same phenomenon.

Neale (1990; ch. 3) took up the Kripkean line about speaker's reference and semantic reference, and attempted to explicate the way in which Gricean principles could be employed to communicate a singular proposition about some individual. Neale's example of how this works involves a case where the speaker and hearer both know that Harry Smith is the chairman of the Flat Earth Society. The idea is that the speaker (S) can use the definite description ‘The Chairman of the Flat Earth Society’ to refer to Harry Smith. The derivation goes as follows:

(a) S has expressed the proposition that [The x: Fx](Gx).

(b) There is no reason to suppose that S is not observing the CP (Grice's cooperative principle) and maxims.

(c) S could not be doing this unless he thought that Gb (where ‘b’ is a name). Gloss: On the assumption that S is observing the Maxim of Relation, he must be attempting to convey something beyond the general proposition that whoever is uniquely F is G. On the assumption that S is adhering to the Maxim of Quality, he must have adequate evidence for thinking that the F is G. I know S knows that b is the F, therefore S thinks that Gb.

(d) S knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I know that b is the F, that I know that S knows that b is the F, and that I can see that S thinks the supposition that he thinks that Gb is required.

(e) S has done nothing to stop me thinking that Gb.

(f) S intends me to think, or is at least willing to allow me to think, that Gb.

(g) And so, S has implicated that Gb.

In the case where we do not refer to an individual known by name, but rather to someone in the perceptual environment, we replace step (c) of the derivation with (c′).

(c′) S could not be doing this unless he thought that Gb (where ‘b’ is a demonstrative that refers to an individual salient in the environment). Gloss: On the assumption that S is observing the Maxim of Relation, he must be attempting to convey something beyond the general proposition that whoever is uniquely F is G. On the assumption that S is adhering to the Maxim of Quality, he must have adequate evidence for thinking that the F is G. It is not plausible to suppose that he has just general grounds for this belief, therefore he must have object-dependent grounds. I can see that there is someone in the perceptual environment who could be taken to satisfy the description ‘the F’, and I can see that S can see this. Therefore the grounds for his assertion that the F is G are plausibly furnished by the belief that Gb.

Naturally, with this sort of analysis the devil is in the details, and there are plenty of steps in Neale's derivation that one might worry about. For example, in steps (c) and (c′) one might wonder precisely how one infers that S is attempting to communicate all of these things. Clearly there is more work to be done if this strategy is to be fully executed.

Fleshing out the details may be worth the effort, however, given the potential payoff. For example, one of the advantages of employing the Gricean distinction between the proposition literally communicated and the proposition meant is that it offers an account for our being ambivalent about Donnellan's (1966) misdescription cases. In the courtroom case discussed above, I might say “Smith's murderer is insane,” and still say something true even if the crazy man at the defense table is entirely innocent of the charges and the actual murderer, who is miles from the courtroom, is quite sane. At the same time there is some pull to say that in such a case one is saying something false too. We can say that this is a case where what we literally said was false, but that what we intended to communicate — the proposition meant — was true. The two-level theory thus accounts for our conflicting intuitions.

Similarly, Hornsby (1977) gave the case of my observing the man ranting at the defense table and (me) saying, “The murderer of Smith is insane” not realizing that the man at the table is both innocent and quite sane, while the actual murderer is at large and quite insane. Again we are ambivalent about the truth of what I say, and as Neale (1990; 91-93) observed, the distinction between the proposition literally expressed and the proposition meant allows us to understand why. In this case, the proposition literally expressed is true, but what I intend to communicate is mistaken.

Unfortunately, there are cases where the two-stage theory doesn't appear to be sufficient. For example, there remains a difficulty that Ludlow and Segal (2003) have called the residue of the problem of misdescription. Consider a case where we are at the crime scene, and unbeknownst to Detective Brown there is not one murderer but several — suppose there were several perpetrators and they were all mad members of an evil cult. When Brown utters the sentence ‘The murderer of Smith is insane’ has he said something true or false? Again we are in two minds about the matter but this time the distinction between what is literally said and what is meant is no help. We will return to this puzzle in section 5, but for now it is worth noting that the issues surrounding the problem of misdescription have not been exhausted, in spite of several decades of debate.

4.3 The argument from incompleteness

Another persistent problem for the classical Russellian theory of descriptions has been the charge that it fails to account for the problem of “incomplete descriptions” (for discussion see Donnellan (1968), Hornsby (1977), Devitt (1981; chapter 2, 2003), Wettstein (1981), Recanati (1986), Salmon (1982), Soames (1986), Neale (1990; chapter 2), and Reimer (1992)). In addition, Kripke (1977), while defending Russell's theory of description against the problem of misdescription, allows that the argument from incomplete descriptions might be enough of a problem to force us to accept referential interpretations of descriptions. The worry, initially raised in Strawson (1950), is that if I say ‘the table is covered with books’, I do not mean to be suggesting that there is only one table in the world. Unfortunately, that seems to be precisely what the Russellian theory of descriptions is committed to. (Recall that on the Russellian analysis my utterance is shorthand for ‘there is a table and only one table and every table is covered with books’.)

One strategy for dealing with this problem is that the context may provide us the means to flesh out the description (this view is sometimes associated with Sellars 1954, but see Stanley 2002 for a discussion which suggests Sellars has something rather different in mind). For example, perhaps descriptions can be fleshed out appropriately if we allow referential devices to be inserted into the description. The suggestion is that when we speak of the table we are implicitly specifying a spatial coordinate — in effect, we are saying ‘the table over there’. One problem with strategies of this nature is that there fails to be a principled basis (in the terminology of Devitt and Sterelny 1999) for determining what the content of these descriptions is to be. Is it to be a description that the speaker has in mind? Is this description really sufficient to uniquely identify the object in question? Is it always clear that the speaker has a description in mind?

Neale (1990) has argued that whatever we may want to say about the problem of incompleteness, it is not very effective as an argument for the referential analysis of descriptions. For example, at the crime scene Detective Brown may simply utter ‘The murderer is insane’ failing to specify exactly which murderer he is talking about (is it the murderer of Smith or Jones or …?). But by hypothesis this case is a canonical example of an attributive use of a definite description. No reference is possible, so how can appeal to reference bail us out? How can any of this be an argument for definite descriptions being semantically referential?

Even stronger, it appears that there are numerous examples involving quantified expressions that suffer the same fate as incomplete descriptions. I can say ‘Everyone came to the party’, not intending to mean everyone in the world. Or I might say, as Yogi Bera once did, ‘Nobody goes there anymore, it's too crowded’. It certainly appears that what is going on in these cases is similar to the cases of incomplete definite descriptions and that there should be a single strategy for accounting for these different cases of “incompleteness.” (But see Devitt 2003 for an argument that these cases are genuinely different in kind.)

Recent work has investigated the strategy of treating these cases as similar in kind — arguing that the problem of incomplete definite descriptions can be accounted for if we pursue an appropriate theory of quantifier domain restriction. Stanley and Szabo (2000), for example, take this approach, suggesting that context can restrict the domain of quantification. On their proposal, context can even shift within a sentence, allowing us to make sense of an utterance like ‘The dogs barked at the dogs’, where I mean to say that one group of dogs barked while the other group perhaps suffered in silence. (As their proposal is applicable to all quantified expressions and not just the theory of descriptions, I cannot focus on it here, except to note that it has spawned a great deal of discussion, including Bach (2000), Neale (2000b), and Lepore (2003).

It is important to note (following Szabo (2000) and Ludlow and Segal (2003) that even with a fully functional account of quantifier domain restriction there is a lingering problem here too. Let's call it the residue of the incompleteness problem. Consider cases like (11)

(11) Put the book on the book

Now clearly, the first use of ‘the book’ cannot have the same domain of quantification as the second use, since that would put two books in the domain of quantification and it would mean that both descriptions in the sentence are incomplete. But one wonders how kosher a domain-shift analysis is here. Is there really a shift in the domain of quantification between the first utterance of ‘the book’ and the second utterance of that noun phrase? What would count as independent evidence either for, or against, a domain-shift taking place?

The problem can be given more teeth if we embed cases like (11) in conditionals as in example (12), discussed in Heim (1990).

(12) If a bishop meets another bishop, the bishop blesses the other bishop

Here it is especially difficult to see how a domain-shift can help. The options are fairly limited too. One can make a meta-linguistic move and use paraphrases like ‘the bishop mentioned first’ and the ‘bishop mentioned second’, but precisely which bishop was mentioned first? A number of moves and counter-moves have been made in response to this problem, but I want to put off further discussion for just a bit. In the next section we will see that the same problem arises in significant ways for theories of descriptive anaphora. We will discuss the problem at length in that context and then I'll return to the problem yet again in section 6, with some more optimistic thoughts about how the problem might be handled.

4.4 Non-denoting expressions again

As observed in Section 1, one of the key motivations for Russell's theory of descriptions was the idea that it could ameliorate the problem of non-denoting expressions — expressions like ‘Pegasus’, ‘The Golden Mountain’, and ‘The Present King of France’. It is now widely believed that this solution is not altogether satisfactory in the case of fictions (like ‘Pegasus’), and that it is unhappy in all cases when we embed the descriptions in a certain class of intensional constructions.

In the case of fictions, one problem has to do with the fact that there is often no single shared description for certain fictions. Even a simple case like ‘Santa Claus’ presents difficulties here. Many people will associate many different descriptions with the name ‘Santa Claus’. Which, if any of those descriptions is the correct one, and in what sense can we say that all the people deploying the name ‘Santa Claus’ and associating different descriptions with the term are talking about the same thing? Complicating the matter further, others might not use the term ‘Santa Claus’ but a name like ‘Saint Nick’ or ‘Babbo Natale’, and associate those terms with descriptions that converge to some degree with typical Santa descriptions. At best the Russellian can argue that others are in the same boat here. Consider the option of non-existent objects. If such objects are individuated by their properties then we can again ask which properties the non-existent object Santa Claus is supposed to have. And is the Italian who deploys the term ‘Babbo Natale’ talking about the same nonexistent object as a child that deploys the name ‘Santa Claus’? This problem seems analogous to the one faced by the Russellian. (See Everett and Hofweber (2000) and French and Wettstein (2001) for some recent papers on these general issues).

Another problem, however, has to do with intensional transitive constructions — constructions that are not propositional attitude reports, but which nonetheless are intensional. Examples include ‘John worships Zeus’, ‘Cortez sought the golden mountain’, and ‘Sally is looking for the present King of France’. The problem posed by these examples is that if the name is really a Russellian description in disguise, and if (for example) we want to say that Cortez had a particular thing in mind we seem forced to an analysis like ‘there is a unique golden mountain and Cotez sought it’, but this in turn seems to commit us to the existence of the Golden Mountain. How does the Russellian satisfy the demand that Cortez have a particular thing in mind and yet safely keep the description within the scope of the intensional verb. The contrast with the case of propositional attitude verbs will make this problem more vivid. Take the sentence ‘Cortez believed that the Golden Mountain was in Mexico’. In this case, the Russellian analysis yields something like ‘Cortez believed that there was a unique object that was golden and a mountain and that it was in Mexico’. Since this seems unproblematic (the description is safely within the scope of the attitude verb) one strategy for the Russellian has been to claim that intensional transitive constructions are actually propositional attitude constructions in disguise. Consider Quine's analysis of ‘seeks’ according to which ‘Cortez sought the golden mountain’ had the analysis ‘Cortez endeavored that he find the golden mountain’. Borrowing this strategy, the Russellian might say that this allows the description to safely remain within the scope of the intensional verb (crudely: ‘Cortez endeavored such that there is a unique object x that was golden and a mountain such that he find x’). Such solutions strike many (though not all) as implausibly strained, and others have held that the strategy cannot be extended in a natural way to other intensional verbs like ‘worships’. Once again, this remains an open topic of debate.

5. Descriptive Theories of Pronominal Anaphora

Consider sentence (1) again.

(1) A man came in the room. He turned on the TV

One of the arguments that Strawson (1952) enlisted on behalf of the referential theory of descriptions was the following. Since the pronoun in (1) gets its content from the description that it is anaphoric on, and because the pronoun refers, it must be the case that the description also refers. Strawson's idea was that descriptions refer because their anaphoric pronouns do.

There are obviously two reponses to Strawson here. One may either reject the idea that the content of the pronoun is in some sense dependent upon the description (for example, one might claim it independently picks out some object raised to salience (Lewis 1979), one might claim that it is a bound variable (Geach 1962)), or one can argue that the pronoun is a kind of definite description in disguise. This third idea has been explored by Parsons (1978), Cooper (1979), Davies (1981), Neale (1990; ch. 6), Heim (1990), Ludlow (1994), and van Rooy (2001) (the view is sometimes attributed to Evans (1977), but it is more accurate to say that he thought the pronouns had their references fixed rigidly by descriptive content). As noted above, the basic idea is that the pronoun in (1) may stand proxy for the underlined definite description in (1′).

(1′) A man came in. The man who came in turned on the TV.

The philosophical attraction of this view should be obvious. What it allows us to do is to make sense of cases where we employ nondenoting pronouns in negative existentials, belief reports, and fictional contexts. Examples would be the following:

(13) The present King of France doesn't clean my pool. He doesn't exist, either.

(14) Mary believes that the present King of France exists and that he cleans my pool.

Clearly if these pronouns are referring expressions then any victories won through the theory of descriptions are going to be fleeting. In effect, all the unwelcome metaphysical commitments that we banished by using descriptions would re-enter via the back door as soon as we employ anaphoric pronouns in our discourse. But if we treat anaphors as standing proxy for descriptions, the back door is blocked as well.

Consider an example like (14), with the descriptive material spelled out.

(14′) Mary believes that ([the x: present King of France(x)](exists(x)) and [the x: present King of France(x) & exists(x))(cleans my pool(x)).

Mary's belief is strange, but general for all that, so we can report it without being committed to the existence of the Present King of France.

Nor is this strategy necessarily limited to pronominal anaphora. Ludlow (1999, 2000) has argued that temporal and modal anaphora can be handled in a similar manner. In effect, one can take a temporal anaphor as standing proxy for a when-clause and a modal anaphor like ‘that’ in ‘that would have hurt’ as standing proxy for the antecedent of a conditional.

To illustrate, consider an example like (15), due to Partee (1972).

(15) I turned the stove off.

Now clearly this does not mean that I turned the stove off once in my life, but rather there is intuitively some relevant time when I turned it off — for example, when I left the house this morning. The standard analysis would have it that I refer to a past time or past time interval here, but such an analysis does not go down well with presentists like Prior and others who think there is something epistemologically troubling about referring to past times and their ilk. An alternative would be to suppose that the implicit temporal anaphora here can be accounted for by the introduction of descriptive material — an explicit temporal when-clause — as in (16), for example.

(16) I turned the stove off [when I left the house this morning]

The presentist can then treat ‘when’ as a primitive tense that holds between propositions. (See Ludlow (1999) for details.)

As in the pronominal anaphora case, descriptive material does the work that reference does in most other accounts of the semantics of temporal and modal discourse. Again, the goal is metaphysical austerity and faithfulness to our epistemic position.

Clearly descriptive anaphora represents a powerful extension of Russell's theory of descriptions and a useful tool for presentists and modal antirealists. For all of that, the theory has encountered a number of objections, many of them related to the problem of incomplete descriptions discussed in section 4.3. One issue that comes in from the start is the principled basis objection discussed earlier. Precisely where does the descriptive material for these anaphors come from? Is it material that the agent has in mind? Is it extracted from previous discourse? The difficulties here are obvious, and if anything they are accentuated in the extension of the theory to temporal anaphora in cases like (16). But the difficulties do not stop here. We also have to struggle with the uniqueness implications that are carried by definite descriptions.

Consider (17), for example, and a paraphrase (18) in which the pronoun is rendered as a description.

(17) If a man enters the room, he will turn the switch

(18) If a man enters the room, the man who enters will turn the switch

Heim (1982) held that (18) (unlike (17)) implies that a unique man entered the room and that (18) will therefore be false if two men enter the room. The question is, is there some way to answer this objection and retain the descriptive analysis of anaphora? Davies (1981), Lappin (1989), Neale (1990; chapter 6), Krifka (1996), and Yoon (1996) explored the possibility that the descriptive pronouns are in fact numberless — that is, the pronoun in (18) might in fact be proxy for something like ‘the man or men who enter’. (See Kanazawa (2001) for a literature review and criticism of this idea.)

Another idea, considered in Heim (1990) and Ludlow (1994) is to see descriptive theories of pronouns fare when embedded within an event-based theory of conditionals like that articulated by Kratzer (1989), and Lycan (1984). On an event-based analysis of conditionals, we would expect a treatment of the second sentence of (17) along the lines of (19).

(19) [All e] ([an x: man x]enter (x, e) → [the x: man x & enter(x,e)](∃e*•e) turned (x, the switch, e*))

We might understand this as saying that for all atomic events e, if e is an entering by a man then there is an event e* “related to” e which is a turning of the switch by the man. The nature of the relation will depend upon the kind of conditional. In some cases, the relation will be epistemic. In other cases the relation might be causal. (Here we are ignoring some very serious complications that arise with examples like ‘most men who entered turned the switch’.)

(19) seems to accurately reflect the truth conditions of ‘He will turn the switch’, even in the case where two men turn the switch simultaneously. To see this we need merely recognize that even though two men (say Ralph and Norton) may turn the switch simultaneously, it is still the case that we can recognize two independent atomic events; one where Ralph turns the switch and one where Norton turns the switch. The strategy is to show that the supposed loss of uniqueness is an epiphenomenon, and is due to the fact that the descriptive pronoun's denotation is relativized to events.

Unfortunately, there are more sophisticated versions of these cases where simple relativization to events simply will not do. These include the sage plant examples discussed in Heim (1982, 1990) and Kadmon (1990).

(20) If a man buys a plant he buys nine others along with it

The problem is that when one fleshes out the descriptive content of the pronoun as in (20) it appears that the sentence is necessarily false.

(21) If a man buys a sage plant he buys nine others along with the sage plants he bought

If nine plants are bought in addition to the plants purchased then there are eighteen plants purchased, but there must be nine plants purchased in addition to those, etc.

Finally, there is a version of example (12) above, only with pronouns instead of explicit descriptions. (Heim (1990) attributes the example to Hans Kamp and Jan van Eijk).

(22) If a bishop meets another bishop, he blesses him.

The interesting feature of this example is that the uniqueness implications of the definite descriptions remain problematic, for they imply that there is a unique satisfier of the description in each event. But notice that because the bishops bless each-other, it appears there is no unique individual that satisfies either description in the consequent of (22).

What is to be done about these cases? One idea that has received currency of late is to treat the pronoun in these cases as semantically akin to an indefinite description rather than a definite description. (See Groendijk and Stokhof (1991), Chierchia (1996), van der Does (1994), and also see van Rooy (2001) for criticism. The proposal in King (1978) has a similar effect.) If we make this move, then (22) might be glossed as in (22′).

(22′) If a bishop meets another bishop, a bishop that meets another bishop blesses a bishop that is met by another bishop.

Similarly, the sage plant example in (21) would receive the gloss in (21′).

(21′) If a man buys a sage plant he buys nine others along with a sage plant he bought

Obviously, this has to be handled with some delicacy. In the bishops case need to be sure that the domain of quantification is restricted (cf section 4.3 above) so that there are no stray bishops on the scene and we also want to block cases in which one bishop blesses himself while the other blesses no one.

Of course, as Kadmon (1990) stressed, pronouns typically do have uniqueness implications, as an example like (24) shows.

(23) Leif has a chair. It is in the kitchen

Notice that the first sentence doesn't have this implication, so the pronoun has a uniqueness implication that indefinites do not. What this means is that whatever account we give of pronouns — through dynamic semantics or whatever — we will want to account for this variation in interpretation in a principled way. We want to know precisely why a pronoun looks like a definite description here, but an indefinite description there. Whether extant accounts are satisfactory in this respect is subject to debate.

Of course, none of this is to say that solving this problem will close the book on the analysis of descriptive pronouns. A number of other puzzles remain, including the problem of pronominal contradiction, which has been discussed by Strawson (1952), Davies (1981), Ludlow and Neale (1991), and van Rooy (2001) among many others. Consider the following brief dialogue.

A: A man fell in front of the train

B: He didn't fall, he was pushed.

The problem is that if the pronoun is to have its descriptive content recovered from previous discourse, the pronoun ‘He’ is going to stand proxy for a description like ‘the man who fell in front of the train’ or ‘a man who fell in front of the train’. Here, considerations about uniqueness implications are of little help. One possibility, advocated by Davies (1981) and Ludlow and Neale (1981) is to say that speaker B is engaged in a kind of pretense — playing along with speaker A, as if saying with scare quotes something like B′.

B′: The “man who fell in front of the train” didn't fall, he was pushed

Other strategies are also in play, for example one might ignore the descriptive content of the antecedent and build the content out of thematic roles like agent and theme (Ludlow 1994), or perhaps metalinguistic material (“the person you spoke of”). Whatever the ultimate disposition of these cases, it is fair to say that there are more issues here than whether pronouns are to be treated as standing proxy for definite descriptions or indefinite descriptions.

Given the difficulties with descriptive theories of pronominal anaphora it is not surprising that there are alternatives which are widely preferred. Key among these theories are a class of approaches to anaphora in which anaphors are free variables which are bound by discourse operators of some form — i.e., operators that have scope over the entire discourse — or perhaps are interpreted by the model theory in such a way that the same effect ensues. These theories, which include Discourse Representation Theory (DRT) are also motivated by considerations about the proper treatment of indefinite descriptions, so we will discuss them in more detail in the next section.

6. Indefinite Descriptions

Most of the action in the philosophy of language has been with definite descriptions, but indefinite descriptions have also generated a fair bit of attention — some of it mirroring the debates about definite descriptions. For example Chastain (1975), Donnellan (1978), Wilson (1978), and Fodor and Sag (1982), held that indefinite descriptions are ambiguous between referential and quantificational interpretations. That is to say, there are referential and quantificational uses of indefinite descriptions and these are a reflex of a genuine semantical ambiguity. The basic structure of their argument was the following. Referential uses of indefinites must be either a function of quantifier scope or a semantically referential indefinite determiner. Since indefinites with the relevant scopal properties would violate standard syntactic constraints, indefinites must in some cases be semantically referential.

Examples of the kinds of syntactic considerations they had in mind include island constraints like the following. Quantified expressions are ordinarily considered to be clause bound. So, for example, a sentence like (24) is not supposed to have the interpretation in (24′), where the quantified expression takes wide scope.

(24) Someone believes that every man I know is angry

(24′) *[every y: man(y) and know(I, y)][Some x: person(x)](x believes that y is angry)

On the other hand, it seems more natural to say that (25) can have the interpretation corresponding to the structure in (25′).

(25) Everyone believes that a man I know is angry

(25′) [An y: man(y) and know(I, y)] [every x: person(x)] (x believes that y is angry)

A more compelling example of an island constraint would be the antecedent of a conditional, as in (26), which is not supposed to have the interpretation in (26′).

(26) If every man I know is happy then I will be happy

(26′) *[every x: man(x) and know(I, x)](if x is happy then I will be happy)

But a “wide understanding” of (27) does seem to be possible.

(27) If a man I know is happy then I will be happy

(27′) [An x: man(x) and know(I, x)](if x is happy then I will be happy)

The moral was supposed to be that these “wide” readings are not the reflex of wide scope quantification (that would be to make indefinite descriptions syntactically special), but rather due to the fact that the indefinites in these examples are referring expressions.

The Fodor and Sag argumentation was taken up in the philosophical literature by King (1988) and Ludlow and Neale (1991), who argued that there is a confusion in the Fodor and Sag discussion. Kripke's claim, of course, was that referential uses of a description are a function of pragmatics, not quantifier scope. Nor, of course, could a referential use be associated with wide scope, as Kripke (1977) argued forcefully — they simply are not the same phenomenon. The problem is that the Fodor and Sag arguments do not seem to address the pragmatic account of referential uses, which of course was the alternative advanced by Kripke.

In addition, there do appear to be more quantifier scope possibilities than the Fodor and Sag proposal seems to allow. Consider (28), from Ludlow and Neale and (29) from Kripke.

(28) Each teacher overheard many exclamations that a student of mine cheated.

(29) Hoover charged that the Berrigans plotted to kidnap a high American official

In the case of (28) ‘a student of mine’ can have narrow scope with respect to ‘every teacher’ but wide scope with respect to ‘many exclamations’. Similarly, as Kripke (1977) observed, intermediate scope is possible in (29) (as when the Berrigans have someone in mind, but Hoover does not know who). Similar observations about the possibility of intermediate scope have been made by Farkas (1981), Rooth and Partee (1982), King (1988), Ruys (1992) and Abusch (1994). How are Fodor and Sag supposed to generate readings like that, given only a referential/quantificational ambiguity and no relative scope relations? As Kripke put the point, “no two-fold distinction can replace Russell's notion of scope.” While this tells against referential analysis of indefinites, it opens a can of worms for the other approaches as well; for example, if indefinite descriptions are ordinary quantified expressions, then why do they have such extraordinary island-escaping properties (or at least appear to)?

One attractive possibility that has emerged from the literature in Discourse Representation Theory — in particular in work by Heim (1982), Kamp (1984), Deising (1992), Kamp and Reyle (1993) — has been that the appearance of a determiner in an indefinite description is chimeral — ‘a man’ in fact comes to an expression containing a predicate and a free variable, as in ‘man(x)’. This free variable might then be picked up by some sort of discourse operator as discussed in the previous section.

Accordingly, a sentence like (1) might have a logical form, or better, a discourse representation structure akin to (1*) (abstracting from details).

(1*) [[man(x) came in the room] [x turned on the TV]]

This general strategy gives us some explanation for why indefinites sometimes appear to have island escaping properties as in cases like conditionals. The answer is that they don't escape at all, but are free variables that are bound by operators outside of the island. This describes the DRT strategy only in the most general of terms, but we can already see that questions which plague the Russellian story have their reflex here as well. Everyone now recognizes that intermediate scope is a possibility in cases like (28) and (29), but the question is just what mechanisms make it possible? The Russellian has to opt for operators with unusual island escaping properties. What is the DRT theorist to do?

One option, explored by Reinhart (1996), Kratzer (1995), and Winter (1997), employs the device of choice functions. As Winter informally characterizes the doctrine, the idea is as follows.

(A1) Indefinites lack quantificational force of their own

(A2) An indefinite NP in an argument position, however, ends up denoting an individual, because the semantics involves a free function variable that assigns an individual to the restriction predicate.

(A3) This function variable is existentially closed, together with the restriction that it is a choice function: a function that chooses a member from any non-empty predicate it gets.

How does this help in the case of intermediate scope? For Reinhart (1996), choice functions by themselves cannot account for the extant phenomenon (in particular cases of intermediate scope), but the theory must be supplemented with standard quantifier raising accounts as well. Winter (1997) has offered a more general account employing choice functions (also extending the account to plural indefinites) which purport to make do without the additional resource of quantifier raising.

The interesting conceptual issue that arises, whether we opt for standard DRT accounts or such accounts supplemented with choice functions, is whether this departs from the Russellian analysis of indefinite descriptions in important ways. In one respect, of course, the accounts are very different — Russell takes indefinite descriptions to be existential quantifiers, while the DRT accounts take them to be akin to free variables. On the other hand, once the free variables are interpreted the effect comes to very much the same thing: in both cases the accounts are fundamentally quantificational.

Not everyone has seen DRT theory and choice functions in this light. Kratzer (1995) maintained that the choice function provided something like a referential interpretation of an indefinite, here understood as a “pointing gesture within the mind of the speaker,” but as Winter points out this raises some difficult methodological issues, and in the view of Ludlow and Neale (1991) this amounts to a conflation of the notions of referentiality and specificity, and a further confusion about the nature of specificity. On their view, using an expression with a particular individual in mind is not the same thing as referring to that individual. For example, according to Ludlow and Neale, there are a number of possible uses to which we can put indefinite descriptions, including referential uses, specific uses, definite uses, and purely existential uses. To understand this distinction, consider the following cases.

Referential use: A teacher announces the following to the class, with a single red haired student in the front row. “I'm not going to name names, but I have good reason to believe that red haired student in the front row cheated on yesterday's exam.” In this case the teacher has singular grounds for the utterance, and is communicating directly to the audience the identity of the individual that serves as the grounds for the utterance.

Specific use: In this case the teacher has singular grounds, and wishes to communicate that fact to the audience, but does not wish to communicate the identity of the cheater to the class. “I'm sorry to announce that yesterday I witnessed a student cheating on the exam.”

Definite use: In this case the teacher knows that there must have been a unique cheater, but does not know the identity of the cheater and hence does not have singular grounds for the utterance and accordingly is not in a position to communicate the identity of the cheater except under extraordinary circumstances. “I have statistical evidence that a student cheated on the exam. Fortunately there only appears to be one cheater.”

Purely quantificational use: In this instance not only does the teacher fail to know the identity of the cheater, but also fails to know whether or not there was a unique cheater (perhaps there were several). “I have evidence that a student cheater on the exam. The answer sheet was stolen from my office. Hopefully, there was only one student involved. We will know more pending an investigation.”

According to Ludlow and Neale, it is implausible to think that all of these uses can be chalked up to semantic facts. In each case, the proposition expressed is argued to be that which would be expressed if the indefinite determiner were replaced by the existential quantifier. The different uses of descriptions then stem from the application of Gricean principles of conversational implicature to what was literally said.

7. Unified Theories of Definite and Indefinite Descriptions

If the application of Gricean or other pragmatic principles can give rise to definite uses of indefinite descriptions, then one might speculate that the distinction between definite and indefinite descriptions can be collapsed altogether — that is, perhaps ‘the’ and ‘a’ have the same literal meaning and the only relevant distinction between them is pragmatic.

This idea is not as farfetched as it might seem. Very few natural languages have what we would recognize as definite and indefinite descriptions. In most Slavic languages, for example, ‘the man’ and ‘a man’ would both be expressed in the same way — in the determiner-free Russian equivalent of ‘man’. Perhaps it is just our infatuation with surface grammatical form that leads us to think that English or German really has two different logical elements corresponding to surface forms ‘the’ and ‘a’. Perhaps there is a single logical element with different pragmatic application conditions. That is, perhaps ‘the’ and ‘a’ have the same literal meaning — i.e., for both ‘An F is G’ and ‘The F is G’ the literal semantics is exhausted by the interpretation that [∃x: Fx](Gx) receives in a standard truth-conditional semantics. A number of linguists and philosophers have entertained this idea in recent years, including Kempson (1975), Breheney (1999), Szabo (2000), Zvolensky (1997), Ludlow and Segal (2003) and a version of the idea is at least considered in Heim (1982) and Kamp and Reyle (1993).

Obviously there are important differences between our application of the terms ‘the’ and ‘a’, but it does not follow that these differences in application are part of their semantical content. Indeed, many synonyms customarily are put to different uses. Take, for example, Grice (1961, 1975) on the distinction between ‘but’ and ‘and’. On Grice's story ‘but’ and ‘and’ literally mean the same thing, but different “conventional implicatures” are associated with them; ‘but’ implicates a sense of contrast between the conjuncts.

Ludlow and Segal (2003) offer a similar story about ‘a’ and ‘the’. Following a standard assumption in traditional grammar, they argue that ‘the’ signals that the object under discussion is given in the conversational context. Noun phrases fronted by the determiner ‘a’ signal that they involve new information. The idea advanced by Ludlow and Segal, however, is that this slender bit of information, combined with Gricean principles, is sufficient to generate the uniqueness implication that is carried by a definite description. That is, an existential claim that there is an F that is G, plus a signal that this is given information, is often enough to allow us to implicate that there is unique F that is G.

It is worth noting that there are a number of cases in which definite descriptions can occur without uniqueness implications, including facts like the following.

(30) Smith went to the theater and then to the pub (British English)

(31) Smith then drove the car into the ditch and had to go to the hospital.

(32) If a doctor and a lawyer enter Smith's room together, the doctor will sit down first

(33) The lawyer will ask if he can borrow Smith's pencil.

The unified semantical treatment of definite and indefinite descriptions allows one to avoid the uniqueness implications in these cases, while still accounting for uniqueness implications when they occur.

Armed with this idea, let's return to the some of the loose threads that we left hanging in sections 3 and 4 above — the residue of the misdescription problem, the residue of the incompleteness problem, and the problem of uniqueness faced in descriptive theories of pronouns. As we will see, the unified treatment of definite and indefinite descriptions may provide us an entering wedge for cracking open these puzzles. Let's look at the misdescription case first.

The residue of the problem of misdescription

Recall the case in which Detective Brown says ‘the murderer of Smith is insane’, incorrectly believing that there was one murderer when in fact the crime was committed by a ghoulish cult of insane individuals. There is a sense in which Brown spoke falsely, but there is also clearly some pull for us to say that what he said was true. As we saw in section 3, the distinction between the proposition literally expressed and the proposition meant was not sufficient to account for this ambivalence on our part. But according to Ludlow and Segal (2003), if we combine this pragmatic distinction with the unified analysis of definite and indefinite descriptions there is something we can say about this last bit of residue.

According to the unified analysis of descriptions, what Detective Brown literally expresses is not the idea that there was a unique murderer of Smith who is insane. To the contrary, he literally expresses the proposition that there is at least one murderer of Smith who is insane. By applying Gricean principles in this context we have made out that Brown intends to say that there is a unique murderer murderer of Smith and that he is insane. We are pulled in two directions by this case it is because what Brown has said is literally true but what he intended to communicate was, strictly speaking, false.

The residue of the problem of uniqueness

In section 3.3 we considered cases like (11), which did not seem to yield in a natural way to the device of quantifier domain restriction.

(11) Put the book on the book

But as Szabo (2000) and Ludlow and Segal (2003) have argued, if we combine quantifier domain restriction with the unified analysis of descriptions, the problem seems more amenable to solution. The idea is the following: What one literally expresses in (11) is that the hearer should put a book on a book. Pragmatics helps us to make out that one book in particular is being spoken of, which book that is, and where it is to be moved.

This solution is also argued to work in cases where the description is embedded within a conditional, as in (12) discussed above.

(12) If a bishop meets another bishop, the bishop blesses the other bishop

Before, we worried about which bishop got to count as the bishop in the context in question, but now this worry seems to have dissolved. An utterance of (12) is literally expressing the same thing as (12′)

(12′) If a bishop meets another bishop, a bishop that meets a bishop blesses a bishop that is met by a bishop

As long as we restrict the domain of quantification in this case to include just the two bishops in question, this will yield the truth conditions that we are looking for.

Descriptive theories of anaphora reconsidered

The solution we just arrived at is similar to one that we considered for the treatment of descriptive pronouns. As a number of individuals have argued (perhaps most forcefully, van der Does (1994)), a number of puzzles untangle if we treat the descriptive pronouns in cases like (22) as actually standing proxy for indefinite descriptions. The problem with that solution is that it doesn't go far enough — it doesn't explain why we get exactly the same phenomenon with explicit definite descriptions as in (12). The unified treatment of definite and indefinite descriptions circumvents this worry and unifies the treatment of cases like (12) and (22).

8. Descriptive Theories of Proper Names

This is not the place for an extended discussion of the theory of proper names, but an abbreviated discussion may help to illustrate the connection between the theory of descriptions and various theories of proper names. Suppose that we are satisfied that the theory of descriptions as proposed by Russell holds up pretty well, and indeed that the problems of incomplete descriptions, the problem of misdescription, and the problem of pronominal anaphora can be resolved. Can we say that Russell was also right in proposing that some names are really definite descriptions in disguise? Here we face a new series of objections and worries.

As noted in section 3, the motivations for the descriptive theory of names are clear. The question is whether the theory is workable. On the face of it a naïve application of the theory faces some serious difficulties. Devitt and Sterelney (1998; 48 ff) catalogue them as follows:

The principled basis objection. There are a number of different descriptions that people might associate with a name like Aristotle. An historian might know him under the description of ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’, a Catholic Church historian might know him under the description of ‘the leading influence on Saint Aquinas’, some philosophers might know him under the description of ‘the pupil of Plato and author of The Metaphysics and The Nichomachean Ethics’, Plato himself might have known him under the description ‘the obnoxious student of mine.’ Which of these descriptions is the correct one, what is the principled basis that determines which description is correct?

The unwanted ambiguity objection. Suppose that we respond to the principled basis objection by letting many flowers bloom. That is, suppose we argue that there is no single correct description associated with the name but there are many. We now run into the teeth of the problem of unwanted ambiguity. Are there really that many different names, each corresponding to an different description? If so, why does ‘Aristotle was Aristotle’ seem so much less informative than ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great was the leading influence on Saint Aquinas’?

The unwanted necessity objection. Consider a sentence like ‘Aristotle taught Alexander the Great’. This seems to be a contingent claim — one that is true but matters could have gone otherwise. Aristotle could have decided it was immoral to take the position, or Phillip of Macedonia could have decided that Aristotle was not the best tutor for his young Alexander. We can imagine numerous possible worlds in which the sentence turns out to be false (unlike necessary claims like ‘5+7=12’ which appear to be true in every possible world). But now consider this sentence with the description unpacked. We get something like ‘The pupil of Aristotle and teacher of Alexander the Great taught Alexander the Great’, and it seems that this would have to be true in every world in which someone satisfies the relevant description. The problem is that the Russellian analysis seems to turn a contingent proposition into a necessary proposition.

Searle (1958, 1969; 162 ff.) offers some modifications designed to overcome these difficulties with the descriptive theory of names. Consider a name like ‘Socrates’. Is it really part of the meaning of that name that it's bearer drank hemlock, taught Plato and did all of the other things that we are told that he did when we study the history of philosophy? Searle suggests that we needn't associate the meaning of a name with a description that contains all of these elements — it might be enough that most of them hold, or that a suitably weighted bundle of them hold. (Other versions of this idea were proposed in Strawson (1959; 180 ff.) and Wilson (1959).)

How does Searle's proposal help with the objections just listed? The unwanted necessity objection collapses immediately because the use of a name does not commit the speaker to the object in question having all the properties in the bundle. When I say Aristotle authored the Nichomachean Ethics it is as though I uttered the following:

(34) The individual who is associated with some significant number of these properties (taught by Plato, taught Alexander, wrote the Nichomachean Ethics, etc.) wrote the Nichomachean Ethics.

Someone might be associated with this bundle of properties and not written the Nichomachean ethics (so long as they had enough of the other properties).

The principled basis objection is supposed to collapse because there is now no issue of choosing which description is the correct one — if the theologian, the historian, and the philosopher all associate different descriptions and hence different properties with Aristotle, all of those properties will make it into the bundle of properties for the name ‘Aristotle’. We don't need to worry about the principled basis for chosing the relevant properties because we don't have to choose period. We take them all.

The unwanted ambiguity objection is supposed to collapse because every use of the name ‘Aristotle’ is now associated with the same bundle of properties. ‘Aristotle is Aristotle’ is uninformative because it is shorthand for (35).

(35) The individual who is associated with some significant number of these properties (taught by Plato, taught Alexander, wrote the Nichomachean Ethics, etc.) is the individual who is associated with some significant number of these properties (taught by Plato, taught Alexander, wrote the Nichomachean Ethics, etc.)

As compelling as Searle's proposal may seem at first blush, it soon runs into problems of its own. As Devitt and Sterelny observe, the three objections to the traditional descriptive theory of names come creeping back. For starters, one presumably doesn't want every single fact about Aristotle to make it into the bundle of properties that we associate with his name (that would lead us down the path to an extreme holism in which every fact that we acquire changes the meaning of the name), so what is the principled basis for deciding what goes into the bundle? Worse, what is the principled basis by which we weight the importance of the properties in the bundle?

The unwanted ambiguity objection returns as well if we allow that different people will associate different bundles of properties with a name or at least weight those properties differently. One might be tempted to dodge this problem by arguing that the relevant bundle of properties for a name is socially fixed and does not vary between individuals, but then it is hard to see how names like ‘Scott’ and ‘Sir Walter’ could be associated with different bundles of properties since the community as a whole is likely to attribute the same bundle of properties (with the same weights) to these names. This is a problem, because different bundles of properties are needed to distinguish the differences in cognitive significance between ‘Scott’ and ‘Sir Walter’. There is a dilemma then: one can avoid the problem of unwanted ambiguity only at the expense of the problem of accounting for the cognitive significance of names.

Finally, as Kripke (1980) argued, Searle's solution really doesn't help with the problem of unwanted necessity. Aristotle might have had none of the properties that we ordinarily associate with his name. Searle certainly didn't think this was possible — for him, if nothing had the properties in question (or enough of them) then Aristotle did not exist. But Kripke (ch. 2) enlisted a number of arguments to show that the behavior of names in modal environments suggests otherwise. For example even if we concede that Aristotle did all the things he was supposed to have done, it is still the case that Aristotle need not have done any of the things he did. He could have forsaken philosophy for other pursuits. He could have been run over by a chariot at age 2. But then how do we make sense of a descriptive name in a sentence like (1)?

(36) It might have been the case that Aristotle was run over by a chariot at age 2

If the description is unpacked, we get something like

(36′) It might have been the case that the philosopher who was taught by Plato, taught Alexander etc. was run over by a chariot at age 2

And this looks like a claim that is necessarily false.

Kripke held that the behavior of names in these environments can only be explained if we think of the names as being rigid designators — i.e., as devices which rigidly pick out an individual across possible worlds. Kripke also stressed that this is not really a point about conditional or modal sentences — the same point can be made for simple declarative sentences evaluated in a counterfactual situation. So, for example, take a simple sentence like (37).

(37) Aristotle was run over by a chariot at age 2

We can evaluate this sentence in other possible worlds. We can say that it might have been true under certain circumstances. But it does not seem plausible that there is a possible world where the following is true.

(38) The philosopher who taught was taught by Plato, taught Alexander etc. was run over by a chariot at age 2

Finally, Donnellan (1972) and Kripke (1980) both argued that the Descriptive Theory of Names suffers from an important epistemological defect. The descriptions that we associate with names routinely do not describe the individuals that we intend to refer to. Asked to come up with a description to substitute for the name ‘Einstein’, many people would write ‘The inventor of the atom bomb’ (which of course he was not). Others might write ‘the inventor of the theory of relativity’, but then asked what the theory of relativity was would respond ‘the theory that Einstein invented’. The descriptive information that we associate with names just is not sufficient to pick out the intended referent.

Kripke's positive proposal — suggestion really — was that names are associated with a causal chain; there is an initial baptism of an individual (e.g., Albert Einstein as ‘Albert Einstein’) and that referent is passed along to other users of the name. Likewise the referent of ‘Aristotle’ is not fixed by some description, but by a causal chain linking our use of ‘Aristotle’ with some historical individual. (This is not the place for an extended discussion of this proposal, but see Devitt 1981 and Salmon … for development of this idea and Evans (1973, 1980) for criticism.)

In spite of the great force of Kripke's criticism of the descriptive theory of names, there have been some significant attempts to answer them. One idea (explored by Loar (1976), McDowell (1977), and Schiffer (1978)) would have the description be something like ‘the individual designated by the name ‘Aristotle’’. For Kripke (1980), and Devitt (1981) this sort of approach was hopelessly circular. Indeed, Devitt and Sterelny disparagingly refered to the position as “circular descriptivism” (but see Kroon (1989) for an attempt to disarm the circularity charge). Another idea (taken up in Kroon (1987) and Jackson (1998)) was to build reference to the causal chain into the description itself. Thus, ‘Aristotle’ might stand proxy for ‘the individual linked by a causal chain to ‘Aristotle’’ (this view was dubbed “causal descriptivism” by Lewis (1984)). Whatever the merits of these views, they clearly abandon some of the key motivations for the descriptive theories of names — in particular the idea that the description could do the work of providing the sense of the name.

Still, from a linguistic point of view, we should note that there are features of names in natural language that make them appear to be similar to descriptions. Names can take determiners like ‘a’ and ‘the’ (indeed in some languages they routinely do so), which suggests that they are behaving more like nouns than like saturated referring expression. Indeed it is a widespread linguistic analysis of names that they have possibly empty determiner positions, so that a name like Aristotle has at a minimum the following structure:

[DP [Det ∅ ] [N Aristotle]].

In addition, Burge (1973) offered a number of arguments in of support the idea that names really are predicates, and further support has come from Hornsby (1976), Larson and Segal (1995) and Eluguardo (2002). (But see Boer (1975), Bach (1987), and Higginbotham (1988) for criticism.)

The Burge story had the determiner as something like a bare demonstrative. It is not a long step to the supposition that the default interpretation of the null element is to treat it as the definite determiner ‘the’. This is in effect the proposal offered in Larson and Segal (1995); ‘Aristotle’ stands in for an incomplete definite description of the form ‘the Aristotle’. In both cases, the predicate in question would be something like being named ‘Aristotle’, so again it is difficult to see how this general approach (without emendation) can satisfy Russell's desiderata that the description play the role of senses.

An alternative riff on these ideas which has been widely discussed, but not, so far as I know, published, would be to suppose that there is a rigid property of being Aristotle — one that only Aristotle could have in any possible world (this property would be completely independent of being named ‘Aristotle’). The idea is that the content of the description could consist solely of that property. For example, when we say that ‘Aristotle may have been run over by a chariot’ we would in effect be saying there is a possible world in which the unique individual who has the property of being Aristotle was run over by a chariot. It seems that charges of circularity are not so easily advanced here, although the view does raise questions about the nature of these rigid properties and our epistemic access to them.

Another class of responses has attempted to retain the standard descriptive content of names but moved to circumvent Kripke's modal worries. Dummett (1973; 111-135, 1981) and Sosa (1996; ch. 3, 2001) proposed that the behavior of names in modal contexts can be accounted for if we take names to be descriptions with mandatory wide scope. So, for example, (36) could be taken to have the following logical form.

(36″) [The x: taught Alexander etc. (x)] possibly (it was the case that x was run over by a chariot at age 2)

Kripke discussed this possibility briefly in the Preface to (1980), holding that the move overlooks the fact that we can simply evaluate (37) in other possible worlds, hence no embedding within modal operators is really necessary. For that matter, would could simple consider a sentence like ‘(37) might have been true’. How does a wide scope story help us in this case? More recently, Soames (2002; ch. 2) has expanded on Kripke's points and marshaled a number of additional arguments against the wide scope thesis, including the observation that if one embeds a name within a propositional attitude environment and in turn embeds the propositional attitude in a modal environment then one is in the peculiar position of needing the description to escape the modal environment (to honor the rigidity facts) but not escape the propositional attitude environment (to honor the ‘Scott’/ ‘Sir Walter’ cases that Russell (1905) employed to motivate the descriptive theory of names). In other words, the description theorists need to have their cake and eat it too.

Another possibility (considered in Nelson (2002)) would be to argue that names are “rigidified descriptions” (i.e., descriptions like ‘The individual who actually was a student of Plato, taught Alexander, etc.’ or perhaps rigidified causal descriptions (Nelson)). This general strategy is criticized by Soames (2002; ch. 2), who argues that ‘the actual F is G’ and ‘n is G’, where n is a name, do not express the same proposition. The argument for this turns on cases where these expressions are embedded in propositional attitude environments, as in (39).

(39)     a. Smith believes that n is G
    b. Smith believes that the actual F is G

According to Soames, there are contexts of utterance and worlds of evaluation where (39a) is true but (39b) is false. Accordingly, ‘the actual F is G’ and the ‘n is G’ cannot express the same proposition. Hence names cannot be rigidified descriptions. (But see Nelson (2002) for a response to this argument.)

Yet another approach to defending descriptions would be to employ a “2-dimensionalist” semantics (in the sense of Stalnaker (1978, 1990), Davies and Humberstone (1980)) to account for the behavior of descriptive names in modal environments. Some form of this idea has been offered by Evans (1982), Stanley (1997a, 1997b), Chalmers (2000, 2002), and Jackson (1998). Here the basic idea is that the content of a description picks out different contents in different possible worlds. Accordingly, if we want to evaluate the descriptive content of ‘Aristotle’ in another possible world, we do not take the description ‘student of Plato…’, since that is only the appropriate description for this world. In other worlds there will be other descriptive contents. As Jackson (1998; 112) puts the idea:

If speakers can say what refers to what when various possible worlds are described to them, description theorists can identify the property associated in their [the speaker's] minds with, for example, the word ‘water’: it is the disjunction of the properties that guide the speaker in each particular possible world when the say which stuff, if any, in each world counts as water. This disjunction is in their minds in the sense that they can deliver the answer for each possible world when it is described in sufficient detail, but it is implicit in the sense that the pattern that brings the various disjuncts together as part of the, possibly highly complex, disjunction may be one they cannot state.

Soames (2003) has responded that this particular 2-dimensionalist approaches is “tantamount to the claim that descriptive theories of reference determination as a priori irrefutable, since any refutation would require a clear, uncontroversial description of a possible scenario in which n referred to something o not satisfying the description associated with n by speakers like us, whereas our very judgment that n does refer to o in this scenario would be taken…to demonstrate the existence of an implicit description in out minds that does successfully determine reference, whether or not we can successfully state it.” Further criticism can be found in Block and Stalnaker (1998).

This has been only a very cursory look at various descriptive theories of proper names. A more thorough examination is commissioned for this encyclopedia. Accordingly my aim has been merely to canvass some of the positions that have been argued recently. Suffice it to say for now that the theory of descriptive names is yet another topic area that remains contentious and a source of lively debate.

9. Plural, Mass, and Generic Descriptions

So far we have discussed singular definite and indefinite descriptions (and the possibility that names are descriptions) but as it turns out these types of descriptions are probably not the most commonly occurring descriptions in English. Ultimately we also want to take into account plural descriptions (as in ‘the dogs are barking’), mass noun descriptions (as in ‘the water is cold’), and generics (as in ‘the dog is a loyal friend’). The question is whether each of these constructions must be treated in a different way, or whether it is possible to unify their treatment with the analysis of definite descriptions discussed above. Sharvy (1980) suggested that a unified treatment is indeed possible (this is also a possibility that Chomsky (1975) saw).

Sharvy's idea was that we could generalize Russell's theory of descriptions by ‘the F (or Fs) is (are) G’ to be equivalent to the following,

(40) ∃x(Fx & ∀y(Fyyx) & G(x))

where F can be either a singular count noun (like ‘dog’), a plural count noun (like ‘dogs’) or a mass noun (like ‘water’), and the symbol ‘≤’ indicates a parthood relation. Here is the idea. We take singular count nouns to be predicates true of individuals, plural count nouns to be predicates true of groups or collections of individuals, and mass nouns to be predicates true of portions of masses. Then, a definite description ‘the F’ (‘the Fs’) denotes the maximal sum or mass in the extension of F. So, for example, when we utter ‘The dogs’ we are denoting the maximal set of dogs in the domain of discourse. When we utter ‘the water’, we are denoting the maximal mass of water in the discourse. In the case of singular definite descriptions (like ‘the dog’) we are still denoting the maximal set of dogs in the domain of discourse (since in this case there is only one dog). In effect, singular definite descriptions are just special cases of Sharvy's generalized theory of descriptions.

Fara (2001) notes that the same strategy can be extended to generics as well.

(41) The dog is related to the wolf

If natural kinds like species and sub-species can bear the parthood relation to one another, then one can extend the Sharvy parthood operator to these cases as well. I don't mean to suggest that Sharvy's analysis of these constructions has no competitors, but the fact that he was able to give a unified treatment of these constructions suggests that competitors will have to do the same. It really does seem as though singular, plural, mass, and generic descriptions are not so different in kind. A unified Russellian treatment of the constructions is possible.

There remains the question of whether this generalized treatment of definite descriptions undermines the proposal — explored in section 6 — of unifying definite and indefinite descriptions. For example, is it plausible to treat plural definite descriptions as semantically akin to indefinite plurals? There is much to recommend such a strategy. If my neighbor has 101 Dalmatians, I might complain ‘the dogs are barking again’, even if only some of them are barking (and it doesn't seem plausible to say that I am restricting the domain of discourse to just the 20 or so dogs that are barking). Likewise for definite mass terms; if I say that the bread in the breadbox is moldy I am not saying that the bread is moldy through and through — I'm saying that some of it is. And if I say that ‘the dog is a loyal animal’ I am not saying that all subspecies of dogs are loyal. (And while I'm at it, if I say ‘the American people elected George W. Bush president’ I'm not even saying that the majority of the voting age population who bothered to vote cast their votes for him.) Perhaps the maximality condition in Sharvy's generalized theory of descriptions should be dropped altogether.

In this case we really have a generalized semantics for descriptions — one that covers “definite” and “indefinite” singular, plural, mass, and generic descriptions. Any difference in the behavior of ‘the F’ (‘the Fs’) and ‘an F’ (‘some Fs’) would be fundamentally pragmatic.

10. Descriptions as Predicates

At the beginning of this article we noted that some uses of the expressions ‘an F’ and ‘the F’ are argued to be predicational, rather than quantificational. So, for example, consider the following cases.

(42) John is a lawyer

(43) John is the mayor of Pittsburgh

It is not unusual to think of ‘is a lawyer’ and ‘is the mayor of Pittsburgh’ as predicates. In the case of (42), we intuitively are not saying that there is a lawyer such that John is identical to that lawyer. Indeed, as Williams (1983) observed, this appearance is even more pronounced if we consider cases like (44).

(44) John is not a lawyer

(44) does not seem to have the meaning that there is a lawyer such that John is not identical to that lawyer. It is more natural to take an utterance of (44) as denying that John has a certain property.

If this is right, then the copula ‘is’ is really just the ‘is’ of predication and semantically dispensable (significantly, it routinely does not appear in many other languages unless it is needed to carry tense or other inflectional information). Likewise, we might say that the indefinite article ‘a’ is semantically inert as well — a mere “grace note” in Higginbotham's (1987) terminology. In this vein, one widely held view, due to Kamp (1984) and Heim (1982), is that we could regard indefinite descriptions as expressions containing free variables which are bound by adverbs of quantification (in the sense of Lewis (1975)) interpreted as existentially quantified by the model theory, or perhaps bound by implicit existential closure operators (Diesing 1992).

For linguists it is now standard to think of indefinite descriptions following the copula as always being predicational, and it is a widespread belief that definite descriptions following the copula are often predicational. Philosophers have also been attracted to this view. See, for example, Geach (1962; section 39), Wiggins (1965, 42 ff.), Kim (1970; 211 ff.), Wilson (1978), Smiley (1981) and Higginbotham (1987) among others). Does it follow that we must admit two different kinds of descriptions (quantificational and predicational)? We saw that singular, plural, mass, and generic descriptions can be unified; can we perform the same unification trick here?

There are two options if we want to unify the analysis of descriptions in subject and predicate position. The first is to say that, despite appearances, each type of occurrence is quantificational. Following Enc (1986) cases with definite descriptions, like (43), can be argued to have an implicit time index (e.g., ‘the mayor of Boston at t’). In addition, Ludlow (1991) argued that one has to be cautious in handling facts like (44); they could be accounted for by proposing that negation is a scope island. The idea would be that ‘a lawyer’ cannot take wide scope over the negation in (44) for precisely the same reasons that ‘always’ cannot take wide scope over negation in (45).

(45) John doesn't always go to parties

Now clearly this cannot mean that it is always the case that John doesn't go to parties. It might be that there are similar reasons for thinking (44) cannot mean there is a lawyer x, such that John is not x. (But see Mandelbaum (1994) for criticism of this argument.)

Alternatively, Graff (2001) pursued the possibility that all uses of definite descriptions are predicational — even descriptions in subject position. The idea is that if I say ‘The present King of France is bald’, I am saying something like the following: some x is such that x is the unique present King of France and x is bald. The interesting riff here is the notion that the uniqueness condition is built into the predicate. Extending the Sharvy analysis of descriptions, we get the following, where F is the set of all Fs, or the mass of all substance that is F:


||an F|| = F;

||the F|| = {x: xF & ∀y (yFyx}

But again we might consider collapsing the distinction between definite and indefinite descriptions here, and say that there is a single rule which interprets all descriptions — definite, indefinite, singular, plural, mass, or generic — as predicates (Graff (1999; fn 18) seems open to this idea). In effect:

(46′) ||the F/the Fs/an F/some Fs|| = F

If this is right (it is, let's face it, a very strong and surprising claim in spite of its simplicity), then we might want to go further and incorporate names as well — assimilating them to predicates as discussed in section 7. The consequences of such a view are more than a little striking. At a minimum, this would seem to suggest that there is no such thing as the ‘is’ of identity in natural language (except perhaps in the philosopher's locution ‘is identical to’, but notice that this looks rather like a relational predicate itself — i.e., like ‘is taller than’). Clearly, these are some very interesting possibilities with strong philosophical and linguistic consequences, and they are — even if ultimately untenable — well worth pursing at this stage.

11. Conclusion

The past century of work on the theory of descriptions has shown the tremendous insight that Russell had in his (1905) paper. Even where philosophers and linguists have demurred from his stronger claims (the descriptive theory of names, for example), the ensuing debates have been framed by the considerations set out by Russell. Equally impressive, however, is the fact that the theory has been extended in so many interesting and provocative ways — for example to pronominal anaphora, temporal and modal anaphora, plural descriptions, mass terms, and generics. The allure of the theory of descriptions remains its promise of metaphysical austerity, its ability to untangle numerous semantical puzzles in the theory of meaning, and its role in making sense of the epistemic status of our knowledge claims. Even where philosophers have departed from the stock Russellian theory of descriptions (for example by rejecting the uniqueness clause) they have usually done so with the goal of servicing the more central insight of the theory — that many noun phrases in English, despite appearances, are not referring expressions but are in some sense quantificational. Frank Ramsey was certainly correct, some eighty years ago, when he spoke of Russell's theory of descriptions as “that paradigm of philosophy.” He might just as easily have said “the paradigm of philosophy.”


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Thanks are due to Jason Stanley and Ed Zalta for helpful comments.